What is faith? This entry focusses on the nature of faith, although issues about the justifiability of faith are also implicated.
The concept of faith is a broad one: at its most general ‘faith’ means much the same as ‘trust’. This entry is specifically concerned, however, with the notion of religious faith—or, rather (and the difference is important), the kind of faith exemplified in religious faith. Philosophical accounts are almost exclusively about theistic religious faith—faith in God—and they generally, though not exclusively, deal with faith as understood within the Christian branch of the Abrahamic traditions. But, although the theistic religious context settles what kind of faith is of interest, the question arises whether faith of that same general kind also belongs to other, non-theistic, religious contexts, or to contexts not usually thought of as religious at all. It may perhaps be apt to speak of the faith of—for example—a humanist, or even an atheist, using the same general sense of ‘faith’ as applies to the theist case.
Philosophical reflection on theistic religious faith has produced different accounts or models of its nature. This entry suggests that there are three key components that may feature, with varying emphases, in models of faith—namely the affective, the cognitive and the volitional. Several different principles according to which models of faith may be categorized are noted, including
- how the model relates faith as a state to faith as an act or activity;
- whether it takes its object to be exclusively propositional or not;
- the type of epistemology with which the model is associated—‘evidentialist’ or ‘fideist’;
- whether the model is necessarily restricted to theistic religious faith, or may extend beyond it.
There is, of course, no ‘established’ terminology for different models of faith. A brief initial characterisation of the principal models of faith and their nomenclature as they feature in this discussion may nevertheless be helpful—they are:
- the ‘purely affective’ model: faith as a feeling of existential confidence
- the ‘special knowledge’ model: faith as knowledge of specific truths, revealed by God
- the ‘belief’ model: faith as belief that God exists
- the ‘trust’ model: faith as belief in (trust in) God
- the ‘doxastic venture’ model: faith as practical commitment beyond the evidence to one's belief that God exists
- the ‘sub-doxastic venture’ model: faith as practical commitment without belief
- the ‘hope’ model: faith as hoping—or acting in the hope that—the God who saves exists.
The entry proceeds dialectically, with later sections presupposing the earlier discussion.
- 1. Models of faith and their key components
- 2. The affective component of faith
- 3. Faith as knowledge
- 4. Faith and reason: the epistemology of faith
- 5. Faith as belief
- 6. Faith as trust
- 7. Faith as doxastic venture
- 8. Faith as sub-doxastic venture
- 9. Faith as hope
- 10. Faith as a virtue
- 11. Faith beyond (orthodox) theism
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
An initial broad distinction is between thinking of faith as a state and thinking of it as an act, action or activity. Faith may be a state one is in, or comes to be in; it may also essentially involve something one does. An adequate account of faith, perhaps, needs to encompass both. Certainly, Christians understand faith both as a gift of God and also as requiring a human response of assent and trust, so that people's faith is something with respect to which they are both receptive and active.
There is, however, some tension in understanding faith as both a gift to be received and a venture to be willed and enacted. A philosophical account of what faith is may be expected to illuminate this apparent paradox. One principle for classifying models of faith is according to the extent to which they recognise an active component in faith itself, and the way they identify that active component and its relation to faith's other components. It is helpful to consider the components of faith (variously recognised and emphasised in different models of faith) as falling into three broad categories: the affective, the cognitive and the volitional. (There are also evaluative components in faith—but these may appear as implicated in the affective and/or the cognitive components, according to one's preferred meta-theory of value.)
One component of faith is a certain kind of affective psychological state—namely, a state of feeling confident and trusting. Some philosophers hold that faith is to be identified simply with such a state: see, for example, Clegg (1979, 229) who suggests that this may have been Wittgenstein's understanding. Faith in this sense—as one's overall ‘default’ attitude on life—provides a valuable foundation for flourishing: its loss is recognised as the psychic calamity of ‘losing one's faith’. But if foundational existential confidence is to feature in a model of religious theistic faith, more needs to be added about the kind of confidence involved. Theistic faith is essentially faith in God—and, in general, faith of the kind exemplified by theistic faith must have some intentional object. It may thus be argued that an adequate model of faith cannot reduce to something purely affective: some broadly cognitive component is also required.
What kind of cognitive component belongs to faith, then? One model identifies faith as knowledge of specific truths, revealed by God. Such a model has received prominent recent defence in the work of Alvin Plantinga, who proposes an epistemology in the tradition of the reformers, principally John Calvin. Calvin defines faith thus: ‘a firm and certain knowledge of God's benevolence towards us, founded upon the truth of the freely given promise in Christ, both revealed to our minds and sealed upon our hearts through the Holy Spirit’ (John Calvin, Institutes III, ii, 7, 551, quoted by Plantinga (2000, 244)).
Appeal to a special cognitive faculty
‘Reformed’ epistemologists have appealed to an externalist epistemology in order to maintain that theistic belief may be justified even though its truth is no more than basically evident to the believer—that is, this truth is not rationally inferable from other, more basic, beliefs, but is found to be immediately evident in the believer's experience (see Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983, Alston 1991, Plantinga 2000). On Plantinga's version, theistic beliefs count as knowledge because they are produced by the operation of a special cognitive faculty whose functional design fits it for the purpose of generating true beliefs about God. Plantinga calls this the sensus divinitatis, using—or perhaps adapting (Helm 1998)—a term of Calvin's. This quasi-perceptual faculty meets functional criteria as a mechanism that confers ‘warrant’ and (granted theism's truth) yields knowledge because God designs it just for that purpose. In defence of specifically Christian belief, Plantinga argues that the same warrant-conferring status belongs to the operation of the Holy Spirit in making the great truths of the Gospel directly known to the believer.
The welcome certainty of faith
This appeal to a God-given ‘higher’ cognitive faculty is found (in the early 12th Century) in al-Ghazâlî's Deliverance from Error, where it provides the key to the ‘Sufi’ resolution of his religious crisis and his sceptical doubts about the deliverances of sense perception and unassisted human reason. Faith is thus understood as a kind of knowledge attended by a certainty that excludes doubt. But faith will not be exclusively cognitive, if, as in Calvin's definition, faith-knowledge is not only ‘revealed to our minds’ but also ‘sealed upon our hearts’. For, on this model faith will also have an affective component that includes a welcoming of the knowledge received.
Volitional aspects of faith on the‘special knowledge’ model
This model of faith as special knowledge, certain and welcome, exhibits faith as essentially something to be received. Nevertheless, the model may acknowledge a volitional component, since an active response is required for reception of the divine gift. Such a volitional component is implied by the real possibility that faith may be resisted: indeed, it may be held that in our sinful state we will inevitably offer a resistance to faith that may be overcome only by God's grace. It is, however, a further step for persons of faith to put their revealed knowledge into practice by trusting their lives to God and seeking to obey his will. On this ‘special knowledge’ model of faith, however, this activity counts as ‘acting out’ one's faith rather than as part of faith itself. Persons of faith thus act ‘in’, ‘through’ or ‘by’ faith: but their faith itself is the revealed knowledge on which they act.
Faith seems to involve some kind of venture, even if talk of a ‘leap of faith’ may not be wholly apt. It is thus widely held that faith goes beyond what is ordinarily reasonable, in the sense that it involves accepting what cannot be established as true through the proper exercise of our naturally endowed human cognitive faculties—and this may be held to be an essential feature of faith. As Kant famously reports, in the Preface to the Second Edition of his Critique of Pure Reason: ‘I have … found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith’ (Kant 1787/1933, 29). As well, however, theist philosophers typically desire to show that faith is not ‘contrary to reason’. On models of faith that take a cognitive component as central, and construe faith's object as propositional, reasonable faith arguably needs to conform to evidentialism—the requirement, generally thought essential to rationality, to hold propositions to be true only to the extent justified on one's available evidence. Faith's venturesomeness is thus in tension with its reasonableness, and models of faith differ in the way they negotiate this tension by taking a particular stance on ‘faith and reason’. Another classificatory principle, then, is in terms of the type of epistemology of faith each particular model generates.
The epistemology of the ‘special knowledge’ model
The ‘special knowledge’ model of faith generates an epistemology under which, although ordinary cognitive faculties and sources of evidence do not yield certain knowledge of theistic truths, there is a ‘higher’ cognitive faculty that neatly makes up the deficit. This model seems thus to secure the rationality of faith: if faith consists in beliefs that have the status of knowledge, surely faith cannot fail to be rational? And, once the deliverances of the special cognitive faculty are included amongst the believer's basic experiential evidence, the evidential requirement on reasonable belief is surely satisfied? These considerations may aspire to win the high ground in the ‘faith and reason’ debate for the ‘special knowledge’ model—but it is not clear that this aspiration can finally be met.
Reflective faith and the question of entitlement
From the perspective of reflective persons of faith (or would-be faith), the question of entitlement arises: are they rationally, epistemically—even, morally—entitled to adopt or continue in their faith? This question will be existentially important, since faith will not count as of the religious kind unless commitment to it makes a significant difference to how one lives one's life. Reflective believers who are aware of the many options for faith, and the possibility of misguided and even harmful faith-commitments, will wish to be satisfied that they are justified in their faith. The theistic religious traditions hold a deep fear of idolatry—of giving one's ‘ultimate concern’ (Tillich 1957/2001) to an object unworthy of it. So the desire to be assured of entitlement to faith is not merely externally imposed by commitment to philosophical critical values: it is a demand internal to the integrity of theistic faith itself. Arguably, believers must even take seriously the possibility that the God they have been worshipping is not, after all, the true God (Johnston 2009). But, for this concern to be met, there will need to be conditions sufficient for justified faith that are ‘internalist’—that is, conditions whose obtaining is, at least indirectly if not directly, accessible to believers themselves. Those conditions may plausibly be presumed to include the evidentialist requirement that faith is justified only if the truth of its cognitive content is adequately supported by the available evidence.
The ‘knowledge’ model as leaving the question of entitlement unanswered
It may be argued, however, that, if the ‘special knowledge’ model is correct, those who accept evidentialism will be unable to satisfy themselves of their entitlement to their faith. Theistic truths may be directly revealed, and experienced as certainly and immediately evident, yet, on reflection, one may doubt whether such experiences are genuinely revelatory since competing interpretations seem at least possible. It may be true, as Plantinga's Reformed epistemology emphasises, that if God exists such experiences meet externalist criteria for knowledge, even though the truth of the beliefs concerned remains open to reflective ‘internalist’ doubt. On an externalist account, that is, one might lack independent evidence sufficient to confirm that one has knowledge that God exists while in fact possessing that very knowledge. And one might thus refute an objector who claims that without adequate evidence one cannot genuinely know. But this is still, it may be argued, insufficient to secure entitlement to theistic faith—assuming that entitlement requires that one has evidence adequate to establish one's knowledge, or even just one's justified belief, that God exists. For, one has such evidence only conditionally on God's existence—but it is precisely entitlement to believe that God exists that is at issue (Kenny 1992, 71; Bishop and Aijaz 2004).
If faith is not ‘a firm and certain knowledge’ of theistic truths, then a model of faith as having a propositional object may be retained by identifying faith with a certain kind of belief. The relevant kind will be belief with theological content—that God exists, is benevolent towards us, has a plan of salvation, etc.—where this belief is also held with sufficient firmness and conviction. Richard Swinburne labels this the ‘Thomist view’ of faith, and expresses it thus: ‘The person of religious faith is the person who has the theoretical conviction that there is a God.’ (Swinburne 2005, 138). (Aquinas's own understanding of faith is more complex than this formulation suggests, however, as will be noted shortly.)
The rationality of faith on this model will rest on the rationality of the firmly held theological beliefs in which it consists. As Swinburne notes, if such beliefs are founded on evidence that renders their truth sufficiently more probable than not, then the beliefs concerned may amount to knowledge on a contemporary ‘justified true belief’ fallibilist epistemology, even though they fall short of knowledge on Aquinas's own criteria, which require that what is known be ‘seen’ (i.e., fully and directly comprehended) (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 1, 4 & 5 (O'Brien 1974, 27)). But, in any case, if success attends the extended natural theological project to which Swinburne has notably contributed, the reasonableness of faith on this model will straightforwardly be vindicated.
Some argue, however, that the truth of theism is ‘evidentially ambiguous’—that is, that our total available evidence is equally viably interpreted from both a theist and a naturalist/atheist perspective (Hick 1966 and 1989; Davis 1978; Penelhum 1995; McKim 2001). This thesis of evidential ambiguity may be supported as the best explanation of the diversity of belief on religious matters, and/or of the persistence of the debate about theism, with philosophers of equal acumen and integrity engaged on either side. Or the ambiguity may be considered systematic—for example, on the grounds that both natural theological and natural atheological arguments fail because they are deeply circular, resting on implicit assumptions acceptable only to those already thinking within the relevant perspective. (In relation to Swinburne's Bayesian natural theology, in particular, this objection surfaces in criticism of assumptions about how to set the prior probabilities implicated in calculations of, for example, theism's probability on the evidence of the ‘fine-tuning’ of the Universe's basic physical constants, or of the probability, on all our evidence, of the truth of the Resurrection.) If the ambiguity thesis is correct, then—assuming evidentialism—firmly held theistic belief will fail to be reasonable.
On this model of faith as belief, all that characterises faith apart from its theological content is the firmness or conviction with which faith-propositions are held true. Firm belief in the truth of a scientific proposition, for example, will fail to count as faith only through lacking the right kind of content. This model therefore shares with the ‘special knowledge’ model in taking its theological content as essential to what makes theistic faith faith, and so rejects the suggestion that faith of the same sort as found in the theistic religious traditions might also be found elsewhere.
Furthermore, in taking faith to consist in belief that theological propositions are true, this model invites the assumption that theological convictions belong in the same category of factual claims as scientific theoretical hypotheses with which they accordingly compete. That assumption will lead those who think that theological claims are not reasonably accepted on the evidence to regard faith as worthless and intellectually dishonourable—at best, ‘a degenerating research programme’ (Lakatos 1970). (On this negative assessment of faith's evidential support, persons of faith come perilously close to the schoolboy's definition mentioned by William James: ‘Faith is when you believe something that you know ain't true’ (James 1896/1956, 29). Or, if believers readily abandon theological explanations whenever competing scientific ones succeed, their God gets reduced to ‘the God of the gaps’.) These misgivings about the model of faith as firmly held factual theological belief dissolve, of course, if the ‘Swinburnean’ extended natural theological project succeeds. Those who suspect that this success will not be forthcoming, however, may look towards a model of faith that exhibits its cognitive content as playing some other role than that of a high-level scientific explanatory hypothesis.
Aquinas's account of faith
Though firmly held theological belief is central to it, Aquinas's understanding of faith is more complicated and nuanced than the view that faith is ‘the theoretical conviction that God exists’. Aquinas holds that faith is ‘midway between knowledge and opinion’ (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 1, 2 (O'Brien 1974, 11)). Faith resembles knowledge, Aquinas thinks, in so far as faith carries conviction. But that conviction is not well described as ‘theoretical’, if that description suggests that faith has a solely propositional object. For Aquinas, faith denotes the believer's fundamental orientation towards the divine. So ‘from the perspective of the reality believed in’, Aquinas says, ‘the object of faith is something non-composite’ (non-propositional)—namely God himself. Nevertheless, grasping the truth of propositions is essential to faith, because ‘from the perspective of the one believing … the object of faith is something composite in the form of a proposition’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 1, 2 (O'Brien 1974, 11 & 13), my emphases).
A further problem with describing as Thomist a model of faith simply as firm belief in theological propositions is that Aquinas takes as central an act of ‘inner assent’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 2, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 59–65)). This is problematic because, (i) in its dominant technical usage belief is taken to be a mental (intentional) state—a propositional attitude, namely, the attitude towards the relevant proposition that it is true; (ii) belief in this sense is widely agreed not to be under volitional control—not directly, anyway; yet (iii) Aquinas holds that the assent given in faith is under the control of the will. Aquinas need not, however, be construed as accepting ‘believing at will’, provided we allow that inner assent may be an act without being an intentional action. Assent may be construed as something that has to be elicited yet terminates a process that is subject to the will—a process of inquiry, deliberation or pondering that does involve mental actions, or, in the case of faith, a process of divine grace that may be blocked by the will.
Most importantly, however, Aquinas says that assent is given to the propositional articles of faith because their truth is revealed by God, and on the authority of the putative source of this revelation. Terence Penelhum puts it like this: ‘Thomas tells us that although what one assents to in faith includes many items not ostensibly about God himself, one assents to them, in faith, because they are revealed by God … It is because they come from him and because they lead to him that the will disposes the intellect to accept them’ (Penelhum 1989, 122: see Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 1, 1 & 2 (O'Brien 1974, 5–15)). So Aquinas's model of faith is of believing (assenting to) propositional truth-claims on the basis of authoritative divine testimony. This is the same model found in John Locke: ‘Faith … is the assent to any proposition … upon the credit of the proposer, as coming from God, in some extraordinary way of communication’ (Locke 1698/1924, 355; compare also Alston 1996, 15).
The unanswered question of entitlement—again
Faith as assent to truths on the basis of an authoritative source of divine revelation is possible, though, only for those who already believe that God exists and is revealed through the relevant sources. Might such faith, then, have to rest on a prior faith—faith that God exists and that this is his messenger or vehicle of communication? Those foundational claims, it might be maintained, are held true on the grounds of adequately supporting evidence, such as successful arguments of natural theology and/or evidence for miraculous endorsement of a prophet's authority. Faith might then have a purely rational foundation. But this could hardly be so for every person of faith, since not everyone who believes will have access to the relevant evidence or be able to assess it properly. Besides, although Aquinas allows that rational assessment of the available evidence may lead a person to faith, he does not think that such an assessment could ever elicit assent itself—only demonstration can achieve that (see O'Brien, 1974, footnote 2b, 58–9). Aquinas's view is thus that all believers stand in need of God's grace: ‘the assent of faith, which is its principal act … has as its cause God, moving us inwardly through grace’ ((Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae 6, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 167)). It follows, then, that believing that God exists and is revealed in specific ways is itself a matter of faith, and not a purely rationally establishable prolegomenon to it.
Aquinas's model of faith thus shares with the ‘special knowledge’ model the problem that it leaves unanswered the reflective believer's concern about entitlement. Attempting to settle that concern by meeting the evidential requirement leads to circularity: believers are to accept theological truths on divine authority, yet the truth that there is such an authority (historically mediated as the relevant tradition maintains) is amongst those very truths that are to be accepted on divine authority—indeed, it is the crucial one. As Descartes puts it in the Dedication to his Meditations, ‘although it is absolutely true that we must believe there is a God, because we are so taught in the Holy Scriptures, and, on the other hand, that we must believe the Holy Scriptures because they come from God …, we nevertheless could not place this argument before infidels, who might accuse us of reasoning in a circle’ (Haldane and Ross 1967, 133).
Aquinas and Calvin: faith as accepting theological propositions as divinely revealed
The fact that Aquinas's model shares this epistemic limitation with Calvin's is no accident: both understand faith as (or as essentially involving) the grasping of propositionally expressible truths as divinely revealed through willingly receiving God's gracious gift of that very revelation. Both Aquinas and Calvin take firm belief to be essential to faith, though they differ in whether or not to count it as knowledge. Calvin takes the vehicle of revelation to be a special cognitive faculty, whereas Aquinas takes it to be the tradition, as transmitted through the Church. And the grace that is needed for assent works, for Aquinas, not through a special quasi-perceptual cognitive mechanism, but by enabling the will to avoid blocking assent to the revealed truth. Plantinga's work has effectively displayed what these two Christian thinkers have in common, and he thus aptly names his own model of faith the ‘A/C model’ (Plantinga 2000, 168–86). His appeal to externalist epistemology supplies something needed for a philosophical defence of faith understood in this way, although arguably not all that is required, if it is fair to press the question of entitlement that appears to remain unanswered.
Revelation—and its philosophical critique
The justifiability of belief that God exists is typically the focal issue in the Philosophy of Religion. Yet the theistic traditions always include a foundational claim about an authoritative source, or sources, of revealed truth. Religious theism is not just believing that God exists; it is believing that God exists and is revealed thus and so (in great historical acts, in prophets, in scriptures, in wisdom handed down, etc.). The reasonableness of theism is therefore as much a matter of the reasonableness of an epistemology of revelation as it is of a metaphysics of perfect being. The question of how God may be expected to make himself known has gained prominence through recent discussion of the argument for atheism from ‘divine hiddenness’ (Schellenberg 1993; Howard-Snyder and Moser 2002). That argument assumes that a loving God would make his existence clear—but this assumption is open to question. Perhaps God provides only, as it were, ‘secret’ evidence of his existence, purposely overturning the expectations of our ‘cognitive idolatry’ in order to transform our egocentric self-reliance (Moser 2008); besides, there may be significant constraints logically inherent in the very possibility of unambiguous divine revelation to finite minds (King 2008).
Similarly, accounts of theistic faith will be open to critique when they make assumptions about the mechanisms of revelation. In particular, the model of faith as assent to propositions as revealed holds that, since God's grace is required for that assent, when grace is effective the whole ‘package deal’ of propositional revealed truth is accepted. This yields the notion of ‘the Faith’, as the body of theological truths to be accepted by ‘the faithful’, and it becomes a sign of resistance to divine grace to ‘pick and choose’ only some truths, as heretics do (Greek: hairesis, choice) (see Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 5, 3 (O'Brien 1974, 157–61). For heresy to be judged, however, some human authority must assume it possesses the full doctrinal revelation, with God's grace operating without resistance in its own case. Whether that assumption can ever be sufficiently well founded to justify condemning others is an important question, whose neglect may be seriously harmful, as we are reminded by the fact that the phrase for ‘act of faith’ in Portuguese—auto-da-fé—came to mean the public burning of a heretic.
But the deeper assumption made by this model of faith as belief (as, too, by the ‘special knowledge’ model) is that God's self-revelation is primarily the revelation of the truth of propositions articulated in human language (compare Swinburne 1992). Alternative understandings of revelation are available, however. In particular, it may be held that it is primarily the divine presence itself that is revealed—the reality, not merely a representation of it. Propositional articulations of what is revealed may still be essential, but they need to be accepted as at a remove from the object of revelation itself, and therefore as limited. The process of arriving at propositional articulations expressing the nature and will of the self-revealing God—the doctrines of ‘the Faith’—will, of course, be understood as a process under providential grace. It is often assumed, however, that that process can achieve ‘closure’ in a completed set of infallible credal beliefs. But this assumption about how divine inspiration operates may be contested, both on the theological grounds that it reflects the all-too-human desire to gain control over God's self-revelation (to ‘pin God down once and for all’), and on the wider epistemological grounds that any attempt to grasp independent reality in human language will be in principle fallible and subject to revision in the light of future experience.
Not all models of faith are primarily propositional, however. Theistic faith may seem better expressed as believing in God, rather than as believing that God exists—for example, the Christian creeds begin ‘Credo in unum Deum …’—and it is arguable that ‘belief in’ is neither merely an idiomatic variant on, nor reducible to, ‘belief that’ (Price 1965). It may thus be held that faith as accepting propositional truths as divinely revealed rests on believing in God—and it is this ‘believing in’ which is, fundamentally, the nature of faith.
What more is there to believing in God beyond believing that God exists, on this non-reductive view?. To believe in God is to make a practical commitment—the kind involved in trusting God, or, trusting in God. (The root meaning of the Greek pistis, ‘faith’, is ‘trust’.) This, then, is a model of faith as trust—but of trust not simply in the sense of an affective state of confidence, but in the sense of an action. On this fiducial model of faith, the volitional component of faith takes central place, with the cognitive component entailed by it. The fiducial model is widely identified as Protestant. Swinburne, for example, calls it the ‘Lutheran’ model, and defines it thus: ‘the person of faith does not merely believe that there is a God (and believe certain propositions about him)—he trusts Him and commits himself to Him’ (2005, 142). Yet, as noted earlier, Aquinas takes the ultimate object of faith to be God, ‘the first reality’, and, furthermore, understands ‘formed’ faith as trusting commitment to God, motivated by, and directed towards, love of God as one's true end (see Summa Theologiae 2a2ae, 4, 3; O'Brien 1974, 123–7). It is true that Aquinas attributes faith to the devils—but this ‘faith’ amounts only to their belief that what the Church teaches is the truth, arrived at not by grace but ‘forced from them’ reluctantly by ‘the acumen of their natural intelligence’ (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae, 5, 2; O'Brien 1974, 155 & 157). So Aquinas's account of ‘saving’ faith is also a fiducial model.
The venture of trust
If faith is a kind of trust, then we may expect our understanding of faith to profit from an analysis of trust. Conceptually fundamental to trust is the notion of a person (or persons)—the truster—trusting in some agent or agency—the trustee—for some (assumedly) favourable outcome (though what the trustee is trusted for is often only implicit in the context). As noted at the outset, there is a usage of ‘faith’ for which ‘having/placing faith in’ is (near enough) synonymous with ‘trusting’ or ‘trusting in’. But this usage, of course, omits whatever is distinctive about the kind of trusting that is involved in faith of the theistic sort. Nevertheless, it is worth considering what follows about theistic faith from holding it to be a kind of trust.
Trust involves a venture; so too—it is widely agreed—does faith. So, if faith is trust, the venture of faith might be presumed to be the type of venture implicated in trust. A venture is an action that places the agent and outcomes of concern to the agent significantly beyond the agent's own control. Trust implies venture. When we trust we commit ourselves to another's control, accepting—and, when necessary, co-operating as ‘patient’—with the decisions of the trustee. Venturing in trust is usually assumed to be essentially risky, making oneself vulnerable to adverse outcomes or betrayal. (Swinburne makes the point this way: ‘To trust someone is to act on the assumption that she will do for you what she knows that you want or need, when the evidence gives some reason for supposing that she may not and where there will be bad consequences if the assumption is false’ (2005, 143). Annette Baier puts it somewhat differently, taking trust to involve ‘accepted vulnerability to another's possible but not expected ill will (or lack of good will) toward one’ (Baier 1986, 234).) Accordingly, it seems sensible to hold that one should trust only with good reason. But if, as is plausible, good reason to trust requires sufficient evidence of the trustee's trustworthiness, reasonable trust appears both to have its venturesomeness diminished and, at the same time, to become more difficult to achieve than we normally suppose. For we often lack adequate—or even, any—evidence of a trustee's trustworthiness in advance of our venture, yet in many such cases we suppose that our trust is entirely reasonable. But, if adequate evidence of trustworthiness is not required for reasonable trust, how is reasonable trust different from ‘blind’ trust?
This problem might be avoided by arguing that the question of when one may rationally trust another may be resolved by a decision theoretic calculation, factoring in the extent to which one's evidence supports the potential trustee's trustworthiness and the utilities or disutilities of the possible outcomes. It may thus on occasion be practically rational to trust a person whose likelihood of trustworthiness is low, if a sufficiently valuable outcome may be achieved only by so doing. (An unlikely rescuer may rationally be trusted if the only one available.) But this approach misses something important in social intercourse, where we generally count it a virtue to be ready to trust others decisively without such prior calculation. Such openness may still be broadly rational, however, given our long shared experience that willingness to trust others usually does elicit trustworthy behaviour: accordingly, though I may have little or no direct evidence that this particular fellow citizen of mine will prove trustworthy if I turn to her in a sudden predicament, I may have good evidence for the general reliability of others in my community.
Nevertheless, it can sometimes be reasonable to act decisively on the assumption that people will be worthy of trust in quite particular respects without having evidence for their trustworthiness sufficient to justify such decisiveness (see, for example, Adams 1987). And this seems to be because, in such cases, (i) what has to be decided is all or nothing—whether to trust or not—so that tentatively taking the trustee to be trustworthy only to the partial degree supported by one's evidence is just not a separate option; and (ii) at the point where the decision has to be made it is impossible that there should be evidence that justifies more than modest partial belief—impossible that evidence should justify decisively taking the trustee to be trustworthy. Such cases provide a particularly interesting class of exceptions to the general evidentialist requirement to take a proposition to be true only as justified by one's evidence. They are interesting because they do not involve non-epistemic considerations overriding epistemic ones, as is the case with some readily recognisable types of exception to trust-evidentialism—for example, cases where being in an established relationship with someone obliges one to trust contrary to the weight of one's evidence; or cases of ‘educative’ or ‘therapeutic’ trust, where others are trusted in order to develop or restore their trustworthiness. In the target cases, the epistemic concern to grasp truth and avoid falsehood is not overridden: they are cases where the truth that a person is trustworthy may be beneficially grasped only if one first takes it that the person is trustworthy beyond the possible support of evidence—though once the venture is made conclusive evidence of trustworthiness may happily soon accumulate.
On a model that takes religious faith to consist in an act of trust, the analogy with the venture of interpersonal trust is suggestive. Yet there are significant differences. For one thing, venturing in trust does not carry risk if God really is the trustee. ‘A mother's tender care may cease toward the child she bare: she may be forgetful, yet will I remember thee, for mine is an unchanging love,’ as—more or less—the hymn has the Lord declare. Rather, the venture involved in trusting in God (if such there be) seems doxastic: the one who trusts ventures in believing that God exists and may be relied on for salvation. A model of theistic faith as trust thus appears to have, at its foundation, faith as doxastic venture: trusting in God seems to presuppose trusting that God exists. But, then, of course, the question whether, and under what conditions, one may be entitled to such a venture becomes pressing.
One way to relieve this pressure is to offer a non-realist analysis of theological claims. Trusting God will then not entail any commitment to reality's being a certain way. Rather, on the non-realist view, theological claims arise because living ‘trustingly’ comes to be expressed and reinforced through a culturally constructed fiction (about God and his great saving acts). That existential confidence may then be described, using the language of the fiction, as ‘trusting God’ (Cupitt 1980, Geering 1994). On such a non-realist account, the model of faith as trust brackets the cognitive component of faith—and becomes, in effect, a model of faith as purely a certain kind of affective state. But, as noted earlier, those who take faith to have a genuinely cognitive component (a grasping—or would-be grasping—of how things really are) could not be satisfied with such a reductive model.
Defending doxastic venture by analogy with interpersonal trust?
It might be suggested that entitlement to theistic doxastic venture may still be defended by analogy with the propriety of decisively trusting another beyond one's evidence. Reflecting on that suggestion discloses further points of disanalogy, however. In cases of interpersonal trust a venture is often needed in initially taking the trustee to be trustworthy, but evidence will inevitably later emerge which will either confirm or disconfirm the truth of that claim—and trust may, and rationally should, be withdrawn if the news is bad. Furthermore, interpersonal trust does not require actually believing that the trustee is worthy of trust, only that one decisively takes this to be true (i.e., acts on the assumption of its truth) when one comes to act. People of theistic faith, however, typically do believe that God exists and may be trusted for salvation, and, if—as we are here assuming—acting on this belief ventures beyond evidential support, then it is a venture that persists and is not confined to initial commitment only. Psychologically, no doubt, continuing to journey in theistic faith may reinforce one's commitment—but the reinforcing experiences (which often involve faith renewed in the face of apparent failures of divine love) do not have the status of evidence that independently confirms the initial venture.
Doxastic venture without doxastic voluntarism
Many dismiss the idea that one may venture in believing that God exists as committing a category error: ventures are voluntary, but propositional belief is not directly under voluntary control. Trusting God, however, entails practical commitment to the truth of theological faith-propositions (though the converse entailment fails)—and commitment to the truth of a proposition in one's practical reasoning is under direct voluntary control.
It is one thing to be in the mental state of holding that p is true; it is another to take p to be true in one's practical reasoning (although these typically go together, since to hold that p is true is to be disposed to take p to be true in practical reasoning when the question whether p becomes salient). Practical commitment to a faith-proposition therefore could be a venture: there is no misguided ‘doxastic voluntarism’ in allowing this possibility. Doxastic venture is thus not a matter of willing oneself to believe without adequate evidential support; rather it is a matter of taking an already held belief to be true in one's practical reasoning while recognising that its truth lacks such support.
The psychological possibility of doxastic venture
Some philosophers have argued, however, that one cannot (in full reflective awareness, anyway) believe that p while accepting that one has insufficient evidence for p's truth (Adler 2002). The counterclaim that this is possible is defended by William James, in his controversial 1896 lecture, ‘The Will to Believe’ (James 1896/1956). James agrees that belief must be evoked—one cannot simply believe at will (he later came to regret his lecture's title). But he observes that many beliefs have causes that do not constitute an evidential grounding of their truth: James labels these causes ‘passional’—again, a potentially misleading term, since it includes much more than emotional causes of belief. In particular, beliefs may be caused by ‘the circumpressure of one's caste or set’, of which one's inherited religious tradition is a paradigm case (James 1896/1956, 9). James is thus able to explain the psychological possibility of doxastic venture: one already has a ‘passionally’ caused belief, which one then takes to be true in practical reasoning while recognising its lack of adequate evidential grounding (compare Creel 1994, who takes ‘faith’ to connote a ‘non-evidential doxastic passion’). A doxastic venture model of theistic faith thus reconciles faith as gift with faith as an action: the action is taking a faith-proposition to be true in practical reasoning; the gift provides the motivational resources for so doing, namely a firm belief in the truth of the faith-proposition, despite its recognised lack of adequate evidential grounding.
Examples of doxastic venture models: Kierkegaard and Tillich
On the doxastic venture model, faith involves full commitment, in the face of the recognition that this is not ‘objectively’ justified on the evidence. Kierkegaard's Concluding Unscientific Postcript definition of faith as ‘an objective uncertainty held fast in an appropriation process of the most passionate inwardness’ (Kierkegaard 1846/1968, 180) is an example of a doxastic venture model. So too is Paul Tillich's account of faith as ‘the state of being ultimately concerned’, since the claim of the object of one's ultimate concern to ‘promise total fulfilment even if all other claims have to be subjected to it or rejected in its name’ cannot in principle be established on the basis of the evidence. (Tillich, 1957/2001, 1 and 21).
Doxastic venture model contrasted with evidential proportion models: the status of Aquinas's model
The doxastic venture model contrasts with what Paul Helm has called evidential proportion models of faith (Helm 2000, 21). Calvin's model and Plantinga's A/C model count as evidential proportion models, once it is allowed that believers' evidence includes what is immediately evident in their experience through the operation of divinely ordained mechanisms of revelation. (Plantinga originally expressed his defence of properly basic theistic belief in terms of the rationality of believing in God ‘without any evidence or argument at all’ (Plantinga 1983, 17). But in fact Plantinga endorses the evidentialist requirement on rational theistic belief—his point is just that this requirement may be fully met through what is basically, non-inferentially, evident in the believer's experience. Hence Plantinga's insistence that his Reformed epistemology is not fideistic (Plantinga 2000, 263).)
Aquinas's model of faith, though widely thought of as an evidential proportion model, may arguably be better classified as a doxastic venture model, since, as already noted in Section 5, Aquinas holds that the available evidence, though it supports the truth of foundational faith-propositions, does not provide what Aquinas counts as sufficient (i.e. demonstrative) support to justify inner assent (in addition to references to the Summa Theologiae given previously, see 2a2ae. 2, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 63); and compare also Penelhum 1989, 120). Now, whether practical commitment to the truth of a given faith-proposition does or does not venture beyond adequate evidential support will be relative to assumptions about (a) where the level of evidential support required for ‘adequacy’ should be set, and (b) just how firm and decisive propositional faith-commitment needs to be. On some such assumptions, for example those made by Bayesians, the support provided by the evidence Aquinas adduces—or, by a suitable contemporary upgrading of that evidence—may be considered enough to make reasonable a sufficiently high degree of belief (or credence) in theistic faith-propositions—albeit a credence less than 1—so that there is no venturing beyond the support of the evidence. Interpreting Aquinas's model of faith as an evidential proportion model may thus be viable. Nevertheless, Aquinas's own assumptions on these matters may leave him closer to Kierkegaard and Tillich than is commonly thought (consider Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 4, 1 and, once again, 2a2ae 6, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 117–9 & 167)).
The special role of faith-propositions
It may be argued (again, by Bayesians, for example) that once practical commitment to the truth of propositions is recognised as a matter of degree, there are no possible circumstances where ‘the evidence does not decide’, and so no occasion for faith as doxastic venture. But if the domain of faith is, as C.Stephen Evans puts it, ‘the assumptions, convictions and attitudes which the believer brings to the evidence for and against religious truth’ (Evans 1985, 178), and faith's cognitive component offers a ‘total interpretation’ of the world of our experience (Hick 1966, 154), then (foundational) faith-propositions function as ‘highest-order framing principles’ which necessarily cannot have their truth settled by appeal to the force of a body of independent evidence (Bishop 2007a, 139–44). Taking such a faith-proposition to be true, then, is not something that comes in degrees: either one ‘buys into’ the overall worldview a (foundational) faith-proposition proposes, or one does not. Such a choice is existentially important, and settling it raises anxiety about exercising a responsibility that cannot—without ‘bad faith’—be transferred onto the relatively impersonal function of one's reason, since a venture beyond any rational certification is required. The doxastic venture model may thus be regarded as capturing the spiritual challenge of faith more satisfactorily than evidential proportion models do, since it involves a deeper surrender of self-reliant control, not only in trusting God, but in accepting that there is a God—indeed, this God—who is to be trusted.
Doxastic venture models of faith and epistemic concern
Doxastic venture in favour of faith-propositions can be justifiable, of course, only if there are legitimate exceptions to the evidentialist requirement to take a proposition to be true just to the extent of its evidential support—and only if the legitimate exceptions include the kind of case involved in religious, theistic, faith-commitment.
A possible view of theistic faith-commitment is that it is wholly independent of the epistemic concern that cares about evidential support: faith then reveals its authenticity most clearly when it takes faith-propositions to be true contrary to the weight of the evidence. This view is widely described as ‘fideist’, but ought more fairly to be called arational fideism, or, where commitment contrary to the evidence is positively favoured, irrational or counter-rational fideism. Despite its popular attribution both to the church father Tertullian and to ‘the father of existentialism’, Kierkegaard, counter-rational fideism does not seem to have been espoused by any significant theistic philosophers (passages in Tertullian and Kierkegaard that appear to endorse this position may be interpreted as emphasising that Christian faith requires accepting, not logical contradiction, but ‘contradiction’ of our ‘natural’ expectations, wholly overturned in the revelation that the power of divine love is triumphant in the Crucified One).
Serious philosophical defence of a doxastic venture model of faith amounts to a supra-rational fideism, for which epistemic concern is not overridden and for which, therefore, it is a constraint on faith-commitment that it not accept what is known, or justifiably believed on the evidence, to be false. Rather, faith commits itself only beyond, and not against, the evidence—and it does so out of epistemic concern to grasp truth on matters of vital existential importance. The thought that one may be entitled to commit to an existentially momentous truth-claim in principle undecidable on the evidence when forced to decide either to do so or not is what motivates William James's ‘justification of faith’ in ‘The Will to Believe’ (James 1896/1956). If such faith can be justified, its cognitive content will (on realist assumptions) have to cohere with our best evidence-based theories about the real world. Faith may extend our scientific grasp of the real, but may not counter it. Whether the desire to grasp more truth about the real than science can supply is a noble aspiration or a dangerous delusion is at the heart of the debate about entitlement to faith on this supra-rational fideist doxastic venture model.
A fuller discussion of the debate between the moderate, Jamesian, fideist and the evidentialist is beyond this entry's scope. Still, it is worth remarking that those who think that faith as doxastic venture can be justified face the challenge of providing the tools for weeding out distorted and unjustifiable forms of faith. On the other side, those who reject doxastic venture as impermissible have to consider whether taking a stance on the nature of reality beyond anything science can even in principle confirm may not, in the end, be unavoidable, and potentially implicated in the commitments required for science itself (see Bishop 2007a, Chapters 8 and 9).
Some accounts allow that faith involves practical commitment venturing beyond evidential support, yet do not require (or, even, permit) that the venturer actually believes the faith-proposition assumed to be true. This variant may be called the ‘sub-doxastic venture’ model of faith. F.R.Tennant holds a view of this kind: he takes faith to be the adoption of a line of conduct not warranted by present facts, that involves experimenting with the possible or ideal, venturing into the unknown and taking the risk of disappointment and defeat. Faith is not an attempt to will something into existence but rather treating hoped for and unseen things as if they were real and then acting accordingly (Tennant 1943/1989 p.104). Swinburne refers to this as the ‘pragmatist’ model (Swinburne 2005, 147–8; Swinburne 2001, 211; compare Golding 1990, 2003; Buckareff 2005; and Schellenberg 2005).
William Alston (1996) suggests that faith may involve ‘acceptance’ rather than belief; a sub-doxastic venture model then results if (as Jonathan Cohen holds) to accept that p is ‘to have or adopt a policy of deeming, positing, or postulating that p—i.e. of including that proposition … among one's premisses for deciding what to do or think in a particular context, whether or not one feels it to be true that p’ (Cohen 1992, 4). The firmness of faith-commitment is then just the firmness of one's ‘resolve to use [faith-claims] as a basis for one's thought, attitude and behaviour’ (Alston 1996, 17): there is no firm assurance of their truth. Decisive commitment in the absence of such assurance may nevertheless be possible, motivated (as Swinburne suggested in the first edition of his Faith and Reason) by the evaluative belief that ‘unless [faith-propositions are true], that which is most worthwhile is not to be had’ (Swinburne, 1981, 117). This is a religiously austere model of faith, with God's grace playing a more limited role than usually supposed.
Some philosophers have suggested that the epistemological challenges faced by accounts of faith as involving belief beyond the evidence may be avoided by construing theistic commitment as hope. Theistic hope seems not to be mere tenacity (‘clinging to one's hopes’) (Taylor 1961), but a more complex attitude. James Muyskens suggests, for example, that one who hopes ‘keep[s] his life open or fluid with respect to [a faith-proposition] p—where (a) neither p nor not-p is certain for him, (b) he wants p and (c) he sees p as constructively connected with his own well-being and/or concept of himself as a person’ (1979, 35). Muyskens contrasts hope with faith (understood as belief), arguing that a religion of hope is both epistemically and religiously superior to a religion of faith. But faith is not generally thought of as competing with hope (Creel 1993); indeed, other philosophers identify faith with hoping that the claims of faith are true (Pojman 1986; 2003). Hope as such is an attitude rather than an active commitment: a model of faith as hope may thus, more strictly, take faith to be acting in, or from, hope. It then comes close to a sub-doxastic venture model of faith, differing only in so far as acting from hope that God exists differs from taking this claim to be true (albeit without belief) in one's practical reasoning—and this difference may be undetectable at the level of behavioural outcomes. A model of faith as acting in hope also shares with the sub-doxastic venture model in leaving out the affective certitude that is widely thought to characterise faith (Tennant 1943/1989, 112).
Faith is traditionally regarded as one of the ‘theological’ virtues. If a virtue is a ‘disposition of character which instantiates or promotes responsiveness to one or more basic goods’, then theistic faith qualifies since it is ‘a responsiveness to practical hope and truth’, provided theistic faith-claims are indeed true (Chappell 1996, 27). Faith will not, however, be a virtue as such, if it is accepted that faith can be misplaced or, even, ‘demonic’, directed upon a ‘false ultimate’ (Tillich 1957/2001, 21). To be virtuous, faith must be faith in a worthy object: it is faith in God that is the theological virtue. More generally, faith is virtuous only when it is faith to which one is entitled. An account of the conditions under which faith is permissible is thus the key to an ethics of faith.
On models of faith as a (special) kind of knowledge, or as firmly held belief, it may seem puzzling how faith could be a virtue—unless some implicit volitional component emerges when such models are further explicated, or, alternatively, a case can be made for the claim that what is involuntary may nevertheless be praiseworthy, with theistic faith as a case in point (Adams 1987). Furthermore, as already suggested (Sections 4 & 5 above), models of faith as knowledge or belief fail to provide non-circular conditions sufficient for entitlement, unless the truth of faith-propositions is established by independent argument and evidence. Purely fiducial, evidential proportion, models of faith make it easy enough to see how faith may be praiseworthy—though they will stand in need of a defence that the God who is trusted is indeed the true God. Doxastic (and sub-doxastic) venture models of faith need entitlement conditions, to ensure that not just any ‘leap of faith’ is permissible—the Jamesian account already mentioned (Section 7) aims to meet this need. Arguably, James's own view of what suffices to justify a faith-venture needs an ethical supplement: both the non-evidential motivation for the venture and its content must be morally acceptable (Bishop 2007a, 163–6).
Faith is only one of the theological virtues, of course, the others being hope and charity (or love, agape): and St Paul famously affirms that the greatest of these is love (I Corinthians 13). The question thus arises how these three virtues are related. One suggestion is that faith is taking it to be true that there are grounds for the hope that love is supreme—not simply in the sense that love constitutes the ideal of the supreme good, but in the sense that living in accordance with this ideal constitutes an ultimate salvation, fulfilment or consummation that is, in reality, victorious over all that may undermine it (in a word, over evil). The supremacy of love is linked to the supremacy of the divine itself, since love is the essential nature of the divine. What is hoped for, and what faith assures us is properly hoped for, is a sharing in the divine itself, loving as God loves (see Brian Davies on Aquinas, 2002). On this understanding, reducing faith to a kind of hope (Section 9 above) would eradicate an important relation between the two—namely that people of faith take reality to be such that their hope (for salvation, the triumph of the good) is well founded, and not merely an attractive fantasy or inspiring ideal.
What is the potential scope of faith? On some models, the kind of faith exemplified by theistic faith is found only there. On both the ‘special knowledge’ and the ‘belief’ models, faith is intrinsically linked to theological content—indeed to orthodox theological content, specifiable as one unified set of doctrines conveyed to receptive human minds by the operation of divine grace. Both the doxastic and sub-doxastic venture models, however, allow for the possibility that authentic faith may be variously realised, and be directed upon different, and mutually incompatible, intentional objects. This is an important feature of accounts of faith in the American pragmatist tradition. John Dewey strongly rejected the notion of faith as a special kind of knowledge (Dewey 1934, 20), as did William James—and James's model of faith rests on a permissibility thesis, under which varied and conflicting faith-commitments may equally have a place in the ‘intellectual republic’ (James 1896/1956, 30).
Both Dewey and James defend models of faith with a view to advancing the idea that authentic religious faith may be found outside what is generally supposed to be theological orthodoxy. Furthermore, they suggest that ‘un-orthodox’ faith may be more authentic than ‘orthodox’ faith. ‘The faith that is religious’, says Dewey, ‘[I should describe as] the unification of the self through allegiance to inclusive ideal ends, which imagination presents to us and to which the human will responds as worthy of controlling our desires and choices’ (1934, 33). And James: ‘Religion says essentially two things: First, she says that the best things are the more eternal things, the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word…. [and] the second affirmation of religion is that we are better off now if we believe her first affirmation to be true’ (James 1896/1956, 25–6). Both Dewey and James seek to naturalise (or, better, de-supernaturalise) theistic religion, and, while some of what they say appears non-realist, they do in fact preserve the idea that religious faith aspires to grasp, beyond the evidence, vital truth about the real world. Indeed, Dewey agrees that religious belief grounds hope: it involves taking something to be true about the real world ‘which carr[ies] one through periods of darkness and despair to such an extent that they lose their usual depressive character’ (1934, 14–5).
A general—i.e., non-theologically specific—account of faith may have potential as a tool for criticising philosophical formulations of the content of religious faith. The conditions for permissible faith-venture may exclude faith in God under certain inadequate conceptions of who or what God is—and arguably the ‘omniGod’ of much contemporary philosophy of religion is just such an inadequate conception (Bishop 2007b). An understanding of what faith is, then, may motivate radical explorations into the concept of God as held in the theistic traditions (Bishop 1998; Johnston 2009).
Can there be faith without adherence to any theistic tradition? Those who agree with F.R.Tennant that ‘faith is an outcome of the inborn propensity to self-conservation and self-betterment which is a part of human nature, and is no more a miraculously superadded endowment than is sensation or understanding’ (1943/1989, 111) will accept that this must be a possibility. Tennant himself suggests that ‘much of the belief which underlies knowledge … is the outcome of faith which ventures beyond the apprehension and treatment of data to supposition, imagination and creation of ideal objects, and justifies its audacity and irrationality (in accounting them to be also real) by practical actualization’ (1943/1989, 100). Faith in this sense, however, may not seem quite on a par with faith of the religious kind. True, scientists must act as if their ‘ideal objects’ are real in putting their theories to the empirical test; but they will ‘account them to be also real’ only when these tests do provide confirmation.
If faith is understood as commitment beyond independent objective certification to the truth of some overall interpretation of experience and reality, then all who commit themselves to such a Weltanschauung will be people of faith. Faith of this kind may be religious, and it may be religious without being theistic, of course, as in classical Buddhism. But there may also be non-religious faith: in particular, ‘scientific’ atheists may be making a faith-venture when they take there to be no more to reality than is in principle discoverable by the natural sciences. The suggestion that atheism rests on a faith-venture will, however, be strongly resisted by those who maintain ‘the presumption of atheism’ (Flew, 1976).
An atheist's faith-venture may, however, seem oddly so described because it provides no basis for practical hope or trust. Providing such a basis may plausibly be thought necessary for faith—in which case, understanding faith purely as a cognitive venture is too austere, and needs supplementing with some requirement that the truth to which the venturer commits must be existentially important. (Note, however, that such a supplement is implied in James's requirement that doxastic venture is permissible only for resolving a ‘genuine option’, where a genuine option has inter alia to be ‘momentous’—existentially significant and pressing (James 1896/1956, 3–4).) Some hold that the truth accepted by faith must be a ‘saving’ truth—a solution to a deep problem about the human situation. Their view is thus that faith must be religious, and they accordingly enter into argument as to which religion offers the best solution to the human problem (see, for example, Yandell 1990, 1999). It is arguable, however, that an existentially vital faith that grounds hope can belong within a wholly secular context. Annette Baier suggests that ‘the secular equivalent of faith in God, which we need in morality as well as in science or knowledge acquisition, is faith in the human community and its evolving procedures—in the prospects for many-handed cognitive ambitions and moral hopes’ (Baier 1980, 133). More broadly, some maintain that a meaningful spirituality is consistent with a non-religious atheist naturalism, and include something akin to faith as essential to spirituality. For example, Robert Solomon takes spirituality to mean ‘the grand and thoughtful passions of life’, and holds that ‘a life lived in accordance with those passions’ entails choosing to see the world as ‘benign and life [as] meaningful’, with the tragic not to be denied but accepted (Solomon 2002, 6 & 51).
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Pope, H., 1909, Faith, in The Catholic Encyclopedia, New York: Robert Appleton Company.
- Swindal, J., Faith and Reason, The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Aquinas, Saint Thomas | belief | Christian theology, philosophy and | fideism | James, William | Kierkegaard, Søren | pragmatic arguments and belief in God | religion: and science | religion: epistemology of | religion: philosophy of | trust
The author thanks Sophie Milne for research assistance on this entry, and Imran Aijaz, Thomas Harvey, Katherine Munn and Glen Pettigrove for helpful comments on drafts.