The Concept of Evil

First published Tue Nov 26, 2013

During the past thirty years, moral, political, and legal philosophers have become increasingly interested in the concept of evil. This interest has been partly motivated by ascriptions of ‘evil’ by laymen, social scientists, journalists, and politicians as they try to understand and respond to various atrocities and horrors of the past eighty years, e.g., the Holocaust, the Rwandan genocide, the 9/11 terrorist attacks, and killing sprees by serial killers such as Jeffery Dahmer. It seems that we cannot capture the moral significance of these actions and their perpetrators by calling them ‘wrong’ or ‘bad’ or even ‘very very wrong’ or ‘very very bad.’ We need the concept of evil.

To avoid confusion, it is important to note that there are at least two concepts of evil: a broad concept and a narrow concept. The broad concept picks out any bad state of affairs, wrongful action, or character flaw. The suffering of a toothache is evil in the broad sense as is a white lie. Evil in the broad sense has been divided into two categories: natural evil and moral evil. Natural evils are bad states of affairs which do not result from the intentions or negligence of moral agents. Hurricanes and toothaches are examples of natural evils. By contrast, moral evils do result from the intentions or negligence of moral agents. Murder and lying are examples of moral evils.

Evil in the broad sense, which includes all natural and moral evils, tends to be the sort of evil referenced in theological contexts, such as in discussions of the problem of evil. The problem of evil is the problem of accounting for evil in a world created by an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good God. It seems that if the creator has these attributes, there would be no evil in the world. But there is evil in the world. Thus, there is reason to believe that an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good creator does not exist.

In contrast to the broad concept of evil, the narrow concept of evil picks out only the most morally despicable sorts of actions, characters, events, etc. As Marcus Singer puts it “‘evil’ [in this sense] … is the worst possible term of opprobrium imaginable” (Singer 2004, 185). Since the narrow concept of evil involves moral condemnation, it is appropriately ascribed only to moral agents and their actions. For example, if only human beings are moral agents, then only human beings can perform evil actions. Evil in this narrower sense is more often meant when the term ‘evil’ is used in contemporary moral, political, and legal contexts. This entry will focus on evil in this narrower sense. The entry will not discuss evil in the broad sense or the problem of evil to any significant degree (these topics will be discussed briefly only in section 2).

The main issues discussed by philosophers on the topic of evil have been: Should we use the term ‘evil’ in our moral, political, and legal discourse and thinking, or is evil an out-dated or empty concept which should be abandoned? What is the relationship between evil and other moral concepts such as badness and wrongdoing? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for evil action? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for evil character? What is the relationship between evil action and evil character? What types of evil actions and characters can exist? What is the proper analysis of derivative concepts such as evil institution?

This entry gives an overview of answers to these questions found in the literature.

1. Evil-Skepticism Versus Evil-Revivalism

Evil-skeptics believe we should abandon the concept of evil. On this view we can more accurately, and less perniciously, understand and describe morally despicable actions, characters, and events using more pedestrian moral concepts such as badness and wrongdoing. By contrast, evil-revivalists believe that the concept of evil has a place in our moral and political thinking and discourse. On this view, the concept of evil should be revived, not abandoned (see Russell 2006 and 2007).

Someone who believes that we should do away with moral discourse altogether could be called a moral-skeptic or a moral nihilist. Evil-skepticism is not as broad. Evil-skeptics believe the concept of evil is particularly problematic and should be abandoned while other moral concepts, such as right, wrong, good, and bad, are worth keeping.

Evil-skeptics give three main reasons to abandon the concept of evil: (1) the concept of evil involves unwarranted metaphysical commitments to dark spirits, the supernatural, or the devil; (2) the concept of evil is useless because it lacks explanatory power; and (3) the concept of evil can be harmful or dangerous when used in moral, political, and legal contexts, and so, it should not be used in those contexts, if at all.

1.1 Evil and the Supernatural

The concept of evil is often associated with supernatural powers or creatures, especially in fictional and religious contexts. The monsters of fictions, such as vampires, witches, and werewolves, are thought to be paradigms of evil. These creatures possess powers and abilities that defy scientific explanation, and perhaps human understanding. Many popular horror films also depict evil as the result of dark forces or Satanic possession. We find similar references to supernatural forces and creatures when the term ‘evil’ is used in religious contexts. Some evil-skeptics believe that the concept of evil necessarily makes reference to supernatural spirits, dark forces, or creatures. According to these theorists if we do not believe that these spirits, forces, or monsters exist, we should only use the term ‘evil’ in fictional contexts, if at all (See Clendinnen 1999, 79–113; Cole 2006).

Evil-revivalists respond that the concept of evil need not make reference to supernatural spirits, dark forces, or monsters. There is a secular moral concept of evil which is distinct from fictional or religious conceptions, and it is this secular conception of evil that is meant most often when the term ‘evil’ is used in moral and political contexts (see Garrard 2002, 325; Card 2010, 10–17). Evil-revivalists seek to offer plausible analyses of evil which do not make reference to supernatural spirits, dark forces, or monsters, but which fully capture secular uses of the term ‘evil.’ Evil-revivalists believe that if they are able to offer plausible analyses of evil which do not make reference to the supernatural, they will have successfully defended the concept of evil from the objection that ascriptions of evil necessarily imply unwarranted metaphysical commitments (see sections 3 and 4 for secular accounts of evil).

1.2 Evil and Explanatory Power

Some evil-skeptics argue that we should abandon the concept of evil because it lacks explanatory power and therefore is a useless concept (see, e.g., Clendinnen 1999, 79–113; Cole 2006). The concept of evil would have explanatory power, or be explanatorily useful, if it were able to explain why certain actions were performed or why these actions were performed by certain agents rather than by others. Evil-skeptics such as Inga Clendinnen and Philip Cole argue that the concept of evil cannot provide explanations of this sort and thus should be abandoned.

According to Clendinnen the concept of evil cannot explain the performance of actions because it is an essentially dismissive classification. To say that a person, or an action, is evil is just to say that that person, or action, defies explanation or is incomprehensible (see Clendinnen 1999, 81; see also, Pocock 1985). (Joel Feinberg (2003) also believes that evil actions are essentially incomprehensible. But he does not think that we should abandon the concept of evil for this reason.)

Similarly, Cole believes that the concept of evil is often employed when we lack a complete explanation for why an action was performed. For instance, we might wonder why two ten-year-old boys, Robert Thompson and Jon Venerables, tortured and murdered two-year-old James Bulger while other ten-year-old boys with similar genetic characteristics and upbringings cause little harm? Cole believes that the concept of evil is employed in these cases to provide the missing explanation. However, Cole argues that the concept of evil does not provide a genuine explanation in these cases because to say that an action is evil is just to say either that the action resulted from supernatural forces or that the action is a mystery. To say that an event resulted from supernatural forces is not to give a genuine explanation of the event because these forces do not exist. To say that an event is a mystery is not to give a genuine explanation of an event, but rather, it is to suggest that the event cannot be explained (at least with the information currently available) (2006, 6–9).

Evil-revivalists have offered several responses to the objection that the concept of evil should be abandoned because it is explanatorily useless. One common response is that the concept of evil might be worth keeping for descriptive or prescriptive purposes even if it isn't explanatorily useful (Garrard 2002, 323–325; Russell 2009, 268–269).

Another common response is to argue that evil is no less explanatorily useful than other moral concepts such as good, bad, right, and wrong (Garrard 2002, 322–326; Russell 2009, 268–269). Thus, if we should abandon the concept of evil we should abandon these other moral concepts as well.

Eve Garrard and Luke Russell also point out that even if the concept of evil cannot provide a complete explanation for the performance of an action, it can provide a partial explanation. For instance, Garrard argues that evil actions result from a particular kind of motivation. Call this an E motivation. Thus, to say that an action is evil is to say that it has resulted from an E motivation. This provides a partial explanation for why the action was performed.

1.3 The Dangers of ‘Evil’

Some evil-skeptics believe that we should abandon the concept of evil because it is too harmful or dangerous to use (See e.g., Cole 2006, 21; Held 2001, 107). No one can deny that the term ‘evil’ can be harmful or dangerous when it is misapplied, used perniciously, or used without sensitivity to complicated historical or political contexts. For instance, it is likely that by calling terrorists ‘evildoers’ and Iraq, Iran, and North Korea ‘the axis of evil’ former US President George W. Bush made it more likely that suspected terrorists would be mistreated and less likely that there would be peaceful relations between the peoples and governments of Iraq, Iran, and North Korea and the peoples and government of the United States.

But should we abandon the concept of evil because it leads to harm when it is misapplied or abused? Claudia Card argues that “If the likelihood of the ideological abuse of a concept were sufficient reason to abandon the concept, we should probably abandon all normative concepts, certainly ‘right’ and ‘wrong.’” (Card 2010, 15) And yet evil-skeptics do not believe that we should abandon all normative concepts. So why do they believe that we should abandon the concept of evil?

An evil-skeptic might reply that we should abandon only the concept of evil, and not other normative concepts, because the concept of evil is particularly dangerous or susceptible to abuse. We can discern several reasons why ascriptions of evil might be thought to be more harmful or dangerous than ascriptions of other normative concepts such as badness or wrongdoing. First, since ascriptions of evil are the greatest form of moral condemnation, when the term ‘evil’ is misapplied we subject someone to a particularly harsh judgement undeservedly. Furthermore, it is reasonable to assume that evildoers not only deserve the greatest form of moral condemnation but also the greatest form of punishment. Thus, not only are wrongfully accused evildoers subjected to harsh judgments undeservedly, they may be subjected to harsh punishments undeservedly as well.

Another reason that ascriptions of evil can be particularly harmful or dangerous is that it isn't always clear what people mean when they use the term ‘evil.’ As Eve Garrard puts it “the general obscurity surrounding the term makes some thinkers very reluctant to appeal to the idea of evil”(Garrard 2002, 322). For instance, some people believe that to say that someone performed an evil action implies that that person acted out of malice (see e.g., Kekes 2005), while others believe that evildoing can result from many different sorts of motives, even good motives (see e.g., Card 2002). Given this ambiguity, it might be unclear whether an attribution of evil attributes despicable psychological attributes to an evildoer, and this ambiguity might result in an overly harsh judgment.

Other ambiguities concerning the meaning of the term ‘evil’ may be even more harmful. For instance, on some conceptions of evil, evildoers are possessed, inhuman, incorrigible, or have fixed character traits (See Cole 2006, 1–21; Russell 2006 and 2010; Haybron 2002a and 2002b). These metaphysical and psychological theses about evildoers are controversial. Many who use the term ‘evil’ do not mean to imply that evildoers are possessed, inhuman, incorrigible, or that they have fixed character traits. But others do. If evildoers have these traits, and thus will continue to perform evil actions no matter what we do, the only appropriate response might be to isolate them from society or to have them executed. But if evildoers do not have these fixed dispositions and they are treated as if they do, they will likely be mistreated.

Thus, while most theorists agree that the concept of evil can be harmful or dangerous there is considerable disagreement about what conclusion should be drawn from this fact. Evil-skeptics believe that because the concept of evil is harmful or dangerous we should abandon it in favour of less dangerous concepts such as badness and wrongdoing. Evil-revivalists believe that because the concept of evil is harmful or dangerous more philosophical work needs to be done on it to clear up ambiguities and reduce the likelihood of abuse or misuse. Card and Kekes argue that it is more dangerous to ignore evil than to try to understand it (Card 1996 and 2010; Kekes 1990). For if we do not understand evil we will be ill-equipped to root out its sources, and thus, we will be unable to prevent evils from occurring in the future.

1.3.1 Nietzsche's Attack on Evil

The most celebrated evil-skeptic, nineteenth century German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche, also argues that the concept of evil should be abandoned because it is dangerous. But his reasons for thinking that the concept of evil is dangerous are different from those discussed above. Nietzsche believes that the concept of evil is dangerous because it has a negative effect on human potential and vitality by promoting the weak in spirit and suppressing the strong. In On the Genealogy of Morality: A Polemic, Nietzsche argues that the concept of evil arose from the negative emotions of envy, hatred, and resentment (he uses the French term ressentiment to capture an attitude that combines these elements). He contends that the powerless and weak created the concept of evil to take revenge against their oppressors. Nietzsche believes that the concepts of good and evil contribute to an unhealthy view of life which judges relief from suffering as more valuable than creative self-expression and accomplishment. For this reason Nietzsche believes that we should seek to move beyond judgements of good and evil (Nietzsche 1886 and 1887).

Nietzsche's skeptical attack on the concept of evil has encouraged philosophers to ignore the nature and moral significance of evil and instead focus on the motives people might have for using the term ‘evil’ (Card 2002, 28).

In the Atrocity Paradigm, Claudia Card defends the concept of evil from Nietzsche's skeptical attack. Card rejects Nietzsche's view that judgements of evil indicate a negative life-denying perspective. Instead, she believes that judgements of evil often indicate a healthy recognition that one has been treated unjustly. Card also argues that we have just as much reason to question the motives of people who believe we should abandon the concept of evil as we do to question the motives of people who use the concept. She suggests that people who want to abandon the concept of evil may be overwhelmed by the task of understanding and preventing evil and would rather focus on the less daunting task of questioning the motives of people who use the term (Card 2002, 27–49).

1.4 Arguments in Favor of the Concept of Evil

Some people believe that we should revive the concept of evil because only the concept of evil can capture the moral significance of acts, characters, and events such as sadistic torture, serial killers, Hitler, and the Holocaust. As Daniel Haybron puts it “Prefix your adjectives [such as ‘wrong’ or ‘bad’] with as many ‘very’s as you like; you still fall short. Only ‘evil’, it seems, will do” (Haybron 2002b, 260). According to this line of argument, it is hard to deny that evil exists; and if evil exists, we need a concept to capture this immoral extreme.

A second argument in favour of the concept of evil is that it is only by facing evil, i.e., by becoming clear about its nature and origins, that we can hope to prevent future evils from occurring and live good lives (Kekes 1990, Card 2010).

A third reason to revive the concept of evil is that categorizing actions and practices as evil helps to focus our limited energy and resources. If evils are the worst sorts of moral wrongs, we should prioritize the reduction of evil over the reduction of other wrongs such as unjust inequalities. For instance, Card believes that it is more important to prevent the evils of domestic violence than it is to ensure that women and men are paid equal wages for equal work (Card 2002, 96–117).

A fourth reason to revive the concept of evil is that by categorizing actions and practices as evil we are better able to set limits to legitimate responses to evil. By having a greater understanding of the nature of evil we are better able to guard against responding to evil with further evils (Card 2010, 7–8).

2. The History of Theories of Evil

Prior to World War II there was very little philosophical literature on the concept of evil in the narrow sense. However, philosophers have considered the nature and origins of evil in the broad sense since ancient times. Although this entry is primarily concerned with evil in the narrow sense, it is useful to survey the history of theories of evil in the broad sense since these theories provide the backdrop against which theories of evil in the narrow sense have been developed.

2.1 Dualist and Privation Theories of Evil

The history of theories of evil began with attempts to solve the problem of evil, i.e., attempts to reconcile the existence of evil (in the broad sense) with an all-powerful, all-knowing, all-good God or creator. Philosophers and theologians have recognized that to solve the problem of evil it is important to understand the nature of evil. As the Neoplatonist Plotinus put it “Those inquiring whence Evil enters into beings, or rather into a certain order of beings, would be making the best beginning if they established, first of all, what precisely Evil is” (Plotinus, Enneads, I, 8, 1).

One theory of evil that provides a solution to the problem of evil is Manichaean dualism. According to Manichaean dualism, the universe is the product of an ongoing battle between two coequal and coeternal first principles: God and the Prince of Darkness. From these first principles follow good and evil substances which are in a constant battle for supremacy. The material world constitutes a stage of this cosmic battle where the forces of evil have trapped the forces of goodness in matter. For example, the human body is evil while the human soul is good and must be freed from the body through strict adherence to Manichaean teaching. The Manichaean solution to the problem of evil is that God is neither all-powerful nor the sole creator of the world. God is supremely good and creates only good things, but he or she is powerless to prevent the Prince of Darkness from creating evil. (For more about Manichaeanism see Coyel 2009 and Lieu 1985).

Since its inception, Manichaean dualism has been criticized for providing little empirical support for its extravagant cosmology. A second problem is that, for a theist, it is hard to accept that God is not an all-powerful sole creator. For these reasons influential medieval philosophers such as Saint Augustine, who initially accepted the Manichaean theory of evil, eventually rejected it in favor of the Neoplatonist approach. (See Augustine, Confessions; On the Morals of the Manichaeans; Reply to Manichaeus; Burt, Augustine's World.)

According to the Neoplatonists, evil does not exist as a substance or property but instead as a privation of substance, form, and goodness (Plotinus, Enneads, I, 8; See also O'Brien 1996). For instance, the evil of disease consists in a privation of health, and the evil of sin consist in a privation of virtue. The Neoplatonist theory of evil provides a solution to the problem of evil because if evil is a privation of substance, form, and goodness, then God creates no evil. All of God's creation is good, evil is a lack of being and goodness.

One problem with the privation theory's solution to the problem of evil is that it provides only a partial solution to the problem of evil since even if God creates no evil we must still explain why God allows privation evils to exist (See Calder 2007a; Kane 1980). An even more significant problem is that the privation theory seems to fail as a theory of evil since it doesn't seem to be able to account for certain paradigmatic evils. For instance, it seems that we cannot equate the evil of pain with the privation of pleasure or some other feeling. Pain is a distinct phenomenological experience which is positively bad and not merely not good. Similarly, a sadistic torturer is not just not as good as she could be. She is not simply lacking in kindness or compassion. She desires her victims' suffering for pleasure. These are qualities she has, not qualities she lacks, and they are positively bad and not merely lacking in goodness (Calder 2007a; Kane 1980. See Anglin and Goetz 1982 for a reply to these objections).

2.2 Kant's Theory of Evil

Immanuel Kant, in his Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone, was the first to offer a purely secular theory of evil, i.e., a theory that does not make reference to supernatural or divine entities and which is not developed as a response to the problem of evil. Kant's concern is to make sense of three apparently conflicting truths about human nature: (1) we are radically free, (2) we are by nature inclined toward goodness, (3) we are by nature inclined toward evil.

Kant's thoughts on evil and morality have had an important influence on subsequent philosophers writing about the nature of evil such as Hanna Arendt, Claudia Card, and Richard Bernstein. However, most theorists acknowledge that Kant's theory is disappointing as a theory of evil in the narrow sense since it does not pick out only the morally worst sorts of actions and characters. (See, e.g., Card 2010, 37). Instead, Kant equates evil with having a will that is not fully good.

According to Kant, we have a morally good will only if we choose to perform morally right actions because they are morally right (Kant 1785, 4: 393–4:397; Kant 1793, Bk I). On Kant's view, anyone who does not have a morally good will has an evil will. There are three grades of evil which can be seen as increasingly more evil stages of corruption in the will. First there is frailty. A person with a frail will attempts to perform morally right actions because these actions are morally right, but she is too weak to follow through with her plans. Instead, she ends up doing wrong due to a weakness of will (Kant 1793, Bk I, 24–25).

The next stage of corruption is impurity. A person with an impure will does not attempt to perform morally right actions just because these actions are morally right. Instead, she performs morally right actions partly because these actions are morally right and party because of some other incentive, e.g., for self-interested. Someone with an impure will performs morally right actions, but only partly for the right reason. Kant believes that this form of defect in the will is worse than frailty even though the frail person does wrong while the impure person does right. Impurity is worse than frailty because an impure person has allowed an incentive other than the moral law to guide her actions while the frail person tries, but fails, to do the right thing for the right reason (Kant 1793, Bk I, 25–26).

The final stage of corruption is perversity, or wickedness. Someone with a perverse will inverts the proper order of the incentives. Instead of prioritizing the moral law over all other incentives, she prioritizes self-love over the moral law. Thus, her actions conform to the moral law only if they are in her self-interest. Someone with a perverse will need not do anything wrong because actions which best promote her self-interest may conform to the moral law. But since the reason she performs morally right actions is self-love and not because these actions are morally right, her actions have no moral worth and, according to Kant, her will manifests the worst form of evil possible for a human being. Kant considers someone with a perverse will an evil person (Kant 1793, Bk I, 25).

Most contemporary theorists reject Kant's view that the worst form of evil involves prioritizing self-interest over the moral law (See, e.g., Card 2010, 37 and 2002; Garrard 2002; Kekes 2005). Whether, and to what extent, a person, or her will, is evil seems to depend on details about her motives and the harms she brings about and not just on whether she prioritizes self-interest over the moral law. For instance, it seems far worse to torture someone for sadistic pleasure than to tell the truth to gain a good reputation. In fact, it seems reasonable to suppose that the first act (sadistic torture) indicates an evil will while the second act (telling the truth for self-interest) indicates a will that is merely lacking in moral goodness. But for Kant, both acts indicate wills that are equally evil.

Kant makes several other controversial claims about the nature of evil in Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone. One of these claims is that there is a radical evil in human nature. By this he means that all human beings have a propensity to subordinate the moral law to self-interest and that this propensity is radical, or rooted, in human nature in the sense that it is inextirpable. Kant also believes that we are imputable for this propensity to evil (Kant 1793, Bk I). Richard Bernstein argues that Kant cannot coherently hold both of these theses since we could not be responsible for a propensity that is in us originally and that we cannot be rid of (Bernstein 2002, 11–35).

In his Confessions, Saint Augustine tells us that one day he stole some pears for the sole sake of doing something wrong (Augustine, Confessions, II, v-x). Kant rejects the idea that human beings can be motivated in this way (Kant 1793, Bk I, sect. 2). For Kant, human beings always have either the moral law or self-love as their incentive for acting. Only a devil could do what is wrong just because it is wrong. (For more about Kant and diabolical evil see Bernstein 2002, 36–42; Card 2010, 36–61; and Allison 2001, 86–100).

2.3 Arendt's Analyses of Evil

Secular analyses of the concept of evil in the narrow sense began in the twentieth century with the work of Hanna Arendt. Arendt's thoughts on the nature of evil stem from her attempt to understand and evaluate the horrors of the Nazi death camps. In the Origins of Totalitarianism (1951), Arendt borrows Kant's term ‘radical evil’ to describe the evil of the Holocaust. However, Arendt does not mean what Kant means by ‘radical evil’ (see section 2.2 for Kant's view of radical evil). Instead, Arendt uses the term to denote a new form of wrongdoing which cannot be captured by other moral concepts. For Arendt, radical evil involves making human beings as human beings superfluous. This is accomplished when human beings are made into living corpses who lack any spontaneity or freedom. According to Arendt a distinctive feature of radical evil is that it isn't done for humanly understandable motives such as self-interest, but merely to reinforce totalitarian control and the idea that everything is possible (Arendt 1951, 437–459; Bernstein 2002, 203–224).

In Origins of Totalitarianism Arendt's analysis of evil focuses on evils which results from systems put in place by totalitarian regimes. Her analysis does not address the character and culpability of individuals who take part in the perpetration of evil. In Eichmann in Jerusalem: A Report on the Banality of Evil, Arendt turns her attention to individual culpability for evil through her analysis of the Nazi functionary Adolf Eichmann who was tried in Jerusalem for organizing the deportation and transportation of Jews to the Nazi concentration and extermination camps. Arendt went to Jerusalem in 1961 to report on Eichmann's trial for The New Yorker magazine. In Eichmann in Jerusalem, she argues that “desk murderers” such as Eichmann were not motivated by demonic or monstrous motives. Instead, “It was sheer thoughtlessness—something by no means identical with stupidity—that predisposed [Eichmann] to become one of the greatest criminals of that period” (Arendt 1963, 287–288). According to Arendt, Eichmann's motives and character were banal rather than monstrous. She described him as a “terrifyingly normal” human being who simply did not think very deeply about what he was doing.

Arendt's reflections on Eichmann and her concept of the banality of evil have been both influential and controversial (For a discussion of the controversy see Young-Bruehl 1982). Some theorists take Arendt's thesis of the banality of evil as a datum to be explained. For instance, social psychologists Stanley Milgram (1969) and Philip Zimbardo (2007) have attempted to explain how social conditions can lead ordinary people to perform evil actions. Others have contested Arendt's suggestion that ordinary people can be regular sources of evil (see Card 2010; Calder 2003 and 2009).

3. Contemporary Theories of Evil Action

Spurred on by Arendt's work, and dissatisfied with analyses of evil found in the history of philosophy, several theorists over the past twenty-five years have sought to offer necessary and sufficient conditions for evil. Some theorists focus on evil character, or evil personhood, as the root concept of evil. These theorists consider the concept of evil action to be a derivative concept, i.e., they define an evil action as the sort of action that an evil person performs. But just as many theorists, or more, believe that the concept of evil action is the root concept of evil. These theorists consider the concept of evil personhood to be a derivative concept, i.e., they define an evil person as someone who is prone to perform evil actions. Some theorists who believe that evil action is the root concept believe that only one or two component properties are essential for evil action, while others believe that evil action has a multitude of essential components. This section discusses different views about the essential components of evil action.

3.1 Evil and Wrongdoing

Most philosophers, and laypeople, assume that wrongfulness is an essential component of evil action (See e.g., Card 2002, Garrard 1999, Formosa 2008). It seems that, to be evil, an action must, at least, be wrong. However, this claim is not universally accepted (Calder 2011). The central question for most theorists is: what more is required for evil than mere wrongdoing? One controversial answer to this question is that nothing more is required: an evil is just a very wrongful action (Russell 2007). This position is resisted by most evil-revivalists who claim that evil is qualitatively, rather than merely quantitatively, distinct from mere wrongdoing (See, e.g., Steiner 2002; Garrard 1999 and 2002; Calder 2013).

To determine whether evil is qualitatively distinct from mere wrongdoing we must first understand what it is for two concepts to be qualitatively distinct. According to some theorists two concepts are qualitatively distinct if, and only if, all instantiations of the first concept share a property which no instantiation of the second concept shares (Steiner 2002; Garrard 1999, 2002; Russell, 2007). For instance, Hillel Steiner claims that “evil acts are distinguished from ordinary wrongs through the presence of an extra quality that is completely absent in the performance of ordinary wrongs” (Steiner 2002, 184). According to Steiner, the extra quality shared by all evil actions and lacking from merely wrongful actions, is the perpetrator's pleasure; evil action consists in taking pleasure in doing wrong, no merely wrongful action is pleasurable for its doer (for more about Steiner's theory of evil see Section 3.4).

Todd Calder (2013) disputes this understanding of what it is for two concepts to be qualitatively distinct, arguing instead that two concepts are qualitatively distinct provided they do not share all of their essential properties. Thus, evil actions are qualitatively distinct from merely wrongful actions provided the essential properties of evil actions are not also the essential properties of merely wrongful actions but had to a greater degree.

Calder argues that on plausible theories of evil and wrongdoing, evil and wrongdoing do not share all of their essential properties, and thus, evil and wrongdoing are qualitatively distinct. For instance, Calder argues that it is an essential property of evil actions that the evildoer intends that his victim suffer significant harm while it is not an essential property of wrongful actions that the wrongdoer intend to cause harm. For instance, cheating, lying, and risky behaviour can be wrongful even if the wrongdoer does not intend to cause harm (Calder 2013).

3.2 Evil and Harm

Many theorists writing about evil believe that evil actions must be harmful (see, e.g., Card 2002; Kekes 2005). However, there are reasons to think otherwise. For instance, someone who has a narrow conception of harm, might believe that evil actions need not be harmful. For example, she might believe that only painful experiences are harmful, but that it would be evil to sadistically destroy someone's reputation, even if doing so did not cause any pain. If it is evil to sadistically, yet painlessly, destroy someone's reputation, and only painful experiences are harmful, then some evil actions are not harmful (for more about different conceptions of harm see Nagel 1970; Kagan 1998, 29–41).

One particularly controversial class of actions which some theorists believe are evil and yet not harmful are cases of sadistic voyeurism (Calder 2002, 56; Garrard 2002, 327). For instance, imagine that Alex takes pleasure in witnessing Carol's extreme suffering, but that Alex does not cause Carol's suffering. Some people would call this act of sadistic voyeurism evil even though it causes no additional harm to the victim (we can imagine that Carol is not aware that Alex takes pleasure in her suffering so that the witnessing of her suffering does not aggravate the harm). Paul Formosa suggests that sadistic voyeurism is only evil because the voyeur allows the harm to occur and thus is partly responsible for the suffering (Formosa 2008, 227). The problem with Formosa's analysis of sadistic voyeurism is that it cannot make sense of cases where the voyeur is unable to prevent the harm from occurring. Consider, for example, Daniel Haybron's case of a sadistic quadriplegic who has no ability to communicate. Such a person may “wish nothing more than the greatest suffering for her fellow creatures” and yet be helpless to cause, or prevent, her victim's suffering (Haybron 2002a, 264). One might argue that if this person took pleasure in witnessing someone else's significant harm she would thereby do evil even though there is no sense in which she allows the harm to occur? If so, evil actions need not be harmful.

In response, it could be argued that what is evil about sadistic voyeurism is the person who enjoys someone else's suffering and not her actions. According to this view, theorists who believe that sadistic voyeurs perform evil actions confuse evil action with evil character: the sadistic voyeur is an evil person, but she does not perform an evil action because she does not cause any harm (for more about evil character see Section 4).

However, even if we agree that evil actions, themselves, need not be harmful, it seems plausible to suppose that evil actions must involve a certain amount of harm. For even in cases of sadistic voyeurism it is necessary that someone suffers even if the suffering isn't caused by the evildoer (Russell 2007, 676).

Assuming that harm is an essential component of evil, the question then becomes how much harm is required for evil? In the Roots of Evil John Kekes argues that the harm of evil must be serious and excessive (Kekes 2005, 1–3). In an earlier work, Kekes specifies that a serious harm is one that “interferes with the functioning of a person as a full-fledged agent.” (Kekes 1998, 217). Claudia Card describes the harm of evil as an intolerable harm. By an intolerable harm, Card means a harm that makes life not worth living from the point of view of the person whose life it is. Examples of intolerable harms include severe physical or mental suffering as well as the deprivation of basics such as food, clean drinking water, and social contact (Card 2002, 16).

3.3 Evil and Motivation

Most theorists writing about evil believe that evil action requires a certain sort of motivation. Once again, this claim is somewhat controversial. In the Atrocity Paradigm, Claudia Card makes a point of defining evil without reference to perpetrator motives. She does this because she wants her theory to focus on alleviating the suffering of victims rather than on understanding the motives of perpetrators (Card 2002, 9). Card's theory also has the virtue of being able to count as evil actions which stem from a variety of motives.

However, while Card claims that the atrocity paradigm does not have a motivation component, part of the plausibility of her theory comes from that fact that it restricts the class of evil actions to those that follow from certain sorts of motives. Card's theory of evil is “that evils are reasonably foreseeable intolerable harms produced by inexcusable wrongs” (Card 2010, 16). While this account of evil allows for a wide range of motivations, it does specify that evildoers must foresee the harm they produce and lack a moral justification for producing the harm. In other words, for Card, evildoers are motivated by a desire for some object or state of affairs which does not justify the harm they foreseeably inflict.

Other philosophers have suggested that evildoers desire to cause harm, or to do wrong, for more specific reasons such as pleasure (Steiner 2002), the desire to annihilate all being (Eagleton 2010), or the destruction of others for its own sake (Cole 2006). When evil is restricted to actions that follow from these sorts of motivations, theorists sometimes say that their subject is pure, radical, diabolical, or monstrous evil. This suggests that their discussion is restricted to a type, or form, of evil and not to evil per se.

While some philosophers argue that certain motives, such as malevolence or malice, are necessary for evil, others focus instead on motives or desires that evildoers lack. For instance, Adam Morton contends that evildoers are crucially uninhibited by barriers against considering harming or humiliating others that ought to be there (Morton 2004, 57). Similarly, Laurence Thomas contends that one distinctive feature of an evildoer is that “whereas normally a person's moral sensibilities would get in the way of his performing an act of such moral gravity [i.e., one that results in serious harm], this does not happen when a person performs an evil act” (Thomas 1993, 77).

Eve Garrard's theory of evil also focuses on a deficiency in the motivational structure of the evildoer. To understand Garrard's theory of evil we need to understand the difference between metaphysical and psychological silencers. A metaphysical silencer is a reason which is so weighty that, objectively speaking, it takes away the reason-giving force of some other consideration. When this happens we say that the less weighty consideration has been metaphysically silenced. By contrast, a psychological silencer is a reason which is so weighty for an individual that, subjectively, it takes away the reason-giving force of some other consideration. When this happens we say that the consideration has been psychologically silenced for the individual.

Consider Peter Singer's case of coming across a child drowning in a shallow pond (Singer 1972). If we came across a child drowning in a shallow pond, the need to rescue the child would be so morally important that it would metaphysically silence the desire to keep our clothes clean as a reason for acting or not acting. That is, when a child is in urgent need of rescue, considerations about keeping our clothes clean lose all of their reason-giving force. They cease to be reasons for acting or not acting. For many people, especially for virtuous people, considerations about keeping their clothes clean are also psychologically silenced by the urgent need to rescue a child drowning in a shallow pond. In other words, virtuous people are completely unmoved by considerations about keeping their clothes clean when presented with children in urgent need of rescue.

According to Garrard, the evildoer has a particularly despicable motivational structure. She psychologically silences considerations that are so morally weighty that they metaphysically silence the very considerations which move her to act (Garrard 1999, 55). For instance, it would be evil to psychologically silence the urgent need to rescue a drowning child as a reason for acting because we desire to keep our clothes clean.

Critics of Garrard's theory of evil argue that it is too restrictive since it does not count as evil actions which cause, or allow, significant harm for no good reason when the agent is slightly motivated by morally important considerations. For instance, on Garrard's theory it would not be evil for John to allow a child to drown in a shallow pond if he was slightly motivated to rescue her but not motivated enough to dirty his clothes. Yet it seems that John would do evil by allowing a child to drown for those reasons.

3.4 Evil and Affect

Some theorists believe that to do evil we must feel a certain way or have certain emotions at the time of acting. For example, Laurence Thomas believes that evildoers take delight in causing harm or feel hatred toward their victims (Thomas 1993, 76–77). Hillel Steiner goes even further by contending that there are just two components of evil: pleasure and wrongdoing. According to Steiner “[e]vil acts are wrong acts that are pleasurable for their doer” (Steiner 2002, 189).

Critics of Steiner's view argue that it is neither necessary nor sufficient for evil to take pleasure in performing wrongful actions. Critics argue that it is not necessary to take pleasure in doing wrong to perform an evil action since it is sufficient to intentionally cause significant harm for an unworthy goal such as self-interest (Calder 2013). Imagine that a serial killer tortures and kills his victims but that he does not take pleasure in torturing and killing. It seems that this serial killer is an evildoer even though he does not take pleasure in doing wrong.

Critics of Steiner's view argue that it is not sufficient for performing an evil action to take pleasure in performing a wrongful action since we would not think that it was evil to take pleasure in performing a wrongful action if the victim did not suffer significant harm. For instance, it wouldn't be evil to take pleasure in telling a white lie (Russell 2007).

3.5 Evil and Responsibility

It is universally accepted that to perform an evil action an agent must be morally responsible for what she does. Although hurricanes and rattle snakes can cause great harm, they cannot perform evil actions because they are not moral agents. Furthermore, moral agents only perform evil actions when they are morally responsible for what they do and their actions are morally inexcusable (see e.g., Kekes 2005; Card 2010; Formosa 2008). To meet these conditions evildoers must act voluntarily, intend or foresee their victim's suffering, and lack moral justification for their actions. It is particularly controversial whether these conditions are met in three sorts of cases: (1) serious harms brought about by psychopaths; (2) serious harms brought about by individuals who have had bad upbringings; and (3) serious harms brought about through ignorance.

3.5.1 Psychopaths

Psychopathy is a syndrome that consists in lacking certain emotional, interpersonal, and behavioural traits and having others (Hare 1999). Some of the defining characteristics of psychopathy include shallow emotions, egocentricity, deceitfulness, impulsivity, a lack of empathy, and a lack of guilt and remorse. Particularly relevant for assessments of moral responsibility is the psychopath's inability to care for others and for the rules of morality.

According to the M'Naughten rules for criminal insanity, a person is legally insane if, due to a disease of the mind at the time of acting, she is unable to know the nature or quality of her action or to know that what she is doing is wrong. For instance, a delusional schizophrenic who believes that her neighbour is a demon is not responsible for harming her neighbour since she does not understand that she is harming an innocent person; she believes she is defending herself from an inhuman malicious agent. Many philosophers believe that the M'Naughten rules give us the conditions for moral responsibility as well as the conditions for criminal responsibility (see, e.g., Wolf 1987).

It is controversial whether psychopaths are insane according to the standard set by the M'Naughten rules since it is controversial whether psychopaths know that their actions are wrong. Motivational internalists believe that it is conceptually impossible to believe (and thus to know) that an action is morally wrong and yet be completely unmotivated to refrain from doing the action. That is, for the internalist, there is a conceptual connection between believing that an action is wrong and having a con-attitude toward the action. The internalist believes that one may be able to knowingly do what is wrong because, all things considered, she cares more about something that is incompatible with refraining from wrongdoing, provided she is at least somewhat inclined to refrain from doing what she knows to be wrong. Since psychopaths seem to be completely indifferent to whether their actions are right or wrong, motivational internalists believe that they do not truly believe, or understand, that what they do is morally wrong. At most, they might believe that their harmful actions break societal conventions. But it may be one thing to believe that one has broken a societal convention and quite another to believe that one has broken a moral rule. Philosophers who reject the internalist thesis, i.e., motivational externalists, are more willing to believe that psychopaths know the difference between right and wrong. According to motivational externalists, moral knowledge only requires an intellectual capacity to identify right and wrong, and not the ability to care about morality. Since psychopaths are not intellectually deficient, motivational externalists do not think there is any reason to believe that psychopaths cannot tell the difference between right and wrong. (For more about how the internalist and externalist theses relate to the moral responsibility of psychopaths see Brink 1989, 45–50; Duff 1977; Haksar 1965; and Milo 1984. See also Rosati 2006. Recently some theorists writing about the moral responsibility of psychopaths have tried to avoid the internalist/externalist debate. It is beyond the purview of this entry to survey this literature. See Levy 2007, Matravers 2008, Talbert 2008.)

3.5.2 Bad Upbringings

The degree to which deviant behavior is caused by bad upbringings rather than genetic starting points or individual choices is a difficult empirical question. Assuming that there is a strong causal connection between bad upbringings and deviant behaviour, there are two main arguments for the claim that we should not hold perpetrators morally responsible for behaviour that has resulted from bad upbringings. The first argument contends that since we do not choose our upbringings we should not be held responsible for crimes which result from our upbringings (See, e.g., Cole 2006, 122–147). Susan Wolf (1987) offers a variant of this argument. According to Wolf people who have had particularly bad upbringings are unable to make accurate normative judgements because they have been taught the wrong values. Wolf likens people who have been taught the wrong values to people suffering from psychosis because like psychotics they are unable to make accurate judgements about the world. For example, Wolf has us consider the case of Jojo, the son of Jo, a ruthless dictator of a small South American country. Jo believes that there is nothing wrong with torturing or executing innocent people. In fact, he enjoys expressing his unlimited power by ordering his guards to do just that. Jojo is given a special education which includes spending much of his day with his father. The predictable result of this education is that Jojo acquires his father's values. Wolf argues that we should not hold Jojo responsible for torturing innocent people since his upbringing has made him unable to judge that these actions are wrong. Since Jojo is unable to judge that his actions are wrong he meets the conditions for insanity as stated in the M'Naghten rules (See section 3.5.1 above).

The second argument for the claim that we should not hold people morally responsible for crimes that result from bad upbringings begins with the supposition that we are morally responsible for our crimes only if we are appropriate objects of reactive attitudes, such as resentment (Strawson 1963). According to this argument, perpetrators of crimes who have had particularly bad upbringings are not appropriate objects of reactive attitudes since there is no point to expressing these attitudes toward these perpetrators. A proponent of this argument must then explain why there is no point to expressing reactive attitudes toward these perpetrators. In his paper “Responsibility and the Limits of Evil: Variations on a Strawsonian Theme” (1987) Gary Watson considers various ways to make sense of the claim that there is no point to expressing reactive attitudes toward people who commit crimes due to bad upbringings. Watson's discussion centres on the case of Robert Alton Harris. As a child, Harris was an affectionate good-hearted boy. Family members say that an abusive mother and harsh treatment at corrections facilities turned him into a malicious cold-blooded murderer.

3.5.3 Ignorance

Sometimes ignorance is used as an excuse for putative evildoing (Jones 1999, 69–70). The argument goes something like this: if an agent has no good reason to believe that she causes significant harm without moral justification, then she is not morally responsible for causing this harm because she has no good reason to act otherwise. For instance, if Dorion shoots a gun into some bushes on a country estate without having any reason to believe that a man is hiding there, he is not morally responsible for harming a man who is hiding there (this case comes from Oscar Wilde's A Picture of Dorion Gray). In this way ignorance can be a legitimate excuse for causing unjustified harm.

However, since Aristotle, theorists have recognized that ignorance is only a legitimate excuse for causing unjustified harm when we are not responsible for our ignorance, i.e., when the ignorance is non-culpable (Nichomachean Ethics, Bk III). One sort of culpable ignorance which has received a fair bit of attention from philosophers writing about evil is ignorance that results from self-deception. In self-deception we evade acknowledging to ourselves some truth or what we would see as the truth if our beliefs were based on an unbiased assessment of available evidence. “Self-deceivers are initially aware of moments when they shift their attention away from available evidence to something else, although they may not be aware of the overall project of their self-deception.” (Jones 1999, 82). Some tactics used by self-deceivers to evade acknowledging some truth, including (1) avoiding thinking about the truth, (2) distracting themselves with rationalizations that are contrary to the truth, (3) systematically failing to make inquiries that would lead to evidence of the truth and (4) ignoring available evidence of the truth or distracting their attention from this evidence (Jones 1999, 82). Several theorists writing about evil have suggested that perpetrators of the Holocaust such as Adolf Hitler and Adolf Eichmann were self-deceptive evildoers. (Calder 2003 and 2004; Jones 1999; See also, Martin 1986).

4. Contemporary Theories of Evil Character/Personhood

There are five main types of theories of evil character, or evil personhood (The terms ‘evil personhood’ and ‘evil character’ are used interchangeably in the literature. This entry will follow this convention): frequent evildoer accounts, dispositional accounts, affect-based accounts, motive-based accounts, consistency accounts, and extremity accounts.

4.1 Frequent Evildoer and Dispositional Accounts

On frequent evildoer and dispositional accounts of evil character the concept of evil action is the root concept of evil, while the concept of evil character is a derivative concept. For instance, according to the frequent evildoer approach, an evil person is simply someone who performs evil actions often enough (Kekes 1990, 48; 1998, 217; Thomas 1993, 82).

One serious problem with frequent-evildoer accounts is that they cannot make sense of the fact that an evil person might only very rarely (if ever) do evil. For instance, an evil person might only very rarely do evil if she is too incompetent or cowardly to carry out her evil plans. But since incompetence and cowardice do not make our characters any better, it seems that we can have the worst sort of character, i.e., an evil character, and yet very rarely, if ever, perform evil actions (See Haybron 1999, 132).

In light of this and other problems for frequent evildoer accounts, Luke Russell (2010) has developed a dispositional account of evil character that is similar in many respects to frequent evildoer accounts, but which can make sense of the fact that some evil people do not do evil. According to Russell, an evil person is someone who is strongly and fixedly disposed to perform evil actions when in autonomy favouring conditions. Someone is strongly disposed to do evil if she is very likely to do evil. Someone is fixedly disposed to do evil if this disposition is unlikely to change over time. Someone is in autonomy favouring conditions when she is not deceived, threatened, coerced, or pressed to act in one way rather than another (Russell 2010).

On Russell's dispositional account, an evil person might never do evil because although she is strongly and fixed disposed to do evil in autonomy favouring conditions, she might lack opportunities to perform evil actions or else autonomy favouring conditions might never obtain.

While Russell clearly favours a dispositional account of evil character, he does not say that his dispositional account identifies necessary and sufficient conditions for evil personhood. Instead, he suggests that certain sorts of feelings might also be sufficient for being an evil person (Russell 2010, 249).

4.2 Affect-Based Accounts

According to affect-based accounts, evil people have certain sorts of feelings or emotions. For instance, Colin McGinn argues that “an evil character is one that derives pleasure from pain and pain from pleasure” (62). There is some initial plausibility to this view since sadism and malicious envy are paradigms of evil. However, while it is undoubtedly true that some evil people are sadistic, there is reason to believe that feelings of pleasure in pain or pain in pleasure, or any other sorts of feelings, are neither necessary nor sufficient for evil character. The problem with thinking that certain sorts of feelings are necessary for evil character is that an evil person might routinely cause serious harm to her victims without any accompanying feelings. For instance, someone who routinely runs down pedestrians out of indifference for their well-being, and without any accompanying feelings, seems to qualify as an evil person (Calder 2003, 368).

The problem with thinking that certain sorts of feelings, such as feelings of pleasure in another person's pain, are sufficient for evil character is that these sorts of feelings might be involuntary and not endorsed by the person who has them. For instance, John might be just so constituted to experience pleasure in the face of another person's pain. If John does not desire to take pleasure in other people's pain, and is horrified by his sadistic feelings, it seems too harsh to call him evil. He should be pitied rather than condemned. Calling someone like John ‘evil’ would be like blaming someone for her patellar reflex (Calder 2003, 368–369).

4.3 Motive-Based Accounts

According to motive-based accounts of evil character, to be an evil person is to be motivated in a certain sort of way. For instance, Todd Calder argues that to be an evil person it is sufficient to have a regular propensity for e-desires. An e-desire is a motivational state that consists in a desire for what is correctly believed to be someone else's significant harm for an unworthy goal or for what would correctly be believed to be someone else's significant harm for an unworthy goal in the absence of self-deception (see Section 3.5.3 for more on self-deceptive evil). According to Calder, significant harm is desired for an unworthy goal if a state of affairs consisting of the achievement of the goal together with the harm would be less valuable than if the goal was not achieved and the harm was avoided (Calder 2003 and 2009. See also Card, 2002, 21 for a similar view).

A problem for motive-based accounts is to explain why we should judge someone as evil based solely on her motives. In other words, why judge someone as the morally worst sort of person for having certain motives if these motives do not result in significant harm? Why not judge people as evil only if they actually cause significant harm? One way to respond to this objection is to point out that even if e-desires do not result in significant harm on some particular occasion or for some particular person, e-desires do, for most people most of the time, lead to significant harm (Driver's consequentialist theory of virtue and vice (2001) uses a similar line of thought). However, a problem with this response for the proponent of a purely motive-based account is that if we say that someone has an evil character only if she has motives that generally lead to significant harm then we adopt a dispositional account of evil character (see Section 4.1). Instead, a proponent of a purely motive-based account could insist that judgements of evil character look inward to an agent's psychology and not to the effects (or likely effects) of her actions (See Calder 2007b for a similar view about virtue and vice).

However, if we insist that judgements of evil character look inward to an agent's psychology and not to the effects of her actions, why judge evil character solely on the basis of her motives? Why not take into account the agent's affective states as well? (Haybron 2002b, 267)

4.4 Consistency Accounts

According to most, if not all, theories of evil character, to have an evil character it isn't sufficient to do evil, or have evil-making characteristics, only on occasion; it is necessary to have evil-making characteristics regularly, frequently, or repeatedly (See, e.g., Calder 2003 and 2009; Card 2002; Thomas 1993; Barry 2009). Consistency accounts take this idea to the extreme: according to consistency accounts to be an evil person we must have evil-making characteristics consistently, or almost always. For instance, Daniel Haybron argues that it is necessary and sufficient for evil character to be utterly lacking in motives or sentiments of moral worth (Haybron 2002a and 2002b). For Haybron, evil people almost always lack empathy and concern for others, and they are in no way motivated to help others or to do what is morally right. On Haybron's view, the concept of evil character very closely resembles the concept of psychopathy (For a description of psychopathy see Section 3.5.1).

Critics of the consistency view argue that it is too restrictive. Imagine that Bob loves to torture children and does so frequently, but that Bob also displays genuine compassion for the elderly, perhaps by volunteering at a long-term care facility on a regular basis. On consistency accounts of evil character, Bob is not an evil person because he does not have evil-making characteristics consistently. And yet most people would want to say that torturing children for fun on a regular basis is enough to make Bob an evil person (Calder 2009, 22–27).

4.5 Extremity Accounts

According to extremity accounts of evil character, evil characters have certain bad-making characteristics to an extreme degree. For instance, Peter Brian Barry argues that evil people possess extremely vicious states of character in the following sense: (1) evil people have the worst kinds of vices, such as cruelty and maliciousness rather than more benign forms of vice such as cowardice or laziness, and (2) evil people have these vices to an extreme degree (Barry 2009, 171–173).

Barry believes that one virtue of his theory is that it makes sense of the mirror thesis: that evil people are the perverse mirror images of moral saints (Barry 2009; Haybron 2002b, McGinn 1997, and Steiner 2002 also accept versions of the mirror thesis). According to Barry moral saints are the mirror images of evil people in the sense that they possess extremely virtuous states of character, i.e., the very best virtues, such as justice and compassion, to an extreme degree. (See Russell 2010 for an argument against the mirror thesis.)

5. Evil Institutions

While most theorists writing about evil focus on evil action and evil character, there has also been some discussion of evil institutions. When we speak of ‘evil institutions’ we might mean one of two things: (1) organizations that are evil or that perform evil actions, or (2) social practices that are evil, such as slavery and genocide. Since an organization can only be evil, or perform evil actions, if it is morally responsible for what it does, the debate concerning the concept of evil institutions in sense (1) is discussed under the heading of ‘collective responsibility.’ Evil institutions in this sense will not be discussed in this entry.

According to Claudia Card, an institution, in sense (2), i.e., a social practice, is evil if it is reasonably foreseeable that intolerable harm will result from its normal or correct operation without justification or moral excuse (2002, 20; 2010, 18, 27–35). For instance, genocide is an evil institution since significant suffering and a loss of social vitality result from its normal and correct operation without moral justification (Card 2010, 237–293).

However, while Card's account of evil institutions correctly identifies genocide and other paradigmatically evil institutions as evil, her account also classifies as evil some institutions which are less obviously evil such as capital punishment, marriage, and motherhood (Card 2002, 2010). Her classification of marriage and motherhood as evil has been particularly controversial.

According to Card, marriage and motherhood are evil institutions because it is reasonably foreseeable that their normal, or correct, operation will lead to intolerable harm in the form of domestic abuse without justification or excuse (Card 2002, 139–165). For instance, Card argues that the normal, or correct, operation of marriage leads to spousal abuse “because it provides incentives for partners to stay in broken relationships, places obstacles in the way of escaping from broken relationships, gives perpetrators of abuse virtually unlimited rights of access to their victims, and makes some forms of abuse difficult or impossible to detect or prove” (Calder 2009, 28). Card argues that there is no moral justification for the intolerable harm that results from the institution of marriage since nothing prevents us from abolishing marriage in favour of other less dangerous institutions.

Critics argue that even if Card is correct that it is reasonably foreseeable that the institution of marriage will lead to intolerable harms, it is too heavy-handed to call marriage an evil institution. For instance, Todd Calder has argued that an institution should be considered evil only if intolerable harm is an essential component of the institution. Since suffering and a loss of social vitality are essential components of genocide, genocide is an evil institution. But since spousal abuse is not an essential component of marriage, marriage is not an evil institution (Calder 2009, 27–30).

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