First published Wed Jun 23, 2010; substantive revision Wed Mar 30, 2016

What is faith? This entry focusses on the nature of faith, although issues about the justifiability of faith are also implicated.

‘Faith’is a broad term, appearing in locutions that express a range of different concepts. At its most general ‘faith’ means much the same as ‘trust’. This entry is specifically concerned, however, with the notion of religious faith—or, rather (and this qualification is important), the kind of faith exemplified in religious faith. Philosophical accounts are almost exclusively about theistic religious faith—faith in God—and they generally, though not exclusively, deal with faith as understood within the Christian branch of the Abrahamic traditions. But, although the theistic religious context settles what kind of faith is of interest, the question arises whether faith of that same general kind also belongs to other, non-theistic, religious contexts, or to contexts not usually thought of as religious at all. Arguably, it may be apt to speak of the faith of a humanist, or even an atheist, using the same general sense of ‘faith’ as applies to the theist case.

The present discussion focuses on theistic religious faith as a paradigm of the kind of faith that is of interest, though the question of faith outside this context is taken up in the final Section (11). Philosophical reflection on theistic religious faith has produced different accounts or models of its nature. This entry suggests that there are several key components that may feature, with varying emphases, in models of faith—in particular, the affective, the cognitive, the evaluative and the volitional or practical. It suggests also that there is a variety of different principles according to which models of faith may be categorized, including

  • how the model relates faith as a state to the active components associated with faith;
  • whether the model takes the object of faith to be exclusively propositional or not;
  • the type of epistemology with which the model is associated— whether it is broadly ‘evidentialist’ or ‘fideist’;
  • whether the model is necessarily restricted to theistic religious faith, or may extend beyond it.

There is no single ‘established’ terminology for different models of faith. A brief initial characterisation of the principal models of faith and their nomenclature as they feature in this discussion may nevertheless be helpful—they are:

  • the ‘purely affective’ model: faith as a feeling of existential confidence
  • the ‘special knowledge’ model: faith as knowledge of specific truths, revealed by God
  • the ‘belief’ model: faith as belief that God exists
  • the ‘trust’ model: faith as believing in (in the sense of trusting in) God
  • the ‘doxastic venture’ model: faith as practical commitment beyond the evidence to one's belief that God exists
  • ‘sub-’ and ‘non-doxastic venture’ models: faith as practical commitment to a relevant positively evaluated truth-claim, yet without belief
  • the ‘hope’ model: faith as hoping—or acting in the hope that—the God who saves exists.

The entry proceeds dialectically, with later sections presupposing the earlier discussion.

1. Models of faith and their key components

While philosophical reflection on faith of the kind exemplified in religious faith might ideally hope to yield an agreed definition in terms of sufficient and necessary conditions that articulate the nature of faith, the present discussion proceeds by identifying key components that recur in different accounts of religious faith. It also aims to identify a focal range of issues on which different stances are taken by different accounts. There is a plurality of existing philosophical understandings or models of faith of the religious kind. This discussion therefore aims to set out dialectically an organisation of this plurality, while also giving indications of the reasons there may be for preferring particular models over others. Since ‘religion’ itself may well be a ‘family resemblance’ universal, essentialism about faith of the religious kind might be misplaced. Nevertheless, the concept of faith as found in the Abrahamic, theist, religious traditions is widely regarded as unified enough for an inquiry into its nature to make sense, even if a successful real definition is too much to expect (this kind of faith might conceivably be a conceptual primitive, for example).

Note that some philosophers approach the target of religious faith by first classifying and analysing ordinary language uses of the term ‘faith’ and locutions in which that term occurs. See, for recent examples, Audi 2011 (Chapter 3, Section I), who identifies seven different kinds of faith, and Howard-Snyder (2013b), who attempts a general analysis of ‘propositional’ faith— i.e., faith that p is true, where p is a relevant proposition. The present discussion, however, deals directly with the target notion of the kind of faith exemplified in religious faith, assuming the background of a working grasp of the notion as deployed in religious forms of life, and specifically in those belonging to the theist traditions. Insights from the analysis of faith understood more broadly may, nevertheless, be important in constructing models of faith of the religious kind, as will emerge below in the discussion of religious faith as a kind of trust (Section 6).

The notion of religious faith as the possession of a whole people is familiar, and arguably theologically primary in the theist traditions. Philosophical accounts of theistic faith typically focus, however, on what it is for an individual person to ‘have faith’ or be ‘a person of faith’. An initial broad distinction is between thinking of faith just as a person's state and thinking of it as also involving a person's act, action or activity. Faith may be a state one is in, or comes to be in; it may also essentially involve something one does. An adequate account of faith, perhaps, needs to encompass both. In the Christian context faith is understood both as a gift of God and also as requiring a human response of assent and trust, so that their faith is something with respect to which people are both receptive and active.

There is, however, some tension in understanding faith both as a gift to be received and as essentially involving a venture to be willed and enacted. A philosophical account of faith may be expected to illuminate this apparent paradox. One principle for classifying models of faith is according to the extent to which they recognise an active component in faith itself, and the way they identify that active component and its relation to faith's other components. It is helpful to consider the components of faith (variously recognised and emphasised in different models of faith) as falling into three broad categories: the affective, the cognitive and the volitional or practical. There are also evaluative components in faith—these may appear as implicated in the affective and/or the cognitive components, according to one's preferred meta-theory of value.

2. The affective component of faith

One component of faith is a certain kind of affective psychological state—namely, a state of feeling confident and trusting. Some philosophers hold that faith is to be identified simply with such a state: see, for example, Clegg (1979, 229) who suggests that this may have been Wittgenstein's understanding. Faith in this sense—as one's overall ‘default’ attitude on life—provides a valuable foundation for flourishing: its loss is recognised as the psychic calamity of ‘losing one's faith’. But if foundational existential confidence is to feature in a model of faith of the kind exemplified by theists, more needs to be added about the kind of confidence involved. Theistic faith is essentially faith in God. In general, faith of the kind exemplified by theistic faith must have some intentional object. It may thus be argued that an adequate model of this kind of faith cannot reduce to something purely affective: some broadly cognitive component is also required.

3. Faith as knowledge

What kind of cognitive component belongs to faith, then? One model identifies faith as knowledge of specific truths, revealed by God. Such a model has received prominent recent defence in the work of Alvin Plantinga, who proposes an epistemology which he takes to follow in the tradition of the reformers, principally John Calvin. Calvin defines faith thus: ‘a firm and certain knowledge of God's benevolence towards us, founded upon the truth of the freely given promise in Christ, both revealed to our minds and sealed upon our hearts through the Holy Spirit’ (John Calvin, Institutes III, ii, 7, 551, quoted by Plantinga (2000, 244)).

Appeal to a special cognitive faculty

‘Reformed’ epistemologists have appealed to an externalist epistemology in order to maintain that theistic belief may be justified even though its truth is no more than basically evident to the believer—that is, its truth is not rationally inferable from other, more basic, beliefs, but is found to be immediately evident in the believer's experience (see Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983, Alston 1991, Plantinga 2000). On Plantinga's version, theistic beliefs count as knowledge because they are produced by the operation of a special cognitive faculty whose functional design fits it for the purpose of generating true beliefs about God. Plantinga calls this the sensus divinitatis, using a term of Calvin's. (For discussion of the extent to which Plantinga’s use of this term conforms to Calvin’s own usage see Jeffreys 1997 and Helm 1998.) This quasi-perceptual faculty meets functional criteria as a mechanism that confers ‘warrant’ (where warrant is whatever must be added to true belief to yield knowledge) and, granted theism's truth, it yields knowledge because God designs it just for that purpose. In defence of specifically Christian belief, Plantinga argues that the same warrant-conferring status belongs to the operation of the Holy Spirit in making the great truths of the Gospel directly known to the believer.

The welcome certainty of faith

This appeal to a God-given ‘higher’ cognitive faculty is found (in the early 12th Century) in al-Ghazâlî's Deliverance from Error, where it provides the key to the ‘Sufi’ resolution of his religious crisis and his sceptical doubts about the deliverances of sense perception and unassisted human reason. Faith is thus understood as a kind of knowledge attended by a certainty that excludes doubt. But faith will not be exclusively cognitive, if, as in Calvin's definition, faith-knowledge is not only ‘revealed to our minds’ but also ‘sealed upon our hearts’. For, on this model faith will also have an affective/evaluative component that includes a welcoming of the knowledge received.

Volitional aspects of faith on the‘special knowledge’ model

This model of faith as special knowledge, certain and welcome, exhibits faith as essentially something to be received. Nevertheless, the model may acknowledge a volitional component, since an active response is required for reception of the divine gift. Such a volitional component is implied by the real possibility that faith may be resisted: indeed, Christians may hold that in our sinful state we will inevitably offer a resistance to faith that may be overcome only by God's grace. It is, however, a further step for persons of faith to put their revealed knowledge into practice by trusting their lives to God and seeking to obey his will. On this ‘special knowledge’ model of faith, however, this activity counts as ‘acting out’ one's faith rather than as a part of faith itself. Persons of faith thus act ‘in’, ‘through’ or ‘by’ faith: but, on this model, their faith itself is the welcomed revealed knowledge on which they act.

4. Faith and reason: the epistemology of faith

Faith seems to involve some kind of venture, even if talk of a ‘leap of faith’ may not be wholly apt. It is thus widely held that faith goes beyond what is ordinarily reasonable, in the sense that it involves accepting what cannot be established as true through the proper exercise of our naturally endowed human cognitive faculties—and this may be held to be an essential feature of faith. As Kant famously reports, in the Preface to the Second Edition of his Critique of Pure Reason: ‘I have … found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith’ (Kant 1787/1933, 29). As well, however, theist philosophers typically desire to show that faith is not ‘contrary to reason’. On models of faith that take a cognitive component as central, and construe faith's object as propositional, reasonable faith arguably needs to conform to an evidentialist principle, generally thought essential to rationality, requiring belief commitments to accord with the extent of the support for their truth given by one's total available evidence. Faith's venturesomeness is thus in tension with its reasonableness, and models of faith differ in the way they negotiate this tension by taking a particular stance on ‘faith and reason’. Another classificatory principle, then, is in terms of the type of epistemology of faith each particular model generates.

The epistemology of the ‘special knowledge’ model

The ‘special knowledge’ model of faith generates an epistemology under which, although ordinary cognitive faculties and sources of evidence do not yield certain knowledge of theistic truths, there is a ‘higher’ cognitive faculty that neatly makes up the deficit. This model seems thus to secure the rationality of faith: if faith consists in beliefs that have the status of knowledge, surely faith cannot fail to be rational. And, once the deliverances of the special cognitive faculty are included amongst the believer's basic experiential evidence, the evidential requirement on reasonable belief is surely satisfied. (Note that Plantinga originally expressed his defence of ‘properly basic’ theistic belief in terms of the rationality of believing in God ‘without any evidence or argument at all’ (Plantinga 1983, 17). He does respect the evidential requirement, however, holding that this requirement may be fully met through what is basically, non-inferentially, evident in the believer’s experience. Hence Plantinga’s insistence that his Reformed epistemology is not fideistic (Plantinga 2000, 263).)

Reflective faith and the question of entitlement

The above considerations may aspire to win the high ground in the ‘faith and reason’ debate for the ‘special knowledge’ model. It is not clear, however, that this aspiration can finally be met. From the perspective of reflective persons of faith (or would-be faith), the question of entitlement arises: are they rationally, epistemically—even, morally—entitled to adopt or continue in their faith? This question will be existentially important, since faith will not count as of the kind exemplified by religious faith unless its commitments make a significant difference to how one lives one's life. Reflective believers who are aware of the many options for faith, and the possibility of misguided and even harmful faith-commitments, will wish to be satisfied that they are justified in their faith. The theist traditions hold a deep fear of idolatry—of giving one's ‘ultimate concern’ (Tillich 1957/2001) to an object unworthy of it. The desire to be assured of entitlement to faith is thus not merely externally imposed by commitment to philosophical critical values: it is a demand internal to the integrity of theistic faith itself. Arguably, believers must even take seriously the possibility that the God they have been worshipping is not, after all, the true God (Johnston 2009). But, for this concern to be met, there will need to be conditions sufficient for justified faith that are ‘internalist’—that is, conditions whose obtaining is, at least indirectly if not directly, accessible to believers themselves. Those conditions are widely assumed to include an evidentialist requirement that faith is justified only if the truth of its cognitive content is adequately supported by the available evidence.

The ‘knowledge’ model as leaving the question of entitlement unanswered

It may be argued, however, that, if the ‘special knowledge’ model is correct, those who seek to meet an evidentialist requirement will be unable to satisfy themselves of their entitlement to their faith. Theistic truths may be directly revealed, and experienced as immediately evident, yet, on reflection, one may doubt whether such experiences are genuinely revelatory since competing ‘naturalist’ interpretations of those experiences seem available. It may be true, as Plantinga's Reformed epistemology maintains, that if God exists such experiences meet externalist criteria for conveying knowledge, even though the truth of the beliefs concerned remains open to reflective ‘internalist’ doubt. On an externalist account, that is, one might lack independent evidence sufficient to confirm that one has knowledge that God exists while in fact possessing that very knowledge. And one might thus refute an objector who claims that without adequate evidence one cannot genuinely know. But this consideration is still insufficient to secure entitlement to theistic faith—if, as may be argued, that entitlement requires that one has evidence adequate to justify commitment to the truth that God exists. For, one has such evidence only conditionally on God's existence—but it is precisely entitlement to believe that God exists that is at issue (Kenny 1992, 71; Bishop and Aijaz 2004). For a wider discussion of the possibility of religious knowledge that, inter alia, endorses the present point, see Zagzebski 2010.

5. Faith as belief

If faith is not ‘a firm and certain knowledge’ of theistic truths, then a model of faith as having a propositional object may be retained by identifying faith with a certain kind of belief. The relevant kind will be belief with theological content—that God exists, is benevolent towards us, has a plan of salvation, etc.—where this belief is also held with sufficient firmness and conviction. Richard Swinburne labels this the ‘Thomist view’ of faith, and expresses it thus: ‘The person of religious faith is the person who has the theoretical conviction that there is a God.’ (Swinburne 2005, 138). (Aquinas's own understanding of faith is more complex than this formulation suggests, however, as will be noted shortly.)

The rationality of faith on this model will rest on the rationality of the firmly held theological beliefs in which it consists. As Swinburne notes, if such beliefs are founded on evidence that renders their truth sufficiently more probable than not, then the beliefs concerned may amount to knowledge on a contemporary ‘justified true belief’ fallibilist epistemology, even though they fall short of knowledge on Aquinas's own criteria, which require that what is known be ‘seen’ (i.e., fully and directly comprehended) (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 1, 4 & 5 (O'Brien 1974, 27)). In any case, the reasonableness of faith on this model of faith as belief depends on the beliefs concerned being adequately evidentially justified.

Some argue that the truth of theism is ‘evidentially ambiguous’—that is, that our total available evidence is equally viably interpreted from both a theist and a naturalist/atheist perspective (Hick 1966 and 1989; Davis 1978; Penelhum 1995; McKim 2001). This thesis of evidential ambiguity may be supported as the best explanation of the diversity of belief on religious matters, and/or of the persistence of the debate about theism, with philosophers of equal acumen and integrity engaged on either side. Or the ambiguity may be considered systematic—for example, on the grounds that both natural theological and natural atheological arguments fail because they are deeply circular, resting on implicit assumptions acceptable only to those already thinking within the relevant perspective. (In relation to Swinburne's Bayesian natural theology, in particular, this objection surfaces in criticism of assumptions about how to set the prior probabilities implicated in calculations of, for example, theism's probability on the evidence of the ‘fine-tuning’ of the Universe's basic physical constants, or of the probability, on all our evidence, of the truth of the Resurrection.) If the ambiguity thesis is correct, then—assuming evidentialism—firmly held theistic belief will fail to be reasonable.

On this model of faith as belief, all that characterises faith apart from its theological content is the firmness or conviction with which faith-propositions are held true. Firm belief in the truth of a scientific proposition, for example, fails to count as faith only through lacking the right kind of content. This model therefore shares with the ‘special knowledge’ model in taking its theological content as essential to what makes theistic faith faith, and so rejects the suggestion that faith of the same sort as found in the theist religious traditions might also be found elsewhere.

Furthermore, in taking faith to consist in belief that theological propositions are true, this model invites the assumption that theological convictions belong in the same category of factual claims as scientific theoretical hypotheses with which they accordingly compete. That assumption will lead those who think that theological claims are not reasonably accepted on the evidence to regard faith as worthless and intellectually dishonourable—at best, ‘a degenerating research programme’ (Lakatos 1970). (On this negative assessment of faith's evidential support, persons of faith come perilously close to the schoolboy's definition mentioned by William James: ‘Faith is when you believe something that you know ain't true’ (James 1896/1956, 29). Or, if believers readily abandon theological explanations whenever competing scientific ones succeed, their God gets reduced to ‘the God of the gaps’.) These misgivings about the model of faith as firmly held factual theological belief dissolve, of course, if success attends the project of showing that particular theological claims count as factual hypotheses well supported by the total available evidence. Those who doubt that this condition is or can be met may, however, look towards a model of faith that understands faith's cognitive content as playing some other role than that of an explanatory hypothesis of the same kind as a scientific explanatory hypothesis.

Aquinas's account of faith

Though firmly held theological belief is central to it, Aquinas's understanding of faith is more complicated and nuanced than the view that faith is ‘the theoretical conviction that God exists’. Aquinas holds that faith is ‘midway between knowledge and opinion’ (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 1, 2 (O'Brien 1974, 11)). Faith resembles knowledge, Aquinas thinks, in so far as faith carries conviction. But that conviction is not well described as ‘theoretical’, if that description suggests that faith has a solely propositional object. For Aquinas, faith denotes the believer's fundamental orientation towards the divine. So ‘from the perspective of the reality believed in’, Aquinas says, ‘the object of faith is something non-composite’ (non-propositional)—namely God himself. Nevertheless, grasping the truth of propositions is essential to faith, because ‘from the perspective of the one believing … the object of faith is something composite in the form of a proposition’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 1, 2 (O'Brien 1974, 11 & 13), my emphases).

A further problem with describing as Thomist a model of faith simply as firm belief in the truth of theological propositions is that Aquinas takes as central an act of ‘inner assent’ (Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 2, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 59–65)). This is problematic because, (i) in its dominant contemporary technical usage belief is taken to be a mental (intentional) state—a propositional attitude, namely, the attitude towards the relevant proposition that it is true; (ii) belief in this contemporary sense is widely agreed not to be under volitional control—not directly, anyway; yet (iii) Aquinas holds that the assent given in faith is under the control of the will. Aquinas need not, however, be construed as accepting ‘believing at will’, provided we allow that inner assent may be an act without being an intentional action. Assent may be construed as something that has to be elicited yet terminates a process that is subject to the will—a process of inquiry, deliberation or pondering that does involve mental actions, or, in the case of faith, a process of divine grace that can proceed only if it is not blocked by the will.

Most importantly, however, Aquinas says that assent is given to the propositional articles of faith because their truth is revealed by God, and on the authority of the putative source of this revelation. Terence Penelhum puts it like this: ‘Thomas tells us that although what one assents to in faith includes many items not ostensibly about God himself, one assents to them, in faith, because they are revealed by God … It is because they come from him and because they lead to him that the will disposes the intellect to accept them’ (Penelhum 1989, 122: see Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae, 1, 1 & 2 (O'Brien 1974, 5–15)). So Aquinas's model of faith is of believing (assenting to) propositional truth-claims on the basis of testimony carrying divine authority. John Locke follows the same model: ‘Faith … is the assent to any proposition … upon the credit of the proposer, as coming from God, in some extraordinary way of communication’ (Locke 1698/1924, 355; compare also Alston 1996, 15).

The unanswered question of entitlement—again

Faith as assent to truths on the basis of an authoritative source of divine revelation is possible, though, only for those who already believe that God exists and is revealed through the relevant sources. Might such faith, then, have to rest on a prior faith—faith that God exists and that this is his messenger or vehicle of communication? Those foundational claims, it might be maintained, are held true on the grounds of adequately supporting evidence, such as putatively provided by arguments of natural theology and the claimed evidence for miraculous endorsement of a prophet's authority. Faith might then have a purely rational foundation. But this could hardly be so for every person of faith, since not everyone who believes will have access to the relevant evidence or be able to assess it properly. Besides, although Aquinas allows that rational assessment of the available evidence may lead a person to faith, he does not think that such an assessment could ever elicit assent itself—only demonstration could achieve that and so high a level of proof is not here available (see O'Brien, 1974, footnote 2b, 58–9). Aquinas's view is thus that all believers stand in need of God's grace: ‘the assent of faith, which is its principal act … has as its cause God, moving us inwardly through grace’ ((Summa Theologiae, 2a2ae 6, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 167)). It follows, then, that, on Aquinas's view, believing that God exists and is revealed in specific ways is itself a matter of faith, and not a purely rationally evidentially secured prolegomenon to it.

Aquinas's model of faith thus shares with the ‘special knowledge’ model the problem that it leaves unanswered the reflective believer's concern about entitlement. Attempting to settle that concern by meeting the evidential requirement leads to circularity: believers are to accept theological truths on divine authority, yet the truth that there is such an authority (historically mediated as the relevant tradition maintains) is amongst those very truths that are to be accepted on divine authority—indeed, it is the crucial one. As Descartes puts it in the Dedication to his Meditations, ‘although it is absolutely true that we must believe there is a God, because we are so taught in the Holy Scriptures, and, on the other hand, that we must believe the Holy Scriptures because they come from God …, we nevertheless could not place this argument before infidels, who might accuse us of reasoning in a circle’ (Haldane and Ross 1967, 133).

The fact that Aquinas's model shares this epistemic limitation with Calvin's is no accident: both understand faith as essentially involving accepting propositionally expressible truths as divinely revealed through willingly receiving God's gracious gift of that very revelation. Both Aquinas and Calvin take firm belief to be essential to faith, though they differ in whether or not to count it as knowledge. And they hold that the grace that is needed for assent works, not through any special quasi-perceptual cognitive mechanism (as Plantinga proposes), but by enabling the will to avoid blocking assent to the revealed truth. Nevertheless, Plantinga's appeal to externalist epistemology (in his ‘A/C’ model, named after Aquinas and Calvin (Plantinga 2000, 168-86)) supplies something helpful for a philosophical defence of the epistemic rationality of faith understood as belief assented to on the basis of revelation, by showing how such belief can have genuine epistemic worth independently of its inferential support. But the A/C model does not supply all that such a defence requires if it is fair to press the question of entitlement that seems to remain unanswered.

Revelation—and its philosophical critique

The justifiability of belief that God exists is a typically focal issue in the Philosophy of Religion. Yet the theist traditions always make a foundational claim about an authoritative source, or sources, of revealed truth. What is salient is not just believing that God exists; it is believing that God exists and is revealed thus and so (in great historical acts, in prophets, in scriptures, in wisdom handed down, etc.). The reasonableness of theism is therefore as much a matter of the reasonableness of an epistemology of revelation as it is of a metaphysics of perfect being. The question of how God may be expected to make himself known has gained prominence through recent discussion of the argument for atheism from ‘divine hiddenness’ (Schellenberg 1993; Howard-Snyder and Moser 2002). That argument holds that a loving God would make his existence clear to the non-resistant—but this claim is open to question. Perhaps God provides only ‘secret’ evidence of his existence, purposely overturning the expectations of our ‘cognitive idolatry’ in order to transform our egocentric self-reliance (Moser 2008); besides, there may be significant constraints logically inherent in the very possibility of unambiguous divine revelation to finite minds (King 2008).

Similarly, accounts of theistic faith will be open to critique when they make assumptions about the mechanisms of revelation. In particular, the model of faith as assent to propositions as revealed holds that, since God's grace is required for that assent, when grace is effective the whole ‘package deal’ of propositional revealed truth is accepted. This yields the notion of ‘the Faith’, as the body of theological truths to be accepted by ‘the faithful’, and it becomes a sign of resistance to divine grace to ‘pick and choose’ only some truths, as heretics do (Greek: hairesis, choice; see Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 5, 3 (O'Brien 1974, 157–61)). For heresy to be judged, however, some human authority must assume it possesses the full doctrinal revelation, with God's grace operating without resistance in its own case. Whether that assumption can ever be sufficiently well founded to justify condemning and purging others is an important question, whose neglect may be seriously harmful, as we are reminded by the fact that the phrase for ‘act of faith’ in Portuguese—auto-da-fé—came to mean the public burning of a heretic.

But the deeper assumption made by this model of faith as belief (as, too, by the ‘special knowledge’ model) is that God's self-revelation is primarily the revelation of the truth of propositions articulated in human language (compare Swinburne 1992). Alternative understandings of revelation are available, however. In particular, it may be held that it is primarily the divine presence itself that is revealed—the reality, not merely a representation of it. Propositional articulations of what is revealed may still be essential, but they need to be accepted as at a remove from the object of revelation itself, and therefore as limited. The development of propositional articulations expressing the nature and will of the self-revealing God—the doctrines of ‘the Faith’—will, of course, be understood as a process under providential grace. It is often assumed that that process can achieve ‘closure’ in a completed set of infallibly known creedal propositions. But this assumption about how divine inspiration operates may be contested, both on the theological grounds that it reflects the all-too-human desire to gain control over God's self-revelation (to ‘pin God down once and for all’), and on the wider epistemological grounds that any attempt to grasp independent reality in human language will be in principle fallible and subject to revision in the light of future experience.

6. Faith as trust

Not all models of faith however, identify it as primarily a matter of knowing or believing a proposition or a set of them. What is most central to theistic faith may seem better expressed as believing in God, rather than as believing that God exists. The Christian creeds begin ‘Credo in unum Deum …’—and it is arguable that in this context ‘belief in’ is neither merely an idiomatic variant on, nor reducible to, ‘belief that’ (Price 1965). It may thus be held that theists' acceptance of propositional truths as divinely revealed rests on believing in God—and it is this ‘believing in’, or ‘having faith in’, which is, fundamentally, the nature of faith. Noting that, while faith is held to be a virtue, believing as such is not, Wilfred Cantwell Smith argues that ‘faith is not belief’, ‘but something of a quite different order’ (Smith 1979, 128), requiring ‘assent’ ‘in the dynamic and personal sense of rallying to [what one takes to be the truth] with delight and engagement’ (142). Our considerations now shift, then, from ‘propositional’-attitude-focussed models of faith to ‘operational’ models, to borrow terminology from J.L.Schellenberg (2005, 126).

What does ‘operational’ ‘faith in’ God amount to? What is it to believe in, or have faith in, God beyond, or even independently of, believing that God exists? To have faith in God is to make a practical commitment—the kind involved in trusting God, or, trusting in God. (The root meaning of the Greek pistis, ‘faith’, is ‘trust’.) This, then, is a fiducial model —a model of faith as trust, understood not simply as an affective state of confidence, but as an action. On a fiducial model, faith's practical, volitional, component takes central place, though a cognitive component may be presupposed by it. The fiducial model is widely identified as characteristically Protestant. Swinburne, for example, calls it the ‘Lutheran’ model, and defines it thus: ‘the person of faith does not merely believe that there is a God (and believe certain propositions about him)—he trusts Him and commits himself to Him’ (2005, 142). Yet, as noted earlier, Aquinas too takes the ultimate object of faith to be God, ‘the first reality’, and, furthermore, understands ‘formed’ faith as trusting commitment to God, motivated by, and directed towards, love of God as one's true end (see Summa Theologiae 2a2ae, 4, 3; O'Brien 1974, 123–7). It is true that Aquinas allows that the devils have faith in a certain sense—but this ‘faith’ amounts only to their belief that what the Church teaches is the truth, arrived at not by grace but ‘forced from them’ reluctantly by ‘the acumen of their natural intelligence’ (Summa Theologiae 2a2ae, 5, 2; O'Brien 1974, 155 & 157). Aquinas's account of ‘saving’ faith is thus also a fiducial model.

The venture of trust

As noted at the outset, there is a usage of ‘faith’ for which ‘having/placing faith in’ is (near enough) synonymous with ‘trusting’ or ‘trusting in’. If, moreover, faith of the religious kind is itself a type of trust, then we may expect our understanding of religious faith to profit from an analysis of trust in general. It is therefore worth considering what follows about the nature of faith of the sort exemplified in theistic faith from holding it to be a kind of trust.

Conceptually fundamental to trust is the notion of a person (or persons)—the truster—trusting in some agent or agency—the trustee—for some (assumedly) favourable outcome (though what the trustee is trusted for is often only implicit in the context). Trust involves a venture; so too—it is widely agreed—does faith. So, if faith is trust, the venture of faith might be presumed to be the type of venture implicated in trust. A venture is an action that places the agent and outcomes of concern to the agent significantly beyond the agent's own control. Trust implies venture. When we trust we commit ourselves to another's control, accepting—and, when necessary, co-operating as ‘patient’—with the decisions of the trustee. Venturing in trust is usually assumed to be essentially risky, making oneself vulnerable to adverse outcomes or betrayal. (Swinburne makes the point this way: ‘To trust someone is to act on the assumption that she will do for you what she knows that you want or need, when the evidence gives some reason for supposing that she may not and where there will be bad consequences if the assumption is false’ (2005, 143). Annette Baier makes no requirement for evidence that the trustee may prove untrustworthy, but nevertheless takes trust to involve ‘accepted vulnerability to another's possible but not expected ill will (or lack of good will) toward one’ (Baier 1986, 235, my emphasis).) Accordingly, it seems sensible to hold that one should trust only with good reason. But if, as is plausible, good reason to trust requires sufficient evidence of the trustee's trustworthiness, reasonable trust appears both to have its venturesomeness diminished and, at the same time, to become more difficult to achieve than we normally suppose. For we often lack adequate—or even, any—evidence of a trustee's trustworthiness in advance of our venture, yet in many such cases we suppose that our trust is reasonable. But, if adequate evidence of trustworthiness is not required for reasonable trust, how is reasonable trust different from ‘blind’ trust?

This problem might be avoided by arguing that the question of when one may rationally trust another may be resolved by a decision theoretic calculation, factoring in the extent to which one's evidence supports the potential trustee's trustworthiness and the utilities or disutilities of the possible outcomes. It may thus on occasion be practically rational to trust a person whose likelihood of trustworthiness is low, if a sufficiently valuable outcome may be achieved only by so doing. (An unlikely rescuer may rationally be trusted if the only one available.) But this approach misses something important in social intercourse, where we generally count it a virtue to be ready to trust others without such prior calculation. Such openness may still be broadly rational, however, given our long shared experience that willingness to trust others usually does elicit trustworthy behaviour: accordingly, though I may have little or no direct evidence that this particular fellow citizen of mine will prove trustworthy if I turn to her in a sudden predicament, I may have good evidence for the general reliability of others in my community.

Nevertheless, it can sometimes be reasonable to act decisively on the assumption that people will be worthy of trust in quite particular respects without having evidence for their trustworthiness sufficient to justify such decisiveness (see, for example, Adams 1987). And this seems to be because, in such cases, (i) what has to be decided is all or nothing—whether to trust or not—so that tentatively committing oneself in practice to the trustworthiness of the trustee only to the partial degree supported by one's evidence is not a separate option; and (ii) at the point where the decision has to be made it is impossible that there should be evidence that justifies more than modest partial belief—impossible that evidence should justify decisive commitment to the trustee's trustworthiness. Such cases provide a particularly interesting class of exceptions to the general evidentialist requirement to commit in practice to the truth of a proposition only as justified by one's evidence. They are interesting because they do not involve non-epistemic considerations overriding epistemic ones, as is the case with some readily recognisable types of exception to trust-evidentialism—for example, cases where being in an established relationship with someone obliges one to trust contrary to the weight of one's evidence; or cases of ‘educative’ or ‘therapeutic’ trust, where others are trusted in order to develop or restore their trustworthiness. In the target cases, the epistemic concern to grasp truth and avoid falsehood is not overridden: they are cases where one may benefit from acting on the truth that a person is trustworthy only if one first commits oneself to the person's trustworthiness beyond the possible support of evidence—though once the venture is made conclusive evidence of trustworthiness may happily soon accumulate.

7. Faith as doxastic venture

On a model that takes religious faith to consist fundamentally in an act of trust, the analogy with the venture of interpersonal trust is suggestive. When one person trusts another there seems typically to be both a doxastic and a fiducial aspect—there is the person’s belief as to the other’s trustworthiness and also an active commitment or ‘entrusting’ to the other. Paul Helm proposes that religious faith similarly has importantly distinct doxastic and fiducial aspects: in addition to belief about God’s existence and trustworthiness for salvation held with a degree of strength proportional to the believer’s evidence, persons of faith must also entrust themselves to the one on whom they rely (Helm 2000).

Yet there are also significant differences between the trusting involved in theistic faith and that involved in interpersonal trust. For one thing, venturing in trust would seem not to carry real risk if God really is the trustee. ‘A mother's tender care’ may cease ‘toward the child she bare’: she may be forgetful, ‘yet will I remember thee, for mine is an unchanging love’, as the William Cowper hymn has the Lord declare (see Isaiah 49:15). Given the existence of the God of unchanging love, one trusts in ultimately perfect safety. But the venture of actually entrusting oneself to God seems to begin with the challenge of being able to accept that, indeed, there is such a God. While some affirm that many people have sufficient evidence to justify this claim, others, as already noted, hold that everyone has to confront the evidential ambiguity of foundational theistic claims. For those who think that God’s existence as the one who saves cannot be settled intellectually on the basis of the available evidence, the venture involved in trusting in God (if such there be) may seem to include a doxastic venture: the one who trusts already ventures, somehow beyond or independently of the available evidence, in his or her very believing that God exists and may be relied on for salvation. Trusting in God seems to presuppose, in other words, taking it on trust that God exists. But, if so, the question whether, and under what conditions, one may be entitled to such an evidence-transcending venture becomes pressing.

Theological non-realism

One way to relieve this pressure is to offer a non-realist analysis of theological claims. Trusting God will then not entail any commitment to reality's being a certain way. Rather, on arguably the most sophisticated kind of non-realist view, theological beliefs arise because living ‘trustingly’ comes to be expressed and reinforced through a culturally constructed fiction about God and his great saving acts. This existential confidence may then be described, using the language of the fiction, as ‘trusting God’ (Cupitt 1980, Geering 1994). On such a non-realist account, the model of faith as trust brackets the cognitive component of faith, and risks becoming, in effect, a model of faith as purely a certain kind of affective state. But, in any case, non-realist models will be rejected by those who take faith to have a cognitive component that functions as a grasping—or would-be grasping—of how things really are.

Defending doxastic venture by analogy with interpersonal trust?

Even if faith does involve (under realist assumptions) a venture in belief itself, the justifiability of such a venture might yet be thought defensible by analogy with interpersonal situations where it is justifiable decisively to trust another beyond one's evidence. Reflecting on that proposal discloses further points of disanalogy, however. In cases of interpersonal trust a venture is often needed in initially taking the trustee to be trustworthy, but evidence will inevitably later emerge which will either confirm or disconfirm the truth of that claim—and trust may, and rationally should, be withdrawn if the news is bad. Furthermore, interpersonal trust does not require actually believing that the trustee is worthy of trust, only that one decisively takes this to be true (i.e., acts on the assumption of its truth) when one comes to act. People of theistic faith, however, typically do believe that God exists and may be trusted for salvation, and, if—as we are here assuming—acting on this belief ventures beyond evidential support, then it is a venture that persists and is not confined to initial commitment only. Psychologically, no doubt, continuing to journey in theistic faith may reinforce one's commitment. These reinforcing experiences, which often involve faith renewed in the face of apparent failures of divine love, do not, however, possess the uncontroversial status of evidence that independently and inter-subjectively confirms the initial venture.

Doxastic venture without doxastic voluntarism

Many dismiss the idea that one may venture in one's very believing that God exists as committing a category error: ventures are voluntary, but propositional belief is not directly under voluntary control. Trusting God, however, entails practical commitment to the truth of theological faith-propositions—and commitment to the truth of a proposition in one's practical reasoning may be under direct voluntary control.

It is one thing to be in the mental state of holding that the proposition that p is true; it is another to take it to be true that p in one's practical reasoning (although these typically go together, since to hold that p is true is to be disposed to take it to be true that p in practical reasoning whenever the question whether p becomes salient). Practical commitment to a faith-proposition's truth therefore could be a venture: there is no category error in allowing this possibility. Doxastic venturing —venturing in believing— is thus not a matter of willing oneself to believe without adequate evidential support; rather it is a matter of taking an already held belief to be true in one's practical reasoning even though (as one may oneself recognise) its truth lacks such support.

The psychological possibility of doxastic venture

Some philosophers have argued, however, that one cannot (in full reflective awareness, anyway) believe that p while accepting that one has insufficient evidence for p's truth (Adler 2002). The counterclaim that this is possible is defended by William James, in his controversial 1896 lecture, ‘The Will to Believe’ (James 1896/1956). James agrees that belief cannot be directly willed and must be otherwise causally evoked (he later came to wish that he has used ‘The Right to Believe’ as his lecture's title). James observes, however, that many beliefs have causes that do not constitute or imply an evidential grounding of their truth. James labels such causes ‘passional’—again, a potentially misleading term, since its intended referents include much more than emotional causes of belief. In particular, beliefs may be caused by ‘the circumpressure of one's caste or set’, of which one's inherited religious tradition is a paradigm case (James 1896/1956, 9). James is thus able to explain the psychological possibility of doxastic venture: one already has a ‘passionally’ caused belief, which one then takes to be true in practical reasoning despite its lack of adequate evidential grounding (compare Creel 1994, who similarly describes ‘faith’ as a ‘non-evidential doxastic passion’).

Note that a doxastic venture model of theistic faith reconciles faith as gift with faith's active components: the action is taking a faith-proposition to be true in practical reasoning; the gift provides the motivational resources for so doing, namely a firm belief in the truth of the faith-proposition, despite its lack of adequate evidential support. (In the next section, the possibility is considered that the gift of these motivational resources might not amount to actual belief.) It is also worth noting that those who find the focus on the individual something of a deficiency in analytical accounts of faith (Eklund 2015) may perceive in James’s account some acknowledgment of the social aspect of faith. Arguably, the standard ‘passional’ or ‘non-evidential’ cause of religious belief is cultural immersion within an historical faith-tradition. The motivational resources for faith-commitment may thus be an essentially social possession.

Examples of doxastic venture models

On the doxastic venture model, faith involves full practical commitment to a faith's proposition's truth, despite the recognition that this is not ‘objectively’ justified on the evidence. Kierkegaard's Concluding Unscientific Postcript definition of faith as ‘an objective uncertainty held fast in an appropriation process of the most passionate inwardness’ (Kierkegaard 1846/1968, 180) is an example of a doxastic venture model. So too is Paul Tillich's account of faith as ‘the state of being ultimately concerned’, since the claim of the object of one's ultimate concern to ‘promise total fulfilment even if all other claims have to be subjected to it or rejected in its name’ cannot in principle be established on the basis of the evidence. (Tillich, 1957/2001, 1 and 21).

Aquinas's model of faith, though widely thought of as conforming to an evidential requirement on belief, may arguably be open to interpretation as a doxastic venture model. As noted in Section 5, Aquinas holds that the available evidence, though it supports the truth of foundational faith-propositions, does not provide what Aquinas counts as sufficient (i.e., demonstrative) support to justify inner assent (in addition to references to the Summa Theologiae given previously, see 2a2ae. 2, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 63); and compare also Penelhum 1989, 120). Now, whether practical commitment to the truth of a given faith-proposition does or does not venture beyond adequate evidential support will be relative to assumptions about (a) where the level of evidential support required for ‘adequacy’ should be set, and (b) just how firm and decisive propositional faith-commitment needs to be. On some such assumptions, for example those made by Bayesians, the support provided by the evidence Aquinas adduces—or, by a suitable contemporary upgrading of that evidence, such as that provided in the works of Richard Swinburne—may be considered enough to make reasonable a sufficiently high degree of belief (or credence) in the truth of theistic faith-propositions so that believers need not venture beyond the support of their evidence. Interpreting Aquinas's model of faith as conforming to evidentialism may thus be viable. Nevertheless, Aquinas's own assumptions on these matters may leave him closer to Kierkegaard and Tillich than is commonly thought (consider Summa Theologiae 2a2ae 4, 1 and, once again, 2a2ae 6, 1 (O'Brien 1974, 117–9 & 167)).

The special role of faith-propositions

Bayesians might argue that there is no occasion for faith as doxastic venture since, once practical commitment to the truth of propositions is recognised as a matter of degree, whatever the state of the available evidence relating to a given proposition, there will always (given initial credences) be a rational credence properly associated with that evidence, and hence there are no possible circumstances where ‘the evidence does not decide’. Note, however, Lara Buchak’s (2012) discussion of ways in which Bayesians might understand faith as going beyond the evidence, and her own proposal that faith-ventures essentially include an additional practical commitment, which may be rational under certain conditions, not to inquire further into evidence relevant to the truth of the propositions concerned.

If the domain of faith is, as Stephen Evans puts it, ‘the assumptions, convictions and attitudes which the believer brings to the evidence for and against religious truth’ (Evans 1985, 178), and faith's cognitive component offers a ‘total interpretation’ of the world of our experience (Hick 1966, 154), then (foundational) faith-propositions function as ‘highest-order framing principles’ which necessarily cannot have their truth settled by appeal to the force of a body of independent evidence (Bishop 2007a, 139–44). Taking such a faith-proposition to be true, then, is not something that comes in degrees: either one ‘buys into’ the overall worldview a (foundational) faith-proposition proposes, or one does not. Such a choice is existentially important, and settling it raises anxiety about exercising a responsibility that cannot—without ‘bad faith’—be transferred onto the relatively impersonal function of one's reason, since a venture beyond any rational certification is required. The doxastic venture model may thus be regarded as capturing the spiritual challenge of faith more satisfactorily than do models that understand faith as conforming to evidentialism. This is because, on the doxastic venture model, faith involves a deeper surrender of self-reliant control, not only in trusting God, but in accepting at the level of practical commitment that there is a God—indeed, this God—who is to be trusted.

Doxastic venture models of faith and epistemic concern

Doxastic venture in relation to faith-propositions can be justifiable, of course, only if there are legitimate exceptions to the evidentialist requirement to take a proposition to be true just to the extent of its evidential support—and only if the legitimate exceptions include the kind of case involved in religious, theistic, faith-commitment.

A possible view of theistic faith-commitment is that it is wholly independent of the epistemic concern that cares about evidential support. On this view, faith reveals its authenticity most clearly when it takes faith-propositions to be true contrary to the weight of the evidence. This view is widely described as ‘fideist’, but ought more fairly to be called arational fideism, or, where commitment contrary to the evidence is positively favoured, irrational or counter-rational fideism. Despite its popular attribution both to the church father Tertullian and to ‘the father of existentialism’, Kierkegaard, counter-rational fideism does not seem to have been espoused by any significant theist philosophers (passages in Tertullian and Kierkegaard that appear to endorse this position may be interpreted as emphasising that Christian faith requires accepting, not logical contradiction, but ‘contradiction’ of our ‘natural’ expectations, wholly overturned in the revelation that the power of divine love is triumphant in the Crucified One).

Serious philosophical defence of a doxastic venture model of faith thus implies a supra-rational fideism, for which epistemic concern is not overridden and for which, therefore, it is a constraint on faith-commitment that it not accept what is known, or justifiably believed on the evidence, to be false. Rather, faith commits itself only beyond, and not against, the evidence—and it does so out of epistemic concern to grasp truth on matters of vital existential importance. The thought that one may be entitled to commit to an existentially momentous truth-claim in principle undecidable on the evidence when forced to decide either to do so or not is what motivates William James's ‘justification of faith’ in ‘The Will to Believe’ (James 1896/1956). If such faith is to be justified, its cognitive content will (on realist assumptions) have to cohere with our best evidence-based theories about the real world. Faith may extend our scientific grasp of the real, but may not counter it. Whether the desire to grasp more truth about the real than science can supply is a noble aspiration or a dangerous delusion is at the heart of the debate about entitlement to faith on this supra-rational fideist doxastic venture model.

A discussion of the debate between the moderate, Jamesian, supra-rational fideist and the evidentialist is beyond this entry's scope. Still, it is worth remarking that those who think that faith understood as doxastic venture may be justified face the challenge of providing the tools for weeding out intuitively distorted and unjustifiable forms of faith. On the other side, those evidentialists who reject doxastic venture as impermissible have to consider whether taking a stance on the nature of reality beyond anything science can even in principle confirm may not, in the end, be unavoidable, and potentially implicated in the commitments required for science itself (see Bishop 2007a, Chapters 8 and 9). For a useful recent collection of articles on the wider theme of the relation of religious faith to intellectual virtue, see Callahan and O’Connor 2014.

8. Faith as sub- or non-doxastic venture

Some accounts allow that faith centrally involves practical commitment venturing beyond evidential support, yet do not require (or, even, permit) that the venturer actually believes the faith-proposition assumed to be true. Such accounts may be described as proposing a ‘sub-’ or ‘non-doxastic venture’ model of faith. F.R.Tennant holds a view of this kind: he takes faith to be the adoption of a line of conduct not warranted by present facts, that involves experimenting with the possible or ideal, venturing into the unknown and taking the risk of disappointment and defeat. Faith is not an attempt to will something into existence but rather treating hoped for and unseen things as if they were real and then acting accordingly (Tennant 1943/1989 p.104). Swinburne refers to this as the ‘pragmatist’ model of faith (Swinburne 2005, 147–8; Swinburne 2001, 211; compare also Golding 1990, 2003).

William Alston (1996) suggests that faith may involve an active ‘acceptance’ rather than purely receptive belief. A clearly sub-doxastic venture model results if acceptance is understood on Jonathan Cohen’s account under which to accept that p is ‘to have or adopt a policy of deeming, positing, or postulating that p—i.e. of including that proposition … among one's premisses for deciding what to do or think in a particular context, whether or not one feels it to be true that p’ (Cohen 1992, 4, my emphasis). The firmness of faith-commitment is then just the firmness of one's ‘resolve to use [faith-claims] as a basis for one's thought, attitude and behaviour’ (Alston 1996, 17): there is no firm assurance of their truth. Decisive commitment in the absence of such assurance may nevertheless be possible, motivated (as Swinburne suggested in the first edition of his Faith and Reason) by the evaluative belief that ‘unless [faith-propositions are true], that which is most worthwhile is not to be had’ (Swinburne, 1981, 117). (A faith venture that lacks belief in the faith-proposition to which commitment is made need not, and probably could not, lack doxastic components altogether, as this suggestion of Swinburne’s indicates.)

Andrei Buckareff (2005) and J.L.Schellenberg (2005, 138-9) propose non-doxastic venture models of propositional faith, with Schellenberg emphasising the positive evaluation that persons of faith make of the truth-claim to which they commit themselves. In response to Daniel Howard-Snyder (2013) Schellenberg allows that faith may in some instances involve belief while still maintaining that ‘non-doxastic religious faith … will turn out to be a particularly important way of having religious faith as we head into the future’ (2013, 262). Bishop (2005), in response to Buckareff, also agrees that authentic faith need not always be a specifically doxastic venture. There may, then, be an emerging consensus amongst proponents of venture models that faith, at its core, consists in suitably motivated persistent practical commitment ‘beyond the evidence’ to the positively evaluated truth of foundational faith-claims which may, but need not, actually be believed to be true.

Robert Audi (2011) has also defended a non-doxastic account of faith, contrasting ‘fiducial faith’ and ‘doxastic faith’, and arguing that authentic religious faith need only amount to the former. Audi’s account is not strictly a ‘venture’ model, however, since he does not take commitment beyond the support of adequate evidence to be essential. Audi’s account suggests that religious faith is sui generis, but capable of being understood through its relations with other psychological states and actions, such as beliefs, evaluations and practical commitments. Rational assessment of religious faith, Audi thinks, must avoid treating it as implying belief, while recognising that greater confidence attaches to it than to religious hope. For another version of a non-doxastic account of faith, as a person’s ‘affective orientation or stance’, see Jonathan Kvanvig (2013).

9. Faith and hope

Some philosophers have suggested that the epistemological challenges faced by accounts of faith as involving belief beyond the evidence may be avoided by construing theist commitment as hope. Theist hope seems not to be mere tenacity (‘clinging to one's hopes’) (Taylor 1961), but a more complex attitude. James Muyskens suggests, for example, that one who hopes ‘keep[s] his life open or fluid with respect to [a faith-proposition] p—where (a) neither p nor not-p is certain for him, (b) he wants p and (c) he sees p as constructively connected with his own well-being and/or concept of himself as a person’ (1979, 35). Muyskens contrasts hope with faith (understood as belief), arguing that a religion of hope is both epistemically and religiously superior to a religion of faith. But faith is not generally understood as competing with hope (Creel 1993), and some philosophers identify faith with hoping that the claims of faith are true (Pojman 1986; 2003). Hope as such is an attitude rather than an active commitment, and, as Audi observes, it contrasts with the attitude of faith at least in this respect, namely, that surprise makes little sense as a response to discovering that the object of one’s faith is indeed the case, whereas there need be nothing inappropriate in surprise at the fulfilment of one’s hopes (see Audi 2011, 74).

A more adequate model of faith as hope, then, may rather take faith to be acting in, or from, hope. Such a model then comes close to a sub-doxastic venture model of faith, differing only in so far as acting from hope that God exists differs from taking this claim to be true (albeit without belief) in one's practical reasoning—but this difference may be undetectable at the level of behavioural outcomes. A model of faith as acting in hope also shares with the doxastic and sub-doxastic venture models in leaving out the affective certitude that is widely thought to characterise faith (Tennant 1943/1989, 112).

All these three models, then —doxastic venture, sub-doxastic venture and venture in hope— fit the view that faith is consistent with doubt, and, indeed, impossible without doubt of some kind, though they allow that persons of faith may give firm and sustained commitment to the truth of faith-propositions in practice. The ‘certainty’ of faith on these models seems more a matter of the certainty that persons of faith find themselves conferring on the foundational claims of their faith, rather than a matter of discovering in themselves a certain knowledge or intellectual conviction of the truth of these claims. It is possible, then, on these accounts of faith, to be a committed person of faith and also an ‘agnostic’ in Thomas Huxley’s original sense of someone who does not claim as knowledge what he or she nevertheless commits to as a foundational practical orientation to reality.

10. Faith as a virtue

Faith is traditionally regarded as one of the ‘theological’ virtues. If a virtue is a ‘disposition of character which instantiates or promotes responsiveness to one or more basic goods’, then theistic faith qualifies since it is ‘a responsiveness to practical hope and truth’, provided theistic faith-claims are indeed true (Chappell 1996, 27). Faith will not, however, be a virtue as such, if it is accepted that faith can be misplaced or, even, ‘demonic’, directed upon a ‘false ultimate’ (Tillich 1957/2001, 21). To be virtuous, faith must be faith in a worthy object: it is faith in God that is the theological virtue. More generally, faith is virtuous only when it is faith to which one is entitled. An account of the conditions under which faith is permissible is thus the key to an ethics of faith.

On models of faith as a (special) kind of knowledge, or as firmly held belief, it may seem puzzling how faith could be a virtue—unless some implicit volitional component emerges when such models are further explicated, or, alternatively, a case may be made for the claim that what is involuntary may nevertheless be praiseworthy, with theistic faith as a case in point (Adams 1987). Furthermore, as already suggested (Sections 4 & 5 above), models of faith as knowledge or belief fail to provide non-circular conditions sufficient for entitlement, unless the truth of faith-propositions is established by independent argument and evidence. Fiducial models of faith seem more attuned to exhibiting faith as a virtue, though a defence of the trustworthiness of the one who is trusted for salvation may be required. Doxastic (and sub-doxastic) venture models of faith can vindicate faith as a virtue, provided they provide robust entitlement conditions, to ensure that not just any ‘leap of faith’ is permissible. The Jamesian account already mentioned (Section 7) aims to meet this need. James's own view of what suffices to justify a faith-venture arguably needs an ethical supplement: both the non-evidential motivation for the venture and its content must be morally acceptable (Bishop 2007a, 163–6).

If faith of the religious kind is to count as virtuous, it seems there must be a suitable degree of persistence and steadfastness in the commitment made. Persons of religious faith are faithful to the object of their commitment, though the salient kind of faithfulness may be a matter of the continual renewal of faith rather than of maintaining it unchanged. (See Audi 2014 for a discussion of faith and faithfulness in relation to virtue. Audi defends faithfulness as, like courage, an ‘adjunctive’ virtue, and argues that being ‘a person of faith’ counts as a ‘virtue of personality’.)

Faith is only one of the Christian theological virtues, of course, the others being hope and charity (or love, agape): and St Paul famously affirms that the greatest of these is love (I Cor. 13:13). The question thus arises how these three virtues are related. One suggestion is that faith is taking it to be true that there are grounds for the hope that love is supreme—not simply in the sense that love constitutes the ideal of the supreme good, but in the sense that living in accordance with this ideal constitutes an ultimate salvation, fulfilment or consummation that is, in reality, victorious over all that may undermine it (in a word, over evil). The supremacy of love is linked to the supremacy of the divine itself, since love is the essential nature of the divine. What is hoped for, and what faith assures us is properly hoped for, is a sharing in the divine itself, loving as God loves (see Brian Davies on Aquinas, 2002). On this understanding, reducing faith to a kind of hope (Section 9 above) would eradicate an important relation between the two—namely that people of faith take reality to be such that their hope (for salvation, the triumph of the good) is well founded, and not merely an attractive fantasy or inspiring ideal.

11. Faith beyond (orthodox) theism

What is the potential scope of faith? On some models, the kind of faith exemplified by theistic faith is found only there. On both the ‘special knowledge’ and the ‘belief’ models, faith is intrinsically linked to theological content—indeed to orthodox Christian theological content, specifiable as one unified set of doctrines conveyed to receptive human minds by the operation of divine grace. Both the doxastic and sub-doxastic venture models, however, allow for the possibility that authentic faith may be variously realised, and be directed upon different, and mutually incompatible, intentional objects. This pluralism is an important feature of accounts of faith in the American pragmatist tradition. John Dewey strongly rejected the notion of faith as a special kind of knowledge (Dewey 1934, 20), as did William James, whose ‘justification of faith’ rests on a permissibility thesis, under which varied and conflicting faith-commitments may equally have a place in the ‘intellectual republic’ (James 1896/1956, 30).

Both Dewey and James defend models of faith with a view to advancing the idea that authentic religious faith may be found outside what is generally supposed to be theological orthodoxy. Furthermore, they suggest that ‘un-orthodox’ faith may be more authentic than ‘orthodox’ faith. ‘The faith that is religious’, says Dewey, ‘[I should describe as] the unification of the self through allegiance to inclusive ideal ends, which imagination presents to us and to which the human will responds as worthy of controlling our desires and choices’ (1934, 33). And James: ‘Religion says essentially two things: First, she says that the best things are the more eternal things, the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word…. [and] the second affirmation of religion is that we are better off now if we believe her first affirmation to be true’ (James 1896/1956, 25–6). While some of what Dewey and James say about justifiable faith may appear non-realist, in fact they both preserve the idea that religious faith aspires to grasp, beyond the evidence, vital truth about reality. Dewey holds that religious belief grounds hope because it takes something to be true about the real world ‘which carr[ies] one through periods of darkness and despair to such an extent that they lose their usual depressive character’ (1934, 14–5).

A general—i.e., non-theologically specific—account of the religious kind of faith may have potential as a tool for criticising philosophical formulations of the specific content of religious faith. The conditions for permissible faith-venture may exclude faith in God under certain inadequate conceptions of who or what God is. Arguably, the ‘personal omniGod’ of much contemporary philosophy of religion is just such an inadequate conception (Bishop 2007b). An understanding of what faith is, then, may motivate radical explorations into the concept of God as held in the theistic traditions (Bishop 1998; Johnston 2009; Bishop and Perszyk 2014).

Can there be faith without adherence to any theistic tradition? Those who agree with F.R.Tennant that ‘faith is an outcome of the inborn propensity to self-conservation and self-betterment which is a part of human nature, and is no more a miraculously superadded endowment than is sensation or understanding’ (1943/1989, 111) will consider that this must be a possibility. Tennant himself suggests that ‘much of the belief which underlies knowledge’—and he has scientific knowledge in mind— ‘is the outcome of faith which ventures beyond the apprehension and treatment of data to supposition, imagination and creation of ideal objects, and justifies its audacity and irrationality (in accounting them to be also real) by practical actualization’ (1943/1989, 100). Faith in this sense, however, may not seem quite on a par with faith of the religious kind. True, scientists must act as if their ‘ideal objects’ are real in putting their theories to the empirical test; but they will ‘account them to be also real’ only when these tests do provide confirmation in accordance with the applicable inter-subjective norms.

If faith is understood as commitment beyond independent objective certification to the truth of some overall interpretation of experience and reality, then all who commit themselves (with sufficient steadfastness) to such a Weltanschauung or worldview will be people of faith. Faith of this kind may be religious, and it may be religious without being theistic, of course, as in classical Buddhism or Taoism. Some have argued that faith is a human universal: Cantwell Smith, for example, describes it as ‘a planetary human characteristic [involving the] capacity to perceive, to symbolize, and live loyally and richly in terms of, a transcendent dimension to [human] life’ (1979, 140-141). There may also, arguably, be non-religious faith: for example ‘scientific atheists’, or ‘naturalists’, may be making a faith-venture when they take there to be no more to reality than is in principle discoverable by the natural sciences. The suggestion that atheism rests on a faith-venture will, however, be resisted by those who maintain ‘the presumption of atheism’ (Flew, 1976): it takes no leap to hold the default position.

An atheist's faith-venture may, in any case, seem oddly so described on the grounds that it provides no basis for practical hope or trust. Providing such a basis may plausibly be thought necessary for faith— the truth to which the venturer commits must be existentially important in this way. (Note James's requirement that faith-commitment is permissible only for resolving a ‘genuine option’, where a genuine option has inter alia to be ‘momentous’, that is, existentially significant and pressing (James 1896/1956, 3–4).) Some hold that the truth accepted by faith must be a ‘saving’ truth—a solution to a deep problems about the human situation. Their view is thus that faith is essentially religious, and they accordingly enter into argument as to which religion offers the best solution to the human problem (see, for example, Yandell 1990, 1999). J.L.Schellenberg (2009) argues that the only kind of religious faith that could be justified (if any is) is a sceptical ‘ultimism’, in which one ‘assents’ to and treats as real an imaginatively grasped conception of a metaphysically, axiologically and soteriologically ultimate reality.

Some may nevertheless argue that an existentially vital faith that grounds hope can belong within a wholly secular context—that is, without counting in any recognisable sense as ‘religious’. Cantwell Smith claims, for example, that ‘the Graeco-Roman heritage .. and its fecundating role in Western life [can] be seen as one of the major spiritual traditions of our world’ (1979, 139). Annette Baier suggests that ‘the secular equivalent of faith in God, which we need in morality as well as in science or knowledge acquisition, is faith in the human community and its evolving procedures—in the prospects for many-handed cognitive ambitions and moral hopes’ (Baier 1980, 133). More broadly, some maintain that a meaningful spirituality is consistent with a non-religious atheist naturalism, and include something akin to faith as essential to spirituality. For example, Robert Solomon takes spirituality to mean ‘the grand and thoughtful passions of life’, and holds that ‘a life lived in accordance with those passions’ entails choosing to see the world as ‘benign and life [as] meaningful’, with the tragic not to be denied but accepted (Solomon 2002, 6 & 51).


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Other Internet Resources

  • Pope, H., 1909, Faith, in The Catholic Encyclopedia, New York: Robert Appleton Company.
  • Swindal, J., Faith and Reason, The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


The author thanks Sophie Milne and Selwyn Fraser for research assistance on this entry, and Imran Aijaz, Robert Audi, Thomas Harvey, Daniel Howard-Snyder, Katherine Munn Glen Pettigrove and John Schellenberg for helpful comments on drafts.

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John Bishop <>

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