## Notes to Continuity and Infinitesimals

1. The word “continuous” derives from a Latin root meaning “to hang together” or “to cohere”; this same root gives us the nouns “continent”—an expanse of land unbroken by sea—and “continence”—self-restraint in the sense of “holding oneself together”. Synonyms for “continuous” include: connected, entire, unbroken, uninterrupted.

2. The word “discrete” derives from a Latin root meaning “to separate”. This same root yields the verb “discern”—to recognize as distinct or separate—and the cognate “discreet”—to show discernment, hence “well-behaved”. It is a curious fact that, while “continuity” and “discreteness” are antonyms, “continence” and “discreetness” are synonyms. Synonyms for “discrete” include separate, distinct, detached, disjunct.

3. Of course, this presupposes that there are no “gaps” between the elements or points, which is implicit in the assumption that the points have been obtained by complete division of a continuum.

4. It should also be
mentioned that the German philosopher Johann Friedrich Herbart
(1776–1841) introduced the term *synechology* for the part of
his philosophical system concerned with the continuity of the
real.

5. According to the
*Oxford English Dictionary* the term *infinitesimal* was
originally *an* ordinal, *viz. the “infinitieth”
in order; but, like other ordinals, also used to name fractions,
thus* infinitesimal part *or* infinitesimal *came to
mean unity divided by infinity* (1/∞), *and thus an
infinitely small part or quantity.*

6. For the doctrines of the presocratic philosophers see Kirk, Raven, and Schofield (1983) and Barnes (1986).

7. That this was the Eleatic
position may be inferred from Plato's *Parmenides.*

8. For the history of the doctrine of atomism see especially Pyle (1997).

9. In Book VI of the
*Categories.* Quantity (πoσov) is introduced by Aristotle as
the category associated with *how much.* In addition to
exhibiting continuity and discreteness, quantities are, according to
Aristotle, distinguished by the feature of being *equal* or
*unequal.*

10. Here it must be noted
that for Aristotle, as for ancient Greek thinkers generally, the term
“number”—*arithmos —* means just
“plurality”.

11. Aristotle points out that (spoken) words are analyzable into syllables or phonemes, linguistic “atoms” themselves irreducible to simpler linguistic elements.

12. For an account of Epicurus's doctrines, see Furley (1967).

13. He seems to have refrained, however, from subjecting the continuum to his celebrated “razor”.

14. See, e.g., the papers of Murdoch and Stump in Kretzmann (1982).

15. Hermann Weyl makes a similar suggestion in connection with Galileo's “bending” procedure:

*If a curve consists of infinitely many straight “line
elements”, then a tangent can simply be conceived as indicating
the direction of the individual line segment; it joins two
“consecutive ” points on the curve.* (Weyl 1949, p.
44.)

16. This conception was to
prove fruitful in the later development of the calculus and to achieve
fully rigorous formulation in the smooth infinitesimal analysis of the
later 20^{th} century. See Section 8 below.

17. On Barrow, see Child (1916) and Boyer (1959).

18. On Newton's contributions to the calculus see Baron (1987) and Boyer (1959).

19. *De analysi,*
written 1666, published 1711; *Methodus fluxionum,* written
1671, published 1736; *Quadratura,* written c. 1676, published
1704.

20. On Leibniz see especially Russell (1958).

21. On Nieuwentijdt and other critics of Leibniz see Mancosu (1996).

22. But the other
properties have resurfaced in the theories of infinitesimals which
have emerged over the past several decades. Appropriately defined, the
relation ≈, property 1 holds of the differentials in
*nonstandard analysis,* while properties 1, 2 and 3 hold of the
differentials in *smooth infinitesimal analysis.* See sections
6 and 8 below.

23. On Euler, see especially Truesdell (1972).

24. Or, to put it another way, (real) numbers are just the ratios of infinitesimals: this is a reigning principle of smooth infinitesimal analysis, see Section 8 below.

25. Likely the astronomer Edmund Halley (1656–1742).

26. Kant would probably maintain the truth of the Thesis in that event.

27. This had been previously given by Bolzano.

28. Fisher (1978) argues that here and there in his work Cauchy did “argue directly with infinitely small quantities treated as actual infinitesimals.”

29. According to Hobson (1907, p. 22), “the term ‘arithmetization’ is used to denote the movement which has resulted in placing analysis on a basis free from the idea of measurable quantity, the fractional, negative, and irrational numbers being so defined that they depend ultimately upon the conception of integral number.”

30. The concept of function
had by this time been greatly broadened: in 1837 Dirichlet suggested
that a variable *y* should be regarded as a function of the
independent vatiable *x* if a rule exists according to which,
whenever a numerical value of *x* is given, a unique value of
*y* is determined. (This idea was later to evolve into the
set-theoretic definition of function as a set of ordered pairs.)
Dirichlet's definition of function as a correspondence from which all
traces of continuity had been purged, made necessary Weirstrass's
independent definition of continuous function.

31. The notion of
*uniform continuity* for functions was later introduced (in
1870) by Heine: a real valued function *f* is uniformly
continuous if for any ε > 0 there is δ > 0 such
that |*f*(*x*) − *f*(*y*)| <
ε for all *x* and *y* in the domain of
*f* such that |*x* − *y*| < δ. In
1872 Heine proved the important theorem that any continuous
real-valued function defined on a closed bounded interval of real
numbers is uniformly continuous.

32. On Cantor, see Dauben (1979) and Hallett (1984).

33. Translated in Ewald (1999).

34. This,
*Cantor's continuum hypothesis*, is actually stated in
terms of the transfinite ordinal numbers introduced in previous
sections of the *Grundlagen.*

35. In the terminology of general topology, a set is perfect if it is closed and has no isolated points.

36. This set later became
known as the *Cantor ternary set* or the *Cantor
discontinuum.*

37. Cantor later turned to
the problem of characterizing the linear continuum as an ordered
set. His solution was published in 1895 in the *Mathematische*
Annalen (Dauben, Chapter 8.) For a modern presentation, see §3 of
Ch. 6 of Kuratowski-Mostowski (1968).

38. For du Bois-Reymond's theory of infinitesimals see Fisher (1981); for Veronese's, see Fisher (1994). The introduction to Ehrlich (1994) provides an overview of these “non-Cantorian” theories of infinitesimals and the continuum.

39. In a letter to Husserl drafted in 1905, Brentano asserts that “I regard it as absurd to interpret a continuum as a set of points.”

40. For an account of Peirce's view of the continuum, see the introduction to Peirce (1992).

41. For Poincare's philosophy of mathematics see Folina (1992).

42. The failure of these important results of classical analysis caused most mathematicians of the day to shun intuitionistic, and even constructive mathematics. It was not until the 1960s that adequate constructive versions were worked out. See Section 7 below.

43. A. Laugwitz and
C. Schmieden, “Eine Erweiterung der
Infinitesimalrechnung,” *Mathematische Zeitschrift*, 69:
1–39.

44. So-called, Robinson
says, because his theory “involves and was, in part, inspired by
the so-called Non-standard models of Arithmetic whose existence was
first pointed out by T. Skolem.” (*Ibid.*)

45. It follows that
ℜˆ
is a nonarchimedean ordered field. One might question whether this is
compatible with the facts that
ℜˆ
and ℜ share the same first-order
properties, but the latter is archimedean. These data are consistent
because the archimedean property is not first-order. However, while
ℜˆ
is nonarchimedean, it is *-*archimedean* in the sense that,
for any *a*
∈ ℜˆ
there is *n* ∈
ℕˆ
for which *a* < *n*.

46. Robinson (1996), Ch. 3. A number of “nonstandard” proofs of classical theorems may also be found there.

47. Here “nonempty” has the stronger constructive meaning that an element of the set in question can be constructed.

48. This may be seen to be
plausible if one considers that the according to Brouwer the
construction of a choice sequence is incompletable; at any given
moment we can know nothing about it outside the identities of a finite
number of its entries. Brouwer's principle amounts to the assertion
that every function
from ℕ^{ℕ} to ℕ is continuous.

49. For an explicit statement of the principle of Bar Induction, see Ch. 3 of Dummett (1977), or Ch. 5 of Bridges and Richman (1987).

50. See Kock (1981), Lavendhomme (1996), Lawvere (1980), (1998), McLarty (1992) Moerdijk, I. and Reyes, G. and Moerdijk and Reyes (1991). For an elementary account of smooth infinitesimal analysis see Bell (1998).

51. For any *f*
∈ (Δ^{Δ})_{0},
the microaffineness axiom ensures that there is a unique *b*
∈ **R** for which *f*(ε) =
*b*ε for all ε, and conversely each
*b* ∈ **R** yields the map ε
*b*ε
in (Δ^{Δ})_{0}.

52. A *monoid* is a
multiplicative system (not necessarily commutative) with an identity
element.

53. The domain of
*f* is in fact (**R** − {0}) ∪ {0},
which, because of the failure of the law of excluded middle in SIA, is
provably unequal to **R.**