Monotheism

First published Tue Nov 1, 2005; substantive revision Fri Sep 6, 2013

Theists believe that reality's ultimate principle is God—an omnipotent, omniscient, goodness that is the creative ground of everything other than itself. Monotheism is the view that there is only one such God. After a brief discussion of monotheism's historical origins, this entry looks at the five most influential attempts to establish God's uniqueness. We will consider arguments from God's simplicity, from his perfection, from his sovereignty, from his omnipotence, and from his demand for total devotion. The entry concludes by examining three major theistic traditions which contain strands which might seem at odds with their commitment to monotheism—the Jewish Kabbalistic tradition, Christianity, and Shri Vaishnavism.

1. Monotheism's Origins

Most mainstream Old Testament scholars believe that the religion of the early Israelites was neither monotheistic nor polytheistic but “monolatrous.” While the existence of other gods was not denied, Israel was to worship no god but Yahweh. In virtue of the Mosaic covenant, Yahweh became the “confederate god” of Israel, and they become his people (Meek, 215). In part, this is characteristic of any “national religion: in practice only the gods of one's own nation are significant.” Yet it was also unique, for “one of the distinguishing characteristics of the Israelite religion is the belief that there are not several gods of Israel but only one, Yahweh, who claims exclusive devotion.” (Ringgren, 67) There are no unambiguous assertions of monotheism from the pre-exilic period, however. Even so, biblical scholars agree that the religion of Israel was at least “incipiently” monotheistic from its Mosaic beginnings. Why? Three things were arguably decisive.

In the first place, “we encounter very early the idea that Yahweh is the creator of heaven and earth.” (Ringgren, 67). Although it is true that polytheistic religions frequently include a creator in their pantheons, and these creators are often comparatively unimportant, there is a natural transition from the claim that a god has created heaven and earth to the belief that he or she is lord of heaven and earth, and from there to monotheism. In the second place, there are “repeated affirmations … that Yahweh is the greatest and mightiest of the gods.” (Ringgren, 99) Finally, the religion of Israel is unique in demanding exclusive worship; only Yahweh is to be worshiped by Israel. The extension of this notion to the idea that Yahweh alone is to be worshiped by everyone is natural (although perhaps not inevitable). If these considerations are correct, then the characteristics of Yahweh that eventually led Israel to assert that Yahweh is the only God were his creation of heaven and earth, his power and greatness, and his right to exclusive worship.

Parallel developments occurred elsewhere. Especially noteworthy is a phenomenon that sometimes occurs in polytheism, namely, that during worship the god is treated as if he or she were unlimited and supreme, and given epithets that properly belong to other members of the pantheon. (This occurred at certain stages of Vedic polytheism, for example.) More generally, the religious attitudes bound up with theistic worship (whether monotheistic or polytheistic) appear to have a certain inner logic, tending to lead the devotee to magnify the object of her devotion by denying limitations and adding perfections. The logical limit of this tendency is the ascription of such properties as universal sovereignty and unlimited power. The very same attitudes also tend to lead her to unreservedly commit herself to, and center her life on, the god to whom she is devoted. It is therefore no accident that polytheistic systems often end up elevating one god or principle to the supreme position, and reinterpreting the others as its agents or manifestations; they become, in other words, essentially monotheistic. This occurred, for example, both in late Paganism and in Hinduism.

A striking feature of these developments is that the ideas about the object of worship which seem to have most directly led its devotees to explicit affirmations of monotheism—universal sovereignty, omnipotence, and a demand for total devotion—are precisely those underlying the three most powerful philosophical arguments for God's unicity. We will discuss these shortly. But before doing so let us examine two historically important attempts to show that there can't be two gods because nothing could distinguish them—an argument from God's simplicity and another from his perfection.

2. An Argument from God's Simplicity

God is often thought to be simple in the sense that each of God's real properties is identical with each of his other real properties, and with his being or nature. For example, God's knowledge is identical with his power, and both are identical with his being. Just as “the teacher of Plato” and “the husband of Xanthippe” don't mean the same yet refer to the same individual (namely, Socrates), so “the wisdom of God” and “the power of God” have different meanings but refer to the same thing (namely, the infinitely perfect divine life or activity). If God is simple, however, it seems that there can be only one god.

For consider the following argument. Suppose that there are two simple beings, x and y. x has the property of simplicity, S, and whatever property, P, suffices for identity with x. And because x is simple, S=P. But y, too has S. y must therefore have P as well and, hence, y=x (Leftow, 199–200).

Notice, however, that God's simplicity is a second-order property, that is, a property of God's first-order properties such as wisdom, power, goodness, and the like. The doctrine of simplicity may entail that God's (real) first-order properties are identical. But does it entail that all of God's (real) second-order properties are identical with his (real) first order properties (and thus that God's simplicity is identical with whatever first-order properties suffice for identity with God)? It isn't clear that it does. Since simplicity and other divine second-order properties supervene on his first-order properties, the latter entail the former; nothing could instantiate each of God's (real) first-order properties without instantiating such properties as simplicity. But the converse may not be true. For couldn't a thing be simple in the defined sense (namely, having all its first-order real properties identical with each other and with its being) without having the divine properties? (Numbers might be an example.) If it could, then simplicity is not identical with the real first-order properties that suffice to make God God.

We needn't suppose that God's second-order properties are identical with his first-order properties to mount an argument from simplicity, however. Suppose that God is simple in the sense that, for any two of his first-order properties, P and Q, either P is identical with Q or P is logically equivalent to Q (that is, it is impossible for him to possess P without possessing Q, and vice versa). Let us also suppose that there are two gods. If both are God, then both possess the first-order properties essential to divinity. Call these D. If the two differ, each possesses at least one first-order property which the other lacks. Suppose, for example, that the first possesses a first-order property, H, and the second possesses its complement, non-H. Since each is God, each is simple. Hence, either H is identical with D and non-H is identical with D, or H is logically equivalent to D and non-H is logically equivalent to D. Therefore, either H is identical with non-H or H is logically equivalent to non-H. But this is incoherent and, even if it were not, the possession of H and non-H could not be used to distinguish the two, since either H and non-H are the same property or H and non-H are logically equivalent properties. It therefore seems that if God is simple, there can't be two gods.

There are at least two problems with this argument, though. First, the doctrine of divine simplicity is highly controversial—not all theists accept it. Second, even if the doctrine is accepted, the most that may be required is that God's essential (real) properties are either identical with each other or equivalent to each other. God also appears to have (real) contingent properties, however, and, if he does, these properties can't be identical with or equivalent to his essential properties. For consider the property of being the ultimate cause of my existence or the property of knowing that I am the author of this entry. Since acting and knowing are paradigmatic cases of real properties, being the ultimate cause of my existence or knowing that I am the author of this entry would seem to be real properties of God. (Pace Thomas Aquinas and others who implausibly insist that they aren't even though God really has them, that is, even though God really does stand in these relations to me.) But they are also contingent properties of God, since there are possible worlds in which God exists and doesn't create me, and possible worlds in which God exists but doesn't know that I am the author of this entry (because, for example, I never write it). Since God has his essential properties in every possible world in which he exists and does not have his contingent properties in every possible world in which he exists, his contingent properties can't be identical with, or equivalent to, his essential properties. It follows that if H and non-H are real but contingent properties of two divine beings, they are neither identical with nor equivalent to D. The argument from simplicity thus fails because it leaves open the possibility that two gods could be distinguished by a difference in their real contingent properties.

3. An Argument from God's Perfection

John of Damascus argued that because God is perfect, he is necessarily unique. The only way in which one god could be distinguished from another would be by coming “short of perfection in goodness, or power, or wisdom, or time, or place,” but in that case “he would not be God” (John of Damascus, 173). Aquinas offers a similar argument: If there were several gods, there would be several perfect beings but “if none of these perfect beings lacks some perfection,” and if none of them has “any admixture of imperfection …., nothing will be given in which to distinguish the perfect beings from one another” (Aquinas, 158).

Arguments like this make two assumptions. The first is that properties can be exhaustively divided into three classes. The first class is the class of imperfections, that is, limitations (my inability to run a two minute mile, for instance) or privations (for example, blindness or sin—properties that imply defects, some deviation from the standards appropriate for evaluating beings of the kind in question). The second is the class of mixed perfections, that is, good-making properties that entail some limitation (for example, being human or being corporeal) or privation (repentance, for instance). The third class is that of pure perfections—perfections that entail no limitation or privation (for example, being, goodness, love, knowledge, power, unity, or independence). The second assumption is that God possesses all and only pure perfections. With these assumptions in place, the argument works. Two gods couldn't be distinguished by a difference in their pure perfections since both gods have all of them. And they couldn't be distinguished by a difference in their other properties because they haven't any.

Unfortunately, both assumptions seem false. For God appears to possess some properties which are neither imperfections, mixed perfections, nor pure perfections. If he does, then some properties belong to none of our three classes, and not all of God's properties are pure perfections.

The property of being the ultimate cause of my existence appears to be an example. The property isn't a (pure) perfection but, rather, a contingent expression of a (pure) perfection, namely, the exercise of creative power. (God is perhaps better or more splendid for exercising creative power, but he is not better or more splendid for having created me.) But neither is it a limitation or privation (though it is not, of course, a full or complete expression of the relevant divine perfection). Nor does it appear to be a mixed perfection. God's instantiating a possible world containing me precludes his instantiating possible worlds which lack this interesting feature but entails no inherent limitation or defect in his creative abilities. At least one real property, then, is neither an imperfection, mixed perfection, or pure perfection; and at least one of God's real properties isn't a pure perfection. Both of the assumptions on which the argument is based are thus false.

The argument from divine perfection, like the argument from God's simplicity, fails because God appears to possess some of his real properties contingently. Yet the question remains, could two gods be distinguished on the basis of a difference in their contingent properties? It is doubtful that the contingent properties we have discussed will serve our purpose. “Knowing that Jones exists” would (in a world containing Jones) be a property of any omniscient being existing in that world. And “Creates Smith” would (in a world containing Smith) be a property of any creator of that world. Perhaps all of God's real but contingent properties are expressions of his perfect knowledge, goodness, and creative power. And perhaps it is impossible for two gods to exhibit different expressions of this in the same possible world: In any possible world, w, two omniscient beings would know the same things; being supremely good their appreciations and valuations of the things in w would presumably be identical; and each would be the creative ground of everything else that exists in w. If all of God's real but contingent properties are expressions of his pure perfections and if, for any possible world, two gods couldn't exhibit different expressions of those perfections in that world, then no possible world contains two gods.

Furthermore, if there are individual essences, two individuals, x and y, couldn't differ only in their contingent properties. (I is an individual essence of x if and only if x has I in every possible world in which it exists and, for any individual, y, and any possible world, w, if y has I in w, y in w is identical with x.) For suppose they did. Then their essential properties would be the same. A being's individual essence is an essential property of it, however. Hence, if x and y had the same essential properties, they would also have to have the same individual essence. But, in that case, x and y wouldn't be two individuals contrary to our supposition. And if no two beings can differ only with respect to their contingent properties, two gods can't either. (For a sophisticated version of an argument of this type see Zagzebski 1989.)

Could two gods be distinguished by a difference in their essential properties, however? (The doctrine of simplicity may entail that they can't but—as noted above—the doctrine of simplicity is controversial.) Each god would obviously have to have all the properties essential to divinity (omniscience, omnipotence, perfect goodness, and the like). But could they be differentiated by essential properties peculiar to each? Could, in other words, the first god have an essential property which the second god lacks, or vice versa? Zagzebski (1989) thinks that it can't. Human beings are distinguished in virtue of their having different individual essences, and human rational beings and angelic rational beings are distinguished in virtue of their possessing the properties essential to humanity and to angelhood, respectively. But no individual human (way of being human) exhausts the fullness of humanity (the many ways of being human), and neither humanity nor angelhood exhaust the fullness of rationality (the many different ways of being rational). Being divine, on the other hand, entails being “wholly” or “perfectly” divine, that is, being everything a divine being could possibly be. So “two divine beings” could not differ “in an essential property” in the way in which individual human beings, or human beings and angelic beings, can. (Zagzebski 1989, 10–11)

Is this argument entirely compelling, though? Arguably, it is impossible for any individual to exemplify all the possible ways of being human or all of the possible ways of being rational. So why assume that it is possible for a being to exemplify all the possible ways of being divine? Why think, in other words, that there aren't different and mutually exclusive ways of exemplifying divinity—being Allah as depicted in the Quran, for example, or being the triune God of Christianity, or the Vishnu of the Shri Vaishnavas? (For more on some of these possibilities see section 7 below.) Or again, suppose that the relevant differentiating property is having a certain emotional or mental temper—Yahweh's as depicted in the Hebrew Bible, say, or Krishna's as depicted in the Bhagavata Purana. Suppose further that neither of these emotional or mental tempers is better or more worshipful than the other. Isn't it an open question, at least, whether either of these emotional or mental tempers is essential to divinity although they may be essential to being Yahweh or being Krishna, respectively? If they aren't, then it is by no means clear that any being can exhaust the fullness of divinity.

While the arguments we have discussed in the last two sections are impressive, they hinge on claims that would not be accepted by all theists—that God is simple, for example, or that there are real individual essences, or that any wholly or perfectly divine being exhausts the fullness of divinity. By contrast, the three arguments that we will examine next are firmly rooted in attributes which almost all theists ascribe to God—his universal sovereignty, omnipotence, and demand for total devotion—and are thus more compelling.

4. Two Arguments from God's Sovereignty

4.1 The Argument from Causal Order

One of the most popular arguments for monotheism is drawn from the world's unity. If there were several designers who acted independently or at cross-purposes, we would expect to find evidence of this in their handiwork—one set of laws obtaining at one time or place, for example, and a different set of laws obtaining at a different time or place. We observe nothing of the sort, however. On the contrary, the unity of the world, the fact that it exhibits a uniform structure, that it is a single cosmos, strongly suggests some sort of unity in its cause—that there is either a single designer, or several designers acting cooperatively, perhaps under the direction of one of their number.

This evidence does not force us to conclude that there is only one designer, and the ablest proponents of the argument have recognized this. Thus, William Paley asserts that the argument proves only “a unity of counsel” or (if there are subordinate agents) “a presiding” or “controlling will” (Paley 52). Nevertheless, in the absence of compelling reasons for postulating the existence of two or more cooperating designers, considerations of simplicity suggest that we ought to posit only one designer. It isn't clear that there are any. Some have thought that the existence of evil and apparent disorder is best explained by postulating conflicts between two or more opposed powers. Whether this is true or not, evil and apparent disorder provides no reason for preferring the hypothesis of several cooperating designers to the hypothesis of a single designer. That is, having once decided that natural good and natural evil are consequences of the operation of a single system of laws, and that their cause must therefore be unitary, the existence of evil and apparent disorder is to longer relevant to the question of monotheism (although it may be relevant to the question of the goodness of the cause).

A posteriori arguments of this type can't be used to show that there can be only one god, however—that monotheism is conceptually required by the theist's concept of divinity. A more powerful argument from God's sovereignty remedies this deficiency.

4.2 An Argument from God's “Total Causality”

John Duns Scotus offers several proofs of God's unicity in his Ordinatio. Scotus's fourth proof is based on the theistic intuition that God is the complete or total cause of everything else. His argument is roughly this:

  1. Necessarily, if anything is a god, its creative volition is the necessary and sufficient causal condition of every other concrete object.

Suppose, then, that

  1. Contingent beings exist and there are two gods.

It follows that

  1. Each is the necessary and sufficient causal condition of the set of contingent beings. (From 1 and 2.)

Therefore,

  1. The first is a sufficient causal condition of the set of contingent beings. (From 3.)

Hence,

  1. The second is not a necessary causal condition of the set of contingent beings. (From 4.)

Again,

  1. The first is a necessary causal condition of the set of contingent beings. (From 3.)

So

  1. The second is not a sufficient causal condition of the existence of the set of contingent beings. (From 6.)

Therefore,

  1. The second is neither a necessary nor a sufficient causal condition of the set of contingent beings. (From 5 and 7.)

A similar argument will show that

  1. The first is neither a necessary nor a sufficient causal condition of the existence of the set of contingent beings.

It follows that

  1. Neither god is either a necessary or a sufficient condition of the existence of the set of contingent beings. (From 8 and 9.)

Hence,

  1. If contingent beings existed and there were two gods, each would be a necessary and sufficient causal condition of the existence of the set of contingent beings and neither would be a necessary and sufficient causal condition of the existence of the set of contingent beings. (From 2 through 10.)

But since

  1. The consequent of 11 is impossible,
  1. Its antecedent is impossible. (From 11 and 12. If p entails q, and q is impossible, then p is impossible.)

Thus,

  1. It is impossible that contingent beings exist and there are two gods. (From 13.)

Therefore,

  1. If contingent beings exist, there cannot be two gods. (From 14.) (Scotus, 87)

Scotus's argument is firmly rooted in the theistic intuition that God's creative volition is the necessary and sufficient causal condition of everything that exists outside him. But as it stands it suffers from two weaknesses.

First, the argument doesn't show that God is necessarily unique but only that if contingent beings exist, only one God exists. The second, and more serious, difficulty arises from the fact that there are at least two relevant senses of “sufficient causal condition.”

Striking a match is a causally sufficient condition of the match's ignition in a standard sense since, under normal conditions, if one strikes the match, it will ignite. Many other conditions are causally necessary for this event to occur, however—the presence of oxygen, the match's not being wet, and the like. But in a stronger sense, x is a causally sufficient condition of y if and only if given x alone, y exists or occurs. And in that sense, striking the match is not causally sufficient for the match's ignition since other conditions are needed as well.

The problem with Scotus's argument, then, is this. The inferences from 4 to 5, and from 6 to 7, are valid only upon the assumption that if a cause is sufficient to produce an effect no other cause is a necessary condition of that effect. But this is true only if a causally sufficient condition is such that it alone suffices to produce its effect, that is, if it is causally sufficient in the strong sense. If “causally sufficient condition” is taken in the strong sense, however, there are reasons to believe that the argument's first premise is false. Suppose, for example, that Abel would exist if and only if Adam and Eve were to freely copulate, and Adam and Eve would freely copulate if and only if God were to create them. By creating Adam and Eve, God brings about Abel's existence. Furthermore, given the truth of the relevant subjunctive conditionals, there is a clear sense in which God's doing so is not only a necessary but also a sufficient causal condition of Abel's existence. For if God creates Adam and Eve, Adam and Eve will beget Abel. It isn't sufficient in the strong sense, however, because God's creating Adam and Eve won't, all by itself, ensure Abel's existence. For that to occur, Adam and Eve's free decision to copulate is also needed. Theistic intuitions clearly support the claim that it is necessarily true that God's creative volitions are a causally sufficient condition of the existence of every other concrete object in at least a weak sense. It is less clear that they support the claim that it is necessarily true that God's creative volitions are a causally sufficient condition of the existence of every other concrete object in the strong sense. (Theists with robust views of human freedom, for example, will deny that they are.)

The problem, in short is this. In order to be valid, “sufficient causal condition” must be used in the same sense throughout the argument. If “causally sufficient condition” is taken in the weak sense, however, then the inferences from 4 to 5, and from 6 to 7, are illegitimate. Yet if “casually sufficient condition” is taken in the strong sense, there are reasons to believe that its first premise is false. In either case, the argument is unsound.

Both defects can be remedied, though. Even theists with robust views of human freedom would presumably endorse

1*. Necessarily, if any x is God, then for every concrete object distinct from x, the activity of x is a causally necessary condition for its existence, and if there are in fact one or more contingent beings distinct from x, then the activity of x is causally sufficient (in the strong sense) for the existence of at least one of them.

(1*) is sufficient to yield our conclusion. For if the first god is a causally necessary condition of the existence of every other concrete object, then the second god is not a causally sufficient condition (in the strong sense) of the existence of any contingent being. Similarly, if the first god is a causally sufficient condition (in the strong sense) of the existence of at least one contingent being, then the second god is not a necessary condition of the existence of at least one concrete object that is distinct from itself. And, of course, similar conclusions are true of the second god.

Moreover, if God is a necessary being as many theists believe (that is, if God exists and is God in every possible world), then the argument's first defect can be remedied as well, since the mere possibility of the existence of contingent beings will be sufficient to establish God's necessary unicity. For consider the following argument:

1*. Necessarily, if any x is God, then for every concrete object distinct from x, the activity of x is a causally necessary condition for its existence, and if there are in fact one or more contingent beings distinct from x, then the activity of x is causally sufficient (in the strong sense) for the existence of at least one of them.

Suppose, then, that

  1. There are two gods and contingent beings are possible.

It follows that

  1. There is a possible world, w, in which contingent beings exist (from 16), and that, because each god is necessary,
  1. Both gods exist in w. (From 16.)

Hence,

  1. Each god is a necessary causal condition of the existence of each contingent being in w, and each god is the sufficient causal condition (in the strong sense) of the existence of at least one contingent being in w. (From 1*, 17, and 18.)

But,

  1. It is impossible that each god is a necessary causal condition of the existence of each contingent being in w, and each god is the sufficient causal condition (in the strong sense) of at least one contingent being in w. (For, as we have seen, if one god is a necessary causal condition of the existence of each contingent being in w, the other is not the sufficient causal condition [in the strong sense] of any of them.)

Hence,

  1. It is impossible that there are two gods and contingent beings are possible, that is, it is necessarily true that if contingent beings are possible, it is false that there are two gods. (From 1* through 20. If a proposition [e.g., 16] together with one or more necessary truths [e.g., 1*] entails another [e.g., 19], and the second is impossible, the first is impossible.)

But,

  1. It is logically possible that contingent beings exist. (For they do exist.)

Hence,

  1. It is necessarily true that it is logically possible that contingent beings exist. (From 22. What is possible is necessarily possible.)

Therefore,

  1. It is necessarily false that there are two gods. (From 21, 23, and the principle that if one proposition entails another and the first is necessarily true, then the second is necessarily true.)

5. An Argument from Omnipotence

Al-Ghazali argues that there can't be two gods, for “were there two gods and one of them resolved on a course of action, the second would be either obliged to aid him and [sic] thereby demonstrating that he was a subordinate being and not an all-powerful god, or would be able to oppose and resist thereby demonstrating that he was the all-powerful and the first weak and deficient, not an all-powerful god” (Ghazali, 40). Ghazali's intuition is sound but his argument can be more carefully formulated as follows:

  1. Necessarily, it is possible for the wills of distinct persons to conflict. (The possibility of conflict seems included in the concept of a fully distinct person.)

Therefore,

  1. Necessarily, if there are two distinct, essentially omnipotent persons, their wills can conflict. (From 1. Something has a property like omnipotence essentially if and only if it has that property in every logically possible world in which it exists.)
  1. It is necessarily false that the wills of two omnipotent persons conflict.

Therefore,

  1. It is necessarily false that the wills of two essentially omnipotent persons can conflict. (From 3. If there is a possible world in which their wills can conflict, then, necessarily, there is a possible world in which both are omnipotent and their wills do conflict.)

Therefore,

  1. It is impossible for there to be two distinct, essentially omnipotent, persons. (From 2 and 4.)

It follows that if, as most theists believe,

  1. It is necessarily true that omnipotence is an essential attribute of God,

then

  1. It is impossible for there to be two gods. (From 5 and 6.)

Premise 3 is proved in this way:

  1. Necessarily, if the will of an omnipotent person conflicts with another person's will, the latter's will is thwarted by the former's (since, if it were not, the omnipotent person would not be omnipotent.)
  2. Necessarily, if a person's will is thwarted by another's will, then that person is not omnipotent.

Therefore,

  1. Necessarily, if there were two omnipotent persons and their wills conflicted, then (since each of their wills would be thwarted) neither would be omnipotent. (From 8 and 9.)
  2. It is impossible for there to be two omnipotent persons neither of whom are omnipotent.

Therefore,

  1. It is impossible for the wills of two omnipotent persons to conflict. (From 10 and 11.)

Hence,

  1. It is necessarily false that the wills of two omnipotent persons conflict. (From 12.)

Four of the argument's five premises (namely, 6, 8, 9, and 11) are fairly noncontroversial. Premise 1 has been doubted, however. Thomas V. Morris has suggested that, for persons to be distinct, all that is needed is the possibility that their wills differ. Suppose for example, that it is impossible for x to will A and for y to will not-A (and vice versa) but that it is possible for x to will A and for y to neither will A nor will not-A (and vice versa). Their wills could thus differ although they could not conflict.

Is this sufficient to ensure distinctness of persons, though? It is not clear that it is. If I somehow cannot will anything that is opposed to what some other person wills, my selfhood or identity as a separate person appears endangered. And if the impossibility is not merely contingent but logical or metaphysical, the threat to my independent identity seems even greater.

But this aside, it is doubtful that the wills of two essentially omnipotent beings, at least, could differ in the manner Morris suggests. For suppose they can. Then, where x and y are both essentially omnipotent, and s is some contingent state of affairs that is within the range of omnipotence, x can make y impotent with respect to s (and vice versa). For even though it is intrinsically possible for y to determine whether or not s will occur, x, merely by willing s, makes it impossible for y to will not-s. That is, x, as it were, takes power over s out of y's hands. Whether or not s occurs, in other words, is no longer up to y. Yet surely, if y is essentially omnipotent, and s is within the range of its power (as it must be if y is essentially omnipotent), no contingent circumstance of this sort could make it impotent with respect to s. (For a similar argument see Scotus's seventh proof of unicity [Scotus, 90–1].)

Premise 1 thus emerges unscathed. Since the proof is valid and its other premises appear unexceptionable, the argument from omnipotence seems sound.

6. An Argument from the Demand for Total Devotion

According to William of Ockham, “God” can be understood in two ways. By “God” one may mean “something more noble and more perfect than anything else besides him,” or one might mean “that than which nothing is more noble and more perfect.” If God is understood in the first way, then there can be only one god. For consider the following argument:

  1. Necessarily, if any being is God, it is more perfect than any other being.

Therefore,

  1. Necessarily, if there were two distinct beings and each were God, the first would be more perfect than the second and the second would be more perfect than the first. (From 1.)

But

  1. It is impossible for there to be two beings each of which is more perfect than the other.

Therefore,

  1. It is impossible for there to be two gods. (From 2 and 3.)

But if God is understood in the second way, Ockham thinks that it cannot be shown that there is only one god. For it isn't clear that there couldn't be two equally perfect beings, each of whom was such that no actual or possible being surpassed it (Ockham, 139–40).

Even if Ockham is right about this, it does seem impossible that there be two gods. For it appears to be a conceptual truth that God is unsurpassable. If he is, then, if there were two gods each would be unsurpassable. But there can't be two unsurpassable beings each of which is God. For part of what it means to call something “God” is that it is an appropriate object of total devotion and unconditional commitment. If there were two unsurpassable beings, however, our devotion and commitment should be divided between them. (As Scotus says, if there were two infinite goods, “an orderly will … could not be perfectly satisfied with but one infinite good” [Scotus, 87].) Since they are equally perfect, it would be inappropriate to be totally devoted or unconditionally committed to either one of them. But if it would, then neither of them would be God. So if it is a conceptual truth that God is unsurpassable, he must be unique.

An appeal to unsurpassability isn't really necessary, however, since God's uniqueness follows directly from his being an appropriate object of total devotion and unconditional commitment. For consider the following argument:

  1. God is, by definition, a being worthy of worship (that is, of total devotion and unconditional commitment).

Therefore,

  1. Necessarily, if there were two gods, there would be two beings each of which was worthy of worship. (From 5.)

If so, then

  1. Necessarily, if there were two gods both of them ought to be worshiped. (From 6. Cf. the inference from “x is worthy of admiration” to “everyone ought to admire x.”)

But

  1. Necessarily, if we ought to worship both of these gods, then we can worship both of them. (“Ought” implies “can;” we are only obligated to do what we are able to do.)

Hence,

  1. Necessarily, if there were two gods, we could be totally devoted and unconditionally committed to the first, and totally devoted and unconditionally committed to the second. (From 7, 8, and the definition of “worship.”)

However,

  1. It is impossible to be totally devoted and unconditionally committed to each of two distinct beings.

Therefore,

  1. It is impossible for there to be two gods. (From 9 and 10.)

There are at least two possible problems with this argument, however. First, the inference from 6 to 7 might seem suspect. For if “ought” does imply “can,” and it is impossible to be totally devoted and unconditionally committed to each of two distinct beings (as 10 says), then we aren't under any obligation to do so. The truth of 10 implies the falsity of 7.

Matters aren't so simple, however. “I ought to return John's gun” (since I promised to return it) and “I ought not to return John's gun” (since he is no longer in his right mind) do not entail “I can both return the gun and not return it.” So why think that if I ought to worship the first god and I ought to worship the second, I ought to worship both of them? Because the two cases are dissimilar. In the first, neither obligation is indefeasible; each can, in principle, be trumped by other stronger obligations. While I indeed have prima facie obligations both to return the gun and to not return it, the only actual obligation I have in the circumstances that were described is the obligation to not return the gun. Because “I ought to return the gun and I ought not to return the gun (that is, I have a prima facie obligation to return it and a prima facie obligation to not return it)” does not entail “I have an actual obligation both to return and to not return the gun,” there is no reason to infer that I can do both. By contrast, both of the obligations referred to in 7 are indefeasible. (Their indefeasibility appears to be part of the very concept of divine worship; part of what it means to be God is to be such that no other obligation can take precedence over our obligation to be totally devoted and unconditionally committed to him.) Both are therefore actual, and not merely prima facie, obligations. Now even though one can have a prima facie obligation to do something one is unable to do, it is doubtful that one can have an actual obligation to do something one can't do. That I am obligated to worship both deities thus seems to entail that I can worship both deities. The inference from 6 to 7 seems sound.

Another possible problem concerns the truth of 10. Thus, Thomas Morris has objected that one could be unconditionally committed to each of two distinct beings provided that their wills were necessarily harmonious. For if their wills were necessarily harmonious, they could not require of us conflicting acts. This objection should be discounted, however, because the wills of distinct persons are necessarily opposable. (See discussion in section 5 above.)

It is perhaps less obvious why devotion can't be divided between two beings. But the best answer is probably this. The sort of devotion appropriate to God involves centering one's life in God, and while one can center one's life in x-and-y, one can't center one's life in x and also center one's life in y. The devotion that God requires appears, then, to be inherently indivisible.

In sum, neither of the two problems presents an unsurmountable difficulty for the argument from total devotion.

7. Are the “Monotheistic Traditions” Really Monotheistic?

No discussion of monotheism would be complete which failed to note that some major theistic traditions contain strands which, on their face, seem at odds with their commitment to monotheism.

7.1 The Kabbalah and Monotheism

Consider the Kabbalah, for example. The Zohar (after 1275) identifies the first principle with the En Sof or infinite (unlimited). The En Sof is “the hidden God” or “innermost being” of God, without attributes or qualities. Because it lacks attributes, the En Sof is incomprehensible and thus, in a strict sense, non-personal (although it reveals itself as personal).

The hidden God manifests itself in the sefirot, however. These are conceived as God's attributes, or as divine spheres or realms, or as stages (in his self-manifestation). They are also regarded as names which God gives himself, and together form his “one great name,” or as God's faces or garments, or as beams of his light. They are also sometimes pictured as the branches of a tree whose root is the En Sof, “the hidden root of roots.” (Alternatively, the En Sof is depicted as the sap that circulates through, and maintains, the branches.) These branches are thought of as extending through the whole of the created order; created things exist solely in virtue of the fact that “the power of the sefirot lives and acts in them.”

There are ten sefirot or stages in God's self-manifestation. A brief discussion of the first three will be sufficient for our purposes. The first is, perhaps surprisingly, characterized as Nothing or the Abyss. (We are said to catch glimpses of it when things alter their form or disappear; when things change or are destroyed, Nothingness or the Abyss becomes “visible” for “a fleeting … moment.”) This mystical no-thing-ness is God's Supreme Crown.

Both Wisdom and Intelligence emerge or emanate from the Crown. Wisdom is the “ideal thought” of everything that will emerge in creation. The idea exists at this stage in a confused and undifferentiated form, however. Wisdom is sometimes pictured as a fountain which springs out of Nothingness (the Crown) and from which the other sefirot will flow, sometimes as a seed or germ from which everything develops, and sometimes as a point. (The idea behind the last image is that just as the movement of a point generates a line, and the movement of a line generates a surface, so the “movement” of Wisdom [together with the “movement” of Intelligence] generates the other sefirot.) Intelligence is the principle of “individuation and differentiation,” and “unfolds” what is “folded up” in wisdom. (If wisdom was the “confused” or undifferentiated thought of creation, Intelligence is that thought become clear and distinct. [Scholem 1946, 207–09, 213–20; Epstein, 236].)

The doctrine of the divine emanations or sefirot might already be thought to compromise God's unity. But matters become still more problematic in an influential treatise that was composed in Provence around 1230, and (falsely) ascribed to Hai Goan.

According to its pseudonymous author, “three hidden lights” are found in the “root of roots” that exists “above the first sefirah”—“the inner primordial light,” the “transparent (or: ultra clear) light,” and “the clear light.” These “lights” are one thing and one substance that “are found without separation and without union, in the most intimate relation with the root of roots,” or (more strongly) are the very “name and substance of the root of all roots.” The three lights are the immediate source of “the three supreme sefirot of ‘Pure Thought,’ ‘Knowledge,’ and ‘Intellect,’” but whereas the sefirot “themselves are clearly created [or emanated?] … the triad of the lights illuminate one another, uncreated [and unemanated?], without beginning, in the hidden root.” According to the Pseudo-Hai, then, a triad exists in the hidden Godhead itself.

Later Kabbalists were aware “of a possible connection between these ideas and the Christian Trinity,” but explained the latter as a corruption of the former. Jesus and his disciples were themselves “real Kabbalists, ‘only their Kabbalah was full of mistakes’”—their doctrine of the Trinity was the result of their misinterpretation of the doctrine of the three lights! Whatever one thinks of this, there are striking similarities between the two doctrines. But there are also important differences. The lights “are neither persons nor ‘hypostases’ in God,” for example, and there is no mention of “specific relationships” between them (such as begetting and being begotten, or “spiration” and “procession”) (Scholem 1987, 349–54).

The suspicion of Christian influence was by no means restricted to the Pseudo-Hai's doctrine of the three lights, however, for “philosophical opponents of the Kabbalah” had already suggested “that the doctrine of the ten sefirot was [itself] of Christian origin” (Scholem 1987, 354). Nor was this criticism easily laid to rest. Thus, Isaac bar Sheshet Parfat (1326–1408) says (in Gellman 2005 [in Other Internet Resources]) that he had “heard a philosopher speak in a defaming manner of the Kabbalists,” saying “‘The Gentiles [Christians] are believers in a trinity, and the kabbalists are believers in a ten-ity’”.

The general problem, of course, was that, on its surface at least, the doctrine of the sefirot seems incompatible with God's unity. Rabbi Azriel of Gerona (d. 1238) addressed this issue in his “Explanation of the Ten Sefirot.” In the first place, the higher sefirot, at least, have always existed “in potentia in the Eyn Sof before they were actualized” (Azriel, 93, my emphasis) Moreover, because “the receptor [the sefirah] … unite[s] with the bestower [ultimately, the En Sof] into one power, … the two are really one.” So the answer to our difficulty is apparently this. The emanation of the sefirot is compatible with God's unity because (unlike created beings) the sefirot are contained within the En Sof itself in a potential or undifferentiated form, and because (since their power is the power of the En Sof), there is ultimately only one power. Thus, “no emanation is radiated forth except to proclaim the unity within the Eyn Sof” (Azriel, 93–95). Or as Rabbi Moshe Haim Luzzato claimed (in Gellman 2005 [in Other Internet Resources]) in the first half of the eighteenth century, “the sefirot are not separate from the one who emanates, for they are like the flame connected to the coal, and all is one, a unity that has within it no division.” Whether considerations like these fully resolve the problem is a moot question.

Still, the Kabbalah is only one strand within Judaism. By contrast, the doctrine of the Trinity, and of the divinity of both Vishnu and Lakshmi, are firmly rooted at the very heart of Christianity and Shri Vaishnavism, respectively. Perhaps as a result, these traditions have devoted much more thought to reconciling monotheism with elements which, on their face, seem at odds with it.

7.2 Christianity and the Trinity

The question of the Trinity's compatibility with monotheism is best approached by seeing how that doctrine fares in the light of the three strongest arguments for God's uniqueness—the arguments from God's sovereignty, from his omnipotence, and from the demand for total devotion.

The crucial premise of the first argument is that God's will is the causally necessary and sufficient condition of the existence of contingent beings. (Or, alternatively, a causally necessary condition of the existence of every contingent being and the causally sufficient condition [in the strong sense] of the existence of at least one of them. For the sake of brevity we will focus exclusively on the simpler case, however.) The argument from sovereignty can be deployed against the Trinity only if the relevant property is regarded as an attribute of each member of the Trinity rather than of the Trinity as a whole (that is, of the Trinity considered as a single concrete entity). The Western or Augustinian Tradition does not. On the contrary, the divine intellect and will are aspects of a single divine essence that subsists in three “persons” or “hypostases.” It is thus false that there are three distinct creative wills, and therefore false that there are three distinct creative wills each of which is a necessary and sufficient causal condition of the existence of contingent beings.

Another view, though, is implicit in the position of many second and third century church fathers, some western Christian Platonists, and the Eastern Orthodox Church as a whole.[1] The Trinitarian views of Ralph Cudworth (1617–88) are fairly typical of this position. There are three hypostases or “persons.” Each has its own individual essence. But all share a common specific or generic essence (namely, divinity), so that each member of the Trinity is eternal, necessarily existent, omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, and the like.

“There is not a trinity of [independent] principles,” however, “but … only one principle or fountain of Godhead [the Father] … from which the other[s, namely, the Son and the Holy Spirit] are derived.” They together constitute one entity (“one entire divinity”), as “the root, and the stock and the branches” constitute “one tree,” or as the sun, the light, and its splendor are “undivided” and form one thing. Indeed, there is so “near a conjunction” between the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit as can be found nowhere else in nature. The relations between them are necessary and eternal; they are “indivisibly and inseparably united.” Moreover, each person inheres or indwells in the others, and they are all “ad extra one and the same God, jointly concurring in all the same actions,” they being all “one creator” (Cudworth, 598, 616–20).

On the surface, the argument from sovereignty appears to preclude the “Platonic Trinity.” For, on Cudworth's view, the wills of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are necessarily concurrent. For example, “The Father wills that s” entails “The Son wills that s,” and vice versa. Because the creative volition of any member of the Trinity entails that the other two will the same thing, if any one of them wills the existence of a contingent being, then they all will it. So if their concurrent willings are a causally sufficient condition of the existence of contingent beings, then the Father's (or the Son's or the Holy Spirit's) willing the existence of contingent beings is itself a causally sufficient condition of the existence of contingent beings (since it entails the concurrent willing). And, of course, the creative volition of any member of the Trinity is also a necessary causal condition of the existence of contingent beings. It would seem, then, that there are three creative volitions, each of which is a causally sufficient and causally necessary condition of the existence of contingent beings. There are thus three sovereign creative wills, and this appears to contradict the monotheistic claim that sovereignty is necessarily unique.

Appearances may be deceiving, however. For even though the Father's (or the Son's or the Holy Spirit's) willing that s entails that s, the Father's volition isn't, by itself, sufficient for s's occurrence. For s won't occur unless the Son and Holy Spirit also will it. It is therefore not causally sufficient for the occurrence of s in the strong sense of sufficient condition employed in the argument from sovereignty, namely, that x is a causally sufficient condition of y in the strong sense if and only if, given x alone, y exists or occurs. In that sense, there is only one causally sufficient condition of the existence of contingent beings, and that is the joint operation of the necessarily concurrent wills of the Father, Son, and Holy Spirit. So there is, as Cudworth says, only “one creator.” It thus isn't clear that either the premises or conclusion of the argument from divine sovereignty precludes the existence of the Platonic Trinity.

Nor does the omnipotence proof rule out the existence of the Trinity, since the hypostases are not distinct persons in the nontechnical sense of “person” employed in that` argument. They are not distinct persons in the ordinary sense of “person” because their wills can't conflict. Either there is only one will (which is part of the one divine essence) or the (distinct) wills of the three hypostases necessarily concur.

Finally, the third argument precludes the existence of the Trinity only if each member is, in abstraction from the others, an appropriate object of total devotion and unconditional commitment. In spite of the aberrations of some Christians, it is reasonably clear that the object of the Christian's ultimate concern is the Trinity as a whole, and not one or more of its members considered in isolation. Christian attitudes towards the Father, for example, are inseparable from Christian attitudes towards the Son. Christ is worshiped as the Son of the Father, for instance, and the Father is worshiped as the one who fully reveals himself in Christ. It follows that Christians are only committed to regarding the triad as the appropriate object of theistic attitudes, and that the argument from the appropriateness of these attitudes therefore cannot be used to show that a trinity of divine “persons” is impossible.

7.3 The Shri Vaishnavas and Monotheism

The Shri Vaishnavas provide our third example of a monotheism that is “tainted” by elements apparently in tension with it. The Shri Vaishnavas identify Vishnu with the Brahman. According to Ramanuja (1017?–1137?), Brahman is personal. Indeed, he is the supreme person (paratman), creator and Lord, who leads souls to salvation. Far from having no (positive) attributes, as some Vedantins maintain, Brahman is the sum of all “noble attributes”—omniscient, omnipotent, omnipresent, and all-merciful. He is also advitya (without rival). Shiva, Brahma, and the other gods of the Hindu pantheon are Brahman's agents or servants, created and commissioned by him. (They have the same status, in short, that angels have in the western religious traditions.)

“The entire complex of intelligent and non-intelligent beings (souls and matter [prakriti]) … is real and constitutes the form, i. e., the body of the highest Brahman” (Ramanuja 1962, 88). The space-time world with all it contains is thus related to God as our bodies are related to our souls. A soul-body relationship, according to Ramanuja, is a relationship between (1) support and supported, (2) controller and controlled, and (3) “principal” and “accessory.” (Images of the last relationship are provided by the relations between a master and his “born servant” or an owner and his disposable property.) A body is “entirely subordinate” to its soul (Ramanuja 1962, 424), having no independent reality or value. If the space-time world is Vishnu's body, then, it is absolutely dependent on Vishnu, and has little or no value in comparison with him.

The Shri Vaishnava picture of reality is thus clearly monotheistic. Problems are created, however, by the fact that the scriptures on which the Shri Vaishnavas draw closely associate Vishnu with his consort Lakshmi. In the Pancaratras, for example, “the five functions associated with God's oversight of the world,” namely, creation, preservation, destruction, and “obscuration” and “favoring” (roughly, withholding and bestowing grace) are sometimes ascribed to Vishnu and sometimes to Lakshmi (Kumar, 23f). Again, while Ramanuja and his great predecessor, Yamuna, have little or nothing to say about Lakshmi in their philosophical writings, she plays a significant role in their devotional works, where she is described as Mediatrix between Vishnu and his devotees. Yamuna describes her as inseparable from the Lord, for example, and insists that while non-intelligent and intelligent beings (including the gods such as Brahma and Shiva) are “only a small part of God's reality, … the divine consort” is “the equal match of the Lord, … sharing the same auspicious qualities” (Kumar, 61). Ramanuja, too, claims that Vishnu and Lakshmi are “eternally associated,” and asserts that both possess “‘the multitude … of unlimited, unsurpassed, and innumerable auspicious qualities’” (Kumar 66–7). All of this is regarded as compatible with the oneness or nonduality of “the ultimate reality,” however. Thus, Yamuna insists that Brahman (Vishnu) is the one without a second who “‘neither has, nor had, nor will have an equal or superior capable of being counted as a second’” (Kumar, 61). Nevertheless, the precise relationship between Vishnu and Lakshmi was left undefined, and it remained for later generations to work out fuller accounts which both respected Lakshmi's importance to ritual and devotion and at the same time protected monotheism. There were two major resolutions.

The first is represented by Lokacarya (1213–1323). For Lokacarya, the divine consort's role is subordinate and, perhaps, ultimately, nonessential. Lakshmi displays the “three essential attributes of a mediator: mercy … , dependence on the Lord, … and non-subservience [to] another [than the Lord].” Her ability to mediate between souls and their Lord is thus ultimately dependent on her relation to Vishnu. In other words, Shri Lakshmi “mediates not as an equal partner of the Lord … but only as his dependent and subordinate.” There is even a suggestion that Vishnu can himself function as a mediator without Lakshmi's assistance. Thus, Lokacarya “points out that in the Mahabharata, Krishna himself becomes the mediator, whereas in the Ramayana, Sita becomes the mediator.” (The relevance of this remark becomes clear when one recalls that both Krishna and Sita's consort, Rama, are avataras or “descents” [very roughly, incarnations] of Vishnu.) (Kumar 102–07) Lokacarya, then, preserves monotheism by more or less downgrading Lakshmi's status.

Venkatanatha (1268–1369) offers a different resolution. He does distinguish “the two [salvific] functions of the Lord and his consort,” the Lord being “depicted as the father who disciplines the sinner,” and Lakshmi as the divine mother who intercedes for him. The distinction between these functions is not absolute, however, for the divine consort merely “bring[s] out the ‘Lord's natural compassion’ so that that compassion becomes the basis for the spiritual rebirth of the offending devotee” (Kumar 120–21). Moreover (and most important for our purposes), there is no real or ontological difference between the divine father and the divine mother. Lakshmi is an inseparable attribute of Vishnu. Since a substance and its inseparable attributes “share in the same essential nature,” and since one can't understand a substance without understanding its “essential and inseparable attribute[s],” the Lord and his divine consort form “a single reality” (Kumar 146–7). Thus “‘whenever Bhagavan [i.e., Vishnu] is referred to, Lakshmi should also be considered as referred to,’” and when one offers oneself to either one is offering oneself to both since the deity to which one offers oneself “‘is single [though] it rests with two’” (Kumar 124). In short, Venkatanatha preserves monotheism by denying that God and his divine consort are ontologically distinct.

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