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The Problem of Evil
The epistemic question posed by evil is whether the world contains undesirable states of affairs that provide the basis for an argument that makes it unreasonable for anyone to believe in the existence of God.
This discussion is divided into nine sections. The first is concerned with some preliminary distinctions; the second, with the choice between deductive versions of the argument from evil, and evidential versions; the third, with alternative evidential formulations of the argument from evil; the fourth, with the distinction between three very different types of responses to the argument from evil: attempted total refutations, defenses, and theodicies.
The fifth section then focuses upon attempted total refutations, while the sixth is concerned with defenses. Some traditional theodicies are then considered in section seven. The idea of global properties is then introduced in section eight, and a theodicy with religious content that is based on that idea is considered in section nine.
- 1. Some Important Distinctions
- 2. The Choice between Incompatibility Formulations and Evidential Formulations
- 3. Inductive Versions of the Argument from Evil
- 4. Responses to the Argument from Evil: Refutations, Defenses, and Theodicies
- 5. Attempted Total Refutations
- 6. Attempted Defenses
- 7. Theodicies
- 8. Defenses and Theodicies Based on Global Properties
- 9. Peter van Inwagen's Religious Theodicy and a Global Properties Approach
- Academic Tools
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The term “God” is used with a wide variety of different meanings. These tend to fall, however, into two main groups. On the one hand, there are metaphysical interpretations of the term: God is a prime mover, or a first cause, or a necessary being that has its necessity of itself, or the ground of being, or a being whose essence is identical with its existence. Or God is not one being among other beings—even a supremely great being—but, instead, being itself. Or God is an ultimate reality to which no concepts truly apply.
On the other hand, there are interpretations that connect the term “God” in a clear and relatively straightforward way with religious attitudes, such as those of worship, and with very important human desires, such as the desires that good will triumph, that justice be done, and that the world not be one where death marks the end of the individual's existence.
What properties must something have if it is to be an appropriate object of worship, and if it is to provide reason for thinking that there is a reasonable chance that the fundamental human desires just mentioned will be fulfilled? A natural answer is that God must be a person who, at the very least, is very powerful, very knowledgeable, and morally very good. But if such a being exists, then it seems initially puzzling why various evils exist. For many of the very undesirable states of affairs that the world contains are such as could be eliminated, or prevented, by a being who was only moderately powerful, while, given that humans are aware of such evils, a being only as knowledgeable as humans would be aware of their existence. Finally, even a moderately good human being, given the power to do so, would eliminate those evils. Why, then, do such undesirable states of affairs exist, if there is a being who is very powerful, very knowledgeable, and very good?
What one has here, however, is not just a puzzle, since the question can, of course, be recast as an argument for the non-existence of God. Thus if, for simplicity, we focus on a conception of God as all-powerful, all-knowing, and perfectly good, one very concise way of formulating such an argument is as follows:
- If God exists, then God is omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect.
- If God is omnipotent, then God has the power to eliminate all evil.
- If God is omniscient, then God knows when evil exists.
- If God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil.
- Evil exists.
- If evil exists and God exists, then either God doesn't have the power to eliminate all evil, or doesn't know when evil exists, or doesn't have the desire to eliminate all evil.
- Therefore, God doesn't exist.
That this argument is valid is perhaps most easily seen by a reductio argument, in which one assumes that the conclusion—(7)—is false, and then shows that the denial of (7), along with premises (1) through (6), leads to a contradiction. Thus if, contrary to (7), God exists, it follows from (1) that God is omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect. This, together with (2), (3), and (4) then entails that God has the power to eliminate all evil, that God knows when evil exists, and that God has the desire to eliminate all evil. But when (5) is conjoined with the reductio assumption that God exists, it then follows via modus ponens from (6) that either God doesn't have the power to eliminate all evil, or doesn't know when evil exists, or doesn't have the desire to eliminate all evil. Thus we have a contradiction, and so premises (1) through (6) do validly imply (7).
Whether the argument is sound is, of course, a further question, for it may be that one or more of the premises is false. The point here, however, is simply that when one conceives of God as unlimited with respect to power, knowledge, and moral goodness, the existence of evil quickly gives rise to potentially serious arguments against the existence of God.
Is the situation different if one shifts to a deity who is not omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect? The answer depends on the details. Thus, if one considers a deity who is omniscient and morally perfect, but not omnipotent, then evil presumably would not pose a problem if such a deity were conceived of as too remote from Earth to prevent the evils we find here. But given a deity who falls considerably short of omnipotence, omniscience, and moral perfection, but who could intervene in our world to prevent many evils, and who knows of those evils, it would seem that an argument rather similar to the above could be formulated by focusing not on the mere existence of evil, but upon the existence of evils that such a deity could have prevented.
But what if God, rather than being characterized in terms of knowledge, power, and goodness, is defined in some more metaphysical way—for example, as the ground of being, or as being itself? The answer will depend on whether, having defined God in such purely metaphysical terms, one can go on to argue that such an entity will also possess at least very great power, knowledge, and moral goodness. If so, evil is once again a problem.
By contrast, if God is conceived of in a purely metaphysical way, and if no connection can be forged between the relevant metaphysical properties and the possession of significant power, knowledge, and goodness, then the problem of evil is irrelevant. But when that is the case, it would seem that God thereby ceases to be a being who is either an appropriate object of religious attitudes, or a ground for believing that fundamental human hopes are not in vain.
The argument from evil focuses upon the fact that the world appears to contain states of affairs that are bad, or undesirable, or that should have been prevented by any being that could have done so, and it asks how the existence of such states of affairs is to be squared with the existence of God. But the argument can be formulated in two very different ways. First, it can be formulated as a purely deductive argument that attempts to show that there are certain facts about the evil in the world that are logically incompatible with the existence of God. One especially ambitious form of this first sort of argument attempts to establish the very strong claim that it is logically impossible for it to be the case both that there is any evil at all, and that God exists. The argument set out in the preceding section is just such an argument.
Alternatively, rather than being formulated as a deductive argument for the very strong claim that it is logically impossible for both God and evil to exist, (or for God and certain types, or instances, or a certain amount of evil to exist), the argument from evil can instead be formulated as an evidential (or inductive/probabilistic) argument for the more modest claim that there are evils that actually exist in the world that make it unlikely—or perhaps very unlikely—that God exists.
The choice between incompatibility formulations and evidential formulations is discussed below, in section 2.
Any version of the argument from evil claims that there is some fact concerning the evil in the world such that the existence of God—understood as at least a very powerful, very knowledgeable, and morally very good person, and, ideally, as an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person—is either logically precluded, or rendered unlikely, by that fact. But versions of the argument often differ quite significantly with respect to what the relevant fact is. Sometimes, as in premise (5) in the argument set out above, the appeal is to the mere existence of any evil whatever. Sometimes, on the other hand, it is to the existence of a certain amount of evil. And sometimes it is to the existence of evils of a certain specified sort.
To formulate the argument from evil in terms of the mere existence of any evil at all is to abstract to the greatest extent possible from detailed information about the evils that are found in the world, and so one is assuming, in effect, that such information cannot be crucial for the argument. But is it clear that this is right? For might not one feel that while the world would be better off without the vast majority of evils, this is not so for absolutely all evils? Thus, some would argue, for example, that the frustration that one experiences in trying to solve a difficult problem is outweighed by the satisfaction of arriving at a solution, and therefore that the world is a better place because it contains such evils. Alternatively, it has been argued that the world is a better place if people develop desirable traits of character—such as patience, and courage—by struggling against obstacles, including suffering. But if either of these things is the case, then the prevention of all evil might well make the world a worse place.
It seems possible, then, that there might be evils that are logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, and this possibility provides a reason, accordingly, for questioning one of the premises in the argument set out earlier—namely, premise (4), where it is claimed that if God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil.
But there is also another reason why that claim is problematic, which arises out of a particular conception of free will—namely, a libertarian conception. According to this view of free will, and in contrast with what are known as compatibilist approaches, free will is incompatible with determinism, and so it is impossible even for an omnipotent being to make it the case that someone freely chooses to do what is right.
Many people claim, however, that the world is a better place if it contains individuals who possess libertarian free will, rather than individuals who are free only in a sense that is compatible with one's actions being completely determined. If this claim can be made plausible, one can argue, first, that God would have a good reason for creating a world with individuals who possessed libertarian free will, but secondly, that if he did choose to create such a world, even he could not ensure that no one would ever choose to do something morally wrong. The good of libertarian free will requires, in short, the possibility of moral evil.
Neither of these lines of argument is immune from challenge. As regards the former, one can argue that the examples that are typically advanced of cases where some evil is logically necessary for a greater good that outweighs the evil are not really, upon close examination, convincing, while, as regards the latter, there is a serious problem of making sense of libertarian free will, for although there is no difficulty about the idea of actions that are not causally determined, libertarian free will requires more than the mere absence of determinism, and the difficulty arises when one attempts to say what that something more is.
But although these challenges are important, and may very well turn out to be right, it is fair to say, first, that it has not yet been established that there is no coherent conception of libertarian free will, and, secondly, that it is, at least, very doubtful that one can establish that there cannot be cases where some evil is logically necessary for a greater good that outweighs it without appealing to some substantive, and probably controversial, moral theory.
The upshot is that the idea that either the actuality of certain undesirable states of affairs, or at least the possibility, may be logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, is not without some initial plausibility, and if some such claim can be sustained, it will follow immediately that the mere existence of evil cannot be incompatible with the existence of an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being.
How does this bear upon evidential formulations of the argument from evil? The answer would seem to be that if there can be evils that are logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, then it is hard to see how the mere existence of evil—in the absence of further information—can provide much in the way of evidence against the existence of God.
What if one shifts to a slightly less abstract formulation of the argument from evil that is based upon the premise that the world contains a certain amount of evil, or upon the premise that the world contains at least some natural evil? Then one is including marginally more information. But one is still assuming, in effect, that most of the detailed information about the evils found in the world is completely irrelevant to the argument from evil, and a little reflection brings out how very implausible this assumption is. So, for example, consider a world that contains a billion units of natural evil. Is this a good starting point for an argument from evil? The answer is that whether this fact is an impressive reason for questioning the existence of God surely depends on further details about the world. If those billion units are uniformly distributed over trillions of people whose lives are otherwise extremely satisfying and ecstatically happy, it is not easy to see a serious problem of evil. But if, on the other hand, the billion units of natural evil fell upon a single innocent person, and produced a life that was, throughout, one of extraordinarily intense pain, then surely there would be a very serious problem of evil.
Details concerning such things as how suffering and other evils are distributed over individuals, and the nature of those who undergo the evils, are, then, of crucial importance. Thus it is relevant, for example, that many innocent children suffer agonizing deaths. It is relevant that animals suffer, and that they did so before there were any persons to observe their suffering, and to feel sympathy for them. It is relevant that, on the one hand, the suffering that people undergo apparently bears no relation to the moral quality of their lives, and, on the other, that it bears a very clear relation to the wealth and medical knowledge of the societies in which they live.
The prospects for a successful abstract version of the argument from evil would seem, therefore, rather problematic. It is conceivable, of course, that the correct moral principles entail that there cannot be any evils whose actuality or possibility makes for a better world. But to attempt to set out a version of the argument from evil that requires a defense of that thesis is certainly to swim upstream. A much more promising approach, surely, is to focus, instead, simply upon those evils that are thought, by the vast majority of people, to pose at least a prima facie problem for the rationality of belief in an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.
Given that the preceding observations are rather obvious ones, one might have expected that discussions of the argument from evil would have centered mainly upon concrete formulations of the argument. Rather surprisingly, that has not been so. Indeed, some authors seem to focus almost exclusively upon very abstract versions of the argument.
One of the more striking illustrations of this phenomenon is provided by Alvin Plantinga's discussions of the problem of evil. In God and Other Minds, in The Nature of Necessity, and in God, Freedom, and Evil, for example, Plantinga, starting out from an examination of John L. Mackie's essay “Evil and Omnipotence” (1955), in which Mackie had defended an incompatibility version of the argument from evil, focuses mainly on the question of whether the existence of God is compatible with the existence of evil, although there are also short discussions of whether the existence of God is compatible with the existence of a given quantity of evil, and of whether the existence of a certain amount of evil renders the existence of God unlikely. (The latter topic is then the total focus of attention in his long article, “The Probabilistic Argument from Evil”.)
That Plantinga initially focused upon abstract formulations of the argument from evil was not, perhaps, surprising, given that a number of writers—including Mackie, H. J. McCloskey (1960), and H. D. Aiken (1957-58)—had defended incompatibility versions of the argument from evil, and it is natural to formulate such arguments in an abstract way, since although one may wish to distinguish, for example, between natural evils and moral evils, reference to concrete cases of evil would not seem to add anything. But once one shifts to probabilistic formulations of the argument from evil, the situation is very different: details about concrete cases of evil may be evidentially crucial.
The problem, then, is that Plantinga not only started out by focusing on very abstract versions of the argument from evil, but also maintained this focus throughout. The explanation of this may lie in the fact that Plantinga seems to have believed that if it can be shown that the existence of God is neither incompatible with, nor rendered improbable by, either (1) the mere existence of evil, or (2) the existence of a specified amount of evil, then no philosophical problem remains. People may find, of course, that they are still troubled by the existence of specific evils, but this, Plantinga seems to be believe, is a religious problem, and what is called for, he suggests, is not philosophical argument, but “pastoral care”. (1974a, 63-4)
Plantinga's view here, however, is very implausible. For not only can the argument from evil be formulated in terms of specific evils, but that is the natural way to do so, given that it is only certain types of evils that are generally viewed as raising a serious problem with respect to the rationality of belief in God. To concentrate exclusively on abstract versions of the argument from evil is therefore to ignore the most plausible and challenging versions of the argument.
Consider, now, the following formulation of the argument from evil, which, in contrast to the abstract version of the argument from evil set out in section 1.1, focuses on quite concrete types of evil:
- There exist states of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, and that (a) are intrinsically bad or undesirable, and (b) are such that any omnipotent person has the power to prevent them without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good.
- For any state of affairs (that is actual), the existence of that state of affairs is not prevented by anyone.
- For any state of affairs, and any person, if the state of affairs is intrinsically bad, and the person has the power to prevent that state of affairs without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good, but does not do so, then that person is not both omniscient and morally perfect.
Therefore, from (1), (2), and (3):
- There is no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.
- If God exists, then he is an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person.
- God does not exist.
As it stands, this argument is deductively valid. (Here is a proof.) However it is likely to be challenged in various ways. In particular, one vulnerable point is the claim, made in the last part of statement (1), that an omnipotent and omniscient person could have prevented those states of affairs without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good, and when this is challenged, an inductive step will presumably be introduced, one that moves from what we know about the undesirable states of affairs in question to a conclusion about the overall value of those states of affairs, all things considered—including things that may well lie outside our ken.
But the above argument is subject to a very different sort of criticism, one that is connected with a feature of the above argument which seems to me important, but which is not often commented upon—the fact, namely, that the above argument is formulated in terms of axiological concepts, that is, in terms of the goodness or badness, the desirability or undesirability, of states of affairs. The criticism that arises from this feature centers on statement (3), which asserts that an omniscient and morally perfect being would prevent the existence of any states of affairs that are intrinsically bad or undesirable, and whose prevention he could achieve without either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good. For one can ask how this claim is to be justified. One answer that might be offered would be that some form of consequentialism is true—such as, for example, the view that an action that fails to maximize the balance of good states of affairs over bad states of affairs is morally wrong. But the difficulty then is that any such assumption is likely to be a deeply controversial assumption that many theists would certainly reject.
The problem, in short, is that any axiological formulation of the argument from evil, as it stands, is incomplete in a crucial respect, since it fails to make explicit how a failure to bring about good states of affairs, or a failure to prevent bad states of affairs, entails that one is acting in a morally wrong way. Moreover, the natural way of removing this incompleteness is by appealing to what are in fact controversial ethical claims, such as the claim that the right action is the one that maximizes expected value. The result, in turn, is that discussions may very well become sidetracked on issues that are, in fact, not really crucial—such as, for example, the question of whether God would be morally blameworthy if he failed to create the best world that he could.
The alternative to an axiological formulation is a deontological formulation. Here the idea is that rather than employing concepts that focus upon the value or disvalue of states of affairs, one instead uses concepts that focus upon the rightness and wrongness of actions, and upon the properties—rightmaking properties and wrongmaking properties—that determine whether an action is one that ought to be performed, or ought not to be performed, other things being equal. When the argument is thus formulated, there is no problematic bridge that needs to be introduced connecting the goodness and badness of states of affairs with the rightness and wrongness of actions.
How is the argument from evil best formulated? As an incompatibility argument, or as an evidential argument? In section 1.1, an incompatibility formulation of a very abstract sort was set out, which appealed to the mere fact that the world contains at least some evil. That formulation involved the following crucial premise:
- If God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil.
The problem with that premise, as we saw, is that it can be argued that some evils are such that their actuality, or at least the possibility, is logically necessary for goods that outweigh them, in which case it is not true that a perfectly good being would want to eliminate such evils.
In section 1.4, a much more concrete version of an incompatibility argument was set out, which, rather than appealing to the mere existence of some evil or other, appealed to specific types of evil—in particular, situations where animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer. The thrust of the argument was then that, first of all, an omniscient and omnipotent person could have prevented the existence of such evils without thereby either allowing equal or greater evils, or preventing equal or greater goods, and, secondly, that any omniscient and morally perfect person will prevent the existence of such evils if that can be done without either allowing equal or greater evils, or preventing equal or greater goods.
The second of these claims avoids the objections that can be directed against the stronger claim that was involved in the argument set out in section 1.1—that is, the claim that if God is morally perfect, then God has the desire to eliminate all evil. But the shift to the more modest claim requires that one move from the very modest claim that evil exists to the stronger claim that there are certain evils that an omniscient and omnipotent person could have prevented the existence of such evils without thereby either allowing equal or greater evils, or preventing equal or greater goods, and the question arises as to how that claim can be supported. In particular, can it be established by means of a purely deductive argument?
Consider, in particular, the relevant premise in the more concrete version of the argument from evil set out in section 1.4, namely:
- There exist states of affairs in which animals die agonizing deaths in forest fires, or where children undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, and that (a) are intrinsically bad or undesirable, and (b) are such that any omnipotent person has the power to prevent them without thereby either allowing an equal or greater evil, or preventing an equal or greater good.
How would one go about establishing, via a purely deductive argument that a deer's suffering a slow and painful death because of a forest fire, or a child's undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, is not logically necessary either to achieve a greater good or to avoid a greater evil? If one had knowledge of the totality of morally relevant properties, then it might well be possible to show both that there are no greater evils that can be avoided only at the cost of the evil in question, and that there are no greater goods that are possible only given that evil. Do we have such knowledge? Some moral theorists would claim that we do, and that it is possible to set out a complete and correct moral theory. But this is certainly a highly controversial metaethical claim, and, as a consequence, the prospects for establishing a premise such as (1) via a deductive argument do not appear promising, given the present state of moral theory.
If a premise such as (1) cannot, at least at present, be established deductively, then the only possibility, it would seem, is to offer some sort of inductive argument in support of the relevant premise. But if this is right, then it is surely best to get that crucial inductive step out into the open, and thus to formulate the argument from evil not as a deductive argument for the very strong claim that it is logically impossible for both God and evil to exist, (or for God and certain types, or instances, of evil to exist), but as an evidential (inductive/probabilistic) argument for the more modest claim that there are evils that actually exist in the world that make it unlikely that God exists.
If the argument from evil is given an evidential formulation, what form should that take? There appear to be three main possibilities that have been suggested in recent discussions. The first, which might be called the direct inductive approach, involves the idea that one can show that theism is unlikely to be true without comparing theism with any alternative hypothesis, other than the mere denial of theism. The second, which can be labeled the indirect inductive approach, argues instead that theism can be shown to be unlikely to be true by establishing that there is some alternative hypothesis—other than the mere negation of theism—that is logically incompatible with theism, and more probable than theism. Finally, the third possibility, which might be referred to as a probabilistic or Bayesian approach, starts out from probabilistic premises, and then attempts to show that it follows deductively, via axioms of probability theory, that it is unlikely that God exists.
The first and the third approaches are found, for example, in articles by William Rowe, while the second approach has been set out and defended by Paul Draper. These three approaches will be considered in the sections that follow.
3.2.1 A Concrete, Deontological, and Direct Inductive Formulation
The basic idea behind a direct inductive formulation of the argument from evil is that the argument involves a crucial inductive step that takes the form of an inductive projection or generalization in which one moves from a premise concerning the known moral properties of some state of affairs to a conclusion about the likely overall moral worth of that state of affairs, given all its moral properties, both known and unknown.
Such a direct inductive argument might, for example, take the following form:
- Both the property of intentionally allowing an animal to die an agonizing death in a forest fire, and the property of allowing a child to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, are wrongmaking characteristics of an action, and very serious ones.
- Our world contains animals that die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children who undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer.
- An omnipotent being could prevent such events, if he knew that those events were about to occur.
- An omniscient being would know that such events were about to occur.
- If a being allows something to take place that he knows is about to happen, and which he knows he could prevent, then that being intentionally allows the event in question to occur.
- If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then there are cases where he intentionally allows animals to die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer.
- In many such cases, no rightmaking characteristics that we are aware of both apply to the case in question, and also are sufficiently serious to counterbalance the relevant wrongmaking characteristic.
- If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then there are specific cases of such a being's intentionally allowing animals to die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, that have wrongmaking properties such that there are no rightmaking characteristics that we are aware of that both apply to the cases in question, and that are also sufficiently serious to counterbalance the relevant wrongmaking characteristics.
Therefore it is likely that:
- If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then there are specific cases of such a being's intentionally allowing animals to die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, that have wrongmaking properties such that there are no rightmaking characteristics—including ones that we are not aware of—that both apply to the cases in question, and that are also sufficiently serious to counterbalance the relevant wrongmaking characteristics.
- An action is morally wrong, all things considered, if it has a wrongmaking characteristic that is not counterbalanced by any rightmaking characteristics.
- If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then there are specific cases of such a being's intentionally allowing animals to die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, that are morally wrong, all things considered.
- If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then that being both intentionally refrains from performing certain actions in situations where it is morally wrong to do so, all things considered, and knows that he is doing so.
- A being who intentionally refrains from performing certain actions in situations where it is morally wrong to do so, all things considered, and knows that he is doing so, is not morally perfect.
- If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then that being is not morally perfect.
- There is no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being.
- If God exists, then he is, by definition, an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being.
- God does not exist.
When the argument from evil is formulated in this way, it involves nine premises, set out at steps (1), (2), (3), (4), (5), (7), (10), (13), and (16). Statement (1) makes a moral claim, but one that, setting aside the question of the existence of objective values, is surely very plausible. Statement (2) makes an empirical claim, and one that is surely true. Statements (3) and (4) are true by virtue of the concepts of omnipotence and omniscience, together with the nature of the events in question, while statement (5) is true by virtue of the concept of intentional action. Statement (7) follows from the relevant facts about the world, together with facts about the moral knowledge that we possess. Statement (10) obtains by virtue of the concepts of rightmaking and wrongmaking characteristics, together with the concept of an action's being wrong, all things considered. Statement (13) follows from the concept of moral perfection, while statement (16) simply states what is involved in the concept of God that is relevant here. So all of the premises seem fine.
As regards the logic of the argument, all of the steps are deductive except for one—namely, the non-deductive move from (8) to (9). The deductive inferences, however, are all valid. The argument stands or falls, accordingly, with the inference from (8) to (9). The crucial questions, accordingly, are, first, exactly what the form of that inductive inference is, and, secondly, whether it is sound.
3.2.2 A Natural Account of the Logic of the Inductive Step
A familiar and very common sort of inductive inference involves moving from information to the effect that all observed things of a certain type have a certain property to the conclusion that absolutely all things of the type in question have the relevant property. Could the inductive step in the evidential argument from evil perhaps be of that form?
One philosopher who has suggested that this is the case is William Rowe, in his 1991 article, “Ruminations about Evil”. Let us consider, then, whether that view can be sustained.
In that article, Rowe formulates the premise of the crucial inference as follows:
(P) No good state of affairs that we know of is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being's obtaining it would morally justify that being's permitting E1 or E2.
(Here E1 refers to a case of a fawn who dies in lingering and terrible fashion as a result of a forest fire, and E2 to the case of a young girl who is brutally raped, beaten, and murdered.)
Commenting on P, Rowe emphasizes that what proposition P says is not simply that we cannot see how various goods would justify an omnipotent, omniscient being's permitting E1 or E2, but rather,
The good states of affairs I know of, when I reflect on them, meet one or both of the following conditions: either an omnipotent being could obtain them without having to permit either E1 or E2, or obtaining them wouldn't morally justify that being in permitting E1 or E2. (1991, 72)
Rowe then goes on to say that:
… if this is so, I have reason to conclude that:(Q) No good state of affairs is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being's obtaining it would morally justify that being's permitting E1 or E2.(1991, 72)
Rowe uses the letter ‘J’ “to stand for the property a good has just in case obtaining that good would justify an omnipotent, omniscient being in permitting E1 or E2” (1991, 73). When this is done, the above inference can be compactly represented as follows:
(P) No good that we know of has J.
(Q) No good has J.
Rowe next refers to Plantinga's criticism of this inference, and he argues that Plantinga's criticism now amounts to the claim that
we are justified in inferring Q (No good has J) from P (No good we know of has J) only if we have a good reason to think that if there were a good that has J it would be a good that we are acquainted with and could see to have J. For the question can be raised: How can we have confidence in this inference unless we have a good reason to think that were a good to have J it would likely be a good within our ken? (1991, 73)
Rowe's response is then as follows:
My answer is that we are justified in making this inference in the same way we are justified in making the many inferences we constantly make from the known to the unknown. All of us are constantly inferring from the As we know of to the As we don't know of. If we observe many As and note that all of them are Bs we are justified in believing that the As we haven't observed are also Bs. Of course, these inferences may be defeated. We may find some independent reason to think that if an A were a B it would likely not be among the As we have observed. But to claim that we cannot be justified in making such inferences unless we already know, or have good reason to believe, that were an A not to be a B it would likely be among the As we've observed is simply to encourage radical skepticism concerning inductive reasoning in general. (1991, 73)
Finally, Rowe points out that:
… in considering the inference from P to Q it is very important to distinguish two criticisms:
- One is entitled to infer Q from P only if she has a good reason to think that if some good had J it would be a good that she knows of.
- One is entitled to infer Q from P only if she has no reason to think that if some good had J it would likely not be a good that she knows of.
Plantinga's criticism is of type A. For the reason given, it is not a cogent criticism. But a criticism of type B is entirely proper to advance against any inductive inference of the sort we are considering. (1991, 73-4)
In view of the last point, Rowe concludes that “one important route for the theist to explore is whether there is some reason to think that were a good to have J it either would not be a good within our ken or would be such that although we apprehend this good we are incapable of determining that it has J.” (1991, 74)
3.2.3 An Evaluation of this Account of the Inductive Step
First, Rowe is right that a criticism of type A does involve “radical skepticism of inductive reasoning in general”. But, secondly, having granted that point, how satisfactory is Rowe's account of the reasoning involved? To answer that question, what one needs to notice is that Rowe's claim that “if we observe many As and note that all of them are Bs we are justified in believing that the As we haven't observed are also Bs” is somewhat ambiguous, since while the claim that “we are justified in believing that the As we haven't observed are also Bs” might naturally be interpreted as saying
- We are justified in believing that all the As that we haven't observed are also Bs
it is possible to construe it as making, instead, the following, much weaker claim
- We are justified in believing of each of the As that we haven't observed that that A is also a B.
Let us consider, then, the relevance of this distinction. On the one hand, Rowe is certainly right that any criticism that claims that one is not justified in inferring (2) unless one has additional information to the effect that unobserved As are not likely to differ from observed As with respect to the possession of property B entails inductive skepticism. But, by contrast, it is not true that this is so if one rejects, instead, the inference to (1).
This is important, moreover, because it is (1) that Rowe needs, since the conclusion that he is drawing does not concern simply the next morally relevant property that someone might consider: conclusion Q asserts, rather, that all further morally relevant properties will lack property J. Such a conclusion about all further cases is much stronger than a conclusion about the next case, and one might well think that in some circumstances a conclusion of the latter sort is justified, but that a conclusion of the former sort is not.
One way of supporting the latter claim is by arguing (Tooley, 1977, 690-3, and 1987, 129-37) that when one is dealing with an accidental generalization, the probability that the regularity in question will obtain gets closer and closer to zero, without limit, as the number of potential instances gets larger and larger, and that this is so regardless of how large one's evidence base is. Is it impossible, then, to justify universal generalizations? The answer is that if laws are more than mere regularities—and, in particular, if they are second-order relations between universals—then the obtaining of a law, and thus of the corresponding regularity, may have a very high probability upon even quite a small body of evidence. So universal generalizations can be justified, if they obtain in virtue of underlying laws.
The question then becomes whether Q expresses a law—or a consequence of a law. If—as seems plausible—it does not, then, although it is true that one in justified in holding, of any given, not yet observed morally relevant property, that it is unlikely to have property J, it may not be the case that it is probable that no goodmaking (or rightmaking) property has property J. It may, on the contrary, be probable that there is some morally relevant property that does have property J.
This objection could be overcome if one could argue that it is unlikely that there are many unknown goodmaking properties. For if the number is small, then the probability of Q may still be high even if Q does not express a law, or a consequence of a law. Moreover, I am inclined to think that it may well be possible to argue that it is unlikely that there are many unknown, morally relevant properties. But I also think that it is very likely that any attempt to establish this conclusion would involve some controversial metaethical claims. As a consequence, such a line of argument does not seem especially promising, given the present state of metaethics.
In his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, Hume contended that it was not possible to arrive at the conclusion that the world had a perfectly good cause—or a perfectly evil one—starting out simply from a world that consists of a mixture of good and bad states of affairs:
There may four hypotheses be framed concerning the first causes of the universe: that they are endowed with perfect goodness, that they are endowed with perfect malice, that they are opposite and have both goodness and malice, that they have neither goodness nor malice. Mixed phenomena can never prove the two former unmixed principles. And the uniformity and steadiness of general laws seems to oppose the third. The fourth, therefore, seems be far the most probable. (1779, Part XI, 212)
But if this is right, and the hypothesis that the first cause (or causes) of the universe is neither good nor evil is more probable than the hypothesis that the first cause is perfectly good, then the probability of the latter must be less than one half.
Hume advanced, then, an evidential argument from evil that has a distinctly different logical form than that involved in direct inductive arguments, for the idea is to point to some proposition that is logically incompatible with theism, and then to argue that, given facts about undesirable states of affairs to be found in the world, that hypothesis is more probable than theism, and, therefore, that theism is more likely to be false than to be true.
More than two centuries later, Paul Draper, inspired by Hume, set out and defended this type of indirect inductive argument in a very detailed way. In doing so, Draper focused upon two alternative hypotheses, the first of which he referred to as “the Hypothesis of Indifference,” and which was as follows (1989, 13):
(HI) neither the nature nor the condition of sentient beings on earth is the result of benevolent or malevolent actions performed by nonhuman persons.
Draper then focused upon three sets of propositions about occurrences of pleasure and pain, dealing, respectively, with (a) the experience of pleasure and pain, by moral agents, which is known to be biologically useful, (b) the experience of pleasure and pain, by sentient beings that are not moral agents, which is known to be biologically useful, and (c) the experience of pleasure and pain, by sentient beings, which is not known to be biologically useful, and Draper then argued that, where ‘O’ expresses the conjunction of all those propositions, and ‘T’ expresses the proposition that God exists, then the probability that O is the case given HI is greater than the probability of O given T. It then follows, provided that the initial probability of T is no greater than that of HI, that T is more likely to be false than to be true.
In slightly more detail, and using ‘Pr(P/Q)’ to stand either for the logical probability, or for the epistemic probability, of P given Q, the logic of the argument is as follows:
|(1)||Pr(O/HI) > Pr(O/T)||(Substantive premise)|
|(2)||Pr(O/HI) = Pr(O & HI)/Pr(HI)||(Definition of conditional probability)|
|(3)||Pr(O & HI)/Pr(HI) > Pr(O/T)||(From (1) and (2).)|
|(4)||Pr(O/T) = Pr(O & T)/Pr(T)||(Definition of conditional probability)|
|(5)||Pr(O & HI)/Pr(HI) > Pr(O & T)/Pr(T)||(From (3) and (4).)|
|(6)||Pr(O & HI) = Pr(HI/O) × Pr(O)||(From the definition of conditional probability)|
|(7)||Pr(O & HI)/Pr(HI) = Pr(HI/O) × Pr(O)/Pr(HI)||(From (6).)|
|(8)||Pr(HI/O) × Pr(O)/Pr(HI) > Pr(O & T)/Pr(T)||(From (5) and (7).)|
|(9)||Pr(O & T) = Pr(T/O) × Pr(O)||(From the definition of conditional probability)|
|(10)||Pr(O & T)/Pr(T) = Pr(T/O) × Pr(O)/Pr(T)||(From (9).)|
|(11)||Pr(HI/O) × Pr(O)/Pr(HI) > Pr(T/O) × Pr(O)/Pr(T)||(From (8) and (10).)|
|(12)||Pr(O/T) ≥ 0||(Axiom of probability theory)|
|(13)||Pr(O/HI) > 0||(From (1) and (12).)|
|(14)||Pr(HI) > 0,||(Substantive premise)|
|(15)||Pr(OI/HI) × Pr(HI) = Pr(O & HI) = Pr(HI/O) × Pr(O)||(From the definition of conditional probability)|
|(16)||Pr(O) > 0,||(From (13), (14) and (15).)|
so that Pr(HI)/Pr(O) is defined. Therefore, we can multiply both sides of (11) by Pr(HI)/Pr(O) which gives:
|(17)||Pr(HI/O) > Pr(T/O) × Pr(HI)/Pr(T)|
|(18)||HI entails ~T||(Substantive premise)|
|(19)||Pr(~T/O) ≥ Pr(HI/O)||(From (18).)|
|(20)||Pr(~T/O) > Pr(T/O) × Pr(HI)/Pr(T)||(From (17) and (19).)|
|(21)||Pr(HI) ≥ Pr(T)||(Substantive premise)|
|(22)||Pr(~T/O) > Pr(T/O)||(From (20) and (21).)|
|(23)||O entails [(T & O) or (~T & O)] and [(T & O) or (~T & O)] entails O||(Logical truth)|
|(24)||Pr(T & O) + Pr(~T & O) = Pr(O)||(From (23).)|
Then, in view of (16), we can divide both sides of (24) by Pr(O), which gives us:
|(25)||Pr(T & O)/Pr(O) + Pr(~T & O)/Pr(O) = Pr(O)/Pr(O) = 1|
|(26)||Pr(T/O) + Pr(~T/O) = 1||(From (25).)|
|(27)||Pr(T) < 0.5||(From (22) and (26).)|
There are various points at which this argument might be criticized. First, it might be argued that the substantive premise introduced at (18) is not obviously true. For might it not be logically possible that there was an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being who created a neutral environment in which evolution could take place in a chancy way, and who afterwards did not intervene in any way? But, if so, then while T would be true, HI might also be true—as it would be if there were no other nonhuman persons. So, at the very least, it is not clear that HI entails ~T.
Secondly, the substantive premise introduced at (21) also seems problematic. Draper supports it be arguing that whereas the hypothesis of theism involves some ontological commitment, the Hypothesis of Indifference does not. But, on the other hand, the latter involves a completely universal generalization about the absence of any action upon the earth by any nonhuman persons, of either a benevolent or malevolent sort, and it is far from clear why the prior probability of this being so should be greater than the prior probability of theism.
Both of these objections can be avoided, however, by simply shifting from HI to a different alternative hypothesis that Draper also mentions, namely, “The Indifferent Deity Hypothesis”:
There exists an omnipotent and omniscient person who created the Universe and who has no intrinsic concern about the pain or pleasure of other beings. (1989, 26)
Thirdly, it can be objected that the argument does not really move far beyond two of its three crucial assumptions—the assumptions set out, namely, at steps (18) and (21), to the effect that HI entails ~T, and Pr(HI) ≥ Pr(T). For given those assumptions, it follows immediately that Pr(T) ≤ 0.5, and so the rest of the argument merely moves from that conclusion to the conclusion that Pr(T) < 0.5.
One response to this objection is that the move from Pr(T) ≤ 0.5 to Pr(T) < 0.5 is not insignificant, since it is a move from a situation in which acceptance of theism may not be irrational to one where it is certainly is. Nevertheless, the objection does bring out an important point, namely, that the argument as it stands says nothing at all about how much below 0.5 the probability of theism is. This could be remedied, however, by shifting to a quantitative version of a Draper-style argument. In particular, one can replace (1) above by:
(1+) Pr(O/HI) = Pr(O/T) + k.
One can then derive the following conclusion:
(*) Pr(T) < 0.5 − k × Pr(HI)/2 × Pr(O)
(Here is the derivation.) Then, provided that one can estimate k, Pr(HI), and Pr(O), one will be able to determine a lower bound for the amount that Pr(T) is less than 0.5.
Fourthly, objections can be directed at the arguments that Draper offers in support of a third substantive premise—namely, that introduced at (1). Some of the objections directed against this premise are less than impressive—and some seem quite desperate, as in the case, for example, of Peter van Inwagen, who has to appeal to quite an extraordinary claim about the conditions that one must satisfy in order to claim that a world is logically possible:
One should start by describing in some detail the laws of nature that govern that world. (Physicists' actual formulations of quantum field theories and the general theory of relativity provide the standard of required “detail.”) One should then go on to describe the boundary conditions under which those laws operate; the topology of the world's space-time, its relativistic mass, the number of particle families, and so on. Then one should tell in convincing detail the story of cosmic evolution in that world: the story of the development of large objects like galaxies and of stars and of small objects like carbon atoms. Finally, one should tell the story of the evolution of life. (1991, 146)
Such objections tend to suggest that any flaws in Draper's argument in support of the crucial premise are less than obvious. Nevertheless, given that the argument that Draper offers in support of the premise at (1) involves a number of detailed considerations, very careful scrutiny of those arguments would be needed before one could conclude that the premise is justified.
Finally, rather than attacking the argument itself, one might instead argue that, while it is sound, the conclusion is not really a significant one. For what matters is not whether there is some evidence relative to which it is unlikely that theism is true. What matters is whether theism is improbable relative to our total evidence. But, then, suppose that we introduce some different observations—O*—such that it seems plausible that O* is more likely to be the case if theism is true that if the Hypothesis of Indifference is true. For example, O* might be some proposition about the occurrences of experiences that seem to be experiences of a loving deity. The question then is whether the appropriate revision of the first substantive premise is plausible. That is, do we have good reason for thinking that the following statement is true:
(1&) Pr(O & O*/HI) > Pr(O & O*/T) ?
At the very least, it would seem that (1&) is much more problematic than (1). But if that is right, then the above, Draper-style argument, even if all of its premises are true, is not as significant as it may initially appear, since if (1&) is not true, the conclusion that theism is more likely to be false than to be true can be undercut by introducing additional evidence of a pro-theist sort.
A Draper-style argument is one type of indirect inductive argument from evil. It is important to notice, however, that in formulating an indirect inductive argument from evil, one need not proceed along the route that Draper chooses. This is clear if one focuses upon Hume's formulation, and then thinks in terms of the idea of an inference to the best explanation of the “mixed phenomena” that one finds. If one explains the fact that the world contains an impressive mixture of desirable and undesirable states of affairs by the hypothesis that the creator of the world was an omnipotent, omniscient, and indifferent deity, then nothing more needs to be added. By contrast, if one wants to explain the mixed state of the world by the hypothesis that the creator of the world was an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect deity, one needs to postulate the existence of additional, morally significant properties that lie beyond our ken, and ones, moreover, that are so distributed that the mixed appearance does not correspond to what is really the case. A theistic explanation is, accordingly, less simple than an indifferent deity explanation, and therefore, provided that one can argue that the a priori probability of the latter hypothesis is not less than that of the former, one can appeal to the greater simplicity of the latter in order to conclude that it has a higher posterior probability than the theistic hypothesis. It then follows, given that the two hypotheses are logically incompatible, that the probability of the theistic hypothesis must be less than one half.
In his 1996 paper, “The Evidential Argument from Evil: A Second Look”, Rowe set aside the problem of attempting to find a satisfactory account of the inductive step involved in direct, inductive formulations of the argument from evil in favor of a very different, Bayesian formulation of the argument from evil. The latter argument has been vigorously criticized by Plantinga (1998), but Rowe (1998) has remained confident that the new argument is sound.
3.4.1 A Summary of Rowe's Bayesian Argument
Rowe's new argument can be summarized as follows. First, its formulation involves only three propositions—namely, proposition k, which expresses, roughly, the totality of our background knowledge, together with the following two additional propositions:
(P) No good that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting E1 and E2;
(G) There is an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being.
Secondly, the object of the argument as a whole is to start out from some probabilistic assumptions, and then to move deductively, using only axioms of probability theory, to the following two conclusions:
(C1) Pr(G/P & k) < Pr(G/k)
(C2) Pr(G/P & k) < 0.5.
The first conclusion, then, is that the probability that God exists is lower given the combination of P together with our background knowledge than it is given our background knowledge alone. Thus P disconfirms G in the sense of lowering the probability of G. The second conclusion is that P disconfirms G in a different sense—namely, it, together with our background knowledge, makes it more likely than not that G is false.
Thirdly, in order to establish the first conclusion, Rowe needs only the following three assumptions:
(1) Pr(P/~G & k) = 1
(2) Pr(~G/k) > 0
(3) Pr(P/G & k) < 1
Fourthly, all three assumptions are surely eminently reasonable. As regards (1), it follows from the fact that for any two propositions q and r, if q entails r then Pr(r/q) = 1, together with the fact that Rowe interprets P in such a way that ~G entails P, since he interprets P as saying that it is not the case that there is an omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good being together with some known good that justifies that being in allowing E1 and E2. As regards (2) and (3), it certainly seems plausible that there is at least some non-zero probability that God does not exist, given our background knowledge—here one is assuming that the existence of God is not logically necessary—and also some non-zero probability that no good that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting E1 and E2. Moreover, if the existence of God is neither a logically necessary truth nor entailed by our background knowledge, and if the existence of God together with our background knowledge does not logically entail that no good that we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting E1 and E2, then one can support (2) and (3) by appealing to the very plausible principle that the probability of r given q is equal to one if and only if q entails r.
Finally, to establish the second conclusion—that is, that relative to our background knowledge together with proposition P it is more likely than not that God does not exist—Rowe needs only one additional assumption:
(4) Pr(G/k) ≤ 0.5
3.4.2 The Flaw in the Argument
Given the plausibility of assumptions (1), (2), and (3), together with the impeccable logic, the prospects of faulting Rowe's argument for his first conclusion may not seem at all promising. Nor does the situation seem significantly different in the case of Rowe's second conclusion, given that assumption (4) is also very plausible.
In fact, however, Rowe's argument is unsound. The reason is connected with the point that while inductive arguments can fail, just as deductive arguments can, either because their logic is faulty, or their premises false, inductive arguments can also fail in a way that deductive arguments cannot, in that they may violate a principle—namely, the Total Evidence Requirement—which I shall be setting out below, and Rowe's argument is defective in precisely that way.
Let us begin, then, by considering the following, preliminary objection to Rowe's argument for the conclusion that
Pr(G/P & k) < 0.5.
The objection is based on upon the observation that Rowe's argument involves, as we saw above, only the following four premises:
(1) Pr(P/~G & k) = 1
(2) Pr(~G/k) > 0
(3) Pr(P/G & k) < 1
(4) Pr(G/k) ≤ 0.5
Notice now, first, that the proposition P enters only into the first and the third of these premises, and secondly, that the truth of both of these premises is easily secured. Thus, for the first premise to be true, all that is needed is that ~G entails P, while for the third premise to be true, all that is needed, according to most systems of inductive logic, is that P is not entailed by G & k.
Consider, now, what happens if, for example, Rowe's P is replaced by:
Either God does not exist, or there is a pen in my pocket.
Statements (1) and (3) will both be true given that replacement, while statements (2) and (4) are unaffected, and one will be able to derive the same conclusions as in Rowe's Bayesian argument. But if this is so, then the theist can surely claim, it would seem, that the fact that Rowe's ‘P’ refers to evil in the world turns out to play no crucial role in Rowe's new argument!
This objection, however, is open to the following reply. The reason that I am justified in believing the proposition that either God does not exist or there is a pen in my pocket is that I am justified in believing that there is a pen in my pocket. The proposition that either God does not exist or there is a pen in my pocket therefore does not represent the total evidence that I have. But the argument cannot be set out in terms of the proposition that does represent one's total evidence—namely, the proposition that there is a pen in my pocket—since that proposition is not entailed by ~G.
The conclusion, in short, is that the above parody of Rowe's argument doesn't work, since the parody violates the following requirement:
The Total Evidence Requirement:
For any proposition that is not non-inferentially justified, the probability that one should assign to that proposition's being true is the probability that the proposition has relative to one's total evidence.
But this response to the above objection to the argument for the conclusion that
Pr(G/P & k) < 0.5
now makes it clear that there a decisive objection to the argument as a whole. For notice that if P—the statement that
No good we know of justifies an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being in permitting E1 and E2
—is interpreted in such a way that ~G entails P, it is then logically equivalent to the following disjunctive statement:
~G or P*
where P* is the proposition that Rowe sets out in footnote 8 of his article, namely:
No good we know of would justify God, (if he exists) in permitting E1 and E2 (1996, 283)
Once this is noticed, it is clear that Rowe's argument is open to precisely the same response as that used against the objection to the parody argument just considered, since the justification that one can offer for ~G or P* is in fact just a justification of the second disjunct—that is, P*. This means that in appealing to P (i.e., to (~G) or P*) one is not making use of one's total evidence. So Rowe's argument, if it is to be sound, must instead be formulated in terms of P*.
But while ~G entails P, it does not entail P*. So the result of replacing ‘P’ by ‘P*’ in statement (1)—that is
(1*) Pr(P*/~G & k) = 1
—will not be true, and so an argument of the form that Rowe offers will not go through. Rowe's Bayesian argument is, therefore, unsound.
3.4.3 Can Rowe's Argument Be Revised?
Plantinga has made essentially the same point in terms of the idea of “degenerate evidence”. Rowe has responded to Plantinga by arguing that the parodies that Plantinga offers to show that Rowe's argument must be unsound are not “precisely parallel” arguments. In particular, and putting things in terms of the propositions used above, Rowe's point is that while the proposition that there is a pen in my pocket is evidentially irrelevant to the proposition that God exists, the proposition that no good we know of would justify God, (if he exists) in permitting E1 and E2 is “evidentially very relevant to the question of whether God exists.” (1998, 550)
This observation is certainly correct. But how does it help? It does not do so by showing that Rowe's argument, as it stands, is sound after all. For if an argument from premises (1), (2), (3), and (4) is sound, then the corresponding, parody argument must also be sound, since the corresponding premises are equally true. But Rowe's thought may be that the difference to which he has pointed shows that one can add a further assumption, and one that will not be true in the case of the parodies that Plantinga and I have offered. In particular, one can add the following assumption:
(5) Pr(P*/~G & k) > Pr(P*/G & k).
Then, as Luc Bovens has pointed out, one can offer a revised Bayesian formulation of the argument from evil. For example, one can argue as follows:
|1.||Pr(P*/~G & k) = Pr(P* & ~G/k)/Pr(~G & k)|
|2.||Pr(P*/G & k) = Pr(P* & G/k)/Pr(G & k)|
|3.||Pr(P*/~G & k) > Pr(P*/G & k)||[Assumption (5)]|
|4.||Pr(P* & ~G/k)/Pr(~G & k) > Pr(P* & G/k)/Pr(G & k)||[From 1, 2, and 3]|
|5.||Pr(~G/P* & k) = Pr(~G & P*/k)/Pr(P* & k)|
|6.||Pr(G/P* & k) = Pr(G & P*/k)/Pr(P* & k)|
|7.||Pr(~G/P* & k)/Pr(~G & k) > Pr(G/P* & k)/Pr(G & k)||[From 4, 5, 6, and 7]|
|8.||Pr(G/k) ≤ 0.5||[Assumption (4)]|
|9.||Pr(~G/k) > Pr(G/k)||[From 8]|
|10.||Pr(~G/P* & k) > Pr(G/P* & k)||[From 7 and 9]|
But now the problem is that assumption (5), in contrast to assumptions (1), (2), (3), and (4), is a deeply controversial claim. For while it is true that if God does not exist, then evils such as E1 and E2, which are not justified by any good that we know of, will in all probability arise by the operation of morally blind laws of nature, it might be argued that, even if God does exist, evils such as E1 and E2 may very well arise, either because it is good if events happen in a generally regular way, or even because God will sometimes facilitate the occurrence of events such as E1 and E2, for the sake of some greater good that we have no knowledge of. So it is not at all easy to see why assumption (5) is justified,
In addition, however, any plausibility that assumption (5) has appears to be in virtue of the relation between G and proposition Q—that is, the proposition that no good state of affairs is such that an omnipotent, omniscient being's obtaining it would morally justify that being's permitting E1 or E2. For in asking how likely P* is given, on the one hand, G, and, on the other hand, ~G, is it not likely that one will make use of the fact that if G is true, then ~Q is true, while if ~G is true, then Q is, at least, very, very likely? But if one does make use of these connections in thinking about (5), then it would seem that (5) cannot be plausible unless the proposition that results from (5) when one replaces ‘G’ by ‘~Q’, is also plausible—that is,
(5*) Pr(P*/Q & k) > Pr(P*/~Q & k).
But now consider:
(4*) Pr(~Q/k) ≤ 0.5.
Assumption (4*) does not seem any less plausible than assumption (4). But it, together with (5*), will enable one to parallel the modified Bayesian argument just set out, and arrive at the following conclusion:
Pr(Q/P* & k) > Pr(~Q/P* & k)
The latter, however, would serve to justify the inductive step from P to Q in the argument from evil. So given the apparent plausibility of (4*), any grounds that one has for questioning the inductive step in the earlier, non-Bayesian versions of the argument are likely to translate into grounds for questioning, first of all, proposition (5*), and secondly, the closely connected proposition (5).
The upshot is that if one tries to avoid the objection that Rowe's original Bayesian argument violates the total evidence requirement by shifting to a modified argument that involves assumption (5), one is faced both with the problem of showing why (5) is plausible, and, even more seriously, with the objection that assumption (5) is tantamount to the assumption that the inductive step involved in direct inductive formulations of the argument is sound. The revised argument therefore begs, in effect, the crucial question.
In section 3.2.1, a concrete, deontological, and direct inductive formulation of the argument from evil was set out. All of the steps in that argument were deductive, except for the following inference:
(8) If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then there are specific cases of such a being's intentionally allowing animals to die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, that have wrongmaking properties such that there are no rightmaking characteristics that we are aware of that both apply to the cases in question, and that are also sufficiently serious to counterbalance the relevant wrongmaking characteristics.
Therefore it is likely that:
(9) If there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then there are specific cases of such a being's intentionally allowing animals to die agonizing deaths in forest fires, and children to undergo lingering suffering and eventual death due to cancer, that have wrongmaking properties such that there are no rightmaking characteristics—including ones that we are not aware of—that both apply to the cases in question, and that are also sufficiently serious to counterbalance the relevant wrongmaking characteristics.
The question, accordingly, is whether this inductive step is correct.
The answer, I believe, is that it is. To demonstrate this requires a rather technical argument in inductive logic. But one can gain an intuitive understanding of the underlying idea in the following way. Suppose that there is a rightmaking property of which we have no knowledge. If an action of allowing a child to be brutally killed possessed that property, then it might not be wrong to allow that action, depending upon the weightiness of that unknown rightmaking property. But the existence of unknown rightmaking properties is no more likely, a priori, than of unknown wrongmaking properties. So let us suppose, then, for this illustration, that there are two morally significant properties of which we humans have no knowledge—a rightmaking property, R, and a wrongmaking property W. Let us suppose, further, that these two properties are equally weighty, since, a priori, there is no reason for supposing that one is more significant than the other. Finally, let A be an action of knowingly allowing a child to be brutally killed, and let us suppose that the unknown morally significant rightmaking property R is weightier than the wrongmaking property of knowingly allowing a child to be brutally killed. We can then see that there are four possibilities:
(1) Action A has both unknown properties, R and W. In this case, those two unknown properties cancel one another out, and action A will be morally wrong, all things considered.
(2) Action A has the unknown rightmaking property, R, but not the unknown wrongmaking property, W. In this case, action A may be morally permissible, all things considered, if property R is sufficiently strong to outweigh the known wrongmaking property of allowing a child to be brutally killed.
(3) Action A has the unknown wrongmaking property, W, but not the unknown rightmaking property, R. In this case, action A is even more wrong, all things considered, than it initially appeared to be.
(4) Action A does not have either of the unknown, morally significant properties, R and W. In this case action A is morally wrong to precisely the degree that it initially appeared to be.
The upshot is that in this simplified example, at least three of the four possibilities that we have considered, action A turns out to be morally wrong, all things considered. But what is the situation in general? To answer that question requires a rather lengthy argument in inductive logic. But if one undertakes that task, what is the result? The answer is that if one considers a single action that is morally wrong as judged by the moral knowledge that we possess, then the probability that that action is not morally wrong, all things considered, can be shown to be less than one half. If one considers two actions that are morally wrong as judged by the moral knowledge that we possess, then the probability that neither action is morally wrong, all things considered, can be shown to be less than one third. More generally, one can establish the following result: Suppose that there are n events, each of which, judged by known rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, is such that it would be morally wrong to allow that event. Then, the probability that, judged in the light of all rightmaking and wrongmaking properties, known and unknown, it would not be morally wrong to allow any of those events, must be less than 1/(n + 1).
The upshot is that the probabilistic inference that is involved in the move from statement (8) to statement (9) is inductively sound.
Given either a direct or indirect inductive formulation of the argument from evil, what sorts of responses are possible? A useful way of dividing up possible responses is into what may be referred to as total refutations, defenses, and theodicies. This classification is based upon the following line of thought. The advocate of the argument from evil is claiming, in the first place, that there are facts about evil in the world that make it prima facie unreasonable to believe in the existence of God, and, in the second place, that the situation is not altered when those facts are conjoined with all the other things that one is justified in believing, both inferentially and non-inferentially, so that belief in the existence of God is also unreasonable relative to the total evidence available, together with all relevant basis states. In responding to the argument from evil, then, one might challenge either of these claims. That is to say, one might grant, at least for the sake of argument, that there are facts about evil that, other things being equal, render belief in God unreasonable, but then argue that when those considerations are embedded within one's total epistemic situation, belief in the existence of God can be seen to be reasonable, all things considered. Alternatively, one might defend the more radical thesis that there are no facts about evil in the world that make it even prima facie unreasonable to believe in the existence of God.
If the latter thesis is correct, the argument from evil does not even get started. Such responses to the argument from evil are naturally classified, therefore, as attempted, total refutations of the argument.
The proposition that relevant facts about evil do not make it even prima facie unreasonable to believe in the existence of God probably strikes most philosophers, of course, as rather implausible. We shall see, nevertheless, that a number of philosophical theists have attempted to defend this type of response to the argument from evil.
The alternative course is to grant that there are facts about intrinsically undesirable states of the world that make it prima facie unreasonable to believe that God exists, but then to argue that belief in the existence of God is not unreasonable, all things considered. This response may take, however, two slightly different forms. One possibility is the offering of a complete theodicy. As I shall use that term, this involves, first of all, describing, for every actual evil found in the world, some state of affairs that it is reasonable to believe exists, and which is such that, if it exists, will provide an omnipotent and omniscient being with a morally sufficient reason for allowing the evil in question; and secondly, establishing that it is reasonable to believe that all evils, taken collectively, are thus justified.
It should be noted here that the term “theodicy” is sometimes used in a stronger sense, according to which one who offers a theodicy is attempting to show not only that such morally sufficient reasons exist, but that the reasons cited are in fact God's reasons. Alvin Plantinga (1974a, 10; 1985a, 35) and Robert Adams (1985, 242) use the term in that way, but, as has been pointed out by a number of writers, including Richard Swinburne (1988, 298), and William Hasker (1988, 5), that is to saddle the theodicist with an unnecessarily ambitious program.
The other possibility is that of offering a defense. But what is a defense? In the context of abstract, incompatibility versions of the argument from evil, this term is generally used to refer to attempts to show that there is no logical incompatibility between the existence of evil and the existence of God. Such attempts involve setting out a story that entails the existence of both God and evil, and that is logically consistent. But as soon as one focuses upon evidential formulations of the argument from evil, a different interpretation is needed if the term is to remain a useful one, since the production of a logically consistent story that involves the existence of both God and evil will do nothing to show that evil does not render the existence of God unlikely, or even very unlikely.
So what more is required beyond a logically consistent story of a certain sort? One answer that is suggested by some discussions is that the story needs to be one that is true for all we know. Thus Peter van Inwagen, throughout his book The Problem of Evil, frequently claims that various propositions are “true for all we know,” and in the “Detailed Contents” section at the beginning of his book, he offers the following characterization of the idea of a defense:
The idea of a “defense” in introduced: that is, the idea of a story that contains both God and all the evils that actually exist, a story that is put forward not as true but as “true for all anyone knows”. (2006, xii)
It seems very unlikely, however, that its merely being the case that one does not know that the story is false can suffice, since it may very well be the case that, though I do not know that p is false, I have very strong evidence that it is. But if one has strong evidence that a story is false, it is hard to see how the story on its own could possibly counter an evidential argument from evil.
It seems, accordingly, that some claim about the probability of the story's being true is needed. One possibility, suggested by some discussions, is that one might claim that rather than the story's being a remote possibility that has only a miniscule chance of being true, the story represents “a real possibility”, and so has a substantial chance of being true. Thus, while Peter van Inwagen usually talks about his stories' being true for all anyone knows, he also introduces the distinction between remote possibilities, and real possibilities. (2006, Lecture 4, esp. pp. 66-71)
It is also hard to see, however, how this can be sufficient either. Suppose, for example, that one tells a story about God and the holocaust, which is such that if it were true, an omnipotent being would have been morally justified in not preventing the Holocaust. Suppose, further, that one claims that there is a twenty percent chance that the story is true. A twenty percent chance is certainly a real possibility, but how would that twenty percent chance undermine a version of the argument from evil whose conclusion was that the probability that an omnipotent being would be justified in allowing the Holocaust was extremely low?
Given the apparent failure of the previous two suggestions, a natural conclusion is that the story that is involved in a defense must be one that is likely to be true. But if this is right, how does a defense differ from a theodicy? The answer is that while a theodicy must specify reasons that would suffice to justify an omnipotent and omniscient being in allowing all of the evils found in the world, a defense need merely show that it is likely that there are reasons which would justify an omnipotent and omniscient being in not preventing the evils that we find in the world, even if we do not know what they are. A defense differs from a theodicy, then, in that a defense attempts to show only that some God-justifying reasons probably exist; it does not attempt to specify what they are.
There is, however, one final possibility that needs to be considered. This is the idea that what is needed in a defense is not a story that can be shown to be likely to be true, but, rather, a story that, for all we know, is not unlikely. The thought here is that, even if there is some probability that the story has relative to our evidential base, we may not be able to determine what that probability is, or even any reasonably delimited range in which that probability falls. If so, one cannot show that the story is likely to be true, but neither can it be shown that the story is unlikely to be true.
The question that immediately arises as to whether a proposition that would undercut an inductive argument if one knew it were true can under the argument if one is unable to assign any probability to the proposition's being true, and if so, how. One thought might be that if one can assign no probability to a proposition, one should treat it as equally likely to be true as to be false. But propositions vary dramatically in logical form: some are such as might naturally be viewed as atomic, others are sweeping generalizations, others are complex conjunctions, and so on. If one treated any proposition to which one could not assign a probability as equally likely to be true as to be false, the result would be an incoherent assignment of probabilities. On the other hand, if one adopts this idea only in the case of atomic propositions, then given that stories that are advanced in defenses and theodicies are typically quite complex, those stories will wind up getting assigned low probabilities, and it is then unclear how they could undercut an inductive argument from evil.
There are at least three main ways in which one might attempt to show that the argument from evil does not succeed in establishing that evil is even prima facie evidence against the existence of God, let alone that the existence of God is improbable relative to our total evidence. The first appeals to human epistemological limitations; the second, to the claim that there is no best of all possible worlds; and the third, to the ontological argument.
The most popular attempt at a total refutation of the argument from evil claims that, because of human cognitive limitations, there is no sound inductive argument that can enable one to move from the premise that there are states of affairs that, taking into account only what we know, it would be morally very wrong for an omnipotent and omniscient person to allow to exist, to the conclusion that there are states of affairs such that it is likely that, all things considered, it would be morally very wrong for an omnipotent and omniscient person to allow those states of affairs to exist.
The appeal to human cognitive limitations does raise a very important issue, and we have seen that one very natural account of the logical form of the inductive step in the case of a direct inductive argument is not satisfactory. But, as I indicated in section 3.5, there is an account that is satisfactory, one that involves a serious use of inductive logic.
In addition, the appeal to human cognitive limitations does not show that there is anything wrong either with the reasoning that Draper offers in support of the crucial premise in his indirect inductive version of the argument from evil, or with the inference to the best explanation type of reasoning employed in the updated version of Hume's indirect inductive formulation of the argument from evil.
A second way of attempting to show that the argument from evil does not even get started is by appealing to the proposition that there is no best of all possible worlds. Here the basic idea is that if for every possible world, however good, there is a better one, then the fact that this world could be improved upon does not give one any reason for concluding that, if there is an omnipotent and omniscient being, that being cannot be morally perfect.
This response to the argument from evil has been around for awhile. In recent years, however, it has been strongly advocated by George Schlesinger (1964, 1977), and, more recently, by Peter Forrest (1981)—though Forrest, curiously, describes the defense as one that has been “neglected”, and refers neither to Schlesinger's well-known discussions, nor to the very strong objections that have been directed against this response to the argument from evil.
The natural response to this attempt to refute the argument from evil was set out very clearly some years ago by Nicholas La Para (1965) and Haig Khatchadourian (1966) among others, and it has been developed in an especially forceful and detailed way in an article by Keith Chrzan (1987). The basic thrust of this response is that the argument from evil, when properly formulated in a deontological fashion, does not turn upon the claim that this world could be improved upon, or upon the claim that it is not the best of all possible worlds: it turns instead upon the claim that there are good reasons for holding that the world contains evils, including instances of suffering, that it would be morally wrong, all things considered, for an omnipotent and omniscient being to allow. As a consequence, the proposition that there might be better and better worlds without limit is simply irrelevant to the argument from evil.
If one accepts a deontological approach to ethics, this response seems decisive. Many contemporary philosophers, however, are consequentialists, and so one needs to consider how the ‘no best of all possible worlds' response looks if one adopts a consequentialist approach.
Initially, it might seem that by combining the ‘no best of all possible worlds' response with consequentialism, one can construct a successful, total refutation. For assume that the following things are true:
(1) An action is, by definition, morally right if and only if it is, among the actions that one could have performed, an action that produces at least as much value as every alternative action;
(2) An action is morally wrong if and only if it is not morally right;
(3) If one is an omnipotent and omniscient being, then for any action whatever, there is always some other action that produces greater value.
Then it surely follows that it is impossible for an omnipotent and omniscient being to perform a morally wrong action, and therefore that the failure of such a being to prevent various evils in this world cannot be morally wrong.
Consider an omnipotent and omniscient being that creates a world with zillions of innocent persons, all of whom endure extraordinarily intense suffering for ever. If (1), (2), and (3) are right, then such a being does not do anything morally wrong. But this conclusion, surely, is unacceptable, and so if a given version of consequentialism entails this conclusion, then that form of consequentialism must be rejected.
Can consequentialism avoid this conclusion? Can it be formulated in such a way that it captures the view that allowing very great, undeserved suffering is morally very different, and much more serious, than merely refraining from creating as many happy individuals as possible, or merely refraining from creating individuals who are not as ecstatically happy as they might be. If it cannot, then it would seem that the correct conclusion is that consequentialism is unsound. On the other hand, if consequentialism can be so formulated that this distinction is captured, then an appeal to consequentialism, thus formulated, will not enable one to avoid the crucial objection to the ‘no best of all possible worlds’ response to the argument from evil.
A final way in which one could attempt to show that facts about evil cannot constitute even prima facie evidence against the existence of God is by appealing to the ontological argument. Relatively few philosophers have held, of course, that the ontological argument is sound. But there have certainly been notable exceptions—such as Anselm and Descartes, and, in the last century, Charles Hartshorne (1962), Norman Malcolm (1960), and Alvin Plantinga (1974a, 1974b)
If the ontological argument were sound, it would provide a rather decisive refutation of the argument from evil. For in showing not merely that there is an omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect being, but that it is necessary that such a being exists, it would entail that the proposition that God does not exist must have probability zero on any body of evidence whatever.
The only question, accordingly, is whether the ontological argument is sound. The vast majority of present-day philosophers believe that it is not, and one way of arguing for that view is by appealing to strengthened Gaunilo-type objections—where the idea behind a strengthened Gaunilo-type objection is that, rather than paralleling the ontological argument, as Gaunilo did in responding to Anselm, in order to show that there is an overpopulation problem for reality in the form of perfect islands, perfect unicorns, and so on, one can instead construct versions that lead to mutually incompatible conclusions, such as the conclusion that there is a perfect solvent, together with the conclusion that there is a perfectly insoluble substance (Tooley, 1981). But if the logical form of the ontological argument is such that arguments of precisely the same form generate contradictions, then the ontological argument must be unsound.
A more satisfying response to the ontological argument would, of course, show not merely that the ontological argument is unsound, but precisely why it is unsound. Such a response, however, requires a satisfactory account of the truth conditions of modal statements—something that lies outside the scope of this article
In this section, we shall consider three attempts to show that it is reasonable to believe that every evil is such that an omnipotent and omniscient person would have a morally sufficient reason for not preventing its existence, even if one is not able to say, in every case, what that morally sufficient reason might be.
If a given, concrete formulation of the argument from evil appeals to cases of intrinsically undesirable states of affairs that give rise to only to evidential considerations, rather than to incompatibility considerations, then, although the existence of God may be improbable relative to that evidence, it may not be improbable relative to one's total evidence. Theists, however, have often contended that there are a variety of arguments that, even if they do not prove that God exists, provide positive evidence. May not this positive evidence outweigh, then, the negative evidence of apparently unjustified evils?
Starting out from this line of thought, a number of philosophers have gone on to claim that in order to be justified in asserting that there are evils in the world that establish that it is unlikely that God exists, one would first have to examine all of the traditional arguments for the existence of God, and show that none of them is sound. Alvin Plantinga, for example, says that in order for the atheologian to show that the existence of God is improbable relative to one's total evidence, “he would be obliged to consider all the sorts of reasons natural theologians have invoked in favor of theistic belief—the traditional cosmological, teleological and ontological arguments, for example.” (1979, 3) And in a similar vein, Bruce Reichenbach remarks:
With respect to the atheologian's inductive argument from evil, the theist might reasonably contend that the atheologian's exclusion of the theistic arguments or proofs for God's existence advanced by the natural theologian has skewed the results. (1980, 224)
Now it is certainly true that if one is defending a version of the argument from evil which supports only a probabilistic conclusion, one needs to consider what sorts of positive reasons might be offered in support of the existence of God. But Plantinga and Reichenbach are advancing a rather stronger claim here, for they are saying that one needs to look at all of the traditional theistic arguments, such as the cosmological and the teleological. They are claiming, in short, that if one of those arguments turned out to be defensible, then it might well serve to undercut the argument from evil.
But this view seems mistaken. Consider the cosmological argument. In some versions, the conclusion is that there is an unmoved mover. In others, that there is a first cause. In others, that there is a necessary being, having its necessity of itself. None of these conclusions involve any claims about the moral character of the object in question, let alone the claim that it is a morally perfect person. But in the absence of such a claim, how could such arguments, even if they turned out to be sound, serve to undercut the argument from evil?
The situation is not essentially different in the case of the argument from order. For while that argument, if it were sound, would provide grounds for drawing some tentative conclusion concerning the moral character of the designer or creator of the universe, the conclusion in question would not be one that could be used to overthrow the argument from evil. For given the mixture of good and evil that one finds in the world, the argument from order can hardly provide support even for the existence of a designer or creator who is very good, let alone one who is morally perfect. So it is very hard to see how the teleological argument, any more than the cosmological, can overturn the argument from evil.
A similar conclusion can be defended with respect to other arguments, such as those that appeal to purported miracles, or religious experiences. For while in the case of religious experiences it might be argued that personal contact with a being may provide additional evidence concerning the person's character, it is clear that the primary evidence concerning a person's character must consist of information concerning what the person does and does not do. So, contrary to the claim advanced by Robert Adams (1985, 245), even if there were veridical religious experiences, they would not provide one with a satisfactory defense against the argument from evil.
A good way of underlining the basic point here is by setting out an alternative formulation of the argument from evil in which it is granted, for the sake of argument, that there is an omnipotent and omniscient person. The result of doing this is that the conclusion at which one arrives is not that there is no omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect person, but, rather, that, although there is an omnipotent and omniscient person, that person is not morally perfect.
When the argument from evil is reformulated in that way, it becomes clear that the vast majority of considerations that have been offered as reasons for believing in God can be of little assistance to the person who is trying to resist the argument from evil. For most of them provide, at best, very tenuous grounds for any conclusion concerning the moral character of any omnipotent and omniscient being who may happen to exist, and almost none of them provides any support for the hypothesis that there is an omnipotent and omniscient being who is also morally perfect.
The ontological argument is, of course, a notable exception, and, consequently, the advocate of the argument from evil certainly needs to be able to show that it is unsound. But almost all of the other standard arguments are not at all to the point.
What if, rather than holding that there is positive evidence that lends support to the existence of God, one holds instead that the belief that God exists is non-inferentially justified? The claim in question is an interesting one, and a thorough evaluation of it would involve consideration of some deep issues in epistemology. Fortunately, it does seem to make any real difference in the present context whether or not the claim is true.
The reason emerges if one considers the epistemology of perception. Some philosophers hold that some beliefs about physical objects are non-inferentially justified, while others hold that this is never so, and that justified beliefs about physical states of affairs are always justified via an inference to the best explanation that starts out from beliefs about one's experiences. But direct realists as much as indirect realists admit that there can be cases where a person would be justified in believing that a certain physical state of affairs obtained were it not for the fact that he has good evidence that he is hallucinating, or else subject to perceptual illusion. Moreover, given evidence of the relevant sort, it makes no difference whether direct realism is true, or indirect realism: the belief in question is undermined to precisely the same extent in either case.
The situation is the same in the case of religious experience. If, as was argued in the previous section, the primary evidence concerning a person's character consists of what the person does or fails to do in various circumstances, and if, as a consequence, conclusions concerning the character of a deity based upon religious experience can be undercut by the argument from evil, then nothing is changed if one holds that the having of religious experiences, rather than providing one with evidence for the existence of God, makes it the case that one is non-inferentially justified in believing in the existence of God.
Swinburne (1988 297-8) argued in support of the conclusion that theism does need a theodicy. In doing so, however, he noted one minor qualification—namely, that if one could show, for a sufficiently impressive range of evils that initially seemed problematic, that it was likely that an omnipotent and omniscient person would be morally justified in not having prevented them, then one might very well be justified in believing that the same would be true of other evils, even if one could not specify, in those other cases, what the morally sufficient reason for allowing them might be.
What Swinburne says here is surely very reasonable, and I can see no objection in principle to a defense of this sort. The problem with it is that no theodicy that has ever been proposed has been successful in the relevant way—that is, there is no impressive range of undesirable states of affairs where people initially believe that the wrongmaking properties of allowing such states of affairs to exist greatly outweigh any rightmaking properties associated with doing so, but where, confronted with some proposed theodicy, people come to believe that it would be morally permissible to allow such states of affairs to exist. Indeed, it is hard to find any such cases, let alone an impressive range.
What are the prospects for a complete, or nearly complete theodicy? Some philosophers, such as Swinburne, are optimistic, and believe that “the required theodicy can be provided.” (1988, 311). Others, including many theists, are much less hopeful. Plantinga, for example remarks:
… we cannot see why our world, with all its ills, would be better than others we think we can imagine, or what, in any detail, is God's reason for permitting a given specific and appalling evil. Not only can we not see this, we can't think of any very good possibilities. And here I must say that most attempts to explain why God permits evil—theodicies, as we may call them—strike me as tepid, shallow and ultimately frivolous. (1985a, 35)
What types of theodicies that have been proposed? An exhaustive survey is not possible here, but among the most important are theodicies that appeal, first, to the value of acquiring desirable traits of character in the face of suffering, secondly, to the value of libertarian free will; thirdly, to the value of the freedom to inflict horrendous evil upon others; and fourthly, to the value of a world that is governed by natural laws.
One very important type of theodicy, championed especially by John Hick, involves the idea that the evils that the world contains can be seen to be justified if one views the world as designed by God as an environment in which people, through their free choices can undergo spiritual growth that will ultimately fit them for communion with God:
The value-judgement that is implicitly being invoked here is that one who has attained to goodness by meeting and eventually mastering temptation, and thus by rightly making responsibly choices in concrete situations, is good in a richer and more valuable sense than would be one created ab initio in a state either of innocence or of virtue. In the former case, which is that of the actual moral achievements of mankind, the individual's goodness has within it the strength of temptations overcome, a stability based upon an accumulation of right choices, and a positive and responsible character that comes from the investment of costly personal effort. (1977, 255-6)
Hick's basic suggestion, then, is that soul-making is a great good, that God would therefore be justified in designing a world with that purpose in mind, that our world is very well designed in that regard, and thus that, if one views evil as a problem, it is because one mistakenly thinks that the world ought, instead, to be a hedonistic paradise.
Is this theodicy satisfactory? There are a number of reasons for holding that it is not. First, what about the horrendous suffering that people undergo, either at the hands of others—as in the Holocaust—or because of terminal illnesses such as cancer? One writer—Eleonore Stump—has suggested that the terrible suffering that many people undergo at the end of their lives, in cases where it cannot be alleviated, is to be viewed as suffering that has been ordained by God for the spiritual health of the individual in question. (1993b, 349). But, given that it does not seem to be true that terrible terminal illnesses more commonly fall upon those in bad spiritual health than upon those of good character, let alone that they fall only upon the former, this ‘spiritual chemotherapy’ view seems quite hopeless. More generally, there seems to be no reason at all why a world must contain horrendous suffering if it is to provide a good environment for the development of character in response to challenges and temptations.
Secondly, and is illustrated by the weakness of Hick's own discussion (1977, 309-17), a soul-making theodicy provides no justification for the existence of any animal pain, let alone for a world where predation is not only present but a major feature of non-human animal life. The world could perfectly well have contained only human persons, or only human person plus herbivores.
Thirdly, the soul-making theodicy provides no account either of the suffering that young, innocent children endure, either because of terrible diseases, or at the hands of adults. For here, as in the case of animals, there is no soul-making purpose that is served.
Finally, if one's purpose were to create a world that would be a good place for soul-making, would our earth count as a job well done? It is very hard to see that it would. Some people die young, before they have had any chance at all to master temptations, to respond to challenges, and to develop morally. Others endure suffering so great that it is virtually impossible for them to develop those moral traits that involve relationships with others. Still others enjoy lives of ease and luxury where there is virtually nothing that challenges them to undergo moral growth.
A second important approach to theodicy involves the following ideas: first, that libertarian free will is of great value; secondly, that because it is part of the definition of libertarian free will that an action that is free in that sense cannot be caused by anything outside of the agent, not even God can cause a person to freely do what is right; and thirdly, that because of the great value of libertarian free will, it is better that God create a world in which agents possess libertarian free will, even though they may misuse it, and do what is wrong, than that God create a world where agents lack libertarian free will.
One problem with an appeal to libertarian free will is that no satisfactory account of the concept of libertarian free will is yet available. Thus, while the requirement that, in order to be free in the libertarian sense, an action not have any cause that lies outside the agent is unproblematic, this is obviously not a sufficient condition, since this condition would be satisfied if the behavior in question was caused by random events within the agent. So one needs to add that the agent is, in some sense, the cause of the action. But how is the causation in question to be understood? Present accounts of the metaphysics of causation typically treat causes as states of affairs. If, however, one adopts such an approach, then it seems that all that one has when an action is freely done, in the libertarian sense, is that there is some uncaused mental state of the agent that causally gives rise to the relevant behavior, and why freedom, thus understood, should be thought valuable, is far from clear.
The alternative is to shift from event-causation to what is referred to as ‘agent-causation’. But then the problem is that there is no satisfactory account of agent-causation.
But even if the difficulty concerning the nature of libertarian free will is set aside, there are still very strong objections to the free-will approach. First, and most important, the fact that libertarian free will is valuable does not entail that one should never intervene in the exercise of libertarian free will. Indeed, very few people think that one should not intervene to prevent someone from committing rape or murder. On the contrary, almost everyone would hold that a failure to prevent heinously evil actions when one can do so would be seriously wrong.
Secondly, the proposition that libertarian free will is valuable does not entail that it is a good thing for people to have the power to inflict great harm upon others. So individuals could, for example, have libertarian free will, but not have the power to torture and murder others.
Thirdly, many evils are caused by natural processes, such as earthquakes, hurricanes, and other weather conditions, and by a wide variety of diseases. Such evils certainly do not appear to result from morally wrong actions. If that is right, then an appeal to free will provides no answer to an argument from evil that focuses upon such evils.
Some writers, such as C. S. Lewis and Alvin Plantinga, have suggested that such evils may ultimately be due to the immoral actions of supernatural beings (Lewis, 1957, 122-3; Plantinga, 1974a, 58). If that were so, then the first two objections mentioned above would apply: one would have many more cases where individuals were being given the power to inflict great harm on others, and then were being allowed by God to perform horrendously evil actions leading to enormous suffering and many deaths. In addition, however, it can plausibly be argued that, though it is possible that earthquakes, hurricanes, cancer, and the predation of animals are all caused by malevolent supernatural beings, the probability that this is so is extremely low.
The fact that agents could be free in a libertarian sense even if they did not have the power to inflict great harm upon others has led at least one philosopher, namely, Richard Swinburne, to argue that, while free will is valuable, precisely how valuable it is depends upon the range of actions open to one. If possible actions vary enormously in moral worth, then libertarian free will is very valuable indeed. But if the variation in the moral status of what one can do is very limited, then libertarian free will adds much less to the world: one has a ‘toy world’, where one has very little responsibility for the well-being of others.
This variant on the appeal to libertarian free will is also open to a number of objections. First, as with free will theodicies in general, this line of thought provides no justification for the existence of what appear to be natural evils.
Secondly, if what matters is simply the existence of alternative actions that differ greatly morally, this can be the case even in a world where one lacks the power to inflict great harm on others, since there can be actions that would benefit others enormously, and which one may either perform or refrain from performing.
Thirdly, what exactly is the underlying line of thought here? In the case of human actions, Swinburne surely holds that one should prevent someone from doing something that would be morally horrendous, if one can do so. Is the idea, then, that while occasional prevention of such evils does not significantly reduce the extent of the moral responsibility of others, if one's power were to increase, a point would be reached where one should sometimes refrain from preventing people from performing morally horrendous actions? But why should this be so? One answer might be that if one intervened too frequently, then people would come to believe that they did not have the ability to perform such actions. But, in the first place, it is not clear why that would be undesirable. People could still, for example, be thoroughly evil, for they could wish that they had the power to perform such terrible actions, and be disposed to perform such actions if they ever came to have the power. In the second place, prevention of deeply evil actions could take quite different forms. People could, for example, be given a conscience that led them, when they had decided to cause great injury to others, and were about to do so, to feel that what they were about to do was too terrible a thing, so that they would not carry through on the action. In such a world, people could surely still feel that they themselves were capable of performing heinously evil actions, and so they would continue to attempt to perform such actions.
A final important theodicy involves the following ideas: first, it is important that events in the world take place in a regular way, since otherwise effective action would be impossible; secondly, events will exhibit regular patters only if they are governed by natural laws; thirdly, if events are governed by natural laws, the operation of those laws will give rise to events that harm individuals; so, fourthly, God's allowing natural evils is justified because the existence of natural evils is entailed by natural laws, and a world without natural laws would be a much worse world.
This type of theodicy is also exposed to serious objections. First, what natural evils a world contains depends not just on the laws, but on the initial, or boundary conditions. Thus, for example, an omnipotent being could create ex nihilo a world which had the same laws of nature as our world, and which contained human beings, but which was devoid of non-human carnivores. Or the world could be such that there was unlimited room for populations to expand, and ample natural resources to support such populations.
Secondly, many evils depend upon precisely what laws the world contains. An omnipotent being could, for example, easily create a world with the same laws of physics as our world, but with slightly different laws linking neurophysiological states with qualities of experiences, so that extremely intense pains either did not arise, or could be turned off when they served no purpose. Or additional physical laws of a rather specialized sort could be introduced that would cause very harmful viruses to self-destruct.
Thirdly, this final theodicy provides no account of moral evil. If other theodicies could provide a justification for God's allowing moral evil, that would not be a problem. But, as we have seen, no satisfactory justification appears to be available.
In section 1.3, it was argued that concrete formulations of the argument from evil, which focus upon specific evils, or else upon narrowly defined types of evils, are superior to abstract formulations of the argument from evil, which start out from very general statements concerning evil—such as that there is evil in the world, or that there are natural evils, or that there is an enormous amount of evil, and so on. Consider, then, an evidential argument from evil that focuses upon Rowe's famous case of Sue—a young girl who was brutally beaten, raped, and murdered. Confronted with such a case, it is natural to think that a satisfactory response will involve arguing that it is plausible that the terrible occurrence in question itself has some hidden property that makes it the case that allowing it to happen is not morally wrong all things considered.
But as Peter van Inwagen has argued—most recently in The Problem of Evil—there is a very different possibility, and one that he thinks is much more promising. The basic idea is as follows. First of all, one begins by focusing upon abstract formulations of the argument from evil, and one attempts to put forward a story—which might be either a defense-story or a theodicy-story—that makes it plausible that the existence of, say, a great amount of horrendous suffering in the world, is actually desirable because there is some great good that outweighs that suffering, and that can only be achieved if that amount of suffering is present, or some greater evil that can only be avoided if that amount of suffering is present. Second, if that provides a satisfactory answer to an abstract version of the argument from evil that focuses upon the existence of horrendous suffering, one can turn to concrete versions of the argument from evil, and there the idea will be that God had good reason to allow a certain amount of horrendous suffering, and the terrible case of Sue is simply one of the cases that he allowed. It is not that Sue's suffering itself had some property that made its occurrence good all things considered. God could have very well prevented it, and had he done so, he would have eliminated an occurrence that was bad in itself, all things considered. But had he done so, he would have had to have allowed some other horrendous event that, as things stand, he prevented, and the reason that he would have had to do that would be to ensure that the global property of there being a certain amount of horrendous evil in the world was instantiated—something that was necessary to achieve a greater good, or to avoid a greater evil.
In short, defenses and theodicies that are based upon this idea, rather than appealing to the idea that apparent evils are not evils in themselves, all things considered, once all local properties—all properties that those events themselves have—are taken into account, appeal, instead, to the idea that there are global properties whose instantiation is important, and that can only be instantiated if there are events that are evil in themselves.
Van Inwagen's response to the argument from evil involves two main parts. The first deals with human suffering, and other evils that humans experience, and involves an extended free will defense. The second is concerned with the suffering of non-human animals that lack rationality, and it turns upon claims about ‘massively irregular’ worlds.
In both cases, van Inwagen needs to argue, first, that there is an adequate answer to abstract versions of the argument from evil, and then, secondly, that if this is so, then there is also an adequate response to concrete versions of the argument from evil. Here, however, I shall consider only his responses to abstract versions of the argument.
Van Inwagen characterizes his approach as a ‘defense’, rather than as a ‘theodicy’. But this reflects the fact that in The Problem of Evil he has adopted Plantinga's interpretation of the term ‘theodicy’ (2006, 65). Given how the term ‘Theodicy’ is being used here, van Inwagen is offering a theodicy, since he is specifying properties that, it is claimed, would serve to justify God in allowing evils, rather than attempting to show that there are some unspecified properties that would do this.
I shall begin by setting out the two parts of van Inwagen's theodicy, dealing first with human suffering, and then with the suffering of non-human animals.
To deal with the evils that humans endure, van Inwagen sketches quite a complicated story. The story, however, is not exactly unfamiliar, for while it is not, in all of its details, the story told by traditional Christianity, there are very strong resemblances, and it is fair to say that it is very unlikely that anyone unfamiliar with Christianity would have come up van Inwagen's story.
In brief, it runs as follows. God guided evolution to produce the primates that immediately preceded Homo sapiens. A relatively small group of those primates formed, at one time, a breeding community, and God “miraculously raised them to rationality,” thereby giving them “the gifts of language, abstract thought, and disinterested love—and, of course, the gift of free will.” (2006, 85)
But God also bestowed many other striking gifts upon them:
God not only raised these primates to rationality—not only made of them what we call human beings—but also took them into a kind of mystical union with himself, the sort of union that Christians hope for in Heaven and call the Beatific Vision. Being in union with God, these new human beings, these primates who had become human beings at a certain point in their lives, lived together in the harmony of perfect love and also possessed what theologians used to call preternatural powers—something like what people who believe in them today call ‘paranormal abilities’. Because they lived in the harmony of perfect love, none of them did any harm to the others. Because of their preternatural powers, they were able somehow to protect themselves from wild beasts (which they were able to tame with a look), from disease (which they were able to cure with a touch), and from random, destructive natural events (like earthquakes) which they knew about in advance and were able to escape. (2006, 85-86)
For reasons that we cannot understand, however, all of these people abused their free will, and left the union with God. In doing so, they lost their preternatural powers, and so were subject to disease, to aging, to destructive natural events, and to death. But separation from God also meant that they were subject to tendencies present in their inherited genes, so that they now suffered from “an inborn tendency to do evil against which all human efforts are in vain.” (2006, 87)
What did God do at this point? He might have acted in accordance with the demands of justice, and simply have left human beings in the ruined world that they had brought about. Alternatively, God might have acted out of mercy, and annihilated the human race. But God is also a God of love, and so he “neither left our species to its own devices nor mercifully destroyed it.” (2006, 87) Instead, he carried out some sort of rescue operation.
God's goal in that rescue operation was to have humans beings cooperate in that enterprise by freely choosing to love God and to be reunited with him. Because of this, God had good reason not to remove all horrific evils from the world:
For human beings to cooperate with God in this rescue operation, they must know that they need to be rescued. They must know what it means to be separated from him. And what it means to be separated from God is to live in a world of horrors. If God simply ‘canceled’ all the horrors of this world by an endless series of miracles, he would thereby frustrate his own plan of reconciliation. If he did that, we should be content with our lot and should see no reason to cooperate with him. (2006, 88)
The horrific evils that the world contains will not, however, last forever:
At some point, for all eternity, there will be no more unmerited suffering: this present darkness, ‘the age of evil’, will eventually be remembered as a brief flicker at the beginning of human history. Every evil done by the wicked to the innocent will have been avenged, and every tear will have been wiped away. If there is still suffering, it will be merited: the suffering of those who refuse to cooperate with God's great rescue operation and are allowed by him to exist forever in a state of elected ruin—those who, in a word, are in Hell. (2006, 89)
The response to global arguments from evil that van Inwagen proposes for the case of human suffering provides no explanation for the suffering of non-human animals. Moreover, and more generally, no account in terms of the abuse of free will by human beings can provide such an explanation, given that non-human animals existed before human beings. So what account can be offered?
In Lecture 7 in The Problem of Evil, van Inwagen discusses the accounts that others have offered—including the view that the suffering of non-human animals is due to the corruption of nature that resulted from the abuse of free will by fallen angels—and he argues that none of those accounts is satisfactory. What, then, is van Inwagen's account? The answer consists of a story that involves the following four propositions:
(1) Every world that God could have made that contains higher-level sentient creatures either contains patterns of suffering morally equivalent to those of the actual world, or else is massively irregular.
(2) Some important intrinsic or extrinsic good depends on the existence of higher-level sentient creatures; this good is of sufficient magnitude that it outweighs the patterns of suffering found in the actual world.
(3) Being massively irregular is a defect in a world, a defect at least as great as the defect of containing patterns of suffering morally equivalent to those found in the actual world.
(4) The world—the cosmos, the physical universe—has been created by God. (2006, 114)
Van Inwagen contends that this story is true for all we know, and that we have no reason for viewing any of the four propositions as implausible. But if that is so, then van Inwagen thinks that one has a satisfactory answer to versions of the global argument from evil that focus specifically on the suffering of non-human animals.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Essays, and Reviews of Books, on the Problem of Evil, selected by Jeffrey Lowder (Past President, Internet Infidels, Inc.).
- “The Evidential Argument from Evil”, a paper by Nicholas Tattersall, 1998.
- “Evil and Omnipotence”, John L. Mackie, in Mind, n.s. 64 (254) (April 1955): 200-212.
- “Natural Selection and the Problem of Evil”, by Paul Draper (Florida International University).
- “Review of Andrea Weisberger's Suffering Belief: Evil and the Anglo-American Defence of Theism (1999)”, by Graham Oppy (Monash University).
[Please contact the author with further suggestions.]
abduction | Bayes' Theorem | ethics: deontological | God: concepts of | Hume, David: on religion | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | incompatibilism: arguments for | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm: on the problem of evil | ontological arguments | probability, interpretations of | providence, divine
In revising this piece, I received a number of excellent suggestions from Edward N. Zalta, and I very much appreciate his interest in the philosophical issues, and his extremely helpful input.