Supplement to Descartes' Life and Works

Descartes' Law Thesis

In 1616 Descartes earned a degree and license in Canon and Civil Law from the law school of the University of Poitiers. But, it would not be until an unexpected find in 1981 that we would know anything about his early interests in law. While reframing a seventeenth-century engraving that had been hanging in a museum restaurant, a curator for the Sainte-Croix Museum discovered stuffed in the back of the engraving a public broadsheet, printed in 1616, which advertised the oral defense of one René Descartes. As was customary for the time, a student would have advertisements (broadsheets) of his upcoming defense printed, the broadsheets usually containing an introduction or dedication and a list of several statements that the student was prepared to defend. They would be posted in public places.

In 1986 the discovery of the broadsheet was officially documented in the Archives departementales de la Vienne, at Poitiers. Jean-Robert Armogathe, Vincent Carraud, and Robert Feenstra have verified the document's authenticity. In 1988 they published a brief history of the document's discovery, a Latin transcription of the original, and the first French translation in Nouvelles De La Republique Des Lettres.

Descartes' broadsheet (hereafter referred to as the “1616 Law Thesis”) contains an elaborately worded dedication to his maternal uncle, René Brochard, followed by a list of forty statements--thirty-six of which would appear to be commonly held and uncontroversial. Unfortunately, a corner of the original document has been torn, and so the section of text containing the last four statements, which very likely express the main (or at least the unique part) of his thesis, is missing.

The dedication is flowery (and beautiful). It tells us of a young Descartes who nursed at the well-springs of the liberal arts, desiring only to “drink in the poetical waters.” However, he could hear below (in the ground) the roar of a great current, which drew him to wanting to drink from “the wider rivers of eloquence.” But, in time, he discovered that neither the poetical waters nor the wider rivers of eloquence quenched his thirst for knowing. He followed the rivers out to the ocean, the sciences, from which all rivers of knowledge flow (the analogy, of course, is a bit off, for rivers flow to the ocean, not from it). He claims that at first he wanted to drink in every river and stream. But, he came upon the stream of his uncle, and discovered how silly his attempt at drinking in everything was. The stream that supplied his uncle's well-spring with the purest waters was that of the Law. And, it was to this stream that he would dedicate the rest of his life. The metaphor changes and Descartes tells us that a goddess had appeared to him, Themis (Justice), and she enslaved him. He ends the dedication by expressing his hope that his uncle, René Brochard, will “unite to me the favor and benevolence of so lovable a goddess.”

The thesis itself deals with the legal concept of inheritance, which is expressed by way of the forty propositions that follow the dedication. Because of the missing section of text, it is impossible to say with certainty what Descartes' main point was. However, given what has survived, the bulk of it suggests that he was arguing that in certain cases a specific branch of law, namely Singular Law, could be applied in the making of a will.

There were several branches of Canon Law: Common Law, Universal Law, General Law, and Singular Law. They are distinct in light of the domain of objects over which they operate. For instance, Common Law operates over things (owned), Universal Law over territories, and General Law over (classes) of persons. Singular Law operates over those individual cases which the other branches cannot adequately handle. Since last wills deal with the dispensing of things, they fell under the jurisdiction of Common Law.

At the beginning of the 1616 Law Thesis, Descartes draws a well-known distinction between Civil Law (jus civilis) and Law of the Nations (jus gentium). The latter refers to those laws found in common with all nations. It was sometimes referred to as ‘natural law’. It was customary in Rome (and very likely in seventeenth-century France) that when a strict application of Civil Law would result in an injustice, a court could appeal to Law of the Nations for help in hopes that a just decision could be reached.

Common Law, says Descartes, requires either that the one making the will orally proclaim the will or state it in writing. In either case seven witnesses are needed. Common Law is apparently very strict not only in respect to the number of witnesses, but in respect to how the will is proclaimed or written (and sealed), and so on. Descartes mentions several special cases (Propositions 37-39) in which meeting the criteria of Common Law is impossible—for example, in the case of a soldier in battle, a farmer isolated in the countryside, or a man who has come down with the plague. It may be impossible for them to fulfill the seven witness criterion, for example. Justice would not be brought about if these individuals were not able to make a last will. Descartes's thesis seems to be that in these cases Singular Law could be applied, and justice could be brought about. The precedent, it seems, is the court's already appealing to Law of the Nations to deal with those cases which Civil Law cannot handle.

Further Documentation

Descartes' 1616 Law Thesis -- Copy of Original Document

Descartes' 1616 Law Thesis -- Latin Transcription

Descartes' 1616 Law Thesis -- English Translation


Thanks to Roger Ariew and Helen Hattab for their advice on this project, and to Daniel Garber for providing me with a copy of the original document. I am also indebted to Holly Johnson (co-translator of the English translation) for making the thesis clearer to me, in our many discussions.

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Kurt Smith <>

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