Notes to Definitions

1. Thanks to an anonymous editor for drawing my attention to Frege’s essay.

2. Note that experience can have the effect of restricting not only the domain of quantification but also the interpretations of non-logical constants.

3. Whitehead and Russell observe that a definition of, e.g., cardinal number, “contains an analysis of a common idea, and may therefore express a notable advance (1925, 12).” A little later they add, “it will be found, in what follows, that the definitions are what is most important, and what deserves the reader’s prolonged attention.”

4. See, however, the discussion of implicit definitions below.

5. Dudman notes that an application of both criteria can be found already in Frege’s Begriffschrift (1879). Hodges points out that the Eliminability criterion can be traced to Pascal’s treatment of definitions in the 17th century and even to Porphyry’s writings dating from the third century. Thanks to Ed Zalta for drawing my attention to Dudman’s and Hodges’s essays. A previous version of this entry misreported Urbaniak’s views on this topic. Thanks to Urbaniak and Hämäri 2012 for the correction.

6. Recall that we have put no restrictions on \(\mathcal{D}\) other than those stated at the outset: that its definiendum and definiens are of the same logical category and that the former contains the defined term. The proof of the claim relies on the Replacement Theorem for equivalent formulas.

7. Notice that in a definition in normal form, the defined term is the only non-logical constant in the definiendum. Hence, in such a definition, the defined term need not be specified separately.

8. This requirement is the stumbling point when the Ontological Proof is formalized in classical logic. The definition of “God” as “that than which nothing greater can be thought” does imply the existence of God. But the definition is legitimate only if there is one, and only one, being such that nothing greater can be thought than it. The definition cannot serve, therefore, as the ground for a proof of the existence of God. (If the Ontological Proof is formalized in a logic that admits vacuous singular terms, then the definition may well be legitimate, but it will not imply the existence of God.)

9. The traditional account allows contextual definitions—that is, definitions that provide a method of reducing sentences containing the defined terms to sentences of the ground language. (Such a definition can be viewed as consisting of an infinity of instances of form (2), each sentence containing the defined term serving as the definiendum of one instance.) However, the traditional account implies that a contextual definition adds no new power, for its effect can be gained by a definition in normal form.

It is instructive to reflect here on Russell’s theory of definite descriptions. (For an account of this theory, see the entry on descriptions.) Suppose a definite description ‘the \(F\)’ is introduced into a classical first-order language in the manner prescribed by Russell’s theory. The Conservativeness and Eliminability criteria are, it appears, satisfied. Yet an equivalent definition in normal form may well not exist. Why this incongruity?

The answer is that a definite description, under Russell’s theory, is not a genuine singular term; it is not even a meaningful unit. When ‘the \(F\)’ is added to the ground language in the manner of Russell, the resulting language merely looks like a familiar first-order language. In actuality its logic is quite different. For instance, one cannot existentially generalize on the occurrences of ‘the \(F\)’. The logical form and character of the formulas of the expanded language is revealed by their Russellian analyses, and these contain no constituent corresponding to ‘the \(F\)’. (There is also the further fact that, under the Russellian analysis, formulas containing ‘the \(F\)’ are potentially ambiguous. The earlier observation holds, however, even if the ambiguity is somehow legislated away—for instance, by prescribing rules for the scope of the definite description.)

Russell’s theory is best thought of as providing a contextual elimination of the definite description, not a contextual definition of it.

10. Not all recursive definitions formulable in the language of Peano Arithmetic have normal forms. For instance, a recursive definition can be given in this language for truth—more precisely, for “Gödel number of a true sentence of the language of Peano Arithmetic”—but the definition cannot be put in normal form. Recursive definitions in first-order arithmetic enable one to define \(\Pi^{1}_{1}\) sets of natural numbers, whereas normal forms exist only for those that define arithmetical sets. For a study of recursive definability in first-order languages, see Moschovakis 1974.

11. Note that we can regard a recursive definition such as (15) as an implicit definition by a theory that consists of the universal closures of the equations.

12. It is sometimes said that logical constants are implicitly defined by the logical laws, or by the logical rules, governing them. More specifically, it has been claimed that the “introduction and elimination” rules for a logical connective are implicit definitions of the connective. (The idea has its roots in the work of Gerhard Gentzen.) For example, the sentential connective ‘and’, it is claimed, is defined by following rules:

‘And’-Introduction: From \(\phi\) and \(\psi\), one may infer ‘\(\phi\) and \(\psi\)’;

‘And’-Elimination: From ‘\(\phi\) and \(\psi\)’, one may infer \(\phi\) and one may also infer \(\psi\).

These ideas invoke a notion of implicit definition that is quite different from the one under consideration here. Under the latter notion, non-logical constants are implicitly defined by a theory, and the interpretation of logical constants is held fixed. The interpretation of the logical constants provides the scaffolding, so to speak, for making sense of implicit definitions. Under the former notion, the scaffolding is plainly different. For further discussion, see the entry on logical constants and the works cited there.

13. If the aim is to explain the rationality of accepting a theory on the basis of actual observations, then almost the entire theory would need to be taken as implicitly defining theoretical terms. Now both criteria would be a violated.

If the aim is to sustain the idea that the factual component of a theory is identical to its empirical content, then one can take what has come to be known as the “Carnap sentence” for the theory as implicitly defining the theoretical terms. Now there is a violation only of the Eliminability criterion. For further discussion and for an explanation of the notion of “Carnap sentence,” see Demopoulos 2003.

14. And also for systems of interdependent definitions. From now on, the expression ‘circular definition’ will be understood broadly to include these systems as well.

15. More precisely, finiteness is defined as follows. Let ground models be interpretations of the ground language. And call a hypothesis \(V\) reflexive iff, for some number \(n \gt 0, n\) applications of the revision rule to \(V\) yields \(V\) again. A definition \(\mathcal{D}\) is finite iff, for all ground models \(M\), there is a natural number \(m\) such that for all hypotheses \(V\), the result of \(m\) application to \(V\) of the revision rule for \(\mathcal{D}\) in \(M\) is reflexive.

16. The key features of \(\mathbf{C}_{0}\) are that (i) integer indices are assigned to each step in a derivation to distinguish revision stages, and (ii) the rules for definitions, namely, Definiendum Introduction and Definiendum Elimination, are weakened. If an instance of the definiens is available as a premiss and its index is \(j\) then the corresponding instance of the definiendum may be inferred but must be assigned the index \(j + 1\). And, conversely, if an instance of the definiendum with an index \(j + 1\) is available, then the corresponding instance of the definiens may be inferred but must be assigned the index \(j\). For a full account of \(\mathbf{C}_{0}\), see Gupta and Belnap 1993. For more information about finite definitions, see Martinez 2001 and Gupta 2006.

17. Since revision sequences are typically non-monotonic, the extension is not straightforward. The limit stages in a transfinite revision sequence can be treated in a variety of ways. This topic has been studied by Anil Gupta, Hans Herzberger, Nuel Belnap, Aladdin Yaqūb, André Chapuis, and Philip Welch. See the entry on the revision theory of truth for references.

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Anil Gupta <>

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