Condemnation of 1277

First published Thu Jan 30, 2003; substantive revision Tue Sep 24, 2013

On March 7, 1277, the Bishop of Paris, Stephen Tempier, prohibited the teaching of 219 philosophical and theological theses that were being discussed and disputed in the faculty of arts under his jurisdiction. Tempier's condemnation has gained great symbolic meaning in the minds of modern intellectual historians, and possibly for this reason, there is still considerable disagreement about what motivated Tempier to promulgate his prohibition, what exactly was condemned, and who the targets were. In addition, the effects of Tempier's action on the course of medieval thought in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, and even beyond, has been the subject of much debate. The lack of a commonly accepted standard account of Tempier's actions plus the enormous amount of literature and of textual evidence that either directly or indirectly bears on the events of 1277, puts specific limitations to the present entry. It will be confined to presenting those historical facts that are uncontroversial and to indicating the main issues of current debate with respect to Tempier's condemnation.

1. The events leading up to March 7, 1277

The traditional picture of the events leading to Bishop Tempier's condemnation looks something like this. On January 18, 1277 Pope John XXI informed Stephen Tempier, Bishop of Paris, in a letter that he had heard rumors of heresy and charged him with the task of examining (facias inspici vel inquiri) where and by whom these errors had been disseminated (CUP 1: 541). On March 7, 1277, Bishop Tempier published his list of 219 theological and philosophical theses (articuli) and of some books that were condemned. Anyone teaching or listening to the listed errors would be excommunicated, unless they turned themselves in to the bishop or the chancellor within seven days, in which case the bishop would inflict proportionate penalties (CUP 1: 543).

Since this papal letter precedes Tempier's condemnation, it has been generally assumed that Tempier acted on papal initiative, and moreover, acted in an overzealous and hasty way. In his letter, the pope merely requested Tempier to investigate rumors of false teaching, whereas the latter responded by drawing up a list of 219 false propositions. Furthermore, only about six weeks elapsed between the papal instructions and Tempier's publication of this list, a list which has been characterized by historians as repetitious and disorderly.

Unfortunately, the chain of events leading up to Tempier's condemnation still is not totally clear. If Tempier, indeed, acted on a papal mandate, it is surprising that he does not mention it in the introduction to his syllabus of errors, but merely indicates that he had received information from important people (Who these “important people” may have been is a question that will be addressed below). 

Another puzzling aspect concerning the course of events sketched above is the papal letter “Flumen aquae vivae” of April 28, 1277, that is, more than forty days after Tempier had promulgated his list of condemned articles. Curiously enough, this letter gives no indication whatsoever that the pope knew about Tempier's action. On the contrary, the pope grants a mandate to Tempier to notify him, the pope, about new errors, and to inform him about the names of the propagators of these errors, about their followers, and about their writings. Pope John's second letter is a further specification of his first: he now indicates the culpits, namely “some scholars of arts and in the faculty of theology at Paris” (nonnulli tam in artibus quam in theologica facultate studentes Parisius). In addition, its purpose is more focused. The pope will use the dossier that he has requested from the bishop to establish – with the help of an advisory committee – the nature of the errors and to decide whether they will have to be recanted, or condemned and whether the University of Paris will need to be reformed.

In short, the evidence also allows another scenario, namely that Tempier did not act on the pope's instigation, but was already in the process of preparing his condemnation when he received the papal letter of January 18, 1277. In this scenario of events, the papal letter Flumen aquae vivae crossed the letter in which Tempier announced the condemnation.

2. The juridical context of Tempier's condemnation

Tempier's condemnation is only one of the approximately sixteen lists of censured theses that were issued at the University of Paris during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Most of these lists of propositions were put together into systematic collections of prohibited articles. One of the earliest of these collections of medieval condemned articles originated towards the end of the thirteenth century under the name of Parisian Articles or also Collectio errorum in anglia et parisius condempnatorum. Initially this collection consisted of twenty-two chapters presenting the errors condemned in 1277 by Archbishop Robert Kilwardby at Oxford, in 1241 by Bishop William of Alvernia in Paris, and in 1270 and 1277 by Bishop Stephen Tempier in Paris (in this order).

During the fourteenth century, this Collection grew significantly, so that, in fact, a second, augmented Collection came into existence. All the propositions that were added to the first compilation had been condemned in the fourteenth century at the University of Paris. It can be seen as a collection of verdicts, which at the opening of each new set of verdicts provides information about the parties involved and the date. The verdicts are not motivated, nor does the collection provide an account of the events (narratio).

The collection of Parisian Articles must have had some kind of official status, and must have circulated among medieval scholars. Bachelors in theology were required by oath not to maintain anything “in favor of articles that have been condemned at the Roman curia or in Paris.” Moreover, many medieval philosophical and theological texts contain references to and quotations from the “Parisian articles,” which by no means should always be identified with Tempier's list of condemned articles.

If one compares Tempier's 1277 syllabus to the other lists of errors assembled in the compilation of Parisian Articles two features stand out, namely the anonimity of its targets and its promulgation by a bishop. Tempier does not specify the persons behind the false views, but merely states that the errors were disseminated by “certain scholars at the faculty of arts.” The other condemnations, however, all concern specific scholars whose names are explicitly mentioned in the Collectio errorum. In addition, it is one of the few censures in which a bishop was involved right from the start, and not, for instance, at a later stage of the proceedings as judge of an appeal.

In his introductory letter to the syllabus of errors, Tempier indicates that he responded to information received from important people (magnarum et gravium personarum crebra zeloque fidei accensa insinuavit relatio). The allegations were that “some scholars of arts at Paris” (nonnulli Parisius studentes in artibus) had been transgressing the limits of their own faculty (proprie facultatis limites excedentes). In all likelihood, this complaint stemmed from theological circles.

In his introductory letter, Tempier also reports that he sought the advice “not only of the doctors of Sacred Scripture, but also of other wise men” (tam doctorum sacrae Scripturae, quam aliorum prudentium virorum communicato consilio). From other cases of suspect teaching we know that the task of the theologians was to examine certain works and draw up a list of errors. In cases where a list of alleged errors already existed, the theologians were charged with assessing the degree of error of the listed propositions. The theologian John of Pouilly reports that sixteen masters of theology were Tempier's assessors for the condemnation. One of the members of the commission was Henry of Ghent, as he himself testifies in his Quodlibet II. It is unknown when these masters met, but it must have been after Henry of Ghent had become a regent master in theology, a position that he obtained in 1276. That there were some tensions between Tempier and the theologians is attested by Giles of Rome, a contemporary witness of the events of 1277: he claimed that some articles were condemned not on the basis of the advice of the masters, but rather due to the “obstinacy of a few.” This observation has been taken to concern Tempier, but it might also have included some of the “wise men” who had assisted him.

The identity of these other wise men is unknown. Since, however, they are so clearly distinguished from the theologians, they have to be sought among the prelates. Of these, only the involvement of the chancellor, John of Alleux, is directly substantiated by the textual evidence: the introductory letter to Tempier's condemnation stipulated that offenders had to report either to the bishop himself or to the chancellor. Other likely candidates are Simon of Brion, the papal legate, and Ranulph of Houblonnire, Tempier's future successor as bishop of Paris.

In addition, mention should be made of the possible role of the inquisitor of France, Simon du Val. On November 23, 1276 he had summoned three ex-scholars from Paris, now residing in Liège, to appear before his court “probably and gravely suspect of the crime of heresy” (de crimine heresis probabiliter et vehementer suspectos). They were Siger of Brabant, canon at Saint Paul's, and Goswin of Chapelle and Bernier of Nivelles, canons at Saint Martin's, all in Liège. At least one of them, Siger of Brabant, was also implicated in Tempier's condemnation (see below). Although there is no firm textual evidence, it is tempting to speculate that the inquisitor's dossier concerning these three arts masters was known to Bishop Tempier.

3. What was condemned?

The condemnation of 1277 not only covered the already mentioned syllabus of 219 errors, but also the work “De amore” by Andreas Capellanus, a treatise on geomancy with the incipit “Estimaverunt Indi” and the explicit “Racionare ergo super eum, et invenies, etc.” – which has not yet been identified – and unnamed treatises on necromancy, witchcraft, or fortunetelling.

Of interest to historians of philosophy is the list of censured propositions. It is unknown what method Tempier and his advisers used to draw up their syllabus of 219 errors. Usually, it is claimed that Tempier's list not very well organised and “broad in scope to the point of confusion.” However, the lack of doctrinal cohesion is also present in other lists of the Collectio errorum, simply because the order in which the charged errors appeared on the roll was determined by other factors such as, for instance, the order in which they appeared in the examined work. Shortly after 1277 the extremely long list of 219 prohibited views was reorganized, possibly to facilitate its use in the academic community. At the beginning of this century, Pierre Mandonnet once again put Tempier's articles into a new order, numbering and distinguishing the 179 philosophical theses from the 40 theological ones.

A very helpful summary of the condemned propositions has been provided by John F. Wippel. The first seven of the philosophical propositions bear on the nature and excellence of philosophy. Propositions 8 through 12 (in the numbering of Mandonnet) have a bearing on the knowability and nature of God. Propositions 13–15 concern divine knowledge, and 16 through 26 divine omnipotence. Many of the articles, notably 34–61 regard the separate intelligences (angels). Another interesting group of articles is 67–69. By condemning these articles, Tempier endorsed God's absolute power to do whatever he wills. Other interesting themes that are touched in the philosophical articles are the world's eternity (80 through 89), the unicity of the human intellect and its implications (117 through 133), and human freedom and free will (151 through 166). Among the theological articles, themes that appear are theology as a science (180–186), the doctrine of the Eucharist (196–199), Christian morality (202–205), and human immortality and reward and punishment in the life to come (213–219). It should be emphasized that Tempier's theses express positions that cannot be maintained in light of revealed truth; for this reason, each is followed by the qualification, “error”.

Recently, Sylvain Piron has argued that Tempier's list of condemned articles does exhibit an encyclopedic organization, which suggests that Tempier had a deliberate plan. Articles 25–183 can be divided into sub-sections which respectively touch upon the topics of God, angels, the world, the soul, the intellect, the will, philosophy, the will again (due to the misplacement of a rubric), and ethics. The same global order is also present in articles 1–24. The final articles, 184–219, seem to be a miscellaneous collection. Possibly, Tempier's list actually consists of three separate lists.

4. Who was condemned on March 7, 1277?

The question of who the targets were of Tempier's condemnation cannot be entirely separated from the question of what views were censured. As was mentioned above, Tempier did not identify the targets of his condemnation, but merely indicated that it was directed against unspecified members of the arts faculty in Paris. Even though their names appear nowhere in the document itself (and in the rubrics of only two of the many medieval manuscripts which have preserved Tempier's condemnation), Siger of Brabant and Boethius of Dacia have been singled out as the most prominent targets of the 1277 censure.

Yet, their identification should be qualified, as becomes clear from the results, or should one say lack of results, of the ground-breaking study by Roland Hissette. He tried to identify the proximate background of the 219 condemned theses. As his point of departure, Hissette took known works by Siger and Boethius and three anonymous writings from the arts faculty that were available in a modern edition at the time that he wrote his study. From Hissette's own summary of the results of his careful examination it appears that surprisingly few of the censured propositions could be identified with any degree of certainty in the known works of thirteenth-century artistae. Of the 219 propositions, only 79 can be identified, with various degrees of probability, in the works of Siger of Brabant, Boethius of Dacia, or the three anonymous writings. Of 72 propositions the attribution is uncertain, whereas 68 propositions could not be identified at all. Moreover, many censured propositions that seem to have been derived from the examined works that originated at the arts faculty in the thirteenth century do not really represent the author's own view, but rather appear to be quotations or paraphrases from Aristotle, from  Arabic philosophers, or from “the philosophers” as Hissette himself indicates.

Hissette's examination was based on the assumption that Tempier's censure envisioned only teachings from the faculty of arts. The introductory letter, however, seems to contradict this assumption. There, Tempier draws an important distinction, which has not been duly recognized in the scholarly literature, between propagators and views. He accuses the members of the arts faculty of disseminating (tractare et disputare) manifest and damned errors (manifesti et exsecrabiles errores). The errors are specified in the roll or leaves connected to the introductory letter (in rotulo seu cedulis, praesentibus hiis annexo seu annexis). They are the 219 censured propositions. Tempier does not state, however, that the members of the arts faculty are the authors of these errors. In his introductory letter Tempier separates the 219 censured errors from their propagators. Only the propagators have to be sought in the arts faculty in Paris: on pain of excommunication, they are prohibited to dogmatize, disseminate, or sustain in any way (dogmatizare, aut defendere seu sustinere quoquo modo) the propositions collected by Tempier. The origin of these propositions, however, is not stated in the introductory letter. In other words, Tempier indicates that those artistae who were castigated for disseminating false teachings were not necessarily disseminating their own views. When drawing up the syllabus, Tempier and his advisers relied on more sources, written or oral, than those that were used by Hissette. Possibly, Tempier's list even included earlier lists of suspect views.

The inconclusiveness of Hissette's study strongly suggests that research into the proximate background of the censured propositions has to be broadened. The directions that such research should take are indicated, either implicitly or explicitly, by Roland Hissette, and by other scholars such as John Wippel and Calvin Normore. Today it is generally agreed that a considerable number of the 219 censured propositions have a bearing on the reintroduction of pagan philosophy into the arts faculty, and on the ensuing crisis over the relation of faith and reason. Consequently, Greek or Arabic sources may prove to be at the origin of a number of censured propositions, as is also suggested in Tempier's preface, in which he indicated that the scholars whose errors he condemned took their inspiration from pagan writings (cum errores praedictos gentilium scripturis muniant),  Other propositions may well have been derived from the teaching of theologians, such as Thomas Aquinas. In particular, John Wippel has argued (against Roland Hissette) that Aquinas' teaching was also implied in Tempier's condemnation and that some of the positions were taken from his writings. In this respect, the oft-quoted statement from Tempier's introductory letter that members of the arts faculty were transgressing the limits of their own faculty (propriae facultatis limites excedentes) could acquire new meaning. Some members of the arts faculty were rebuked not only for teaching suspect philosophical views but also for teaching suspect theological views.

5. The doctrinal significance of Tempier's condemnation

Tempier's condemnation has often been depicted as the most dramatic and significant doctrinal censure in the history of the University of Paris, and a landmark in the history of medieval philosophy and theology. Yet, the doctrinal significance of the condemnation has received very diverse assessments. Since the appearance of the studies by Pierre Mandonnet and Fernand van Steenberghen, Tempier's condemnation has come to be associated with the opposition between faith and reason, caused by the introduction of newly translated philosophical sources in the Latin West, in particular Aristotle and his commentator Averroes. Studies which present Tempier's condemnation as a response to “Averroism” or to “radical Aristotelianism,” follow this line of interpretation.

This interpretation is often associated with the view that Tempier's action was a symptom of an already existing opposition to rationalism, that is, against philosophical research pursued without concern for Christian orthodoxy. Evidence of the presence of rationalist tendencies at the University of Paris was found in certain articles of Tempier's syllabus, or in the prefatory letter in which Tempier expounded his notion of double truth. According to Tempier, some scholars maintained that certain views were true according to philosophy, but not according to Catholic faith, “as if there were two contrary truths, and as if against the truth of Sacred Scripture, there is truth in the sayings of the condemned pagans.”

The so-called theory of double truth has been the source of much confusion. Nowadays, scholars agree that there were no medieval authors who entertained the philosophically absurd theory that two contradictory propositions – one derived from philosophical investigation, the other from Christian revelation--can both be true at the same time. Rather, Tempier's reproach should be taken as an attempt to ridicule the hermeneutical practice of commentators to evaluate a doctrine (for instance's Aristotle's) from a philosophical point of view (“philosophically speaking”) and from faith. In reality, however, medieval scholars generally supposed that in cases of conflict between reason and faith, the truth was always on the side of the faith.

In more recent times, the idea that Tempier's condemnation was a symptom of the existence of rationalist currents at the University of Paris, in the sense of the emergence of philosophy as an autonomous discipline vis-à-vis divine revelation, has been further developed by scholars such as Alain de Libera, Kurt Flasch, and Luca Bianchi. Although there are differences in detail and in emphasis, they view Tempier's action as an attempt to curb the concept of philosophy as a comprehensive doctrine of natural knowledge aimed at the attainment of happiness here in this life, rather than after death. Their studies about the significance of Tempier's condemnation also address fundamental questions about the nature of philosophy in the Middle Ages. 

In the historiography of medieval science, the views of Pierre Duhem, have proven to be extremely influential. Duhem believed that Tempier, with his insistence of God's absolute power, had liberated Christian thought from the dogmatic acceptance of Aristotelianism, and in this way marked the birth of modern science. Especially articles 39 and 49 played a pivotal role in his eyes. Duhem's thesis has opened up the historiography of medieval science as a serious academic discipline. Yet, at the same time, no one in the field any longer endorses his view that modern science started in 1277. Of contemporary historians of science, Edward Grant probably comes closest to Duhem's vision, though his view includes many refinements and historical materials that were unknown to Duhem.

6. Tempier's other 1277 condemnations

Although Tempier's action of March 7, 1277 is best known in the historiography of philosophy, mention should also be made of two additional doctrinal investigations of 1277 that are attributed to Bishop Tempier. The first one concerned the theologian Giles of Rome, and was concluded before March 28, 1277 with the censure of fifty-one propositions taken from Giles's commentary on the Sentences. The second doctrinal inquiry was aimed against Thomas Aquinas. It was begun after Giles's censure, but still before March 28, 1277. According to Robert Wielockx,, the inquiry against Thomas Aquinas was never completed. Basing his conclusions on evidence provided in a letter by John Pecham, Wielockx claimed that during the vacancy of the Apostolic See, sometime between May 20 and November 25, 1277, Tempier received orders from the curia to stop his investigation.

Wielockx's thesis of a separate process against Thomas Aquinas has been generally accepted in the scholarly literature. However, recently the historical evidence has been reexamined and his interpretation been questioned by John Wippel and Hans Thijssen, the latter in the context of a substantially revised account of the juridical procedures against Giles of Rome.

Bibliography

Editions and translations

  • Anzulewicz, Henryk. “Eine weitere Überlieferung der Collectio errorum in Anglia et Parisius condemnatorum im Ms. lat. fol. 456 der Staatsbibliothek Preussischer Kulturbesitz zu Berlin,” Franziskanische Studien, 74 (1992): 375–99.
  • Denifle, H. and E. Châtelain (eds.), Chartularium Universitatis Parisiensis, vol. 1, pp. 543–558, Paris, 1889.
  • Flasch, Kurt. Aufklärung im Mittelalter? Die Verurteilung von 1277, Frankfurt, 1989.
  • Grant, Edward, A Source Book in Medieval Science, Cambridge, MA, 1974.
  • Mandonnet, P. Siger de Brabant et l'averroïsme latin au XIIIe siècle, 2 vols., Louvain, 1908–11, especially vol. 2, pp. 175–191.
  • Piché, D. (ed.), La condemnation parisienne de 1277. Texte latin, traduction, introduction et commentaire, Paris, 1999.

Studies

  • Aertsen, Jan A., Kent Emery, Jr. and Andreas Speer (eds.), 2001. Nach der Verurteilung von 1277. Philosophie und Theologie an der Universität von Paris im letzen Viertel des 13. Jahrhunderts. Studien und Texte, Berlin, New York. [multilingual volume with an excellent state of the art introduction in English]
  • Bianchi, Luca, 1990. Il vescovo e i filosofi: La condanna parigina del 1277 e l'evoluzione dell'aristotelismo scolastico, Bergamo.
  • –––, 1998. “1277: A Turning Point in Medieval Philosophy?,” in: Jan A. Aertsen and Andreas Speer (eds.), Was ist Philosophie im Mittelalter?, Berlin, New York, pp. 90–110.
  • Dales, Richard C., 1984. “The Origin of the Doctrine of the Double Truth,” Viator, 15: 169–79.
  • De Libera, Alain, 1991. Penser au Moyen Âge, Paris.
  • –––, 1998. “Philosophie et censure. Remarques sur la crise universitaire parisienne de 1270–1277,” in: Jan A. Aertsen and Andreas Speer (eds.), Was ist Philosophie im Mittelalter? Berlin, New York, pp. 71–89.
  • Duhem, P. 1906–1913 Études sur Leonard de Vinci, 3 vols., Paris.
  • Grant, Edward, 1979. “The Condemnation of 1277, God's Absolute Power, and Physical Thought in the Late Middle Ages,” Viator, 10: 211–44.
  • –––, 1996. The Foundations of Modern Science in the Middle Ages. Their Religious, Institutional, and Intellectual Contexts, Cambridge.
  • Hissette, Roland, 1977. Enquête sur les 219 articles condamnés à Paris le 7 mars 1277, Louvain.
  • –––, 1982. “Albert le Grand et Thomas d'Aquin dans la censure parisienne du 7 mars 1277,” in Studien zur mittelalterlichen Geistesgeschichte und ihren Quellen, ed. Albert Zimmermann, pp. 229–237, Berlin.
  • –––, 1990. “Note sur le syllabus ‘antirationaliste’ du 7 mars 1277,” Revue Philosophique de Louvain, 88: 404–16.
  • –––, 1998. “Thomas d'Aquin compromis avec Gilles de Rome en mars 1277,” Revue d'Histoire Ecclésiastique,” 93: 5–26.
  • –––, 1998. “Thomas d'Aquin directement visé par la censure du 7 mars 1277? Réponse à John F. Wippel,” in: J. Hamesse (ed.), Roma, Magistra mundi. Itineraria culturae medievalis (Mélanges L.E. Boyle), Louvain-La-Neuve, pp. 425-437.
  • Mandonnet, Pierre, 1908–1911. Siger de Brabant et l'averroïsme latin au XIIIe sicle, 2 vols., Louvain.
  • Murdoch, John E., 1991. “Pierre Duhem and the History of Late Medieval Science and Philosophy in the Latin West,” in Gli studi di filosofia medievale fra otto e novecento, ed. Alfonso Maier and Ruedi Imbach, Rome, 253–302.
  • –––, 1998. “1277 and Late Medieval Natural Philosophy,” in: Jan A. Aertsen and Andreas Speer (eds.), Was ist Philosophie im Mittelalter? Berlin, New York, pp. 111–121.
  • Normore, Calvin G., 1995. “Who Was Condemned in 1277?” The Modern Schoolman, 72: 273–81.
  • Piron, Sylvain, 2011. “Le plan de l'évêque. Pour une critique interne de la condemnation du 7 Mars 1277” Recherches de Théologie et Philosophie médiévales, 78(2): 383–415.
  • Thijssen, J. M. M. H., 1998. Censure and Heresy at the University of Paris, 1200–1400, Philadelphia.
  • –––, 1997. “1277 Revisited: A New Interpretation of the Doctrinal Investigations of Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome,” Vivarium, 34: 1–29.
  • Van Steenberghen, Fernand, 1977. Maître Siger de Brabant. Louvain.
  • –––, 1980. Thomas Aquinas and Radical Aristotelianism, Washington, D.C.
  • Wielockx, Robert, 1985. Aegidii Romani, Apologia, Florence.
  • –––, 1988. “Autour du procs de Thomas d'Aquin.” In Thomas von Aquin. Werk und Wirkung im Licht neurerer Forschungen, ed. A. Zimmermann, 413–38, Berlin.
  • –––, 1999. “Procédures contre Giles de Rome et Thomas d'Aquin. Réponse à J.M.M.H. Thijssen,” Revue des sciences philosophiques et théologiques, 83: 293–313.
  • –––, 1998. “A Separate Process against Aquinas. A Response to John F. Wippel,” in: J. Hamesse (ed.), Roma, Magistra mundi. Iteneraria culturae medievalis (Mélanges L.E. Boyle), Louvain-La-Neuve, pp. 1009-1030.
  • Wippel, John F., 1977. “The Condemnations of 1270 and 1277 at Paris,” The Journal of Medieval and Renaissance Studies, 7: 169–201.
  • –––, 1995. Mediaeval Reactions to the Encounter Between Faith and Reason, Milwaukee.
  • –––, 1995. “Thomas Aquinas and the Condemnation of 1277,” The Modern Schoolman, 72: 233–72.
  • –––, 1997. “Bishop Stephen Tempier and Thomas Aquinas: A Separate Process Against Aquinas?” Freiburger Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Theologie, 44: 117–36.

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