Descartes' Ethics

First published Wed Aug 6, 2003; substantive revision Mon Feb 4, 2013

Descartes is not well known for his contributions to ethics. Some have charged that it is a weakness of his philosophy that it focuses exclusively on metaphysics and epistemology to the exclusion of moral and political philosophy. Such criticisms rest on a misunderstanding of the broader framework of Descartes' philosophy. Evidence of Descartes' concern for the practical import of philosophy can be traced to his earliest writings. In agreement with the ancients, he identifies the goal of philosophy with the attainment of a wisdom that is sufficient for happiness. The details of this position are developed most fully in writings from the latter part of Descartes' career: his correspondence with Princess Elisabeth, The Passions of the Soul, and the preface to the French translation of the Principles of Philosophy, where he presents his famous image of the tree of philosophy, whose uppermost branch is “the highest and most perfect moral system, which presupposes a complete knowledge of the other sciences and is the ultimate level of wisdom.”


1. The Place of Ethics in Descartes' Philosophy

Descartes did not write extensively on ethics, and this has led some to assume that the topic lacks a place within his philosophy. This assumption has been bolstered by the tendency, prevalent until recently, to base an understanding of Descartes' philosophy primarily on his two most famous books, Discourse on the Method and Meditations on First Philosophy. Although both works offer insight into Descartes' ethics, neither presents his position in detail.

Descartes' writings reveal a consistent conception of philosophy's goal. In the first rule of the unfinished Rules for the Direction of the Mind, he states: “The aim of our studies should be to direct the mind with a view to forming true and sound judgements about whatever comes before it” (AT X 359/CSM I 9). The principal goal of philosophy is to cultivate one's capacity for sound judgment, which Descartes identifies with “good sense” (le bons sens) and “universal wisdom.” This goal should be pursued for its own sake, since other ends may distract us from the course of inquiry. Nevertheless, Descartes insists upon the practical benefits of the wisdom thereby achieved: one should consider “how to increase the natural light of his reason… in order that his intellect should show his will what decision it ought to make in each of life's contingencies” (AT X 361/CSM I 10). In this way, we can expect to realize the “legitimate fruits” of the sciences: “the comforts of life” and “the pleasure to be gained from contemplating the truth, which is practically the only happiness in this life that is complete and untroubled by pain” (ibid.).

The last point previews the principal concern of Descartes' ethics. In agreement with the ancients, he takes philosophy's practical goal to be the realization of a happy life: one in which we enjoy the best existence that a human being can hope to achieve. Descartes characterizes this life in terms of a type of mental contentment, or tranquility, that is experienced by the person with a well-ordered mind. Here the influence of Stoic and Epicurean writers is evident. In keeping with a central theme of Hellenistic ethics, Descartes likens philosophy to a form of therapy that can treat the mind's illnesses (those that stand in the way of its happiness), just as medicine treats the illnesses of the body. As he writes in one of his earliest recorded remarks, “I use the term ‘vice’ to refer to the diseases of the mind, which are not so easy to recognize as diseases of the body. This is because we have frequently experienced sound bodily health, but have never known true health of the mind” (AT X 215/CSM I 3). Philosophy is thus charged with leading us to “true health of the mind,” which it does through the cultivation of “true and sound judgment.” It is significant that Descartes—again in agreement with the ancients—focuses his efforts on the happiness that can be realized within the natural life of a human being. He is careful to note that it is a dogma of faith that “the supreme happiness,” consisting “solely in the contemplation of the divine majesty” and attainable only through divine grace, is reserved for the “next life” (AT VII 52/CSM II 36). However, in contrast to the position defended by Aquinas and Roman Catholic theology, the consideration of this “supernatural bliss” (béatitude surnaturelle) plays no role in Descartes' system. On the contrary, he emphasizes that genuine happiness is attainable within this life, in spite of the trials we face. “One of the main points of my own ethical code,” he tells Mersenne, “is to love life without fearing death” (AT II 480–1/CSMK 131). The key to developing this affirmative attitude toward life is the cultivation of reason: “True philosophy… teaches that even amidst the saddest disasters and most bitter pains we can always be content, provided that we know how to use our reason” (AT IV 314/CSMK 272).

Descartes' estimation of the importance of ethics is expressed most clearly in the programmatic statement that prefaces the French translation of the Principles of Philosophy (1647). Here he presents his conception of philosophy in strikingly traditional terms: “the word 'philosophy' means the study of wisdom, and by 'wisdom' is meant not only prudence in our everyday affairs but also a perfect knowledge of all things that mankind is capable of knowing, both for the conduct of life and for the preservation of health and the discovery of all manner of skills” (AT IXB 2/CSM I 179). The key to the attainment of this wisdom, Descartes argues, is the recognition of the essential order among the different parts of our knowledge, an order he depicts in his image of the “tree of philosophy”: “The roots are metaphysics, the trunk is physics, and the branches emerging from the trunk are all the other sciences, which may be reduced to three principal ones, namely medicine, mechanics and morals” (AT IXB 14/CSM I 186). Within this scheme, metaphysics is foundational, but this knowledge and the knowledge of physics that is built upon it are sought for the sake of the practical benefits that follow from the sciences of medicine, mechanics and morals: “just as it is not the roots or the trunk of a tree from which one gathers the fruit, but only the ends of the branches, so the principal benefit of philosophy depends on those parts of it which can only be learned last of all” (AT IXB 15/CSM I 186). Foremost among these sciences is la morale: “the highest and most perfect moral system, which presupposes a complete knowledge of the other sciences and is the ultimate level of wisdom” (ibid.). It is for the sake of this science above all that Descartes hopes his readers will “realize how important it is to continue the search for these truths, and to what a high degree of wisdom, and to what perfection and felicity of life, these truths can bring us” (AT IXB 20/CSM I 190).

While it is clear that Descartes accords a privileged place to the science he calls la morale, the fact remains that he left no systematic presentation of his ethical views. He offers several explanations for why he has not devoted more attention to ethics. Given his conception of the order of knowledge, conclusion about ethics must be established in a way that reveals their dependence on the prior conclusions of metaphysics and physics. Thus, the systematic investigation of ethics can begin only after certainty has been achieved in these prior theoretical disciplines. In a late letter to Chanut, Descartes cites two further reasons for his silence on the topic: “It is true that normally I refuse to write down my thoughts concerning morality. I have two reasons for this. One is that there is no other subject in which malicious people can so readily find pretexts for vilifying me; and the other is that I believe only sovereigns, or those authorized by them, have the right to concern themselves with regulating the morals of other people” (AT V 86–7/CSMK 326). The first of these reasons reflects Descartes' inherent caution, reinforced by the hostile reception his philosophy had received at the University of Utrecht. The second points to an important limitation in Descartes' conception of ethics: he does not enunciate a specific set of duties, because these, he believes, are the purview of the sovereign. This again may make it seem that Descartes rejects a substantial role for philosophy in ethics, offering in its place a Hobbesian account of the authority of moral dictates grounded in a sovereign will. There is an element of truth in this suggestion, but uncovering it requires drawing a crucial distinction: if Descartes limits the role of philosophy in determining specific moral rules, he nonetheless upholds the ancients' conception of philosophy as the search for a wisdom sufficient for happiness. It is in this sense that ethics remains central to Descartes' philosophy.

2. The Provisional Moral Code of the Discourse

The best-known expression of Descartes' ethical views is the “provisional moral code” (une morale par provision) that appears in Part Three of Discourse on the Method. Some have read this as a definitive statement of Descartes' position, but this is consistent neither with the Discourse itself nor with Descartes' later writings. Descartes frames the rules of his provisional moral code as part of the epistemological project—the search for certainty—announced in Part Two of the Discourse. In order that he may act decisively and live as happily as possible while avoiding “precipitate conclusions and assumptions,” Descartes proposes “a provisional moral code consisting of just three or four maxims”:

The first was to obey the laws and customs of my country, holding constantly to the religion in which by God's grace I had been instructed from my childhood…. The second maxim was to be as firm and decisive in my actions as I could, and to follow even the most doubtful opinions, once I had adopted them, with no less constancy than if they had been quite certain…. My third maxim was to try always to master myself rather than fortune, and to change my desires rather than the order of the world…. Finally, to conclude this moral code… I thought I could do no better than to continue with the [occupation] I was engaged in, and to devote my whole life to cultivating my reason and advancing as far as I could in the knowledge of the truth, following the method I had prescribed for myself (AT VI 22–7/CSM I 122–4).

Descartes' apparent uncertainty about the number of rules in his provisional code (“three or four”) is noteworthy and may be explained by the different status he assigns to the rules. While the first three prescribe how to act in the absence of any certain knowledge of good and evil (including the much-criticized deference to the laws and customs of his country), the fourth rule holds out the possibility of cultivating his reason so as to arrive at knowledge of the truth. Echoing his remarks in the Rules, he says that in the discovery of such truths he has experienced “such extreme contentment that I did not think one could enjoy any sweeter or purer one in this life” (AT VI 27/CSM I 124). This might be read as limiting our happiness to the contemplation of intellectual truths of the sort announced in Part Four of the Discourse; however, Descartes makes it clear that he sees the search for truth as having a practical import as well. By following the method he has prescribed for himself and exercising his capacity for judgment, he is confident of eventually acquiring all the true knowledge of which he is capable, and “in this way all the true goods within my reach” (AT VI 28/CSM I 125).

It is evident, then, that the first three maxims of the “provisional moral code” are just that—provisional rules that Descartes will follow while he carries out his search for certain knowledge—and that he is confident that this search will terminate in knowledge of “true goods” that will supply reliable directives for action. Descartes hints at the range of these goods in Part Five of the Discourse. They will include the maintenance of health, “which is undoubtedly the first good [le premier bien] and the foundation of all the other goods in this life.” Because “the mind depends so much on the temperament and disposition of the bodily organs,” Descartes adds, we must look to medicine if we are “to find some means of making men in general wiser and more skilful than they have been up till now” (AT VI 62/CSM I 143). The extent of Descartes' commitment to the integration of physical and psychological health will become apparent in the Passions of the Soul. It would be a mistake, however, to conclude from this that he proposes a reduction of ethics to medicine. As presented already in the Discourse, his ethics is founded on an ideal of virtue as a perfected power of choice, together with the assumption that virtue by itself is sufficient for happiness:

[S]ince our will tends to pursue or avoid only what our intellect represents as good or bad, we need only to judge well in order to act well, and to judge as well as we can in order to do our best—that is to say, in order to acquire all the virtues and in general all the other goods we can acquire. And when we are certain of this, we cannot fail to be happy. (AT VI 28/CSM I 125)

Expressed in this passage are the core ideas of Descartes' ethics: the notion of virtue, as a disposition of the will to choose in accordance with reason's judgments about the good, and the notion of happiness, as a state of mental well-being that is achieved through the practice of virtue. In his correspondence with Princess Elisabeth, Descartes will elaborate on the relationship between these two ideas. Here is it worth noting that while it is virtue that links ethics to the broader goal of the cultivation of reason, Descartes gives no less weight to the importance of happiness, in the form of tranquility. This is made clear near the end of the Discourse, when he explains why, in spite of his reservations, he has published the book under his own name: “I am not excessively fond of glory—indeed if I dare to say so, I dislike it in so far as I regard it as opposed to that tranquility which I value above everything else…. [I]f I had done this [sc. concealed his identity] I thought I would do myself an injustice, and moreover that would have given me a certain sort of disquiet, which again would have been opposed to the perfect peace of mind I am seeking” (AT VI 74/CSM I 149).

3. The Meditations and the Ethics of Belief

The Meditations is distinguished from Descartes' other works in explicitly foreswearing practical concerns. The conceit of the Meditations is a thinker who has abstracted himself from any connection to the external world. For this reason, Descartes feels confident in pursuing the method of hyperbolic doubt, which rejects as false any opinion concerning which the slightest doubt can be raised: “I know that no danger or error will result from my plan, and that I cannot possibly go too far in my distrustful attitude. This is because the task now in hand does not involve action but merely the acquisition of knowledge” (AT VII 22/CSM II 15).

On these grounds, one might feel justified in setting aside the Meditations in an examination of Descartes' ethics. In fact, however, the Meditations pursues, in a theoretical context, an inquiry that is closely related to ethics: the proper disposition of the will. Descartes takes the operation of the will to be integral to both action and judgment. In general, the will, or “freedom of choice,” consists “in our ability to do or not do something (that is, to affirm or deny, to pursue or avoid); or rather, it consists simply in the fact that when the intellect puts something forward for affirmation or denial or for pursuit or avoidance, our inclinations are such that we do not feel we are determined by any external force” (AT VII 57/CSM II 40). For Descartes, freedom is an essential property of the will; however, this freedom does not entail indifference: “if I always saw clearly what was true and good, I should never have to deliberate about the right judgement or choice; in that case, although I should be wholly free, it would be impossible for me ever to be in a state of indifference” (AT VII 58/CSM II 40). We are indifferent only when our perception of the true, or of the good, is less than clear and distinct.

Descartes assigns the will a pivotal role in the pursuit of knowledge. When presented with a clear and distinct perception of what is true, the will is compelled to assent to it. When the perception is less than fully clear and distinct, the will is not compelled in the same way. In such cases, it has the power either to assent or to withhold assent. Given this, the correct use of free will is identified as the critical factor in the attainment of knowledge: “If… I simply refrain from making a judgment in cases where I do not perceive the truth with sufficient clarity and distinctness, then it is clear that I am behaving correctly and avoiding error. But if in such cases, I either affirm or deny, then I not using my free will correctly” (AT VII 59–60/CSM II 41). Provided we refrain from assenting to what is not clearly and distinctly perceived, our judgments are guaranteed to be true.

In the Fourth Meditation, Descartes draws a close parallel between the will's relation to the true and to the good. Just as the will is compelled to assent to what is clearly and distinctly perceived to be true, so it is compelled to choose what is clearly and distinctly perceived to be good: “if I always saw clearly what was true and good, I should never have to deliberate about the right judgement or choice” (AT VII 58/CSM II 40). And analogously, we might suppose, just as the recipe for avoiding error is to withhold assent from that whose truth is not perceived clearly and distinctly, so the recipe for avoiding moral error, or sin, is to refuse to choose that whose goodness is not perceived clearly and distinctly. In his objections to the Meditations, Arnauld cautioned Descartes on this point, suggesting that the comments he makes “on the cause of error would give rise to the most serious objections if they were stretched out of context to cover the pursuit of good and evil” (AT VII 215/CSM II 151). Heeding Arnauld's warning, Descartes added a disclaimer to the Synopsis of the Meditations: “But here it should be noted in passing that I do not deal at all with sin, i.e. the error which is committed in pursuing good and evil, but only with the error that occurs in distinguishing truth and falsehood” (AT VII 15/CSM II 11). This assertion flatly contradicts the text of the Fourth Meditation, where Descartes had written that, where the will is indifferent, “it easily turns aside from what is true and good, and this is the source of my error and sin” (AT VII 58/CSM II 40–1). In light of this, and Descartes' insistence to Mersenne that the disclaimer be placed in parentheses to indicate that it had been added, there is reason to believe that Descartes is committed to upholding the same account of the will in relation to the true and to the good.

There is nonetheless one important way in which the operation of the will in a purely theoretical context (such as the Meditations) must be distinguished from its operation in a practical context. In the pursuit of certainty, Descartes claims that it is both possible and reasonable to withhold assent from any idea that is not perceived clearly and distinctly. Outside the isolated confines of the Meditations, however, it is impossible to maintain such an attitude of detachment. Life demands that we act, by choosing among competing goods on the basis of ideas that are often less than clear and distinct. When faced with the exigencies of existence, suspension of choice is not an option. Since we are forced to act under conditions of uncertainty, it might seem to follow that we are condemned to a life of moral error, constantly making wrong choices on the basis of inadequate perceptions of the goodness and badness of objects. This may be the ordinary lot of human beings. However, Descartes does not believe that this situation is irremediable. In his later writings he presents an account of virtue that shows how we can be assured of our ability to make the right choices, or to act virtuously, despite the inadequacy of much of our knowledge.

4. Virtue and Happiness: The Correspondence with Princess Elisabeth

Descartes' correspondence with Princess Elisabeth has as its central topic the relation of mind and body—a relation that is explored from the point of view of both theory (the problem of mind-body union) and practice. With the respect to the latter, Descartes is again concerned with the connection between physical and mental well-being, and in particular the deleterious effects of passions such as sadness, grief, fear and melancholy. He discusses these topics in the course of advising Elisabeth on how to cope with her own illness and distress. The question, however, is an ancient one: when faced with the hardships of life—physical illness, loss, anxiety—how can one respond in a way that allows one to preserve the state of tranquility, or contentment, that is the core of our happiness?

Descartes' abiding interest in medicine is prominent here, since the treatment of physical illness is the most effective way of removing one of main sources of mental disturbance. Yet he is well aware of the limits of medical knowledge, and so he acknowledges that the passions must also be confronted directly: “They are domestic enemies with whom we are forced to keep company, and we have to be perpetually on guard lest they injure us” (AT IV 218/CSMK 249). Descartes prescribes to Elisabeth a two-part remedy for protecting herself against the harmful effects of the passions: “so far as possible to distract our imagination and senses from them, and when obliged by prudence to consider them, to do so with our intellect alone” (ibid.). The first part of the remedy relies on our ability to direct the imagination away from the immediate objects of the passions. Given this power, Descartes argues, “there might be a person who had countless genuine reasons for distress but who took such pains to direct his imagination that he never thought of them except when compelled by some practical nececessity, and who spent the rest of his time in the consideration of objects which could furnish contentment and joy” (AT IV 219/CSMK 250). Intriguingly, Descartes speculates that this kind of cognitive therapy by itself might be sufficient to restore the patient to health. In circumventing the causal pathway by which the passion arises, the body will be returned to a healthy state. Descartes offers his own history as an example of this phenomenon: “From [my mother] I inherited a dry cough and a pale colour which stayed with me until I was more than twenty, so that all the doctors who saw me up to that time gave it as their verdict that I would die young. But I have always had an inclination to look at things from the most favorable angle and to make my principal happiness depend upon myself alone, and I believe that this inclination caused the indisposition, which was almost part of my nature, gradually to disappear completely” (AT IV 221/CSMK 251). This line of thought leads directly to the Passions of the Soul, in which Descartes discusses at length the causation and function of the passions.

The second part of the remedy prescribed to Elisabeth aligns Descartes' position with that of the ancients, who stress the role of reason in regulating the passions. The person who is led by passion will inevitably experience sadness, grief, fear, anxiety—emotions inconsistent with “perfect happiness.” Such happiness is the possession alone of those elevated souls in which reason “always remains mistress”:

the difference between the greatest souls and those that are base and common consists principally in the fact that common souls abandon themselves to their passions and are happy or unhappy only according as the things that happen to them are agreeable or unpleasant; the greatest souls, on the other hand, reason in a way that is so strong and cogent that, although they also have passions, and indeed passions which are often more violent than those of ordinary people, their reason nevertheless always remains mistress, and even makes their afflictions serve them and contribute to the perfect happiness they enjoy in this life. (AT IV 202; translation from Gaukroger 2002, 236).

The link between reason and happiness is explored at length by Descartes in letters exchanged with Elisabeth during the summer and fall of 1645. The discussion begins with Descartes' suggestion that they examine what the ancients had to say on the topic, and he chooses as exemplary Seneca's work “On the Happy Life” (De Vita Beata). Descartes, however, quickly becomes dissatisfied with Seneca's treatment and proposes instead to explain to Elizabeth how he thinks the subject “should have been treated by such a philosopher, unenlightened by faith, with only natural reason to guide him” (AT IV 263/CSMK 257).

Basic to Descartes' account is the distinction he draws between (i) the supreme good, (ii) happiness, and (iii) the final end or goal, notions generally taken as equivalent in ancient eudaimonism (AT IV 275/CSMK 261). Descartes identifies the supreme good with virtue, which he defines as “a firm and constant will to bring about everything we judge to be the best and to employ all the force of our intellect in judging well” (AT IV 277/CSMK 262). Virtue is the supreme good, he argues, because it is “the only good, among all those we can possess, which depends entirely on our free will” (AT IV 276/CSMK 261), and because it is sufficient for happiness. Descartes explains happiness (la béatitude) entirely in psychological terms. It is the “perfect contentment of mind and inner satisfaction… which is acquired by the wise without fortune's favor” (AT IV 264/CSMK 257). According to Descartes, “we cannot ever practice any virtue—that is to say, do what our reason tells us we should do—without receiving satisfaction and pleasure from doing so” (AT IV 284/CSMK 263). Thus, happiness is a natural product of virtue and can be enjoyed regardless of what fortune brings. The dependence of happiness on virtue is confirmed by Descartes' account of the final end, which, he says, can be regarded either as happiness or as the supreme good: virtue is the target at which we ought to aim, but happiness is the prize that induces us to fire at it (AT IV 277/CMSK 262).

As Descartes defines it, virtue depends upon the employment of reason. While it is conceivable that one might have a “firm and constant will” to do something without having examined whether it is the right thing to do, one cannot have a firm and constant will to do what is judged to be the best, unless one is capable of judging what the best is. Thus, virtue presupposes knowledge of the relative goodness of ends, and this knowledge Descartes assigns to reason: “The true function of reason… is to examine and consider without passion the value of all the perfections, both of the body and of the soul, which can be acquired by our conduct, so that… we shall always choose the better” (AT IV 286–7/CSMK 265).

But how exactly does reason allow us to discriminate between lesser and greater goods? On one point Descartes' position is clear: the claim of virtue to be the supreme good follows from the fact that it is nothing more than the correct use of our free will, employing it to choose whatever reason represents as the greatest good. As Descartes argues in the Fourth Meditation, we are in no way more like God—that is, more perfect—than in our possession of free will. Hence the correct use of this will is our greatest good: “free will is in itself the noblest thing we can have, since it makes us in a way equal to God and seems to exempt us from being his subjects; and so its correct use is the greatest of all the goods we possess” (AT V 85/CSMK 326). Reason shows that the greatest good within our power is the perfection of the will. In any choice we make, the value of the particular goods we pursue will always be less than that of the will itself; hence, provided we act virtuously, we can be content, whether or not we succeed in obtaining whatever other goods we seek.

Yet this still leaves open the question of how to assess the value of these other goods. The supreme good, virtue, consists in a firm resolution to bring about whatever reason judges to be the best. But on the basis of what does reason make this determination? What knowledge allows reason to form a well-founded judgment about the goodness and badness of ends, in the pursuit of which we act virtuously? Descartes criticizes Seneca on just this point—that he fails to teach us “all the principal truths whose knowledge is necessary to facilitate the practice of virtue and to regulate our desires and passions, and thus to enjoy natural happiness” (AT IV 267/CSMK 258). In response, Elisabeth worries that Descartes' account, which promises the attainment of happiness, might presuppose more knowledge than we can possibly possess. In assuaging her concern, Descartes summarizes the knowledge he believes we can rely on in directing our will toward virtuous ends. It consists of a suprisingly small set of “the truths most useful to us.” The first two are basic principles of Cartesian metaphysics as presented in the Meditations:

  1. The existence of an omnipotent, supremely perfect God, whose decrees are infallible. “This teaches us to accept calmly all the things which happen to us as expressly sent by God” (AT IV 291–2/CSMK 265).
  2. The immortality of the soul and its independence from the body. “This prevents us from fearing death, and so detaches our affections from the things of this world that we look upon whatever is in the power of fortune with nothing but scorn” (AT IV 292/CSMK 266).

The next three truths derive from Cartesian natural philosophy, broadly understood:

  1. The indefinite extent of the universe. In recognizing this we overcome our inclination to place ourselves at the center of the cosmos, as though everything ought to happen for our sake, which is the source of “countless vain anxieties and troubles” (AT IV 292/CSMK 266).
  2. That we are part of a larger community of beings, whose interest take precedence over our own. “Though each of us is a person distinct from others, whose interests are accordingly in some way different from those of the rest of the world, we ought still to think that none of us could subsist alone and that each one of us is really one of the many parts of the universe…. And the interests of the whole, of which each of us is a part, must always be preferred to those of our particular person” (AT IV 293/CSMK 266).
  3. That our passions represent goods as being much greater than they really are, and that the pleasures of the body are never as lasting as those of the soul or so great in possession as they are in anticipation. “We must pay careful attention to this, so that when we feel ourselves moved by some passion we suspend our judgment until it is calmed, and do not let ourselves be deceived by the false appearances of the goods of this world” (AT IV 295/CSMK 267).

The final proposition is of a quite different character:

  1. Whenever we lack certain knowledge of how to act, we should defer to the laws and customs of the land. “[O]ne must also minutely examine all the customs of one's place of abode to see how far they should be followed. Though we cannot have certain demonstrations of everything, still we must take sides, and in matters of custom embrace the opinions that seem the most probable, so they we may never be irresolute when we need to act. For nothing causes regret and remorse except irresolution” (ibid.).

The truths that Descartes takes to be “most useful to us” do not consist of discoveries original to his philosophy. Rather, they reflect a general outlook on the world that could be embraced by someone without Cartesian sympathies: the existence of an omnipotent and supremely perfect God; the immortality of the soul; the vastness of the universe; that we have duties to a larger whole of which we are a part; that our passions often distort the goodness of their objects. What Descartes can claim at most (and what he does claim in the preface to the Principles of Philosophy) is that he has supplied better reasons for believing these propositions to be true; he has established certain knowledge where before there was only unstable belief.

The establishment of a body of knowledge relevant to the practice of virtue supplies the basis for a new set of moral rules that replaces the provisional morality of the Discourse. Descartes presents them to Elisabeth as a succinct recipe for happiness:

It seems to me that each person can make himself content by himself without any external assistance, provided he respects three conditions, which are related to the three rules of provisional morality which I put forward in the Discourse on the Method. The first is that he should always try to employ his mind as well as he can to discover what he should and should not do in all the circumstances of life. The second is that he should have a firm and constant resolution to carry out whatever reason recommends without being diverted by his passions or appetites…. The third is that he should bear in mind that while he thus guides himself as far as he can by reason, all the good things which he does not possess are one and all entirely outside his power. (AT IV 265/CSMK 257–8)

Here the Discourse's final provisional rule has become the first rule, reflecting the assumption that reason, in the form of judgments about good and evil, can serve as a reliable guide for action. Similarly, the Discourse's second rule, which prescribed that one be “as firm and decisive in [one's] actions” as one can, and “follow even the most doubtful opinions” once adopted, has now become an injunction to carry out whatever reason recommends without being diverted by the passions. The two sets of rules overlap most closely in the third rule, which counsels us to recognize the limits of our power and to curtail our desires for things outside of it. In this case too, however, the rule now has a different status for Descartes, since it is supported by certain knowledge of God, on whom all things depend, and the immortality of the soul.

The truths that Descartes presents to Elisabeth supply a body of rational knowledge on the basis of which we are able to use our free will correctly, choosing good over evil. Clearly, though, the guidance offered by these truths is of the most general sort. They do not underwrite specific directives for action or dictate what we ought to do in any particular circumstance. Instead, they are best seen simply as facilitating right action, by removing impediments to it (anxiety about the future, fear of death) or saving us from obvious errors (ignoring the concerns of others, giving priority to bodily goods). That the content of morality is underdetermined by the knowledge on which it depends is made clear by Descartes' final proposition, which instructs us to defer to the laws and customs of the land when it is not obvious how we ought to act. This proposition echoes the first rule of provisional morality that Descartes prescribes for himself in the Discourse. However, this rule, too, has undergone an important transformation. Whereas in the Discourse deference to the laws and customs of one's country is presented as the first rule of provisional morality, to Elisabeth it is offered as a fallback position, acknowledging that while we do indeed possess certain knowledge of good and evil, there are limits to this knowledge.

The recognition of these limits is an enduring feature of Descartes' ethics. The truths outlined to Elizabeth lay down a set of general guidelines for how to use the will correctly. Following them, however, does not guarantee that we infallibly choose the greatest good; nor is success of this sort required for virtue. As far as virtue is concerned, the critical point is that we do whatever we can to ascertain the best course of action, appealing if necessary to civil law or custom, and that we then will decisively.

This creates an important disanalogy for Descartes between the theoretical and the practical. In both cases, we have a responsibility to correct our understanding before committing the will in judgment or action. Only in the case of judgment, however, is it reasonable to suspend assent indefinitely if we lack the knowledge needed to be confident of the correctness of our decision. In the case of action, Descartes denies that this is appropriate: “As far as the conduct of life is concerned, I am very far from thinking that we should assent only to what is clearly perceived. On the contrary, I do not think that we should always wait even for probable truths” (AT VII 149/CSM II 106). In acting, the essential thing is that we will in the right manner, allowing reason to guide our choice so far as it can. “It is… not necessary that our reason should be free from error,” he tells Elisabeth; “it is sufficient if our conscience testifies that we have never lacked resolution and virtue to carry out whatever we have judged the best course” (AT IV 266/CSMK 258). Resolution, or firmness of judgment, is crucial, for it is the lack of this, above all, that causes “regret and remorse” and thereby threatens our happiness (AT IV 264/CSMK 257).

5. Generosity and The Passions of the Soul

Descartes' correspondence with Princess Elisabeth led directly to the composition of his final book, The Passions of the Soul, a large part of which was written during the winter of 1645–6. In a prefatory letter to the book, Descartes maintains that in it he has set out to explain the passions “only as a natural philosopher [physicien], and not as a rhetorician or even as a moral philosopher” (AT XI 326/CSM I 327). On the face of it, this seems to be contradicted by the contents of the book, since much of it is devoted to understanding the passions from an ethical point of view—that is, understanding how they can be accommodated to the goal of happiness. The significance of Descartes' remark lies in the particular account he gives of the passions. In general, they are defined as “those perceptions, sensations or emotions of the soul which we refer particularly to it, and which are caused, maintained and strengthened by some movement of the [animal] spirits” (art. 27; CSM I 338–9). Descartes' central thesis is that the passions originate in bodily changes, which are communicated by the animal spirits to the pineal gland, and thereby give rise to affective states in the soul—affections which are referred to the soul itself and not to the body. Because the passions originate in the body, a large part of the book is devoted to differentiating the passions and accounting for their effects in physiological terms; hence Descartes' claim to explain them as a natural philosopher.

Descartes distinguishes six primitive passions: wonder, love, hatred, desire, joy and sadness. All the rest are either composed from these or species of them (art. 69). The passions operate in a common manner: “the principal effect of all the human passions is that they move and dispose the soul to want the things for which they prepare the body.” Thus, the passsions are in the first place motivational states that dispose the soul to will specific actions: “the feeling of fear moves the soul to want to flee, that of courage to want to fight, and similarly with the others” (art. 40; CSM I 343). Different passions result from the effects of different motions on the pineal gland; and these, Descartes assumes, have been ordained by God for the sake of preserving the human body: “The function of all the passions consists solely in this, that they dispose our soul to want the things which nature deems useful for us, and to persist in this volition; and the same agitation of the spirits which normally causes the passions also disposes the body to make movements which help to attain these things” (art. 52; CSM I 349).

Given their natural function of preserving the body, the passions are all by nature good (art. 211). They spur us to act in ways that are in general conducive to our well-being. However, the effects of the passions are not uniformly beneficial. For the most part the passions are directed at immediate ends, and for this reason they exaggerate the goodness or badness of their objects, prompting us, for example, to flee quickly from apparent dangers. The passions are also ordered for the sake of the preservation of the body, and not the contentment of the soul; and because they originate in the body, any malfunction of the latter can disrupt the normal operation of the passions. For these reasons, it is necessary that the passions be regulated by reason, whose “proper weapons” against their misuse and excess are “firm and determinate judgements bearing upon the knowledge of good and evil, which the soul has resolved to follow in guiding its conduct” (art. 48; CSM I 347). Summarizing his position at the end of the Passions, Descartes avers that “the chief use of wisdom lies in its teaching us to be masters of our passions and to control them with such skill that the evils which they cause are quite bearable, and even become a source of joy” (art. 212; CSM I 404).

Over and above the role they play in the preservation of the body, the passions also make a direct contribution to human happiness. In the concluding article of the Passions, Descartes goes so far as to say that “it is on the passions alone that all the good and evil of this life depends” (art. 212; CSM I 404). In the body of the article, he qualifies this claim, allowing that “the soul can have pleasures of its own. But the pleasures common to it and the body depend entirely on the passions.” His considered view on this question seems to be that the passions (particularly those of love and joy) form a valuable part of a human life, that the enjoyment of them is consistent with the happiness that is the natural product of virtue, but that happiness of the latter sort can be had even in the presence of harmful passions such as sadness or grief.

Happiness, as Descartes defines it for Elisabeth, is a “perfect contentment of mind and inner satisfaction” (AT IV 264/CSMK 257), or the “satisfaction and pleasure” that accompanies the practice of virtue (AT IV 284/CSMK 263). In the Passions, he distinguishes these affects from the passions that originate in the body. The former are described as “internal emotions of the soul,” which are “produced in the soul only by the soul itself. In this they differ from its passions, which always depend on some movement of the [animal] spirits” (art. 147; CSM I 381). “Internal emotions” are thus independent of the body and the basis of a happiness that can withstand “the most violent assaults of the passions”:

internal emotions affect us more intimately, and consequently have much more power over us than the passions which occur with them but are distinct from them. To this extent it is certain that, provided our soul always has the means of happiness within itself, all the troubles coming from elsewhere are powerless to harm it. Such troubles will serve rather to increase its joy; for on seeing that it cannot be harmed by them, it becomes aware of its perfection. And in order that our soul should have the means of happiness, it needs only to pursue virtue diligently. For if anyone lives in such a way that his conscience cannot reproach him for ever failing to do something he judges to be the best (which is what I here call ‘pursuing virtue’), he will receive from this a satisfaction which has such power to make him happy that the most violent assaults of the passions will never have sufficient power to disturb the tranquillity of his soul. (art. 148; CSM I 381–2)

Descartes is committed to the view that the pursuit of virtue is sufficient for happiness. However, he firmly rejects the idea that virtue has only an instrumental value as a means to happiness. On the contrary, virtue is grounded in the one aspect of human nature that is of unconditional value: freedom of the will—the perfection of the soul that “renders us in a certain way like God by making us masters of ourselves” (art. 152; CSM I 384). The recognition of this fact forms the basis of the moral ideal Descartes calls “generosity.” Generosity incorporates both the perfection of the intellect (wisdom) and the perfection of the will (virtue). The generous person “knows in what manner and for what reason anyone ought to have esteem or contempt for himself,” and he possesses the perfection that is the object of that esteem. “True generosity,” therefore, has two components: “The first consists in his knowing that nothing truly belongs to him but this freedom to dispose his volitions, and that he ought to be praised or blamed for no other reason than his using this freedom well or badly. The second consists in his feeling within himself a firm and constant resolution to use it well—that is, never to lack the will to undertake and carry out whatever he judges to be best. To do that is to pursue virtue in a perfect manner” (art. 153; CSM I 384).

Generosity is an ideal of individual ethical perfection, but Descartes also draws from it an important conclusion about our relations to others. Upon recognizing an element of unconditional value within himself, the generous person is naturally led to extend this recognition to others: “Those who possess this knowledge and this feeling about themselves readily come to believe that any other person can have the same knowledge and feeling about himself, because this involves nothing which depends on someone else.” Those who are endowed with generosity are thus disposed to overlook conventional distinctions of class and social status, and to focus on the true, intrinsic worth of each individual:

Just as they do not consider themselves much inferior to those who have greater wealth or honour, or even to those who have more intelligence, knowledge or beauty, or generally to those who surpass them in some other perfections, equally they do not have much more esteem for themselves than for those whom they surpass. For all these things seem to them to be unimportant, by contrast with the virtuous will for which alone they esteem themselves, and which they suppose also to be present, or at least capable of being present, in every other person. (art. 154; CSM I 384).

Thus, despite its nod to law and custom, which fill the space opened by the limits of our moral knowledge, Descartes' ethics is crowned by a principle of moral universalism. In virtue of their free will, all human beings have the same moral status and deserve equal moral respect. In this we find an important anticipation of Kant's ethics, which emerges from a similar consideration of the unconditional value of a rational and free will.

Bibliography

Primary Works

  • Descartes, René. Oeuvres De Descartes, 11 vols., edited by Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin, 1983. [cited as AT followed by volume and page number]
  • –––. The Philosophical Writings Of Descartes, 3 vols., translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, volume 3 including Anthony Kenny, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988. [cited as CSM(K) followed by volume and page number]
  • –––. The Passions of the Soul, translated by Stephen H. Voss, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1989.
  • –––. The Correspondence between Elisabeth, Princess of Bohemia and Descartes, translated by Lisa Shapiro, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2007.

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Descartes, René | Descartes, René: life and works | Epicurus | ethics: ancient | ethics: virtue | Stoicism

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