# Continuity and Infinitesimals

*First published Wed Jul 27, 2005; substantive revision Fri Sep 6, 2013*

The usual meaning of the word *continuous* is
“unbroken” or “uninterrupted”: thus a
continuous entity—a *continuum—*has no
“gaps.” We commonly suppose that space and time are
continuous, and certain philosophers have maintained that all natural
processes occur continuously: witness, for example, Leibniz's famous
apothegm *natura non facit saltus—*“nature makes no
jump.” In mathematics the word is used in the same general sense,
but has had to be furnished with increasingly precise definitions. So,
for instance, in the later 18th century continuity of a function was
taken to mean that infinitesimal changes in the value of the argument
induced infinitesimal changes in the value of the function. With the
abandonment of infinitesimals in the 19th century this definition came
to be replaced by one employing the more precise concept of
*limit*.

Traditionally, an *infinitesimal* *quantity* is one
which, while not necessarily coinciding with zero, is in some sense
smaller than any finite quantity. For engineers, an infinitesimal is a
quantity so small that its square and all higher powers can be
neglected. In the theory of limits the term “infinitesimal”
is sometimes applied to any sequence whose limit is zero. An
*infinitesimal magnitude* may be regarded as what remains after
a continuum has been subjected to an exhaustive analysis, in other
words, as a continuum “viewed in the small.” It is in this
sense that continuous curves have sometimes been held to be
“composed” of infinitesimal straight lines.

Infinitesimals have a long and colourful history. They make an early appearance in the mathematics of the Greek atomist philosopher Democritus (c. 450 B.C.E.), only to be banished by the mathematician Eudoxus (c. 350 B.C.E.) in what was to become official “Euclidean” mathematics. Taking the somewhat obscure form of “indivisibles,” they reappear in the mathematics of the late middle ages and later played an important role in the development of the calculus. Their doubtful logical status led in the nineteenth century to their abandonment and replacement by the limit concept. In recent years, however, the concept of infinitesimal has been refounded on a rigorous basis.

- 1. Introduction: The Continuous, the Discrete, and the Infinitesimal
- 2. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the Ancient Period
- 3. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the Medieval, Renaissance, and Early Modern Periods
- 4. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the 17th and 18th Centuries
- 5. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the 19th Century
- 6. Critical Reactions to Arithmetization
- 7. Nonstandard Analysis
- 8. The Constructive Real Line and the Intuitionistic Continuum
- 9. Smooth Infinitesimal Analysis
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction: The Continuous, the Discrete, and the Infinitesimal

We are all familiar with the idea of *continuity*. To be
continuous^{[1]}
is to constitute an unbroken or
uninterrupted whole, like the ocean or the sky*.* A continuous
entity—a *continuum—*has no “gaps”.
Opposed to continuity is *discreteness*: to be
discrete^{[2]}
is to be
separated, like the scattered pebbles on a beach or the leaves on a
tree. Continuity connotes unity; discreteness, plurality.

While it is the fundamental nature of a continuum to be
*undivided*, it is nevertheless generally (although not
invariably) held that any continuum admits of repeated or successive
*division* *without limit.* This means that the process
of dividing it into ever smaller parts will never terminate in an
*indivisible* or an *atom—*that is, a part which,
lacking proper parts itself, cannot be further divided. In a word,
continua are *divisible without limit* or *infinitely
divisible.* The unity of a continuum thus conceals a potentially
infinite plurality. In antiquity this claim met with the objection
that, were one to carry out completely—if only in
imagination—the process of dividing an extended magnitude, such
as a continuous line, then the magnitude would be reduced to a
multitude of atoms—in this case, extensionless points—or
even, possibly, to nothing at all. But then, it was held, no matter how
many such points there may be—even if infinitely many—they
cannot be “reassembled” to form the original magnitude, for
surely a sum of extensionless elements still lacks
extension^{[3]}.
Moreover,
if indeed (as seems unavoidable) infinitely many points remain after
the division, then, following Zeno, the magnitude may be taken to be a
(finite) motion, leading to the seemingly absurd conclusion that
infinitely many points can be “touched” in a finite
time.

Such difficulties attended the birth, in the 5^{th} century
B.C.E., of the school of *atomism.* The founders of this school,
Leucippus and Democritus, claimed that matter, and, more generally,
extension, is not infinitely divisible. Not only would the successive
division of matter ultimately terminate in atoms, that is, in discrete
particles incapable of being further divided, but matter had *in
actuality* to be conceived as being compounded from such atoms. In
attacking infinite divisibility the atomists were at the same time
mounting a claim that the continuous is ultimately reducible to the
discrete, whether it be at the physical, theoretical, or perceptual
level.

The eventual triumph of the atomic theory in physics and chemistry
in the 19^{th} century paved the way for the idea of
“atomism”, as applying to matter, at least, to become
widely familiar: it might well be said, to adapt Sir William Harcourt's
famous observation in respect of the socialists of his day, “We
are all atomists now.” Nevertheless, only a minority of
philosophers of the past espoused atomism at a metaphysical level, a
fact which may explain why the analogous doctrine upholding continuity
lacks a familiar name: that which is unconsciously acknowledged
requires no name. Peirce coined the term *synechism* (from Greek
*syneche,* “continuous”) for his own
philosophy—a philosophy permeated by the idea of continuity in
its sense of “being
connected”^{[4]}.
In this article I shall
appropriate Peirce's term and use it in a sense shorn of its Peircean
overtones, simply as a contrary to atomism. I shall also use the term
“divisionism” for the more specific doctrine that continua
are infinitely divisible.

Closely associated with the concept of a continuum is that of
*infinitesimal*.^{[5]}
An *infinitesimal magnitude* has been
somewhat hazily conceived as a continuum “viewed in the
small,” an “ultimate part” of a continuum. In
something like the same sense as a discrete entity is made up of its
individual units, its “indivisibles”, so, it was
maintained, a continuum is “composed” of infinitesimal
magnitudes, its ultimate parts. (It is in this sense, for example, that
mathematicians of the 17^{th} century held that continuous
curves are “composed” of infinitesimal straight lines.) Now
the “coherence” of a continuum entails that each of its
(connected) parts is also a continuum, and, accordingly, divisible.
Since points are indivisible, it follows that no point can be part of a
continuum. Infinitesimal magnitudes, as parts of continua, cannot, of
necessity, be points: they are, in a word, *nonpunctiform*.

Magnitudes are normally taken as being *extensive*
quantities, like mass or volume, which are defined over extended
regions of space. By contrast, infinitesimal magnitudes have been
construed as *intensive* magnitudes resembling locally defined
intensive quantities such as temperature or density. The effect of
“distributing” or “integrating” an intensive
quantity over such an intensive magnitude is to convert the former into
an infinitesimal extensive quantity: thus temperature is transformed
into infinitesimal heat and density into infinitesimal mass. When the
continuum is the trace of a motion, the associated
infinitesimal/intensive magnitudes have been identified as
*potential* magnitudes—entities which, while not
possessing true magnitude themselves, possess a *tendency* to
generate magnitude through motion, so manifesting
“becoming” as opposed to “being”.

An infinitesimal *number* is one which, while not coinciding
with zero, is in some sense smaller than any finite number. This sense
has often been taken to be the failure to satisfy the *Principle of
Archimedes*, which amounts to saying that an infinitesimal number
is one that, no matter how many times it is added to itself, the result
remains less than any finite number. In the engineer's practical
treatment of the differential calculus, an infinitesimal is a number so
small that its square and all higher powers can be neglected. In the
theory of limits the term “infinitesimal” is sometimes
applied to any sequence whose limit is zero.

The concept of an *indivisible* is closely allied to, but to
be distinguished from, that of an infinitesimal. An indivisible is, by
definition, something that cannot be divided, which is usually
understood to mean that it has no proper parts. Now a partless, or
indivisible entity does not necessarily have to be infinitesimal:
souls, individual consciousnesses, and Leibnizian monads all supposedly
lack parts but are surely not infinitesimal. But these have in common
the feature of being unextended; extended entities such as lines,
surfaces, and volumes prove a much richer source of
“indivisibles”. Indeed, if the process of dividing such
entities were to terminate, as the atomists maintained, it would
necessarily issue in indivisibles of a qualitatively different nature.
In the case of a straight line, such indivisibles would, plausibly, be
points; in the case of a circle, straight lines; and in the case of a
cylinder divided by sections parallel to its base, circles. In each
case the indivisible in question is infinitesimal in the sense of
*possessing one fewer dimension than the figure from which it is
generated*. In the 16^{th} and 17^{th} centuries
indivisibles in this sense were used in the calculation of areas and
volumes of curvilinear figures, a surface or volume being thought of as
a collection, or sum, of linear, or planar indivisibles
respectively.

The concept of infinitesimal was beset by controversy from its
beginnings. The idea makes an early appearance in the mathematics of
the Greek atomist philosopher Democritus c. 450 B.C.E., only to be
banished c. 350 B.C.E. by Eudoxus in what was to become official
“Euclidean” mathematics. We have noted their reappearance
as indivisibles in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries: in this
form they were systematically employed by Kepler, Galileo's student
Cavalieri, the Bernoulli clan, and a number of other mathematicians. In
the guise of the beguilingly named “linelets” and
“timelets”, infinitesimals played an essential role in
Barrow's “method for finding tangents by calculation”,
which appears in his *Lectiones Geometricae* of 1670. As
“evanescent quantities” infinitesimals were instrumental
(although later abandoned) in Newton's development of the calculus,
and, as “inassignable quantities”, in Leibniz's. The
Marquis de l'Hôpital, who in 1696 published the first treatise on
the differential calculus (entitled *Analyse des Infiniments Petits
pour l'Intelligence des Lignes Courbes*), invokes the concept in
postulating that “a curved line may be regarded as being made up
of infinitely small straight line segments,” and that “one
can take as equal two quantities differing by an infinitely small
quantity.”

However useful it may have been in practice, the concept of
infinitesimal could scarcely withstand logical scrutiny. Derided by
Berkeley in the 18^{th} century as “ghosts of departed
quantities”, in the 19^{th} century execrated by Cantor
as “cholera-bacilli” infecting mathematics, and in the
20^{th} roundly condemned by Bertrand Russell as
“unnecessary, erroneous, and self-contradictory”, these
useful, but logically dubious entities were believed to have been
finally supplanted in the foundations of analysis by the limit concept
which took rigorous and final form in the latter half of the
19^{th} century. By the beginning of the 20^{th}
century, the concept of infinitesimal had become, in analysis at least,
a virtual “unconcept”.

Nevertheless the proscription of infinitesimals did not succeed in extirpating them; they were, rather, driven further underground. Physicists and engineers, for example, never abandoned their use as a heuristic device for the derivation of correct results in the application of the calculus to physical problems. Differential geometers of the stature of Lie and Cartan relied on their use in the formulation of concepts which would later be put on a “rigorous” footing. And, in a technical sense, they lived on in the algebraists' investigations of nonarchimedean fields.

A new phase in the long contest between the continuous and the
discrete has opened in the past few decades with the refounding of the
concept of infinitesimal on a solid basis. This has been achieved in
two essentially different ways, the one providing a rigorous
formulation of the idea of infinitesimal *number*, the other of
infinitesimal *magnitude*.

First, in the nineteen sixties Abraham Robinson, using methods of
mathematical logic, created *nonstandard analysis,* an extension
of mathematical analysis embracing both “infinitely large”
and infinitesimal numbers in which the usual laws of the arithmetic of
real numbers continue to hold, an idea which, in essence, goes back to
Leibniz. Here by an infinitely large number is meant one which exceeds
every positive integer; the reciprocal of any one of these is
infinitesimal in the sense that, while being nonzero, it is smaller
than every positive fraction 1/*n*. Much of the usefulness of
nonstandard analysis stems from the fact that within it every statement
of ordinary analysis involving limits has a succinct and highly
intuitive translation into the language of infinitesimals.

The second development in the refounding of the concept of
infinitesimal took place in the nineteen seventies with the emergence
of *synthetic differential geometry,* also known as *smooth
infinitesimal analysis*. Based on the ideas of the American
mathematician F. W. Lawvere, and employing the methods of category
theory, smooth infinitesimal analysis provides an image of the world in
which the continuous is an autonomous notion, not explicable in terms
of the discrete. It provides a rigorous framework for mathematical
analysis in which every function between spaces is smooth (i.e.,
differentiable arbitrarily many times, and so in particular continuous)
and in which the use of limits in defining the basic notions of the
calculus is replaced by *nilpotent infinitesimals*, that is, of
quantities so small (but not actually zero) that some power—most
usefully, the square—vanishes. Smooth infinitesimal analysis
embodies a concept of intensive magnitude in the form of
*infinitesimal tangent vectors* to curves. A tangent vector to a
curve at a point *p* on it is a short straight line segment
*l* passing through the point and pointing along the curve. In
fact we may take *l* actually to be an infinitesimal
*part* of the curve. Curves in smooth infinitesimal analysis are
“locally straight” and accordingly may be conceived as
being “composed of” infinitesimal straight lines in de
l'Hôpital's sense, or as being “generated” by an
infinitesimal tangent vector.

The development of nonstandard and smooth infinitesimal analysis has breathed new life into the concept of infinitesimal, and—especially in connection with smooth infinitesimal analysis—supplied novel insights into the nature of the continuum.

## 2. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the Ancient Period

The opposition between Continuity and Discreteness played a
significant role in ancient Greek philosophy. This probably derived
from the still more fundamental question concerning the One and the
Many, an antithesis lying at the heart of early Greek thought (see
Stokes [1971]). The Greek debate over the continuous and the discrete
seems to have been ignited by the efforts of Eleatic philosophers such
as Parmenides (c. 515 B.C.E.), and Zeno (c. 460 B.C.E.) to establish
their doctrine of absolute
monism^{[6]}.
They were concerned to
show that the divisibility of Being into parts leads to contradiction,
so forcing the conclusion that the apparently diverse world is a
static, changeless
unity.^{[7]}
In his *Way of Truth* Parmenides
asserts that Being is *homogeneous* and *continuous*.
However in asserting the continuity of Being Parmenides is likely no
more than underscoring its essential unity. Parmenides seems to be
claiming that Being is more than merely continuous—that it is, in
fact, a single whole, indeed an *indivisible* whole. The single
Parmenidean existent is a continuum without parts, at once a continuum
and an atom. If Parmenides was a synechist, his absolute monism
precluded his being at the same time a divisionist.

In support of Parmenides' doctrine of changelessness Zeno formulated
his famous paradoxes of motion. (see entry on
Zeno's paradoxes)
The *Dichotomy*
and *Achilles* paradoxes both rest explicitly on the limitless
divisibility of space and time.

The doctrine of
*Atomism*,^{[8]}
which seems to have
arisen as an attempt at escaping the Eleatic dilemma, was first and
foremost a physical theory. It was mounted by Leucippus (*fl*.
440 B.C.E.) and Democritus (b. 460–457 B.C.E.) who maintained
that matter was not divisible without limit, but composed of
indivisible, solid, homogeneous, spatially extended corpuscles, all
below the level of visibility.

Atomism was challenged by Aristotle (384–322 B.C.E.), who was
the first to undertake the systematic analysis of continuity and
discreteness. A thoroughgoing synechist, he maintained that physical
reality is a continuous plenum, and that the structure of a continuum,
common to space, time and motion, is not reducible to anything else.
His answer to the Eleatic problem was that continuous magnitudes are
potentially divisible to infinity, in the sense that they may be
divided *anywhere*, though they cannot be divided
*everywhere* at the same time.

Aristotle identifies continuity and discreteness as attributes
applying to the category of
Quantity^{[9]}.
As examples of
continuous quantities, or *continua*, he offers lines, planes,
solids (i.e., solid bodies), extensions, movement, time and space;
among discrete quantities he includes
number^{[10]}
and
speech^{[11]}.
He also
lays down definitions of a number of terms, including continuity. In
effect, Aristotle defines continuity as a *relation* between
entities rather than as an *attribute* appertaining to a single
entity; that is to say, he does not provide an explicit definition of
the concept of *continuum*. He observes that a single continuous
whole can be brought into existence by “gluing together”
two things which have been brought into contact, which suggests that
the continuity of a whole should derive from the way its *parts*
“join up”. Accordingly for Aristotle quantities such as
lines and planes, space and time are continuous by virtue of the fact
that their constituent parts “join together at some common
boundary”. By contrast *no* constituent parts of a
discrete quantity can possess a common boundary.

One of the central theses Aristotle is at pains to defend is the irreducibility of the continuum to discreteness—that a continuum cannot be “composed” of indivisibles or atoms, parts which cannot themselves be further divided.

Aristotle sometimes recognizes *infinite
divisibility*—the property of being divisible into parts
which can themselves be further divided, the process never terminating
in an indivisible—as a consequence of continuity as he
characterizes the notion. But on occasion he takes the property of
infinite divisibility as *defining* continuity. It is this
definition of continuity that figures in Aristotle's demonstration of
what has come to be known as the *isomorphism* *thesis*,
which asserts that either magnitude, time and motion are all
continuous, or they are all discrete.

The question of whether magnitude is perpetually divisible into
smaller units, or divisible only down to some atomic magnitude leads to
the *dilemma of divisibility* (see Miller [1982]), a difficulty
that Aristotle necessarily had to face in connection with his analysis
of the continuum. In the dilemma's first, or *nihilistic* horn,
it is argued that, were magnitude everywhere divisible, the process of
carrying out this division completely would reduce a magnitude to
extensionless points, or perhaps even to nothingness. The second, or
*atomistic,* horn starts from the assumption that magnitude is
not everywhere divisible and leads to the equally unpalatable
conclusion (for Aristotle, at least) that indivisible magnitudes must
exist.

As a thoroughgoing materialist,
Epicurus^{[12]}
(341–271
B.C.E.) could not accept the notion of potentiality on which
Aristotle's theory of continuity rested, and so was propelled towards
atomism in both its conceptual and physical senses. Like Leucippus and
Democritus, Epicurus felt it necessary to postulate the existence of
physical atoms, but to avoid Aristotle's strictures he proposed that
these should not be themselves conceptually indivisible, but should
*contain* conceptually indivisible parts. Aristotle had shown
that a continuous magnitude could not be composed of *points,*
that is, indivisible units lacking extension, but he had not shown that
an indivisible unit must necessarily lack extension. Epicurus met
Aristotle's argument that a continuum could not be composed of such
indivisibles by taking indivisibles to be partless units of magnitude
possessing extension.

In opposition to the atomists, the Stoic philosophers Zeno of Cition
(fl. 250 B.C.E.) and Chrysippus (280–206 B.C.E.) upheld the
Aristotelian position that space, time, matter and motion are all
continuous (see Sambursky [1963], [1971]; White [1992]). And, like
Aristotle, they explicitly rejected any possible existence of void
within the cosmos. The cosmos is pervaded by a continuous invisible
substance which they called *pneuma* (Greek:
“breath”). This pneuma—which was regarded as a kind
of synthesis of air and fire, two of the four basic elements, the
others being earth and water—was conceived as being an elastic
medium through which impulses are transmitted by wave motion. All
physical occurrences were viewed as being linked through tensile forces
in the pneuma, and matter itself was held to derive its qualities form
the “binding” properties of the pneuma it contains.

## 3. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the Medieval, Renaissance, and Early Modern Periods

The scholastic philosophers of Medieval Europe, in thrall to the
massive authority of Aristotle, mostly subscribed in one form or
another to the thesis, argued with great effectiveness by the Master in
Book VI of the *Physics,* that continua cannot be composed of
indivisibles. On the other hand, the avowed infinitude of the Deity of
scholastic theology, which ran counter to Aristotle's thesis that the
infinite existed only in a potential sense, emboldened certain of the
Schoolmen to speculate that the actual infinite might be found even
outside the Godhead, for instance in the assemblage of points on a
continuous line. A few scholars of the time, for example Henry of
Harclay (c. 1275–1317) and Nicholas of Autrecourt (c. 1300–69) chose to
follow Epicurus in upholding atomism reasonable and attempted to
circumvent Aristotle's counterarguments (see Pyle [1997]).

This incipient atomism met with a determined synechist rebuttal, initiated by John Duns Scotus (c. 1266–1308). In his analysis of the problem of “whether an angel can move from place to place with a continuous motion” he offers a pair of purely geometrical arguments against the composition of a continuum out of indivisibles. One of these arguments is that if the diagonal and the side of a square were both composed of points, then not only would the two be commensurable in violation of Book X of Euclid, they would even be equal. In the other, two unequal circles are constructed about a common centre, and from the supposition that the larger circle is composed of points, part of an angle is shown to be equal to the whole, in violation of Euclid's axiom V.

William of Ockham (c. 1280–1349) brought a considerable degree of
dialectical
subtlety^{[13]}
to his analysis of continuity; it has been
the subject of much scholarly
dispute^{[14]}.
For Ockham the
principal difficulty presented by the continuous is the infinite
divisibility of space, and in general, that of any continuum. The
treatment of continuity in the first book of his *Quodlibet* of
1322–7 rests on the idea that between any two points on a line there is
a third—perhaps the first explicit formulation of the property of
*density*—and on the distinction between a
*continuum* “whose parts form a unity” from a
*contiguum* of juxtaposed things. Ockham recognizes that it
follows from the property of density that on arbitrarily small
stretches of a line infinitely many points must lie, but resists the
conclusion that lines, or indeed any continuum, consists of points.
Concerned, rather, to determine “the sense in which the line may
be said to consist or to be made up of anything.”, Ockham claims
that “no part of the line is indivisible, nor is any part of a
continuum indivisible.” While Ockham does not assert that a line
is actually “composed” of points, he had the insight,
startling in its prescience, that a punctate and yet continuous line
becomes a possibility when conceived as a dense array of points, rather
than as an assemblage of points in contiguous succession.

The most ambitious and systematic attempt at refuting atomism in the
14^{th} century was mounted by Thomas Bradwardine (c. 1290
– 1349). The purpose of his *Tractatus de Continuo* (c.
1330) was to “prove that the opinion which maintains continua to
be composed of indivisibles is false.” This was to be achieved by
setting forth a number of “first principles” concerning the
continuum—akin to the axioms and postulates of Euclid's
*Elements—*and then demonstrating that the further
assumption that a continuum is composed of indivisibles leads to
absurdities (see Murdoch [1957]).

The views on the continuum of Nicolaus Cusanus (1401–64), a champion
of the actual infinite, are of considerable interest. In his *De
Mente Idiotae* of 1450, he asserts that any continuum, be it
geometric, perceptual, or physical, is divisible in two senses, the one
ideal, the other actual. Ideal division “progresses to
infinity”; actual division terminates in atoms after finitely
many steps.

Cusanus's realist conception of the actual infinite is reflected in
his quadrature of the circle (see Boyer [1959], p. 91). He took the
circle to be an *infinilateral* regular polygon, that is, a
regular polygon with an infinite number of (infinitesimally short)
sides. By dividing it up into a correspondingly infinite number of
triangles, its area, as for any regular polygon, can be computed as
half the product of the apothegm (in this case identical with the
radius of the circle), and the perimeter. The idea of considering a
curve as an infinilateral polygon was employed by a number of later
thinkers, for instance, Kepler, Galileo and Leibniz.

The early modern period saw the spread of knowledge in Europe of
ancient geometry, particularly that of Archimedes, and a loosening of
the Aristotelian grip on thinking. In regard to the problem of the
continuum, the focus shifted away from metaphysics to technique, from
the problem of “*what* indivisibles were, or
*whether* they composed magnitudes” to “the new
marvels one could *accomplish* with them” (see Murdoch
[1957], p. 325) through the emerging calculus and mathematical
analysis. Indeed, tracing the development of the continuum concept
during this period is tantamount to charting the rise of the calculus.
Traditionally, geometry is the branch of mathematics concerned with the
continuous and arithmetic (or algebra) with the discrete. The
infinitesimal calculus that took form in the 16^{th} and
17^{th} centuries, which had as its primary subject matter
*continuous variation*, may be seen as a kind of synthesis of
the continuous and the discrete, with infinitesimals bridging the gap
between the two. The widespread use of indivisibles and infinitesimals
in the analysis of continuous variation by the mathematicians of the
time testifies to the affirmation of a kind of mathematical atomism
which, while logically questionable, made possible the spectacular
mathematical advances with which the calculus is associated. It was
thus to be the infinitesimal, rather than the infinite, that served as
the mathematical stepping stone between the continuous and the
discrete.

Johann Kepler (1571–1630) made abundant use of infinitesimals in his
calculations. In his *Nova Stereometria* of 1615, a work
actually written as an aid in calculating the volumes of wine casks, he
regards curves as being infinilateral polygons, and solid bodies as
being made up of infinitesimal cones or infinitesimally thin discs (see
Baron [1987], pp. 108–116; Boyer [1969], pp. 106–110). Such uses are in
keeping with Kepler's customary use of infinitesimals of the same
dimension as the figures they constitute; but he also used indivisibles
on occasion. He spoke, for example, of a cone as being composed of
circles, and in his *Astronomia Nova* of 1609, the work in which
he states his famous laws of planetary motion, he takes the area of an
ellipse to be the “sum of the radii” drawn from the
focus.

It seems to have been Kepler who first introduced the idea, which
was later to become a reigning principle in geometry, of *continuous
change of a mathematical object*, in this case, of a geometric
figure. In his *Astronomiae pars Optica* of 1604 Kepler notes
that all the conic sections are continuously derivable from one another
both through focal motion and by variation of the angle with the cone
of the cutting plane.

Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) advocated a form of mathematical atomism
in which the influence of both the Democritean atomists and the
Aristotelian scholastics can be discerned. This emerges when one turns
to the First Day of Galileo's *Dialogues Concerning Two New
Sciences* (1638). Salviati, Galileo's spokesman, maintains,
contrary to Bradwardine and the Aristotelians, that continuous
magnitude is made up of indivisibles, indeed an infinite number of
them. Salviati/Galileo recognizes that this infinity of indivisibles
will never be produced by successive subdivision, but claims to have a
method for generating it all at once, thereby removing it from the
realm of the potential into actual realization: this “method for
separating and resolving, at a single stroke, the whole of
infinity” turns out simply to the act of bending a straight line
into a circle. Here Galileo finds an ingenious
“metaphysical” application of the idea of regarding the
circle as an infinilateral polygon. When the straight line has been
bent into a circle Galileo seems to take it that that the line has
thereby been rendered into indivisible parts, that is, points. But if
one considers that these parts are the sides of the infinilateral
polygon, they are better characterized not as indivisible points, but
rather as unbendable straight lines, each at once part of and tangent
to the
circle^{[15]}.
Galileo does not mention this
possibility, but nevertheless it does not seem fanciful to detect the
germ here of the idea of considering a curve as a an assemblage of
infinitesimal “unbendable” straight
lines.^{[16]}

It was Galileo's pupil and colleague Bonaventura Cavalieri
(1598–1647) who refined the use of indivisibles into a reliable
mathematical tool (see Boyer [1959]); indeed the “method of
indivisibles” remains associated with his name to the present
day. Cavalieri nowhere explains precisely what he understands by the
word “indivisible”, but it is apparent that he conceived of
a surface as composed of a multitude of equispaced parallel lines and
of a volume as composed of equispaced parallel planes, these being
termed the indivisibles of the surface and the volume respectively.
While Cavalieri recognized that these “multitudes” of
indivisibles must be unboundedly large, indeed was prepared to regard
them as being actually infinite, he avoided following Galileo into
ensnarement in the coils of infinity by grasping that, for the
“method of indivisibles” to work, the precise
“number” of indivisibles involved *did not matter*.
Indeed, the essence of Cavalieri's method was the establishing of a
correspondence between the indivisibles of two “similar”
configurations, and in the cases Cavalieri considers it is evident that
the correspondence is suggested on solely geometric grounds, rendering
it quite independent of number. The very statement of Cavalieri's
principle embodies this idea: if plane figures are included between a
pair of parallel lines, and if their intercepts on any line parallel to
the including lines are in a fixed ratio, then the areas of the figures
are in the same ratio. (An analogous principle holds for solids.)
Cavalieri's method is in essence that of reduction of dimension: solids
are reduced to planes with comparable areas and planes to lines with
comparable lengths. While this method suffices for the computation of
areas or volumes, it cannot be applied to rectify curves, since the
reduction in this case would be to points, and no meaning can be
attached to the “ratio” of two points. For rectification a
curve has, it was later realized, to be regarded as the sum, not of
indivisibles, that is, points, but rather of infinitesimal straight
lines, its microsegments.

René Descartes (1596–1650) employed infinitesimalist techniques, including Cavalieri's method of indivisibles, in his mathematical work. But he avoided the use of infinitesimals in the determination of tangents to curves, instead developing purely algebraic methods for the purpose. Some of his sharpest criticism was directed at those mathematicians, such as Fermat, who used infinitesimals in the construction of tangents.

As a philosopher Descartes may be broadly characterized as a
synechist. His philosophical system rests on two fundamental
principles: the celebrated Cartesian dualism—the division between
mind and matter—and the less familiar identification of matter
and spatial extension. In the *Meditations* Descartes
distinguishes mind and matter on the grounds that the corporeal, being
spatially extended, is divisible, while the mental is partless. The
identification of matter and spatial extension has the consequence that
matter is continuous and divisible without limit. Since extension is
the sole essential property of matter and, conversely, matter always
accompanies extension, matter must be ubiquitous. Descartes' space is
accordingly, as it was for the Stoics, a plenum pervaded by a
continuous medium.

The concept of infinitesimal had arisen with problems of a geometric
character and infinitesimals were originally conceived as belonging
solely to the realm of continuous magnitude as opposed to that of
discrete number. But from the algebra and analytic geometry of the
16^{th} and 17^{th} centuries there issued the concept
of *infinitesimal number*. The idea first appears in the work of
Pierre de Fermat (see Boyer [1959]) (1601–65) on the determination of
maximum and minimum (extreme) values, published in 1638.

Fermat's treatment of maxima and minima contains the germ of the fertile technique of “infinitesimal variation”, that is, the investigation of the behaviour of a function by subjecting its variables to small changes. Fermat applied this method in determining tangents to curves and centres of gravity.

## 4. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the 17th and 18th Centuries

Isaac
Barrow^{[17]}
(1630–77) was one of the first
mathematicians to grasp the reciprocal relation between the problem of
quadrature and that of finding tangents to curves—in modern
parlance, between integration and differentiation. In his *Lectiones
Geometricae* of 1670, Barrow observes, in essence, that if the
quadrature of a curve *y* = *f*(*x*) is known,
with the area up to *x* given by *F*(*x*), then
the subtangent to the curve *y* = *F*(*x*) is
measured by the ratio of its ordinate to the ordinate of the original
curve.

Barrow, a thoroughgoing synechist, regarded the conflict between divisionism and atomism as a live issue, and presented a number of arguments against mathematical atomism, the strongest of which is that atomism contradicts many of the basic propositions of Euclidean geometry.

Barrow conceived of continuous magnitudes as being generated by
motions, and so necessarily dependent on time, a view that seems to
have had a strong influence on the thinking of his illustrious pupil
Isaac
Newton^{[18]}
(1642–1727). Newton's meditations
during the plague year 1665–66 issued in the invention of what he
called the “Calculus of Fluxions”, the principles and
methods of which were presented in three tracts published many years
after they were
written^{[19]}
: *De analysi per aequationes numero
terminorum infinitas; Methodus fluxionum et serierum infinitarum;*
and *De quadratura* *curvarum*. Newton's approach to the
calculus rests, even more firmly than did Barrow's, on the conception
of continua as being generated by motion.

But Newton's exploitation of the kinematic conception went much
deeper than had Barrow's. In *De Analysi,* for example, Newton
introduces a notation for the “momentary increment”
(*moment*)—evidently meant to represent a moment or
instant of time—of the abscissa or the area of a curve, with the
abscissa itself representing time. This
“moment”—effectively the same as the infinitesimal
quantities previously introduced by Fermat and Barrow—Newton
denotes by *o* in the case of the abscissa, and by *ov*
in the case of the area. From the fact that Newton uses the letter
*v* for the ordinate, it may be inferred that Newton is thinking
of the curve as being a graph of velocity against time. By considering
the moving line, or ordinate, as the moment of the area Newton
established the generality of and reciprocal relationship between the
operations of differentiation and integration, a fact that Barrow had
grasped but had not put to systematic use. Before Newton, quadrature or
integration had rested ultimately “on some process through which
elemental triangles or rectangles were added together”, that is,
on the method of indivisibles. Newton's explicit treatment of
integration as inverse differentiation was the key to the integral
calculus.

In the *Methodus fluxionum* Newton makes explicit his
conception of variable quantities as generated by motions, and
introduces his characteristic notation. He calls the quantity generated
by a motion a *fluent*, and its rate of generation a
*fluxion*. The fluxion of a fluent *x* is denoted by
*x·*,
and its moment,
or “infinitely small increment accruing in an infinitely short
time *o*”, by
*x·**o*. The problem of
determining a tangent to a curve is transformed into the problem of
finding the relationship between the fluxions
*x·*
and
*z·*
when presented with an equation representing the
relationship between the fluents *x* and *z*. (A
quadrature is the inverse problem, that of determining the fluents when
the fluxions are given.) Thus, for example, in the case of the fluent
*z* = *x*^{n}, Newton first forms
*z·*
+
*z·**o* =
(*x·* +
*x·**o*)^{n}, expands the
right-hand side using the binomial theorem, subtracts *z* =
*x*^{n}, divides through by *o*,
neglects all terms still containing *o*, and so obtains
*z·*
=
*nx*^{n−1}
*x·*.

Newton later became discontented with the undeniable presence of
infinitesimals in his calculus, and dissatisfied with the dubious
procedure of “neglecting” them. In the preface to the
*De quadratura curvarum* he remarks that there is no necessity
to introduce into the method of fluxions any argument about infinitely
small quantities. In their place he proposes to employ what he calls
the method of *prime and ultimate ratio*. This method, in many
respects an anticipation of the limit concept, receives a number of
allusions in Newton's celebrated *Principia mathematica philosophiae
naturalis* of 1687.

Newton developed three approaches for his calculus, all of which he regarded as leading to equivalent results, but which varied in their degree of rigour. The first employed infinitesimal quantities which, while not finite, are at the same time not exactly zero. Finding that these eluded precise formulation, Newton focussed instead on their ratio, which is in general a finite number. If this ratio is known, the infinitesimal quantities forming it may be replaced by any suitable finite magnitudes—such as velocities or fluxions—having the same ratio. This is the method of fluxions. Recognizing that this method itself required a foundation, Newton supplied it with one in the form of the doctrine of prime and ultimate ratios, a kinematic form of the theory of limits.

The philosopher-mathematician G. W. F.
Leibniz^{[20]}
(1646–1716) was
greatly preoccupied with the problem of the composition of the
continuum—the “labyrinth of the continuum”, as he
called it. Indeed we have it on his own testimony that his
philosophical system—*monadism—*grew from his
struggle with the problem of just how, or whether, a continuum can be
built from indivisible elements. Leibniz asked himself: if we grant
that each real entity is either a simple unity or a multiplicity, and
that a multiplicity is necessarily an aggregation of unities, then
under what head should a geometric continuum such as a line be
classified? Now a line is extended and Leibniz held that extension is a
form of repetition, so, a line, being divisible into parts, cannot be a
(true) unity. It is then a multiplicity, and accordingly an aggregation
of unities. But of what sort of unities? Seemingly, the only candidates
for geometric unities are points, but points are no more than
extremities of the extended, and in any case, as Leibniz knew, solid
arguments going back to Aristotle establish that no continuum can be
constituted from points. It follows that a continuum is neither a unity
nor an aggregation of unities. Leibniz concluded that continua are
*not real* *entities* at all; as “wholes preceding
their parts” they have instead a purely ideal character. In this
way he freed the continuum from the requirement that, as something
intelligible, it must itself be simple or a compound of simples.

Leibniz held that space and time, as continua, are ideal, and
anything real, in particular matter, is discrete, compounded of simple
unit substances he termed *monads*.

Among the best known of Leibniz's doctrines is the
*Principle* or *Law of Continuity*. In a somewhat
nebulous form this principle had been employed on occasion by a number
of Leibniz's predecessors, including Cusanus and Kepler, but it was
Leibniz who gave to the principle “a clarity of formulation which
had previously been lacking and perhaps for this reason regarded it as
his own discovery” (Boyer 1959, p. 217). In a letter to Bayle of
1687, Leibniz gave the following formulation of the principle:
“in any supposed transition, ending in any terminus, it is
permissible to institute a general reasoning in which the final
terminus may be included.” This would seem to indicate that
Leibniz considered “transitions” of any kind as continuous.
Certainly he held this to be the case in geometry and for natural
processes, where it appears as the principle *Natura non facit
saltus*. According to Leibniz, it is the Law of Continuity that
allows geometry and the evolving methods of the infinitesimal calculus
to be applicable in physics. The Principle of Continuity also furnished
the chief grounds for Leibniz's rejection of material atomism.

The Principle of Continuity also played an important underlying role
in Leibniz's mathematical work, especially in his development of the
infinitesimal calculus. Leibniz's essays *Nova Methodus* of 1684
and *De Geometri Recondita* of 1686 may be said to represent the
official births of the differential and integral calculi, respectively.
His approach to the calculus, in which the use of infinitesimals, plays
a central role, has combinatorial roots, traceable to his early work on
derived sequences of numbers. Given a curve determined by correlated
variables *x*, *y*, he wrote *dx* and *dy*
for infinitesimal differences, or *differentials,* between the
values *x* and *y*: and *dy*/*dx* for the
ratio of the two, which he then took to represent the slope of the
curve at the corresponding point. This suggestive, if highly formal
procedure led Leibniz to evolve rules for calculating with
differentials, which was achieved by appropriate modification of the
rules of calculation for ordinary numbers.

Although the use of infinitesimals was instrumental in Leibniz's approach to the calculus, in 1684 he introduced the concept of differential without mentioning infinitely small quantities, almost certainly in order to avoid foundational difficulties. He states without proof the following rules of differentiation:

Ifais constant, then

da= 0 d(ax)= a dxd(x+y−z)= dx+dy−dzd(xy)= xdy+ydxd(x/y)= [− xdy+ydx]/y^{2}d(x^{p})= px^{p−1}dx, also for fractionalp

But behind the formal beauty of these rules—an early manifestation of what was later to flower into differential algebra—the presence of infinitesimals makes itself felt, since Leibniz's definition of tangent employs both infinitely small distances and the conception of a curve as an infinilateral polygon.

Leibniz conceived of differentials *dx*, *dy* as
variables ranging over differences. This enabled him to take the
important step of regarding the symbol *d* as an
*operator* acting on variables, so paving the way for the
*iterated* *application* of *d*, leading to the
higher differentials *ddx* = *d*^{2}*x*,
*d*^{3}*x* = *dd*^{2}*x*,
and in general *d*^{n}^{+1}*x* =
*dd*^{n}*x*. Leibniz supposed that the
first-order differentials *dx*, *dy*,…. were
incomparably smaller than, or infinitesimal with respect to, the finite
quantities *x*, *y*,…, and, in general, that an
analogous relation obtained between the
(*n*+1)* ^{th}*-order differentials

*d*

^{n+1}

*x*and the

*n*

^{th}-order differentials

*d*

^{n}

*x*. He also assumed that the

*n*

^{th}power (

*dx*)

^{n}of a first-order differential was of the same order of magnitude as an

*n*-order differential

^{th}*d*

*, in the sense that the quotient*

^{n}x*d*

*/(*

^{n}x*dx*)

*is a finite quantity.*

^{n}For Leibniz the incomparable smallness of infinitesimals derived from their failure to satisfy Archimedes' principle; and quantities differing only by an infinitesimal were to be considered equal. But while infinitesimals were conceived by Leibniz to be incomparably smaller than ordinary numbers, the Law of Continuity ensured that they were governed by the same laws as the latter.

Leibniz's attitude toward infinitesimals and differentials seems to have been that they furnished the elements from which to fashion a formal grammar, an algebra, of the continuous. Since he regarded continua as purely ideal entities, it was then perfectly consistent for him to maintain, as he did, that infinitesimal quantities themselves are no less ideal—simply useful fictions, introduced to shorten arguments and aid insight.

Although Leibniz himself did not credit the infinitesimal or the
(mathematical) infinite with objective existence, a number of his
followers did not hesitate to do so. Among the most prominent of these
was Johann Bernoulli (1667–1748). A letter of his to Leibniz
written in 1698 contains the forthright assertion that “inasmuch
as the number of terms in nature is infinite, the infinitesimal exists
*ipso facto*.” One of his arguments for the existence of
actual infinitesimals begins with the positing of the infinite sequence
1/2, 1/3, 1/4,…. If there are ten terms, one tenth exists; if a
hundred, then a hundredth exists, etc.; and so if, as postulated, the
number of terms is infinite, then the infinitesimal exists.

Leibniz's calculus gained a wide audience through the publication in
1696, by Guillaume de L'Hôpital (1661–1704), of the first
expository book on the subject, the *Analyse des Infiniments Petits
Pour L'Intelligence des Lignes Courbes*. This is based on two
definitions:

- Variable quantities are those that continually increase or decrease; and constant or standing quantities are those that continue the same while others vary.
- The infinitely small part whereby a variable quantity is continually increased or decreased is called the differential of that quantity.

And two postulates:

- Grant that two quantities, whose difference is an infinitely small quantity, may be taken (or used) indifferently for each other: or (what is the same thing) that a quantity, which is increased or decreased only by an infinitely small quantity, may be considered as remaining the same.
- Grant that a curve line may be considered as the assemblage of an infinite number of infinitely small right lines: or (what is the same thing) as a polygon with an infinite number of sides, each of an infinitely small length, which determine the curvature of the line by the angles they make with each other.

Following Leibniz, L'Hôpital writes *dx* for the
differential of a variable quantity *x*. A typical application
of these definitions and postulates is the determination of the
differential of a product *xy*:

d(xy) = (x+dx)(y+dy) −xy=ydx+xdy+dxdy=ydx+xdy.

Here the last step is justified by Postulate I, since *dx*
*dy* is infinitely small in comparison to *y* *dx*
+ *x* *dy*.

Leibniz's calculus of differentials, resting as it did on somewhat
insecure foundations, soon attracted criticism. The attack mounted by
the Dutch physician Bernard Nieuwentijdt^{[21]} (1654–1718) in works of 1694-6 is
of particular interest, since Nieuwentijdt offered his own account of
infinitesimals which conflicts with that of Leibniz and has striking
features of its own. Nieuwentijdt postulates a domain of quantities,
or numbers, subject to a ordering relation of greater or less. This
domain includes the ordinary finite quantities, but it is also
presumed to contain infinitesimal and infinite quantities—a
quantity being infinitesimal, or infinite, when it is smaller, or,
respectively, greater, than any arbitrarily given finite quantity. The
whole domain is governed by a version of the Archimedean principle to
the effect that zero is the only quantity incapable of being
multiplied sufficiently many times to equal any given
quantity. Infinitesimal quantities may be characterized as
quotients *b/m* of a finite quantity *b* by an infinite
quantity *m*. In contrast with Leibniz's differentials,
Nieuwentijdt's infinitesimals have the property that the product of
any pair of them vanishes; in particular each infinitesimal is
“nilsquare” in that its square and all higher powers are
zero. This fact enables Nieuwentijdt to show that, for any curve given
by an algebraic equation, the hypotenuse of the differential triangle
generated by an infinitesimal abscissal increment *e* coincides
with the segment of the curve between *x* and *x*
+ *e*. That is, a curve truly *is* an infinilateral
polygon.

The major differences between Nieuwentijdt's and Leibniz's calculi of infinitesimals are summed up in the following table:

LeibnizNieuwentijdtInfinitesimals are variables Infinitesimals are constants Higher-order infinitesimals exist Higher-order infinitesimals do not exist Products of infinitesimals are not absolute zeros Products of infinitesimals are absolute zeros Infinitesimals can be neglected when infinitely small with respect to other quantities (First-order) infinitesimals can never be neglected

In responding to Nieuwentijdt's assertion that squares and higher
powers of infinitesimals vanish, Leibniz objected that it is rather
strange to posit that a segment *dx* is different from zero and
at the same time that the area of a square with side *dx* is
equal to zero (Mancosu 1996, 161). Yet this oddity may be regarded as
a consequence — apparently unremarked by Leibniz himself — of
one of his own key principles, namely that curves may be considered as
infinilateral polygons. Consider, for instance, the curve *y*
= *x*^{2}. Given that the curve is an infinilateral
polygon, the infinitesimal straight stretch of the curve between the
abscissae 0 and *dx* must coincide with the tangent to the
curve at the origin — in this case, the axis of abscissae —
between these two points. But then the point
(*dx*, *dx*^{2}) must lie on the axis of
abscissae, which means that *dx*^{2} = 0.

Now Leibniz could retort that that this argument depends crucially on
the assumption that the portion of the curve between abscissae 0
and *dx* is indeed straight. If this be denied, then of course
it does not follow that *dx*^{2} = 0. But if one
grants, as Leibniz does, that that there is an infinitesimal straight
stretch of the curve (a side, that is, of an infinilateral polygon
coinciding with the curve) between abscissae 0 and *e*, say,
which does not reduce to a single point then *e* cannot be
equated to 0 and yet the above argument shows
that *e*^{2} = 0. It follows that, if curves are
infinlateral polygons, then the “lengths” of the sides of
these latter must be nilsquare infinitesimals. Accordingly, to do full
justice to Leibniz's (as well as Nieuwentijdt's)
conception, *two* sorts of infinitesimals are required: first,
“differentials” obeying= as laid down by Leibniz — the
same algebraic laws as finite quantities; and second the (necessarily
smaller) nilsquare infinitesimals which measure the lengths of the
sides of infinilateral polygons. It may be said that Leibniz
recognized the need for the first, but not the seccond type of
infinitesimal and Nieuwentijdt, vice-versa. It is of interest to note
that Leibnizian infinitesimals (differentials) are realized in
nonstandard analysis, and nilsquare infinitesimals in smooth
infinitesimal analysis (for both types of analysis see below). In fact
it has been shown to be possible to combine the two approaches, so
creating an analytic framework realizing both Leibniz's and
Nieuwentijdt's conceptions of infinitesimal.

The insistence that infinitesimals obey precisely the same algebraic
rules as finite quantities forced Leibniz and the defenders of his
differential calculus into treating infinitesimals, in the presence of
finite quantities, *as if* they were zeros, so that, for
example, *x* + *dx* is treated as if it were the same as
*x*. This was justified on the grounds that differentials are to
be taken as variable, not fixed quantities, decreasing continually
until reaching zero. Considered only in the “moment of their
evanescence”, they were accordingly neither something nor
absolute zeros.

Thus differentials (or infinitesimals) *dx* were ascribed
variously the four following properties:

*dx*≈ 0*neither**dx*= 0*nor**dx*≠ 0*dx*^{2}= 0*dx*→ 0

where “≈” stands for “indistinguishable
from”, and “→ 0” stands for “becomes
vanishingly small”. Of these properties only the last, in which a
differential is considered to be a variable quantity tending to 0,
survived the 19^{th} century refounding of the calculus in
terms of the limit
concept^{[22]}.

The leading practitioner of the calculus, indeed the leading
mathematician of the 18^{th} century, was Leonhard
Euler^{[23]}
(1707–83). Philosophically Euler was
a thoroughgoing synechist. Rejecting Leibnizian monadism, he favoured
the Cartesian doctrine that the universe is filled with a continuous
ethereal fluid and upheld the wave theory of light over the corpuscular
theory propounded by Newton.

Euler rejected the concept of infinitesimal in its sense as a
quantity less than any assignable magnitude and yet unequal to 0,
arguing: that differentials must be zeros, and *dy*/*dx*
the quotient 0/0. Since for any number α, α · 0 = 0,
Euler maintained that the quotient 0/0 could represent any number
whatsoever^{[24]}.
For Euler *qua* formalist the
calculus was essentially a procedure for determining the value of the
expression 0/0 in the manifold situations it arises as the ratio of
evanescent increments.

But in the mathematical analysis of natural phenomena, Euler, along
with a number of his contemporaries, did employ what amount to
infinitesimals in the form of minute, but more or less concrete
“elements” of continua, treating them not as atoms or
monads in the strict sense—as parts of a continuum they must of
necessity be divisible—but as being of sufficient minuteness to
preserve their rectilinear *shape* under infinitesimal flow, yet
allowing their *volume* to undergo infinitesimal change. This
idea was to become fundamental in continuum mechanics.

While Euler treated infinitesimals as formal zeros, that is, as fixed quantities, his contemporary Jean le Rond d'Alembert (1717–83) took a different view of the matter. Following Newton's lead, he conceived of infinitesimals or differentials in terms of the limit concept, which he formulated by the assertion that one varying quantity is the limit of another if the second can approach the other more closely than by any given quantity. D'Alembert firmly rejected the idea of infinitesimals as fixed quantities, and saw the idea of limit as supplying the methodological root of the differential calculus. For d'Alembert the language of infinitesimals or differentials was just a convenient shorthand for avoiding the cumbrousness of expression required by the use of the limit concept.

Infinitesimals, differentials, evanescent quantities and the like
coursed through the veins of the calculus throughout the
18^{th} century. Although nebulous—even logically
suspect—these concepts provided, *faute de mieux,* the
tools for deriving the great wealth of results the calculus had made
possible. And while, with the notable exception of Euler, many
18^{th} century mathematicians were ill-at-ease with the
infinitesimal, they would not risk killing the goose laying such a
wealth of golden mathematical eggs. Accordingly they refrained, in the
main, from destructive criticism of the ideas underlying the calculus.
Philosophers, however, were not fettered by such constraints.

The philosopher George Berkeley (1685–1753), noted both for his
subjective idealist doctrine of *esse est percipi* and his
denial of general ideas, was a persistent critic of the presuppositions
underlying the mathematical practice of his day (see Jesseph [1993]).
His most celebrated broadsides were directed at the calculus, but in
fact his conflict with the mathematicians went deeper. For his denial
of the existence of abstract ideas of any kind went in direct
opposition with the abstractionist account of mathematical concepts
held by the majority of mathematicians and philosophers of the day. The
central tenet of this doctrine, which goes back to Aristotle, is that
the mind creates mathematical concepts by *abstraction*, that
is, by the mental suppression of extraneous features of perceived
objects so as to focus on properties singled out for attention.
Berkeley rejected this, asserting that mathematics as a science is
ultimately concerned with objects of sense, its admitted generality
stemming from the capacity of percepts to serve as signs for all
percepts of a similar form.

At first Berkeley poured scorn on those who adhere to the concept of infinitesimal. maintaining that the use of infinitesimals in deriving mathematical results is illusory, and is in fact eliminable. But later he came to adopt a more tolerant attitude towards infinitesimals, regarding them as useful fictions in somewhat the same way as did Leibniz.

In *The Analyst* of 1734 Berkeley launched his most sustained
and sophisticated critique of infinitesimals and the whole metaphysics
of the calculus. Addressed *To an Infidel
Mathematician*^{[25]},
the
tract was written with the avowed purpose of defending theology against
the scepticism shared by many of the mathematicians and scientists of
the day. Berkeley's defense of religion amounts to the claim that the
reasoning of mathematicians in respect of the calculus is no less
flawed than that of theologians in respect of the mysteries of the
divine.

Berkeley's arguments are directed chiefly against the Newtonian fluxional calculus. Typical of his objections is that in attempting to avoid infinitesimals by the employment of such devices as evanescent quantities and prime and ultimate ratios Newton has in fact violated the law of noncontradiction by first subjecting a quantity to an increment and then setting the increment to 0, that is, denying that an increment had ever been present. As for fluxions and evanescent increments themselves, Berkeley has this to say:

And what are these fluxions? The velocities of evanescent increments? And what are these same evanescent increments? They are neither finite quantities nor quantities infinitely small, nor yet nothing. May we not call them the ghosts of departed quantities?

Nor did the Leibnizian method of differentials escape Berkeley's strictures.

The opposition between continuity and discreteness plays a
significant role in the philosophical thought of Immanuel Kant
(1724–1804). His mature philosophy, *transcendental
idealism*, rests on the division of reality into two realms. The
first, the *phenomenal* realm, consists of appearances or
objects of possible experience, configured by the forms of sensibility
and the epistemic categories. The second, the *noumenal* realm,
consists of “entities of the understanding to which no objects of
experience can ever correspond”, that is,
things-in-themselves.

Regarded as magnitudes, appearances are spatiotemporally extended and continuous, that is infinitely, or at least limitlessly, divisible. Space and time constitute the underlying order of phenomena, so are ultimately phenomenal themselves, and hence also continuous.

As objects of knowledge, appearances are continuous
*extensive* magnitudes, but as objects of sensation or
perception they are, according to Kant, *intensive* magnitudes.
By an intensive magnitude Kant means a magnitude possessing a
*degree* and so capable of being apprehended by the senses: for
example brightness or temperature. Intensive magnitudes are entirely
free of the intuitions of space or time, and “can only be
presented as unities”. But, like extensive magnitudes, they are
continuous. Moreover, appearances are always presented to the senses as
intensive magnitudes.

In the *Critique of Pure Reason* (1781) Kant brings a new
subtlety (and, it must be said, tortuousity) to the analysis of the
opposition between continuity and discreteness. This may be seen in the
second of the celebrated Antinomies in that work, which concerns the
question of the mereological composition of matter, or extended
substance. Is it (*a*) discrete, that is, consists of simple or
indivisible parts, or (*b*) continuous, that is, contains parts
within parts *ad infinitum*? Although (*a*), which Kant
calls the *Thesis* and (*b*) the *Antithesis*
would seem to contradict one another, Kant offers proofs of both
assertions. The resulting contradiction may be resolved, he asserts, by
observing that while the antinomy “relates to the division of
appearances”, the arguments for (*a*) and (*b*)
implicitly treat matter or substance as things-in-themselves. Kant
concludes that both Thesis and Antithesis “presuppose an
inadmissible condition” and accordingly “both fall to the
ground, inasmuch as the condition, under which alone either of them can
be maintained, itself falls.”

Kant identifies the inadmissible condition as the implicit taking of
matter as a thing-in-itself, which in turn leads to the mistake of
taking the division of matter into parts to subsist independently of
the act of dividing. In that case, the Thesis implies that the sequence
of divisions is finite; the Antithesis, that it is infinite. These
cannot be both be true of the *completed* (or at least
completable) sequence of divisions which would result from taking
matter or substance as a
thing-in-itself.^{[26]}
Now since the truth
of both assertions has been shown to follow from that assumption,
*it* must be false, that is, matter and extended substance are
appearances only. And for appearances, Kant maintains, divisions into
parts are not completable in experience, with the result that such
divisions can be considered, in a startling phrase, “neither
finite nor infinite”. It follows that, for appearances, both
Thesis and Antithesis are *false*.

Later in the *Critique* Kant enlarges on the issue of
divisibility, asserting that, while each part generated by a sequence
of divisions of an intuited whole is given with the whole, the
sequence's incompletability prevents *it* from forming a whole;
*a fortiori* no such sequence can be claimed to be actually
infinite.

## 5. The Continuum and the Infinitesimal in the 19th Century

The rapid development of mathematical analysis in the
18^{th} century had not concealed the fact that its underlying
concepts not only lacked rigorous definition, but were even (e.g., in
the case of differentials and infinitesimals) of doubtful logical
character. The lack of precision in the notion of continuous
function—still vaguely understood as one which could be
represented by a formula and whose associated curve could be smoothly
drawn—had led to doubts concerning the validity of a number of
procedures in which that concept figured. For example it was often
assumed that every continuous function could be expressed as an
infinite series by means of Taylor's theorem. Early in the
19^{th} century this and other assumptions began to be
questioned, thereby initiating an inquiry into what was meant by a
function in general and by a continuous function in particular.

A pioneer in the matter of clarifying the concept of continuous
function was the Bohemian priest, philosopher and mathematician Bernard
Bolzano (1781–1848). In his *Rein analytischer Beweis* of 1817
he defines a (real-valued) function *f* to be continuous at a
point *x* if the difference *f*(*x* + ω)
− *f*(*x*) can be made smaller than any preselected
quantity once we are permitted to take *w* as small as we
please. This is essentially the same as the definition of continuity in
terms of the limit concept given a little later by Cauchy. Bolzano also
formulated a definition of the derivative of a function free of the
notion of infinitesimal (see Bolzano [1950]). Bolzano repudiated
Euler's treatment of differentials as formal zeros in expressions such
as *dy*/*dx*, suggesting instead that in determining the
derivative of a function, increments Δ*x*,
Δ*y*, …, be *finally set* to zero. For
Bolzano differentials have the status of “ideal elements”,
purely formal entities such as points and lines at infinity in
projective geometry, or (as Bolzano himself mentions) imaginary
numbers, whose use will never lead to false assertions concerning
“real” quantities.

Although Bolzano anticipated the form that the rigorous formulation
of the concepts of the calculus would assume, his work was largely
ignored in his lifetime. The cornerstone for the rigorous development
of the calculus was supplied by the ideas—essentially similar to
Bolzano's—of the great French mathematician Augustin-Louis Cauchy
(1789–1857). In Cauchy's work, as in Bolzano's, a central role is
played by a purely arithmetical concept of limit freed of all geometric
and temporal intuition. Cauchy also formulates the condition for a
sequence of real numbers to converge to a limit, and states his
familiar criterion for
convergence^{[27]}
, namely, that a
sequence <*s*_{n}> is convergent if and
only if *s*_{n+r} −
*s _{n}* can be made less in absolute value than any
preassigned quantity for all

*r*and sufficiently large

*n*. Cauchy proves that this is necessary for convergence, but as to sufficiency of the condition merely remarks “when the various conditions are fulfilled, the convergence of the series is assured.” In making this latter assertion he is implicitly appealing to geometric intuition, since he makes no attempt to define real numbers, observing only that irrational numbers are to be regarded as the limits of sequences of rational numbers.

Cauchy chose to characterize the continuity of functions in terms of
a rigorized notion of infinitesimal, which he defines in the *Cours
d'analyse* as “a variable quantity [whose value] decreases
indefinitely in such a way as to converge to the limit 0.” Here
is his definition of continuity. Cauchy's definition of continuity of
*f*(*x*) in the neighbourhood of a value *a*
amounts to the condition, in modern notation, that
lim_{x→a}*f*(*x*) =
*f*(*a*). Cauchy defines the derivative *f*
′(*x*) of a function *f*(*x*) in a manner
essentially identical to that of Bolzano.

The work of Cauchy (as well as that of Bolzano) represents a crucial
stage in the renunciation by mathematicians—adumbrated in the
work of d'Alembert—of (fixed) infinitesimals and the intuitive
ideas of continuity and motion. Certain mathematicians of the day, such
as Poisson and Cournot, who regarded the limit concept as no more than
a circuitous substitute for the use of infinitesimally small
magnitudes—which in any case (they claimed) had a real
existence—felt that Cauchy's reforms had been carried too far.
But traces of the traditional ideas did in fact remain in Cauchy's
formulations, as evidenced by his use of such expressions as
“variable quantities”, “infinitesimal
quantities”, “approach indefinitely”, “as
little as one wishes” and the
like^{[28]}.

Meanwhile the German mathematician Karl Weierstrass (1815–97)
was completing the banishment of spatiotemporal intuition, and the
infinitesimal, from the foundations of analysis. To instill complete
logical rigour Weierstrass proposed to establish mathematical analysis
on the basis of number alone, to
“arithmetize”^{[29]}
it—in effect, to replace the continuous by the discrete.
“Arithmetization” may be seen as a form of mathematical
atomism. In pursuit of this goal Weierstrass had first to formulate a
rigorous “arithmetical” definition of real number. He did
this by defining a (positive) real number to be a countable set of
positive rational numbers for which the sum of any finite subset always
remains below some preassigned bound, and then specifying the
conditions under which two such “real numbers” are to be
considered equal, or strictly less than one another.

Weierstrass was concerned to purge the foundations of analysis of
all traces of the intuition of continuous motion—in a word, to
replace the variable by the static. For Weierstrass a variable
*x* was simply a symbol designating an arbitrary member of a
given set of numbers, and a continuous variable one whose corresponding
set *S* has the property that any interval around any member
*x* of *S* contains members of *S* other than
*x*. Weierstrass also formulated the familiar (ε,
δ) definition of continuous
function^{[30]}
: a function
*f*(*x*) is continuous at *a* if for any ε
> 0 there is a δ > 0 such that |*f*(*x*)
− *f*(*a*)| < ε for all *x* such
that |*x* − *a*| <
δ.^{[31]}

Following Weierstrass's efforts, another attack on the problem of
formulating rigorous definitions of continuity and the real numbers was
mounted by Richard Dedekind (1831–1916). Dedekind focussed
attention on the question: exactly what is it that distinguishes a
continuous domain from a discontinuous one? He seems to have been the
first to recognize that the property of density, possessed by the
ordered set of rational numbers, is insufficient to guarantee
continuity. In *Continuity and Irrational Numbers* (1872) he
remarks that when the rational numbers are associated to points on a
straight line, “there are infinitely many points [on the line] to
which no rational number corresponds” so that the rational
numbers manifest “a gappiness, incompleteness,
discontinuity”, in contrast with the straight line's
“absence of gaps, completeness, continuity.” Dedekind
regards this principle as being essentially indemonstrable; he ascribes
to it, rather, the status of an axiom “by which we attribute to
the line its continuity, by which we think continuity into the
line.” It is not, Dedekind stresses, necessary for *space*
to be continuous in this sense, for “many of its properties would
remain the same even if it were discontinuous.”

The filling-up of gaps in the rational numbers through the
“creation of new point-individuals” is the key idea
underlying Dedekind's construction of the domain of real numbers. He
first defines a *cut* to be a partition
(*A*_{1}*, A*_{2}) of the rational
numbers such that every member of *A*_{1} is less than
every member of *A*_{2}. After noting that each rational
number corresponds, in an evident way, to a cut, he observes that
infinitely many cuts fail to be engendered by rational numbers. The
discontinuity or incompleteness of the domain of rational numbers
consists precisely in this latter fact.

It is to be noted that Dedekind does not identify irrational numbers
with cuts; rather, each irrational number is newly
“created” by a mental act, and remains quite distinct from
its associated cut. Dedekind goes on to show how the domain of cuts,
and thereby the associated domain of real numbers, can be ordered in
such a way as to possess the property of *continuity*, viz.
“if the system ℜ
of all real numbers divides into two classes
_{1},
_{s} such
that every number *a*_{1} of the class
_{1} is
less than every number *a*_{2} of the class
_{2}, then
there exists one and only one number by which this separation is
produced.”

The most visionary “arithmetizer” of all was Georg
Cantor^{[32]}
(1845–1918). Cantor's analysis of
the continuum in terms of infinite point sets led to his theory of
transfinite numbers and to the eventual freeing of the concept of set
from its geometric origins as a collection of points, so paving the way
for the emergence of the concept of general abstract set central to
today's mathematics. Like Weierstrass and Dedekind, Cantor aimed to
formulate an adequate definition of the real numbers which avoided the
presupposition of their prior existence, and he follows them in basing
his definition on the rational numbers. Following Cauchy, he calls a
sequence *a*_{1}, *a*_{2},…,
*a _{n}*,… of rational numbers a

*fundamental sequence*if there exists an integer

*N*such that, for any positive rational ε, there exists an integer

*N*such that |

*a*−

_{n+m}*a*| < ε for all

_{n}*m*and all

*n*>

*N*. Any sequence <

*a*> satisfying this condition is said to have a

_{n}*definite limit b*. Dedekind had taken irrational numbers to be “mental objects” associated with cuts, so, analogously, Cantor regards these definite limits, as nothing more than

*formal symbols*associated with fundamental sequences. The domain

*B*of such symbols may be considered an enlargement of the domain

*A*of rational numbers. After imposing an arithmetical structure on the domain

*B*, Cantor is emboldened to refer to its elements as (real)

*numbers*. Nevertheless, he still insists that these “numbers” have no existence except as representatives of fundamental sequences. Cantor then shows that each point on the line corresponds to a definite element of

*B*. Conversely, each element of

*B*should determine a definite point on the line. Realizing that the intuitive nature of the linear continuum precludes a rigorous proof of this property, Cantor simply assumes it as an axiom, just as Dedekind had done in regard to his principle of continuity.

For Cantor, who began as a number-theorist, and throughout his
career cleaved to the discrete, it was numbers, rather than geometric
points, that possessed objective significance. Indeed the isomorphism
between the discrete numerical domain *B* and the linear
continuum was regarded by Cantor essentially as a device for
facilitating the manipulation of numbers.

Cantor's arithmetization of the continuum had the following
important consequence. It had long been recognized that the sets of
points of any pair of line segments, even if one of them is infinite in
length, can be placed in one-one correspondence. This fact was taken to
show that such sets of points have no well-defined “size”.
But Cantor's identification of the set of points on a linear continuum
with a domain of numbers enabled the *sizes* of point sets to be
compared in a definite way, using the well-grounded idea of *one-one
correspondence* between sets of numbers.

Cantor's investigations into the properties of subsets of the linear
continuum are presented in six masterly papers published during
1879–84, *Über unendliche lineare
Punktmannigfaltigkeiten* (“On infinite, linear point
manifolds”). Remarkable in their richness of ideas, these papers
provide the first accounts of Cantor's revolutionary theory of infinite
sets and its application to the classification of subsets of the linear
continuum. In the fifth of these papers, the *Grundlagen* of
1883,^{[33]}
are to be found some of Cantor's most
searching observations on the nature of the continuum.

Cantor begins his examination of the continuum with a tart summary
of the controversies that have traditionally surrounded the notion,
remarking that the continuum has until recently been regarded as an
essentially unanalyzable concept. It is Cantor's concern to
“develop the concept of the continuum as soberly and briefly as
possible, and only with regard to the *mathematical* theory of
sets”. This opens the way, he believes, to the formulation of an
exact concept of the continuum. Cantor points out that the idea of the
continuum has heretofore merely been presupposed by mathematicians
concerned with the analysis of continuous functions and the like, and
has “not been subjected to any more thorough
inspection.”

Repudiating any use of spatial or temporal intuition in an exact
determination of the continuum, Cantor undertakes its precise
arithmetical definition. Making reference to the definition of real
number he has already provided (i.e., in terms of fundamental
sequences), he introduces the *n*-dimensional arithmetical space
*G _{n}* as the set of all

*n*-tuples of real numbers <

*x*

_{1},

*x*

_{2},…,

*x*>, calling each such an

_{n}*arithmetical point*of

*G*The distance between two such points is given by

_{n.}
Cantor defines an *arithmetical* point-set in
*G _{n}* to be any “aggregate of points of the
points of the space

*G*that is given in a lawlike way”.

_{n}
After remarking that he has previously shown that all spaces
*G _{n}* have the same power as the set of real numbers
in the interval (0,1), and reiterating his conviction that any infinite
point sets has either the power of the set of natural numbers or that
of
(0,1),

^{[34]}Cantor turns to the definition of the general concept of a continuum within

*G*

_{n}_{.}. For this he employs the concept of

*derivative*or

*derived set*of a point set introduced in a paper of 1872 on trigonometric series. Cantor had defined the derived set of a point set

*P*to be the set of

*limit points*of

*P,*where a limit point of

*P*is a point of

*P*with infinitely many points of

*P*arbitrarily close to it. A point set is called

*perfect*if it coincides with its derived set

^{[35]}. Cantor observes that this condition does not suffice to characterize a continuum, since perfect sets can be constructed in the linear continuum which are dense in no interval, however small: as an example of such a set he offers the set

^{[36]}consisting of all real numbers in (0,1) whose ternary expansion does not contain a “1”.

Accordingly an additional condition is needed to define a continuum.
Cantor supplies this by introducing the concept of a
*connected* set. A point set *T* is connected in
Cantor's sense if for any pair of its points *t*,
*t*′ and any arbitrarily small number ε there is
a finite sequence of points *t*_{1},
*t*_{2},…, *t _{n}* of

*T*for which the distances [

*t*

*t*

_{1}], [

*t*

_{1}

*t*

_{2}], [

*t*

_{2}

*t*

_{3}], …, [

*t*

_{ n}

*t*′], are all less than ε. Cantor now defines a continuum to be a perfect connected point set.

Cantor has advanced beyond his predecessors in formulating what is
in essence a *topological* definition of continuum, one that,
while still dependent on metric notions, does not involve an order
relation^{[37]}.
It is interesting to compare Cantor's
definition with the definition of continuum in modern general topology.
In a well-known textbook (see Hocking and Young [1961]) on the subject
we find a *continuum* defined as a compact connected subset of a
topological space. Now within any *bounded* region of Euclidean
space it can be shown that Cantor's continua coincide with continua in
the sense of the modern definition. While Cantor lacked the definition
of compactness, his requirement that continua be “complete”
(which led to his rejecting as continua such noncompact sets as open
intervals or discs) is not far away from the idea.

Throughout Cantor's mathematical career he maintained an unwavering,
even dogmatic opposition to infinitesimals, attacking the efforts of
mathematicians such as du Bois-Reymond and
Veronese^{[38]}
to
formulate rigorous theories of actual infinitesimals. As far as Cantor
was concerned, the infinitesimal was beyond the realm of the possible;
infiinitesimals were no more than “castles in the air, or rather
just nonsense”, to be classed “with circular squares and
square circles”. His abhorrence of infinitesimals went so deep as
to move him to outright vilification, branding them as
“Cholera-bacilli of mathematics.” Cantor's rejection of
infinitesimals stemmed from his conviction that his own theory of
transfinite ordinal and cardinal numbers exhausted the realm of the
numerable, so that no further generalization of the concept of number,
in particular any which embraced infinitesimals, was admissible.

## 6. Critical Reactions to Arithmetization

Despite the great success of Weierstrass, Dedekind and Cantor in
constructing the continuum from arithmetical materials, a number of
thinkers of the late 19^{th} and early 20^{th}
centuries remained opposed, in varying degrees, to the idea of
explicating the continuum concept entirely in discrete terms. These
include the philosophers Brentano and Peirce and the mathematicians
Poincaré, Brouwer and Weyl.

In his later years the Austrian philosopher Franz Brentano
(1838–1917) became preoccupied with the nature of the continuous
(see Brentano [1988]). In its fundamentals Brentano's account of the
continuous is akin to Aristotle's. Brentano regards continuity as
something given in perception, primordial in nature, rather than a
mathematical construction. He held that the idea of the continuous is
abstracted from sensible intuition. Brentano suggests that the
continuous is brought to appearance by sensible intuition in three
phases. First, sensation presents us with objects having parts that
coincide. From such objects the concept of *boundary* is
abstracted in turn, and then one grasps that these objects actually
*contain* coincident boundaries. Finally one sees that this is
all that is required in order to have grasped the concept of a
continuum.

For Brentano the essential feature of a continuum is its inherent
capacity to engender boundaries, and the fact that such boundaries can
be grasped as coincident. Boundaries themselves possess a quality which
Brentano calls *plerosis* (“fullness”). Plerosis is
the measure of the number of directions in which the given boundary
actually bounds. Thus, for example, within a temporal continuum the
endpoint of a past episode or the starting point of a future one bounds
in a single direction, while the point marking the end of one episode
and the beginning of another may be said to bound doubly. In the case
of a spatial continuum there are numerous additional possibilities:
here a boundary may bound in all the directions of which it is capable
of bounding, or it may bound in only some of these directions. In the
former case, the boundary is said to exist in *full plerosis*;
in the latter, in *partial plerosis*. Brentano believed that the
concept of plerosis enabled sense to be made of the idea that a
boundary possesses “parts”, even when the boundary lacks
dimensions altogether, as in the case of a point. Thus, while the
present or “now” is, according to Brentano, temporally
unextended and exists only as a boundary between past and future, it
still possesses two “parts” or aspects: it is both the end
of the past and the beginning of the future. It is worth mentioning
that for Brentano it was not just the “now” that existed
only as a boundary; since, like Aristotle he held that
“existence” in the strict sense means “existence
*now*”, it necessarily followed that existing things exist
only as boundaries of what has existed or of what will exist, or
both.

Brentano took a somewhat dim view of the efforts of mathematicians
to construct the continuum from numbers. His attitude varied from
rejecting such attempts as inadequate to according them the status of
“fictions”^{[39]}.
This is not surprising given his
Aristotelian inclination to take mathematical and physical theories to
be genuine descriptions of empirical phenomena rather than
idealizations: in his view, if such theories were to be taken as
literal descriptions of experience, they would amount to nothing better
than “misrepresentations”.

Brentano's analysis of the continuum centred on its phenomenological and qualitative aspects, which are by their very nature incapable of reduction to the discrete. Brentano's rejection of the mathematicians' attempts to construct it in discrete terms is thus hardly surprising.

The American philosopher-mathematician Charles Sanders Peirce's
(1839–1914) view of the
continuum^{[40]}
was, in a sense,
intermediate between that of Brentano and the arithmetizers. Like
Brentano, he held that the cohesiveness of a continuum rules out the
possibility of it being a mere collection of discrete individuals, or
points, in the usual sense. And even before Brouwer Peirce seems to
have been aware that a faithful account of the continuum will involve
questioning the law of excluded middle. Peirce also held that any
continuum harbours an *unboundedly large* collection of
points—in his colourful terminology, a
*supermultitudinous* collection—what we would today call a
*proper class*. Peirce maintained that if “enough”
points were to be crowded together by carrying insertion of new points
between old to its ultimate limit they would—through a
*logical* “transformation of quantity into
quality”—lose their individual identity and become fused
into a true continuum.

Peirce's conception of the number continuum is also notable for the
presence in it of an abundance of *infinitesimals*, Peirce
championed the retention of the infinitesimal concept in the
foundations of the calculus, both because of what he saw as the
efficiency of infinitesimal methods, and because he regarded
infinitesimals as constituting the “glue” causing points on
a continuous line to lose their individual identity.

The idea of continuity played a central role in the thought of the
great French mathematician Henri
Poincaré^{[41]}
(1854–1912).
While accepting the arithmetic definition of the continuum, he
questions the fact that (as with Dedekind and Cantor's formulations)
the (irrational) numbers so produced are mere symbols, detached from
their origins in intuition. Unlike Cantor, Poincaré accepted the
infinitesimal, even if he did not regard all of the concept's
manifestations as useful.

The Dutch mathematician L. E. J. Brouwer (1881–1966) is best
known as the founder of the philosophy of (neo)*intuitionism*
(see Brouwer [1975]; van Dalen [1998]). Brouwer's highly idealist views
on mathematics bore some resemblance to Kant's. For Brouwer,
mathematical concepts are admissible only if they are adequately
grounded in intuition, mathematical theories are significant only if
they concern entities which are constructed out of something given
immediately in intuition, and mathematical demonstration is a form of
construction in intuition. While admitting that the emergence of
noneuclidean geometry had discredited Kant's view of space, Brouwer
held, in opposition to the logicists (whom he called
“formalists”) that arithmetic, and so all mathematics, must
derive from temporal intuition.

Initially Brouwer held without qualification that the continuum is
not constructible from discrete points, but was later to modify this
doctrine. In his mature thought, he radically transformed the concept
of point, endowing points with sufficient fluidity to enable them to
serve as generators of a “true” continuum. This fluidity
was achieved by admitting as “points”, not only fully
defined discrete numbers such as √2, π, *e*, and the
like—which have, so to speak, already achieved
“being”—but also “numbers” which are in a
perpetual state of becoming in that their the entries in their decimal
(or dyadic) expansions are the result of free acts of choice by a
subject operating throughout an indefinitely extended time. The
resulting *choice sequences* cannot be conceived as finished,
completed objects: at any moment only an initial segment is known. In
this way Brouwer obtained the mathematical continuum in a way
compatible with his belief in the primordial intuition of
time—that is, as an unfinished, indeed unfinishable entity in a
perpetual state of growth, a “medium of free development”.
In this conception, the mathematical continuum is indeed
“constructed”, not, however, by initially shattering, as
did Cantor and Dedekind, an intuitive continuum into isolated points,
but rather by assembling it from a complex of continually changing
overlapping parts.

The mathematical continuum as conceived by Brouwer displays a number
of features that seem bizarre to the classical eye. For example, in the
Brouwerian continuum the usual law of comparability, namely that for
any real numbers *a*, *b* either *a* <
*b* or *a* = *b* or *a* > *b*,
fails. Even more fundamental is the failure of the law of excluded
middle in the form that for any real numbers *a*, *b*,
either *a* = *b* or *a* ≠ *b*. The
failure of these seemingly unquestionable principles in turn vitiates
the proofs of a number of basic results of classical analysis, for
example the Bolzano-Weierstrass theorem, as well as the theorems of
monotone convergence, intermediate value, least upper bound, and
maximum value for continuous
functions^{[42]}.

While the Brouwerian continuum may possess a number of negative features from the standpoint of the classical mathematician, it has the merit of corresponding more closely to the continuum of intuition than does its classical counterpart. Far from being bizarre, the failure of the law of excluded middle for points in the intuitionistic continuum may be seen as fitting in well with the character of the intuitive continuum.

In 1924 Brouwer showed that every function defined on a closed
interval of his continuum is uniformly continuous. As a consequence the
intuitionistic continuum is *indecomposable,* that is, cannot be
split into two disjoint parts in any way whatsoever. In contrast with a
discrete entity, the indecomposable Brouwerian continuum cannot be
composed of its parts. Brouwer's vision of the continuum has in recent
years become the subject of intensive mathematical investigation.

Hermann Weyl (1885–1955), one of most versatile mathematicians
of the 20^{th} century, was preoccupied with the nature of the
continuum (see Bell [2000]). In his *Das Kontinuum* of 1918 he
attempts to provide the continuum with an exact mathematical
formulation free of the set-theoretic assumptions he had come to regard
as objectionable. As he saw it, there is an unbridgeable gap between
intuitively given continua (e.g., those of space, time and motion) on
the one hand, and the discrete exact concepts of mathematics (e.g.,
that of real number) on the other. For Weyl the presence of this split
meant that the construction of the mathematical continuum could not
simply be “read off” from intuition. Rather, he believed
that the mathematical continuum must be treated and, in the end,
justified in the same way as a physical theory. However much he may
have wished it, in *Das Kontinuum* Weyl did not aim to provide a
mathematical formulation of the continuum as it is presented to
intuition, which, as the quotations above show, he regarded as an
impossibility (at that time at least). Rather, his goal was first to
achieve *consistency* by putting the *arithmetical*
notion of real number on a firm logical basis, and then to show that
the resulting theory is *reasonable* by employing it as the
foundation for a plausible account of continuous process in the
objective physical world.

Later Weyl came to repudiate atomistic theories of the continuum, including that of his own Das Kontinuum. He accordingly welcomed Brouwer's construction of the continuum by means of sequences generated by free acts of choice, thus identifying it as a “medium of free Becoming” which “does not dissolve into a set of real numbers as finished entities”. Weyl felt that Brouwer, through his doctrine of intuitionism, had come closer than anyone else to bridging that “unbridgeable chasm” between the intuitive and mathematical continua. In particular, he found compelling the fact that the Brouwerian continuum is not the union of two disjoint nonempty parts—that it is indecomposable. “A genuine continuum,” Weyl says, “cannot be divided into separate fragments.” In later publications he expresses this more colourfully by quoting Anaxagoras to the effect that a continuum “defies the chopping off of its parts with a hatchet.”

## 7. Nonstandard Analysis

Once the continuum had been provided with a set-theoretic
foundation, the use of the infinitesimal in mathematical analysis was
largely abandoned. And so the situation remained for a number of years.
The first signs of a revival of the infinitesimal approach to analysis
surfaced in 1958 with a paper by A. H. Laugwitz and C.
Schmieden^{[43]}.
But the major breakthrough came in 1960
when it occurred to the mathematical logician Abraham Robinson
(1918–1974) that “the concepts and methods of contemporary
Mathematical Logic are capable of providing a suitable framework for
the development of the Differential and Integral Calculus by means of
infinitely small and infinitely large numbers.” (see Robinson
[1996], p. *xiii*) This insight led to the creation of
*nonstandard
analysis*,^{[44]}
which Robinson regarded as realizing
Leibniz's conception of infinitesimals and infinities as ideal numbers
possessing the same properties as ordinary real numbers.

After Robinson's initial insight, a number of ways of presenting nonstandard analysis were developed. Here is a sketch of one of them.

Starting with the classical real line
ℜ,
a set-theoretic
universe—the *standard universe—*is first
constructed over it: here by such a universe is meant a set *U*
containing
ℜ
which
is closed under the usual set-theoretic operations of union,
power set, Cartesian products and subsets. Now write
for the structure
(*U*, ∈), where ∈ is the usual membership relation on
*U*: associated with this is the extension
L(*U*) of
the first-order language of set theory to include a name
** u** for each element

*u*of

*U*. Now, using the well-known compactness theorem for first-order logic, is extended to a new structure * = (*

*U*, *∈), called a

*nonstandard universe*, satisfying the following key principle:

Saturation Principle. Let Φ be a collection of L(U)-formulas with exactly one free variable. If Φ isfinitely satisfiablein , that is, if for any finite subset Φ′ of Φ there is an element ofUwhich satisfies all the formulas of Φ′ in , then there is an element of *Uwhich satisfies all the formulas of Φ in *.

The saturation property expresses the intuitive idea that the
nonstandard universe is very rich in comparison to the standard one.
Indeed, while there may exist, for each finite subcollection
F
of a given collection of properties
P,
an element of *U* satisfying the members
of
F in
,
there may not necessarily be an element of *U* satisfying
*all* the members of
P.
The saturation of
*
guarantees the existence of an element of
**U* which satisfies, in
*,
all the members of
P.
For example, suppose the set
ℕ
of natural numbers is a member of *U*; for each *n*
∈
ℕ
let *P _{n}*(

*x*) be the property

*x*∈ ℕ &

*n*<

*x*. Then clearly, while each finite subcollection of the collection P = {

*P*:

_{n}*n*∈ ℕ} is satisfiable in , the whole collection is not. An element of *

*U*satisfying P in * will then be an “natural number” greater than every member of ℕ, that is, an

*infinite*number.

From the saturation property it follows that * satisfies the important

Transfer Principle. If σ is any sentence of L(U), then σ holds in if and only if it holds in *.

The transfer principle may be seen as a version of Leibniz's continuity principle: it asserts that all first-order properties are preserved in the passage to or “transfer” from the standard to the nonstandard universe.

The members of *U* are called *standard sets*, or
*standard objects*; those in **U* − *U*
*nonstandard sets* or *nonstandard objects*: **U*
thus consists of both standard and nonstandard objects. The members of
**U* will also be referred to as *-*sets* or
*-*objects* Since *U* ⊆ **U*, under this
convention every set (object) is also a *-set (object) The
*-*members* of a *-set *A* are the *-objects *x*
for which *x* *∈ *A*.

If *A* is a standard set, we may consider the collection
*Â*—the
*inflate* of *A—*consisting of all the *-members of
*A*: this is not necessarily a set nor even a *-set. The
inflate
*Â* of a standard
set *A* may be regarded as the same set *A* viewed from a
nonstandard vantage point. While clearly *A* ⊆
*Â*,
*Â* may contain
“nonstandard” elements not in *A*. It can in fact be
shown that *infinite* standard sets always get
“inflated” in this way. Using the transfer principle, any
function *f* between standard sets automatically extends to a
function—also written *f*—between their
inflates.

If
=
(*A*, *R*,…) is a mathematical structure, we may
consider the structure
=
(*Â*,*Rˆ*).
From the transfer principle it follows that
and
have precisely
the same first-order properties.

Now suppose that the set
ℕ
of natural numbers is a member of *U*. Then so
is the set
ℜ
of
real numbers, since each real number may be identified with a set of
natural numbers.
ℜ
may be regarded as an ordered field, and the same is
therefore true of its inflate
ℜˆ,
since the latter has precisely the same
first-order properties as
ℜ.
ℜˆ
is called the *hyperreal line*, and its
members *hyperreals*. A standard hyperreal is then just a real,
to which we shall refer for emphasis as a *standard real*.
Since
ℜ is infinite,
nonstandard hyperreals must exist. The saturation principle implies
that there must be an *infinite* (nonstandard)
hyperreal,^{[45]}
that is, a hyperreal *a* such that
*a* > *n* for every *n* ∈
ℕ.
In that case its
reciprocal 1/*a* is infinitesimal in the sense of
exceeding 0 and yet being smaller than 1/*n*+1 for
every *n* ∈
ℕ.
In general, we call a hyperreal *a
infinitesimal* if its absolute value |*a*| is less than
1/*n*+1 for every *n* ∈
ℕ.
In that case the
set *I* of infinitesimals contains not just 0 but a substantial
number (in fact, infinitely many) other elements. Clearly *I* is
an additive subgroup of
ℜ,
that is, if *a*, *b* ∈
*I*, then *a* − *b* ∈ *I*.

The members of the inflate
ℕˆ
of
ℕ
are called *hypernatural numbers*. As for the
hyperreals, it can be shown that
ℕˆ
also contains nonstandard elements which must
exceed every member of
ℕ;
these are called *infinite* hypernatural
numbers.

For hyperreals *a*, *b* we define *a* ≈
*b* and say that *a* and *b* are
*infinitesimally close* if *a* − *b* ∈
*I*. This is an equivalence relation on the hyperreal line: for
each hyperreal *a* we write μ(*a*) for the equivalence
class of *a* under this relation and call it the *monad*
of *a*. The monad of a hyperreal *a* thus consists of all
the hyperreals that are infinitesimally close to *a*: it may be
thought of as a small cloud centred at *a*. Note also that
μ(0) = *I*.

A hyperreal *a* is *finite* if it is not infinite;
this means that |*a*| < *n* for some *n*
∈
ℕ . It is not
difficult to show that finiteness is equivalent to the condition of
*near-standardness*; here a hyperreal *a* is
*near-standard* if *a* ≈ *r* for some
standard real *r*.

Much of the usefulness of nonstandard analysis stems from the fact
that statements of classical analysis involving limits or the
(ε, δ) criterion admit succinct, intuitive translations
into statements involving infinitesimals or infinite numbers, in turn
enabling comparatively straightforward proofs to be given of classical
theorems. Here are some examples of such
translations:^{[46]}

- Let <
*s*> be a standard infinite sequence of real numbers and let_{n}*s*be a standard real number. Then*s*is the limit of <*s*> within ℜ, lim_{n}_{n→∞}*s*=_{n}*s*in the classical sense, if and only if*s*≈_{n}*s for all*infinite subscripts*n*. - A standard sequence <
*s*> converges if and only if_{n}*s*≈_{n}*s*for all infinite_{m}*n*and*m*. (Cauchy's criterion for convergence.)

Now suppose that *f* is a real-valued function defined on
some open interval (*a*, *b*). We have remarked above
that *f* automatically extends to a function—also written
*f—*on

- In order that the standard real number
*c*be the limit of*f*(*x*) as*x*approaches*x*_{0}, lim_{x→x0}*f*(*x*) =*c*, with*x*_{0}a standard real number in (*a*,*b*), it is necessary and sufficient that*f*(*x*) ≈*f*(*x*_{0}) for all*x*≈*x*_{0}. - The function
*f*is continuous at a standard real number*x*_{0}in (*a*,*b*) if and only if*f*(*x*) ≈*f*(*x*_{0}) for all*x*≈*x*_{0}. (This is equivalent to saying that*f*maps the monad of*x*_{0}into the monad of*f*(*x*_{0}.) - In order that the standard number
*c*be the derivative of*f*at*x*_{0}it is necessary and sufficient that*f*(*x*) −*f*(*x*_{0})*x*−*x*_{0}≈ *c**for all x*≠*x*._{0}in the monad of x_{0}

Many other branches of mathematics admit neat and fruitful nonstandard formulations.

## 8. The Constructive Real Line and the Intuitionistic Continuum

The original motivation for the development of constructive mathematics was to put the idea of mathematical existence on a constructive or computable basis. While there are a number of varieties of constructive mathematics (see Bridges and Richman [1987]), here we shall focus on Bishop's constructive analysis (see Bishop and Bridges [1985]; Bridges [1994], [1999]; and Bridges and Richman [1987]) and Brouwer's intuitionistic analysis (see Dummett [1977]).

In constructive mathematics a problem is counted as solved only if
an explicit solution can, in principle at least, be produced. Thus, for
example, “There is an *x* such that
*P*(*x*)” means that, in principle at least, we
can explicitly produce an *x* such that *P*(*x*).
This fact led to the questioning of certain principles of classical
logic, in particular, the law of excluded middle, and the creation of
a new logic, intuitionistic logic (see entry on
intuitionistic logic).
It also led to the introduction of a sharpened definition of real
numbers—the constructive real numbers. A constructive real
number is a sequence of rationals (*r _{n}*) =

*r*

_{1},

*r*

_{2}, … such that, for any

*k*, a number

*n*can be computed in such a way that |

*r*

_{n+p}−

*r*

_{n}| ≤ 1/

*k*. Each rational number a may be regarded as a real number by identifying it with the real number (α, α, …). The set

*R*of all constructive real numbers is the constructive real line.

Now of course, for any “given” real number there are a
variety of ways of giving explicit approximating sequences for it. Thus
it is necessary to define an equivalence relation, “equality on
the reals”. The correct definition here is:
*r* =_{ℜ} *s*
iff for any *k*, a number *n* can be found so that
|*r*_{n+p} −
*s*_{n+p}| ≤
1/*k*, for all *p*. To say that two
real numbers are equal is to say that they are equivalent in this
sense.

The real number line can be furnished with an axiomatic description.
We begin by assuming the existence of a set *R* with

- a binary relation > (
*greater than*) - a corresponding
*apartness relation*# defined by*x*#*y*⇔*x*>*y*or*y*>*x* - a unary operation
*x*−*x* - binary operations (
*x*,*y*)*x*+*y*(*addition*) and (*x*,*y*)*xy*(*multiplication*) - distinguished elements 0 (
*zero*) and 1 (*one*) with 0 ≠ 1 - a unary operation
*x**x*^{−1}on the set of elements ≠ 0.

The elements of *R* are called *real numbers*. A real
number *x* is *positive* if *x >* 0 and
*negative* if −*x* > 0. The relation ≥
(*greater than or equal to*) is defined by

x≥y⇔ ∀z(y > z⇒x > z).

The relations < and ≤ are defined in the usual way; *x*
is *nonnegative* if 0 ≤ *x*. Two real numbers are
*equal* if *x* ≥ *y* and *y* ≥
*x*, in which case we write *x* = *y*.

The sets *N* of natural numbers, *N ^{+}* of
positive integers,

*Z*of integers and

*Q*of rational numbers are identified with the usual subsets of

*R*; for instance

*N*is identified with the set of elements of

^{+}*R*of the form 1 + 1 + … + 1.

These relations and operations are subject to the following three
groups of axioms, which, taken together, form the system
**CA** of axioms for *constructive analysis*, or
the *constructive real numbers* (see Bridges [1999]).

**Field Axioms**

*x*+*y*=*y*+*x*- (
*x*+*y*) +*z*=*x*+ (*y*+*z*) - 0 +
*x*=*x* *x*+ (−*x*) = 0*xy*=*yx*- (
*xy*)*z*=*x*(*yz*) - 1
*x = x* *xx*^{−1}= 1 if*x*# 0*x*(*y*+*z*) =*xy + xz*

**Order Axioms**

- ¬(
*x*>*y*∧*y*>*x*) *x*>*y*⇒ ∀*z*(*x*>*z*∨*z*>*y*)- ¬(
*x*#*y*) ⇒*x*=*y* *x*>*y*⇒ ∀*z*(*x*+*z*>*y*+*z*)- (
*x*> 0 ∧*y*> 0) ⇒*xy*> 0.

The last two axioms introduce special properties of > and ≥.
In the second of these the notions *bounded above, bounded below,
and bounded* are defined as in classical mathematics, and the
*least upper bound*, if it exists, of a
nonempty^{[47]}
set *S* of real numbers is the unique real number *b*
such that

*b*is an upper bound for*S*, and- for each
*c*<*b*there exists*s*∈*S*with*s*>*c*.

**Special Properties of >.**

Archimedean axiom. For eachx∈Rsuch thatx≥ 0 there existsn∈Nsuch thatx<n.

The least upper bound principle. LetSbe a nonempty subset ofRthat is bounded above relative to the relation ≥, such that for all real numbersa,bwitha<b, eitherbis an upper bound forSor else there existss∈Swiths>a. ThenShas a least upper bound.

The following basic properties of > and ≥ can then be established.

- ¬(
*x*>*x*) *x*≥*x**x*>*y*∧*y*>*z*⇒*x*>*z*- ¬(
*x*>*y*∧*y*≥*x*) - (
*x*>*y*≥*z*) ⇒*x*>*z* - ¬(
*x*>*y*) ⇔*y*≥*x* *¬*¬(*x*≥*y*) ⇔ ¬¬(*y*>*x*)- (
*x*≥*y*≥*z*) ⇒*x*≥*z* - (
*x*≥*y*∧*y*≥*x*) ⇒*x*=*y* - ¬(
*x*>*y*∧*x*=*y*) *x*≥ 0 ⇔ ∀ε>0(*x*< ε)*x*+*y*> 0 ⇒ (*x*> 0 ∨*y*> 0)*x*> 0 ⇒ −*x*< 0- (
*x*>*y*∧*z*< 0) ⇒*yz*>*xz* *x*# 0 ⇒*x*^{2}> 0- 1 > 0
*x*^{2}> 0- 0 <
*x*< 1 ⇒*x*>*x*^{2} *x*^{2}> 0 ⇒*x*# 0*n*∈*N*^{+}⇒*n*^{−1}> 0- if
*x*> 0 and*y*≥ 0, then ∃*n*∈*Z*(*nx*>*y*) *x*> 0 ⇒*x*^{−1}> 0*xy*> 0 ⇒ (*x*≠ 0 ∨*y*≠ 0)- if
*a*<*b*, then ∃*r*∈*Q*(*a*<*r*<*b*)

The constructive real line *R* as introduced above is a model of
**CA.** Are there any other models, that is, models not
isomorphic to *R*. If classical logic is assumed,
**CA** is a categorical theory and so the answer is
no. But this is not the case within intuitionistic logic, for there it
is possible for the Dedekind and Cantor reals to fail to be
isomorphic, despite the fact that they are both models
of **CA**.

In constructive analysis, a real number is an infinite (convergent)
sequence of rational numbers generated by an effective rule, so that
the constructive real line is essentially just a restriction of its
classical counterpart. Brouwerian intuitionism takes a more liberal
view of the matter, resulting in a considerable enrichment of the
arithmetical continuum over the version offered by strict
constructivism. As conceived by intutionism, the arithmetical continuum
admits as real numbers not only infinite sequences determined in
advance by an effective rule for computing their terms, but also ones
in whose generation free selection plays a part. The latter are called
*(free) choice sequences*. Without loss of generality we may and
shall assume that the entries in choice sequences are natural
numbers.

While constructive analysis does not formally contradict classical
analysis, and may in fact be regarded as a subtheory of the latter, a
number of intuitionistically plausible principles have been proposed
for the theory of choice sequences which render intuitionistic analysis
divergent from its classical counterpart. One such principle is
*Brouwer's Continuity Principle*: given a relation
*Q*(α, *n*) between choice sequences α and
numbers *n*, if for each α a number *n* may be
determined for which *Q*(α, *n*) holds, then
*n* can already be determined on the basis of the knowledge of a
finite number of terms of
α.^{[48]}
From this one can
prove a weak version of the Continuity Theorem, namely, that every
function from *R* to *R* is
continuous. Another such principle is *Bar Induction*, a certain
form of induction for well-founded sets of finite
sequences^{[49]}.
Brouwer used Bar Induction and the Continuity Principle in proving his
Continuity Theorem that every real-valued function defined on a closed
interval is uniformly continuous, from which, as has already been
observed, it follows that the intuitionistic continuum is
indecomposable.

Brouwer gave the intuitionistic conception of mathematics an
explicitly subjective twist by introducing the *creative
subject*. The creative subject was conceived as a kind of idealized
mathematician for whom time is divided into discrete sequential stages,
during each of which he may test various propositions, attempt to
construct proofs, and so on. In particular, it can always be determined
whether or not at stage *n* the creative subject has a proof of
a particular mathematical proposition *p*. While the theory of
the creative subject remains controversial, its purely mathematical
consequences can be obtained by a simple postulate which is entirely
free of subjective and temporal elements.

The creative subject allows us to define, for a given proposition
*p*, a binary sequence <*a _{n}*> by

*a*= 1 if the creative subject has a proof of

_{n}*p*at stage

*n; a*= 0 otherwise. Now if the construction of these sequences is the only use made of the creative subject, then references to the latter may be avoided by postulating the principle known as

_{n}*Kripke's Scheme*

For each propositionpthere exists an increasing binary sequence <a> such that_{n}pholds if and only ifa= 1 for some_{n}n.

Taken together, these principles have been shown to have remarkable consequences for the indecomposability of subsets of the continuum. Not only is the intuitionistic continuum indecomposable (that is, cannot be partitioned into two nonempty disjoint parts), but, assuming the Continuity Principle and Kripke's Scheme, it remains indecomposable even if one pricks it with a pin. The intuitionistic continuum has, as it were, a syrupy nature, so that one cannot simply take away one point. If in addition Bar Induction is assumed, then, still more surprisingly, indecomposability is maintained even when all the rational points are removed from the continuum.

Finally, it has been shown that a natural notion of infinitesimal can be developed within intuitionistic mathematics (see Vesley [1981]), the idea being that an infinitesimal should be a “very small” real number in the sense of not being known to be distinguishable—that is, strictly greater than or less than—zero.

## 9. Smooth Infinitesimal Analysis

A major development in the refounding of the concept of
infinitesimal took place in the nineteen seventies with the emergence
of *synthetic differential geometry*, also known as *smooth
infinitesimal
analysis* (SIA)^{[50]}.
Based on the ideas of the American
mathematician F. W. Lawvere, and employing the methods of category
theory, smooth infinitesimal analysis provides an image of the world in
which the continuous is an autonomous notion, not explicable in terms
of the discrete. It provides a rigorous framework for mathematical
analysis in which every function between spaces is smooth (i.e.,
differentiable arbitrarily many times, and so in particular continuous)
and in which the use of limits in defining the basic notions of the
calculus is replaced by *nilpotent infinitesimals*, that is, of
quantities so small (but not actually zero) that some power—most
usefully, the square—vanishes. Since in SIA all functions are
continuous, it embodies in a striking way Leibniz's principle of
continuity *Natura non facit saltus*.

In what follows, we use bold **R** to distinguish the
real line in SIA from its counterparts in classical and constructive
analysis. In the usual development of the calculus, for any
differentiable function *f* on the real
line **R**, *y* =
*f*(*x*), it follows from Taylor's theorem that the
increment δ*y* = *f*(*x* +
δ*x*) − *f*(*x*) in
*y* attendant upon an increment δ*x* in *x*
is determined by an equation of the form

δy=f′(x)δx+A(δx)^{2}, (1)

where *f* ′(*x*) is the derivative of
*f*(*x*) and *A* is a quantity whose value depends
on both *x* and δ*x*. Now if it were possible to
take δ*x* so *small* (but not demonstrably
identical with 0) that (δ*x*)^{2} = 0 then (1)
would assume the simple form

f(x+ δx) −f(x) = δy=f′(x) δx. (2)

We shall call a quantity having the property that its square is zero
a *nilsquare infinitesimal* or simply a *microquantity*.
In SIA “enough” microquantities are present to ensure that
equation (2) holds *nontrivially* for *arbitrary*
functions *f:* **R** → **R**. (Of
course (2) holds trivially in standard mathematical analysis because
there 0 is the sole microquantity in this sense.) The meaning of the
term “nontrivial” here may be explicated in following way.
If we replace δ*x* by the letter ε standing for an
arbitrary microquantity, (2) assumes the form

f(x+ ε) −f(x) = εf′(x). (3)

Ideally, we want the validity of this equation to be independent of
ε , that is, given *x*, for it to hold for *all*
microquantities ε. In that case the derivative *f*
′(*x*) may be *defined* as the unique quantity
*D* such that the equation

f(x+ ε) −f(x) = εD

holds for all microquantities ε.

Setting *x* = 0 in this equation, we get in particular

f(ε) =f(0) + εD, (4)

for all ε. *It is equation* (4) *that is taken as
axiomatic in smooth infinitesimal analysis*. Let us write Δ
for the set of microquantities, that is,

Δ = {x:x∈R∧x^{2}= 0}.

Then it is postulated that, for any *f*: Δ →
**R**, there is a *unique D* ∈
**R** such that equation (4) holds for all ε. This
says that the graph of *f* is a straight line passing through
(0, *f*(0)) with slope Δ. Thus any function on Δ is
what mathematicians term *affine*, and so this postulate is
naturally termed the *principle* of *microaffineness*. It
means that Δ *cannot be bent or broken*: it is subject
only to *translations and rotations*—and yet is not (as it
would have to be in ordinary analysis) identical with a point. Δ
may be thought of as an entity possessing position and attitude, but
lacking true extension.

Now consider the space
Δ^{Δ} of maps
from Δ to itself. It follows from the
microaffineness principle that the subspace
(Δ^{Δ})_{0}
of
Δ^{Δ} consisting
of maps vanishing at 0 is isomorphic to
**R**^{[51]}.
The space Δ^{Δ} is a
monoid^{[52]}
under composition which may be regarded as
acting on Δ by evaluation: for *f* ∈
Δ^{Δ},
*f* · ε = *f* (ε). Its subspace
(Δ^{Δ})_{0}
is a submonoid naturally identified as the space of
*ratios of microquantities*. The isomorphism between
(Δ^{Δ})_{0}
and **R** noted above is easily seen to be
an isomorphism of monoids (where **R** is considered a
monoid under its usual multiplication). It follows that
**R** itself may be regarded as the space of ratios of
microquantities. This was essentially the view of Euler, who regarded
(real) numbers as representing the possible results of calculating the
ratio 0/0. For this reason Lawvere has suggested that
**R** be called the space of *Euler reals*.

If we think of a function *y* = *f*(*x*) as
defining a curve, then, for any *a*, the image under *f*
of the “microinterval” Δ + *a* obtained by
translating Δ to *a* is straight and coincides with the
tangent to the curve at *x* = *a*. In this sense each
curve is “infinitesimally straight”.

From the principle of microaffineness we deduce the important
*principle of microcancellation*, viz.

Ifεa= εb for allε,thena=b.

For the premise asserts that the graph of the function *g*:
Δ *→* **R** defined by
*g*(ε) = *aε* has both slope *a*
and slope *b*: the uniqueness condition in the principle of
microaffineness then gives *a* = *b*. The principle of
microcancellation supplies the exact sense in which there are
“enough” infinitesimals in smooth infinitesimal
analysis.

From the principle of microaffineness it also follows that *all
functions on* **R** *are continuous*, that is,
*send neighbouring points to neighbouring points*. Here two
points *x*, *y* on **R** are said to be
neighbours if *x* − *y* is in Δ, that is, if
*x* and *y* differ by a microquantity. To see this, given
*f* : **R** *→* **R** and
neighbouring points *x*, *y*, note that *y* =
*x* + ε with ε in Δ, so that

f(y) −f(x) =f(x+ ε) −f(x) = εf′(x).

But clearly any multiple of a microquantity is also a microquantity,
so ε*f* ′(*x*) is a microquantity, and the
result follows.

In fact, since equation (3) holds for any *f*, it also holds
for its derivative *f* ′; it follows that functions in
smooth infinitesimal analysis are differentiable arbitrarily many
times, thereby justifying the use of the term “smooth”.

Let us derive a basic law of the differential calculus, the
*product rule:*

(fg)′ =f′g+fg′.

To do this we compute

(fg)(x+ ε) = (fg)(x) + ε(fg)′(x) =f(x)g(x) + ε(fg)′(x),(

fg)(x+ ε) =f(x+ ε)g(x+ ε) = [f(x) +f′(x)]·[g(x) +g′(x)]=

f(x)g(x)+ε(f′g+fg′) + ε^{2}f′g′

= f(x)g(x)+ε(f′g+fg′),

since ε^{2} = 0. Therefore
ε(*fg*)′ =
ε(*f* ′*g* +
*fg*′), and the result follows by
microcancellation.

A *stationary point a* in **R** of a function
*f* : **R** *→***R** is defined to be one in whose vicinity
“infinitesimal variations” fail to change the value of
*f*, that is, such that *f*(*a +* ε) =
*f*(*a*) for all ε. This means that
*f*(*a*) *+* ε*f*
′(*a*)*= f*(*a*), so that
ε*f* ′(*a*) = 0 for all ε, whence
it follows from microcancellation that *f* ′(*a*)
*= 0*. This is *Fermat's rule*.

An important postulate concerning stationary points that we adopt in smooth infinitesimal analysis is the

Constancy Principle. If every point in an intervalJis a stationary point off:J→R(that is, iff′ is identically 0), thenfis constant.

Put succinctly, “universal local constancy implies global constancy”. It follows from this that two functions with identical derivatives differ by at most a constant.

In ordinary analysis the continuum **R** is connected
in the sense that it cannot be split into two non empty subsets neither
of which contains a limit point of the other. In smooth infinitesimal
analysis it has the vastly stronger property of
*indecomposability*: it cannot be split *in any way
whatsoever* into two disjoint nonempty subsets. For suppose
**R** = *U* ∪ *V* with *U* ∩
*V* = ∅. Define *f* : **R**
*→* {0, 1} by *f*(*x*) = 1 if
*x* ∈ *U*, *f*(*x*) = 0 if *x*
∈ *V*. We claim that *f* is constant. For we
have

(f(x) = 0 orf(x) = 1) & (f(x+ ε) = 0 orf(x+ ε) = 1).

This gives 4 possibilities:

(i)f(x) = 0 &f(x+ ε) = 0(ii)

f(x) = 0 &f(x+ ε) = 1(iii)

f(x) = 1 &f(x+ ε) = 0(iv)

f(x) = 1 &f(x+ ε) = 1

Possibilities (ii) and (iii) may be ruled out because *f* is
continuous. This leaves (i) and (iv), in either of which
*f*(*x*) = *f*(*x* + ε). So
*f* is locally, and hence globally, constant, that is,
constantly 1 or 0. In the first case *V* = ∅ , and in the
second *U* = ∅.

We observe that the postulates of smooth infinitesimal analysis are
*incompatible with the law of excluded middle of classical
logic*. This incompatibility can be demonstrated in two ways, one
informal and the other rigorous. First the informal argument. Consider
the function *f* defined for real numbers *x* by
*f*(*x*) = 1 if *x* = 0 and *f*(*x*)
= 0 whenever *x* ≠ 0. If the law of excluded middle held,
each real number would then be either equal or unequal to 0, so that
the function *f* would be defined on the whole of
**R**. But, considered as a function with domain
**R**, *f* is clearly discontinuous.
Since, as we know, in smooth infinitesimal analysis every function on
**R** is continuous, *f* cannot have domain
**R**
there^{[53]}.
So the law of excluded middle fails in
smooth infinitesimal analysis. To put it succinctly, *universal
continuity implies the failure of the law of excluded middle*.

Here now is the rigorous argument. We show that the failure of the
law of excluded middle can be derived from the principle of
infinitesimal cancellation. To begin with, if *x* ≠ 0, then
*x*^{2} ≠ 0, so that, if *x*^{2} = 0,
then necessarily not *x* ≠ 0. This means that

for all infinitesimalε,notε ≠ 0. (*)

Now suppose that the law of excluded middle were to hold. Then we would have, for any ε, either ε = 0 or ε ≠ 0. But (*) allows us to eliminate the second alternative, and we infer that, for all ε, ε = 0. This may be written

for allε, ε·1 = ε·0,

from which we derive by microcancellation the falsehood 1 = 0. So again the law of excluded middle must fail.

The “internal” logic of smooth infinitesimal analysis is
accordingly not full classical logic. It is, instead,
*intuitionistic* logic, that is, the logic derived from the
constructive interpretation of mathematical assertions. In our brief
sketch we did not notice this “change of logic” because,
like much of elementary mathematics, the topics we discussed are
naturally treated by constructive means such as direct computation.

What are the *algebraic* and *order structures* on
**R** in SIA? As far as the former is concerned, there is
little difference from the classical situation: in SIA
**R** is equipped with the usual addition and
multiplication operations under which it is a field. In particular,
**R** satisfies the condition that each *x* ≠ 0
has a multiplicative inverse. Notice, however, that since in SIA no
microquantity (apart from 0 itself) is provably ≠ 0, microquantities
are not required to have multiplicative inverses (a requirement which
would lead to inconsistency). From a strictly algebraic standpoint,
**R** in SIA differs from its classical counterpart only
in being required to satisfy the principle of infinitesimal
cancellation.

The situation is different, however, as regards the order structure
of **R** in SIA. Because of the failure of the law of
excluded middle, the order relation < on **R** in SIA
cannot satisfy the trichotomy law

x<y∨y<x∨x = y,

and accordingly < must be a *partial*, rather than a
*total* ordering. Since microquantities do not have
multiplicative inverses, and **R** is a field, any
microquantity ε must satisfy

¬ε < 0 ∧ ¬ε > 0.

Accordingly, if we define the relation < by *x* <
*y* iff ¬(*y* < *x*), then, for any
microquantity ε we have

ε ≤ 0 ∧ ε ≥ 0.

Using these ideas we can identify three *infinitesimal
neighbourhoods* of 0 on **R** in SIA, each of which is
included in its successor. First, the set Δ of microquantities
itself, next, the set *I* = {*x* ∈
**R** : ¬*x* ≠ 0} of elements
indistinguishable from 0; finally, the set *J* = {*x*
∈ **R** : *x* ≤ 0
∧
*x* ≥ 0}
of elements neither less nor greater than 0. These three may be thought
of as the infinitesimal neighbourhoods of 0 defined *algebraically,
logically, and order-theoretically*, respectively.

In certain models of SIA the system of *natural numbers*
possesses some subtle and intriguing features which make it possible to
introduce another type of infinitesimal—the so-called
*invertible* infinitesimals—resembling those of
nonstandard analysis, whose presence engenders yet another
infinitesimal neighbourhood of 0 properly containing all those
introduced above.

In SIA the set **N** of natural numbers can be defined
to be the smallest subset of **R** which contains 0 and is
closed under the operation of adding 1. In some models of SIA,
**R** satisfies the *Archimedean principle* that
every real number is majorized by a natural number. However, models of
SIA have been constructed (see Moerdijk and Reyes [1991]) in which
**R** is not Archimedean in this sense. In these models it
is more natural to consider, in place of **N**, the set
**N*** of *smooth natural numbers* defined by

N*= {x∈R: 0 ≤x∧ sin πx= 0}.

**N*** is the set of points of intersection of the
smooth curve *y* = *sin* π*x* with the positive
*x*-axis. In these models **R** can be shown to
possess the Archimedean property *provided that in the
definition* **N** *is replaced by*
**N***. In these models, then, **N** is a
proper subset of **N***: the members of
**N*** − **N** may be considered
*nonstandard integers*. Multiplicative inverses of nonstandard
integers are infinitesimals, but, being themselves invertible, they are
of a different type from the ones we have considered so far. It is
quite easy to show that they, as well as the infinitesimals in
*J* (and so also those in Δ and *I*) are all
contained in the set—a further infinitesimal neighbourhood of
0—

K= {x∈R:∀n∈N(−1/n+1 <x< 1/n+1)}

of *infinitely small* elements of
** R.** The members of the set

In= {x∈K:x≠ 0}

of invertible elements of *K* are naturally identified as
*invertible* infinitesimals. Being obtained as inverses of
“infinitely large” reals (i.e., reals *r* satisfying
∀*n*∈**N**(*n* < *r*)
∨
∀*n*∈**N**(*r < −n*))
the members of
*In* are the counterparts in SIA of the infinitesimals of
nonstandard analysis.

Finally, a brief word on the *models* of SIA. These are the
so-called smooth toposes, categories (see entry on
category theory)
of a certain kind in
which all the usual mathematical operations can be performed but whose
internal logic is intuitionistic and in which every map between spaces
is smooth, that is, differentiable without limit. It is this
“universal smoothness” that makes the presence of
infinitesimal objects such as Δ possible. The
construction of smooth toposes (see Moerdijk and Reyes [1991])
guarantees the consistency of SIA with intuitionistic logic. This is so
despite the evident fact that SIA is not consistent with classical
logic.

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- Lawvere, F.W. (1998). “Outline of synthetic differential geometry”, unpublished manuscript.

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### Acknowledgments

For a comprehensive account of the evolution of the concepts of continuity and the infinitesimal, see Bell (2005), on which the present article is based.