Notes to Continuity and Infinitesimals

1. The word “continuous” derives from a Latin root meaning “to hang together” or “to cohere”; this same root gives us the nouns “continent”—an expanse of land unbroken by sea—and “continence”—self-restraint in the sense of “holding oneself together”. Synonyms for “continuous” include: connected, entire, unbroken, uninterrupted.

2. The word “discrete” derives from a Latin root meaning “to separate”. This same root yields the verb “discern”—to recognize as distinct or separate—and the cognate “discreet”—to show discernment, hence “well-behaved”. It is a curious fact that, while “continuity” and “discreteness” are antonyms, “continence” and “discreetness” are synonyms. Synonyms for “discrete” include separate, distinct, detached, disjunct.

3. Of course, this presupposes that there are no “gaps” between the elements or points, which is implicit in the assumption that the points have been obtained by complete division of a continuum.

4. It should also be mentioned that the German philosopher Johann Friedrich Herbart (1776–1841) introduced the term synechology for the part of his philosophical system concerned with the continuity of the real.

5. According to the Oxford English Dictionary the term infinitesimal was originally an ordinal, viz. the “infinitieth” in order; but, like other ordinals, also used to name fractions, thus infinitesimal part or infinitesimal came to mean unity divided by infinity (1/∞), and thus an infinitely small part or quantity.

6. For the doctrines of the presocratic philosophers see Kirk, Raven, and Schofield (1983) and Barnes (1986).

7. That this was the Eleatic position may be inferred from Plato's Parmenides.

8. For the history of the doctrine of atomism see especially Pyle (1997).

9. In Book VI of the Categories. Quantity (πoσov) is introduced by Aristotle as the category associated with how much. In addition to exhibiting continuity and discreteness, quantities are, according to Aristotle, distinguished by the feature of being equal or unequal.

10. Here it must be noted that for Aristotle, as for ancient Greek thinkers generally, the term “number”—arithmos — means just “plurality”.

11. Aristotle points out that (spoken) words are analyzable into syllables or phonemes, linguistic “atoms” themselves irreducible to simpler linguistic elements.

12. For an account of Epicurus's doctrines, see Furley (1967).

13. He seems to have refrained, however, from subjecting the continuum to his celebrated “razor”.

14. See, e.g., the papers of Murdoch and Stump in Kretzmann (1982).

15. Hermann Weyl makes a similar suggestion in connection with Galileo's “bending” procedure:

If a curve consists of infinitely many straight “line elements”, then a tangent can simply be conceived as indicating the direction of the individual line segment; it joins two “consecutive ” points on the curve. (Weyl 1949, p. 44.)

16. This conception was to prove fruitful in the later development of the calculus and to achieve fully rigorous formulation in the smooth infinitesimal analysis of the later 20th century. See Section 8 below.

17. On Barrow, see Child (1916) and Boyer (1959).

18. On Newton's contributions to the calculus see Baron (1987) and Boyer (1959).

19. De analysi, written 1666, published 1711; Methodus fluxionum, written 1671, published 1736; Quadratura, written c. 1676, published 1704.

20. On Leibniz see especially Russell (1958).

21. On Nieuwentijdt and other critics of Leibniz see Mancosu (1996).

22. But the other properties have resurfaced in the theories of infinitesimals which have emerged over the past several decades. Appropriately defined, the relation ≈, property 1 holds of the differentials in nonstandard analysis, while properties 1, 2 and 3 hold of the differentials in smooth infinitesimal analysis. See sections 6 and 8 below.

23. On Euler, see especially Truesdell (1972).

24. Or, to put it another way, (real) numbers are just the ratios of infinitesimals: this is a reigning principle of smooth infinitesimal analysis, see Section 8 below.

25. Likely the astronomer Edmund Halley (1656–1742).

26. Kant would probably maintain the truth of the Thesis in that event.

27. This had been previously given by Bolzano.

28. Fisher (1978) argues that here and there in his work Cauchy did “argue directly with infinitely small quantities treated as actual infinitesimals.”

29. According to Hobson (1907, p. 22), “the term ‘arithmetization’ is used to denote the movement which has resulted in placing analysis on a basis free from the idea of measurable quantity, the fractional, negative, and irrational numbers being so defined that they depend ultimately upon the conception of integral number.”

30. The concept of function had by this time been greatly broadened: in 1837 Dirichlet suggested that a variable y should be regarded as a function of the independent vatiable x if a rule exists according to which, whenever a numerical value of x is given, a unique value of y is determined. (This idea was later to evolve into the set-theoretic definition of function as a set of ordered pairs.) Dirichlet's definition of function as a correspondence from which all traces of continuity had been purged, made necessary Weirstrass's independent definition of continuous function.

31. The notion of uniform continuity for functions was later introduced (in 1870) by Heine: a real valued function f is uniformly continuous if for any ε > 0 there is δ > 0 such that |f(x) − f(y)| < ε for all x and y in the domain of f such that |xy| < δ. In 1872 Heine proved the important theorem that any continuous real-valued function defined on a closed bounded interval of real numbers is uniformly continuous.

32. On Cantor, see Dauben (1979) and Hallett (1984).

33. Translated in Ewald (1999).

34. This, Cantor's continuum hypothesis, is actually stated in terms of the transfinite ordinal numbers introduced in previous sections of the Grundlagen.

35. In the terminology of general topology, a set is perfect if it is closed and has no isolated points.

36. This set later became known as the Cantor ternary set or the Cantor discontinuum.

37. Cantor later turned to the problem of characterizing the linear continuum as an ordered set. His solution was published in 1895 in the Mathematische Annalen (Dauben, Chapter 8.) For a modern presentation, see §3 of Ch. 6 of Kuratowski-Mostowski (1968).

38. For du Bois-Reymond's theory of infinitesimals see Fisher (1981); for Veronese's, see Fisher (1994). The introduction to Ehrlich (1994) provides an overview of these “non-Cantorian” theories of infinitesimals and the continuum.

39. In a letter to Husserl drafted in 1905, Brentano asserts that “I regard it as absurd to interpret a continuum as a set of points.”

40. For an account of Peirce's view of the continuum, see the introduction to Peirce (1992).

41. For Poincare's philosophy of mathematics see Folina (1992).

42. The failure of these important results of classical analysis caused most mathematicians of the day to shun intuitionistic, and even constructive mathematics. It was not until the 1960s that adequate constructive versions were worked out. See Section 7 below.

43. A. Laugwitz and C. Schmieden, “Eine Erweiterung der Infinitesimalrechnung,” Mathematische Zeitschrift, 69: 1–39.

44. So-called, Robinson says, because his theory “involves and was, in part, inspired by the so-called Non-standard models of Arithmetic whose existence was first pointed out by T. Skolem.” (Ibid.)

45. It follows that ˆ is a nonarchimedean ordered field. One might question whether this is compatible with the facts that ˆ and ℜ share the same first-order properties, but the latter is archimedean. These data are consistent because the archimedean property is not first-order. However, while ˆ is nonarchimedean, it is *-archimedean in the sense that, for any aˆ there is nˆ for which a < n.

46. Robinson (1996), Ch. 3. A number of “nonstandard” proofs of classical theorems may also be found there.

47. Here “nonempty” has the stronger constructive meaning that an element of the set in question can be constructed.

48. This may be seen to be plausible if one considers that the according to Brouwer the construction of a choice sequence is incompletable; at any given moment we can know nothing about it outside the identities of a finite number of its entries. Brouwer's principle amounts to the assertion that every function from ℕ to ℕ is continuous.

49. For an explicit statement of the principle of Bar Induction, see Ch. 3 of Dummett (1977), or Ch. 5 of Bridges and Richman (1987).

50. See Kock (1981), Lavendhomme (1996), Lawvere (1980), (1998), McLarty (1992) Moerdijk, I. and Reyes, G. and Moerdijk and Reyes (1991). For an elementary account of smooth infinitesimal analysis see Bell (1998).

51. For any f ∈ (ΔΔ)0, the microaffineness axiom ensures that there is a unique bR for which f(ε) = bε for all ε, and conversely each bR yields the map ε maps tp bε in (ΔΔ)0.

52. A monoid is a multiplicative system (not necessarily commutative) with an identity element.

53. The domain of f is in fact (R − {0}) ∪ {0}, which, because of the failure of the law of excluded middle in SIA, is provably unequal to R.

Copyright © 2013 by
John L. Bell <jbell@uwo.ca>

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