John Dewey is well known for his work in logic, scientific inquiry, and philosophy of education. His fame is based largely on his membership in the school of American Pragmatists of which Charles Sanders Peirce and William James were the leading early figures. He has also had a great deal of influence in aesthetics and the philosophy of art. His work Art as Experience (1934) is regarded by many as one of the most important contributions to this area in the 20th century. Yet it is not as widely discussed as that evaluation would indicate. There are several reasons for this.
First, although Dewey seems to write in an almost folksy style, his philosophical prose is often difficult and dense. Second, the book early on had the misfortune of receiving two reviews that negatively impacted its reception. The first, by an avowed follower, Stephen Pepper, complained that it was not truly pragmatist and that Dewey had reverted to an earlier Hegelianism (Pepper 1939). The second, by Benedetto Croce, seemed to confirm this (Croce 1948). Croce, widely seen as Hegelian himself, saw so many similarities between Dewey's work and his own that he accused Dewey of lifting his ideas. Dewey (1948) insisted otherwise, but the sense that there was something too Hegelian in Art as Experience remained. This did not stop many philosophers, educators, and other intellectuals from producing works in aesthetic theory that were strongly influenced by Dewey. Even before Art as Experience Dewey's writings on aesthetics and art influenced such writers as Lawrence Buermeyer (1924), Albert Barnes (1928) and Thomas Munro (1928). After the book's publication his followers included Irwin Edman (1939), Stephen Pepper (1939, 1945, 1953), Horace Kallen (1942), Thomas Munro again (numerous books) and Van Meter Ames (1947, 1953).
However, in the 1950s there was an analytic revolution in English-speaking aesthetics. Prior aesthetic theories were considered to be too speculative and unclear. Dewey's work was caught up in this condemnation. Arnold Isenberg (1987, orig. 1950) for instance, in a founding document of analytic aesthetics, dismissed Art as Experience as a “hodgepodge of conflicting methods and undisciplined speculations,” (p. 128) although he found it full of profound suggestions. Dewey's theories of expression and creativity were particular targets of analytic attack. Dewey's was among the views singled out in a general critique of expression as a defining characteristic of art, although often his own distinctive theory was ignored in the process. A situation followed, and continued well into the 1980s, in which, according to one editor of The Journal of Aesthetics and Art Criticism, Dewey's aesthetics was virtually ignored (Fisher 1989). While Monroe Beardsley, one of the most important late 20th century aestheticians, kept an interest in Dewey alive (1958, 1975, 1982), particularly in his discussions of aesthetic experience, other major figures, including Arthur Danto, Mary Mothersill and Richard Wollheim, completely ignored him. Nelson Goodman may be a partial exception (Freeland 2001). Goodman certainly shared with Dewey a conviction that art and science are close in many ways and, like Dewey, he replaced the question “what is art?” with “when is art?” They also both took a naturalist approach to the arts. However, Goodman, who never refers to Dewey in his Languages of Art (1976), saw art in terms of languages and other symbol systems, whereas Dewey saw it in terms of experience. Joseph Margolis (1980) is perhaps the most important contemporary aesthetician coming out of the analytic school to take Dewey seriously, having a natural affinity to pragmatist ways of thought. His idea that works of art are culturally emergent but physically embodied entities is Deweyan in spirit, as is his insistence on a robust relativist theory of interpretation. However, Margolis seldom refers to Dewey and, although he believes himself closer to Dewey's “Hegelianism” than to Peirce's “Kantianism,” he finds Peirce more interesting. He also faults Dewey for not being an historicist (1999). Another contemporary American aesthetician, Arnold Berleant, has continuously developed themes similar to Dewey's, for example, in his concepts of the “aesthetic field” and “engagement.”(1970,1991).
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Art as Experience
- 2.1 The Live Creature
- 2.2 The Live Creature and “Etherial Things”
- 2.3 Having an Experience
- 2.4 The Act of Expression
- 2.5 The Expressive Object
- 2.6 Substance and Form
- 2.7 Natural History of Form
- 2.8 Organization of Energies
- 2.9 The Common Substance of the Arts
- 2.10 The Varied Substance of the Arts
- 2.11 The Human Contribution
- 2.12 The Challenge to Philosophy
- 2.13 Criticism and Perception
- 2.14 Art and Civilization
- 3. Critical Reactions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
The relative lack of interest in Dewey changed for several reasons in the late 1970s. First, Richard Rorty turned analytic philosophy on its head by advocating a return to pragmatism (Rorty 1979, 1982). In this, Dewey was one of his avowed heroes. Unfortunately, Rorty was not a close reader of Dewey's aesthetics. The Society for the Advancement of American Philosophy along with their publication, The Journal of Speculative Philosophy, as well as the Center for Dewey Studies also contributed to this revival. Dewey was further promoted in aesthetics through the work of Richard Shusterman (1992, 1997a, 2000) who went so far as to advocate a pragmatist aesthetics, with Dewey as his main champion. He particularly emphasized the possibilities of treating popular art as fine art with his well-known example of rap as fine art. He also extended aesthetics into the realm of everyday life through his concept of “somaesthetics.” This strand of pro-Deweyan thinking has also been recently pursued by Crispin Sartwell in response to multi-culturalism and everyday aesthetics (Sartwell 1995, 2003) and by Yuriko Saito (Saito 2007) in her effort to extend aesthetics to everyday life. In the 1980s Dewey's aesthetics finally received an excellent exposition in the work of Thomas Alexander (Alexander 1987). Meanwhile, there has been a steady interest in Dewey's aesthetics in the philosophy of education, with articles appearing on a regular basis in such publications as the Journal of Aesthetic Education and Studies in the Philosophy of Education and several books (Jackson 1998, Garrison 1997, Greene 2001, Maslak 2006, Granger 2006a).
Dewey's renewed influence was due in part to increased interest in various continental aestheticians. The similarities between Dewey and Merleau-Ponty are the most striking (Ames 1953, Kestenbaum 1977), but he also shares certain features with Gadamer (Gilmour 1987, who also notes important differences, and Jeannot 2001). Given his critique of capitalism, one can also find connections between his thinking and that of Marxist aestheticians, particularly Adorno (Lysaker 1998). Some contemporary feminist aestheticians have come to realize that Dewey shares many of their concerns, for example their rejection of mind/body dualism, their democratic instincts, their contextualism, and their tendency to break down traditional distinctions (Seigfried 1996b, Duran 2001). There has also been some work on marked similarities between Dewey's aesthetic thought and that of Taoism (Grange 2001), Transcendental Meditation (Zigler 1982), Dogen's version of Zen (Earls 1992), the great Indian aesthetician, Abhinavagupta (Mathur 1981), the Bhagavad-Gita (Stroud 2009), and Confucius (Shusterman 2009, Man 2007, Mullis 2005, Grange 2004). Alexander has recently discussed relations between Dewey and Eastern Aesthetics generally (Alexander 2009)
An interesting aspect of Dewey's writing, and perhaps another reason for the lack of on-going positive reception, was his lack of strong interest in the history of aesthetics. He seldom explicated or critiqued the aesthetic works of others. Although full of quotations, Art as Experience originally lacked adequate footnotes. (Fortunately, the recent Boydston edition tracks down all quotations and even notes which books were in Dewey's library.) Poets figure as strongly in Dewey's reading list as philosophers, especially Coleridge, Housman, Keats, Poe, Shakespeare and Wordsworth. Visual artists are often quoted, especially Cezanne, Constable, Delacroix, Manet, Matisse (whom he met), Reynolds, and Van Gogh. As for philosophers, he was of course aware of the work of Plato and Aristotle. Yet in Art as Experience he never mentions Hume's aesthetics, Hegel receives only one citation (surprisingly, given the accusation that Dewey was too Hegelian), and Nietzsche none. Kant, however, plays an important role as an opponent, and Schopenhauer receives a few mentions. Amongst contemporaries, he references Matthew Arnold, Clive Bell, Bernard Bosanquet, Andrew Bradley, Benedetto Croce, Roger Fry, Thomas Hulme, Violet Paget (who wrote under the name Vernon Lee), Walter Pater, George Santayana, Hippolyte Taine, and Leo Tolstoy.
Since Dewey was a pragmatist it is worthwhile to look for antecedents in that tradition (see Shusterman 2006b). A strong case can be made for many parallels with Emerson, whom many see as a proto-pragmatist. Charles S. Peirce also touched on themes more familiar in Dewey, for example the continuity of aesthetics and ethics. Although William James did not write in aesthetics, his psychological views had a strong influence on Dewey's aesthetics. Alain Locke, the African-American philosopher and pragmatist culture-theorist, probably had some influence as well.
Other important thinkers of the 19th century also influenced Dewey. Dewey's idea of the live creature interacting with its environment owes much to Charles Darwin (Perricone 2006), and although Dewey never cites Karl Marx, perhaps because he was so committed in his public life to defending an anti-communist form of social liberalism, his views on the relation between art and society were very close to those of Marx, especially the young Marx. Another figure hovering in the background was Sigmund Freud for, although in other books he is critical of Freud's hypostatization of entities within the unconscious, in Art as Experience he gives subconscious processes a significant role in the creative process.
Albert C. Barnes, the industrialist and collector, was Dewey's strongest influence in aesthetics. The two were close friends, and Dewey was a member of the staff of the Barnes Foundation of which he was named Director in 1925 (Barnes Foundation 2011). Barnes, who took a seminar under Dewey in 1917, avidly advocated Dewey's form of pragmatism. He considered himself a strong defender of democracy, although ironically, he made it very difficult for people to see his own extensive collection and was thought by some to be authoritarian in his formalist theories of appreciation. Dewey not only quotes extensively from Barnes' writings but dedicates Art as Experience to him. Many of the illustrations in Dewey's book came from the Barnes collection.
Dewey was ahead of his time in his devotion to multiculturalism. The selection of illustrations Dewey chose for Art as Experience included Pueblo Indian pottery, Bushmen rock-painting, Scythian ornament, and African sculpture, as well as works by El Greco, Renoir, Cezanne and Matisse. He was interested in traditional and folk arts in Mexico, admiring the designs of the rural schools over those of the cities (1926c). He was also associated, mainly through Barnes, with African-American culture. Barnes was invited to write a chapter for The New Negro edited by Alain Locke (Locke 1925) and one of the founding documents of the Harlem Renaissance. The students in Dewey's and Barnes' first experimental classes in art education were mainly from the black working class. Barnes collected African-American art and also encouraged African-American students to study at the Barnes Foundation. African-American painter and illustrator Aaron Douglas, who came to the foundation in 1927, studied in Paris in 1931 under a Foundation fellowship (Jubilee 1982). Barnes also had a long association with Lincoln University, a historically black college, many students of which studied at the Barnes Foundation (Hollingsworth 1994). Dewey was also one of the founding members of the NAACP (National Association for the Advancement of Colored People). In addition, Dewey sought to promote cross-cultural understanding through his founding of the China Institute in New York City in 1926. The China Institute, which continues today, advertises itself as the only institution in that city to focus solely on Chinese civilization, art and culture. Hu Shih, a student of Dewey's at Columbia who invited Dewey to Peking in 1919, and Paul Monroe, were the two other leading figures in the creation of this Institute (Ho 2004—see the Other Internet Resources).
Although Dewey was widely versed in literature, architecture, painting, sculpture, and the theater, he was relatively uneducated in music, and he was said to be tone-deaf. Yet he often had insightful things to say about music, and many musicians and music educators have drawn inspiration from his theory (e.g., Zeltner 1975). He seemed, unfortunately, to have been totally unaware of both photography and film as separate art forms.
Many writers complain that Dewey showed little interest in the avant-garde art of his time. It is true that neither Cubism, Dadaism nor Surrealism play a role in his writing. His theory seems to actually preclude Non-objective painting (Jacobson 1960), although he does speak positively of abstract art. Nor did he refer much to such innovative poets as T.S. Eliot or Ezra Pound. Although this may indicate a conservative approach to the arts, he nonetheless had considerable influence on various innovative art movements both in his own time and later. Perhaps most significantly, the director of the Federal Art Project from 1935–1943, Holger Cahill, was a Dewey follower (Mavigliano 1984). Amongst painters, Thomas Hart Benton, the regionalist realist, was an early convert to his philosophy. In Mexico, Escuelas de Pintura al Aire Libre, or open-air painting schools, began during the Mexican Revolution and achieved an established structure under the government of Alvaro Obregon (1920–24). They were promoted by Alfredo Ramos Martinez who was inspired by the ideas of Dewey. (Dictionary of Art and Artist 2011—see Other Internet Resources)
Turning to late 20th century artists, Dewey's influence on Abstract Expressionism was especially strong (Buettner 1975, Berube 1998). For example, Robert Motherwell, who studied Art as Experience when he was a philosophy major at Stanford, considered it to be one of his bibles (Berube 1998). Donald Judd, the Minimalist sculptor, read and admired Dewey (Raskin 2010). Earth Art, with its emphases on getting art out of the museum, might even be seen as applied Dewey. There is also reason to believe that Allan Kaprow, one of the originators of Happenings and Performance Art, read Dewey and drew on his ideas (Kelly 2003). Although one author has argued that contemporary Body Art has moved away from the integrated consummated aesthetic experience Dewey commends (Jay 2002), another argues that Dewey anticipates this movement (Brodsky 2002).
Dewey's methodology may be off-putting to readers trained in analytic philosophy. He was not much given to argument. (See Aldrich 1944, for a partial defense of Dewey's philosophical method.) However, he did give reasons for rejecting other leading theories in the field. Nor was he adverse to public debate in philosophical journals. Given his emphasis on experience, his method was somewhat similar to that of phenomenologists in the tradition of Edmund Husserl. Yet, unlike Husserl, he was strongly committed to a scientific world-view and did not bracket scientific knowledge in his search for philosophical understanding. His anti-dualism would have also made him hostile to Husserl's Cartesian tendencies. This same anti-dualism meant that he was constantly engaged in undercutting distinctions. It is not surprising then that he did not follow the method of contemporary analytic philosophy of progressively making more and more subtle distinctions in the search for precise definition. Because of his undercutting of distinctions his thinking can sometimes seem similar to the deconstructionism of Jacques Derrida (Derrida 1976). However, unlike Derrida, Dewey would never claim that there is nothing “outside the text,” since the starting point of his philosophy was always the live creature in its environment. Also his emphasis on continuity and his commitment to organicism exhibit a typically modernist belief in harmonious wholes that was not shared by Derrida or by postmodernists generally. Nor would he have accepted Derrida's one-sided insistence on the importance of differences and deferral as found in his idea of différance. Dewey could be seen as against method if method is seen as requiring certainty, but not if it focuses on probability. He did share with analytic philosophy a tendency to back up his points with appeals to common sense and to the meanings of words. In evaluating Dewey's method one must also take into account his considered views on the logic of inquiry as expressed in several books which will be reviewed in other articles in this encyclopedia.
Art as Experience, Dewey's greatest work in aesthetics, had its antecedents. There were scattered short essays and remarks in the 1880s (Dewey 1896, 1897) as well as significant discussion in his Psychology (Dewey 1887). Some discussion appears in Democracy and Education (Dewey 1915) and in his other works on education. He also published a few short articles on aesthetics in the publication of the Barnes foundation in 1925 and 1926 (Dewey 1927). Dewey laid out the beginnings of a theory of aesthetic experience in his major work, Experience and Nature (Dewey 1925a). There are also two important essays in Philosophy and Civilization (Dewey 1931) that address aesthetics. These are all described in the supplementary document
As much as there is fascinating preliminary material in his earlier writings the primary goal of none of these was an aesthetics or a theory of art. Moreover, the understanding of the arts in these writings is relatively primitive compared to Art as Experience. Not only is the density of thought and insight in the later work much greater, but the writing is much clearer. Also, only in the later work do we get a full account of the phenomenology of aesthetic and artistic experience. The explication of this book will follow Dewey's own chapter headings.
Dewey somewhat surprisingly begins this work with the claim that the very existence of works of art hinders any aesthetic theory that seeks to understand them. Art products exist externally and physically, whereas, on his view, the work of art is really what the physical object does within experience. Also the classic status of many works of art isolates them from the conditions within which they came to be, and hence from their experiential function. The business of aesthetics is to restore the continuity between the refined experiences that are works of art and the experiences of everyday life. We must, in short, turn away from artistic products to ordinary experience. To understand the Parthenon, which is widely believed to be a great work of art, one must turn to cultural context of Athens and the lives of the citizens who were expressing their civic religion through its creation.
Dewey then argues that we must begin with the aesthetic “in the raw” in order to understand the aesthetic “refined.” To do this we must turn to the events and scenes that interest the man-in-the-street such as the sounds and sights of rushing fire-engines, the grace of a baseball player, and the satisfactions of a housewife. We find then that the aesthetic begins in happy absorption in activity, for example in our fascination with a fire in a hearth as we poke it. Similarly, Dewey holds that an intelligent mechanic who does his work with care is “artistically engaged.” If his product is not aesthetically appealing this probably has more to do with market conditions that encourage low-quality work than with his abilities.
This move to the everyday entails recognition of the aesthetic nature of the popular arts. Average folk may be repelled by the thought that they enjoy their casual recreation in part for aesthetic reasons. They do not realize that what has life for them, such as movies, jazz, the comics, and sensational newspaper stories, is art. Relegating art to the museum comes with separating it from the experiences of everyday life. Fine art fails to appeal to the masses when it is remote, and so they seek aesthetic pleasure in “the vulgar.” The cause of this is the common separation between spirit and matter, and the consequent downgrading of matter.
There are, however, still people in the world who admire whatever intensifies immediate experience. Practices and artifacts from traditional cultures were, in their original contexts, enhancements of everyday life. Dance, pantomime, music, and architecture were originally connected with religious rites, not with theaters and museums. In prehistoric cultures the various arts consummated the meaning of the community. This is also true for contemporary traditional cultures.
The segregation of art from everyday life came with the rise of nationalism and imperialism. The Louvre began as a place to house Napoleon's loot. The rise of capitalism, with its valuation of rare and costly objects, also contributed to the development of the museum, as did the need to show good taste in an increasingly materialist world.
For Dewey, experience should be understood in terms of the conditions of life. Man shares with animals certain basic vital needs, and derives the means for satisfying these needs from his animal nature. Life goes on not only in an environment but in interaction with that environment. The live creature uses its organs to interact with the environment through defense and conquest. Every need is a lack of adequate adjustment to the environment, and also a demand to restore adjustment—and each recovery is enriched by resistance met and overcome.
Life overcomes and transforms factors of opposition to achieve higher significance. Harmony and equilibrium are the results not of mechanical processes but of rhythmic resolution of tension. The rhythmic alternation within the live creature between disunity and unity becomes conscious in humans. Emotion signifies breaks in experience which are then resolved through reflective action. Objects become interesting as conditions for realizing harmony. Thought is then incorporated into them as their meaning.
The artist, especially, cultivates resistance and tension to achieve a unified experience. By contrast, although the scientist, like the artist, is interested in problems, she always seeks to move on to the next problem. Yet both artist and scientist are concerned with the same materials, both think, and both have their aesthetic moments. The aesthetic moment for the scientist happens when her thought becomes embedded as meaning in the object. The artist's thought is more immediately embodied in the object as she works and thinks in her medium.
Emotions are not merely in the mind. The live animal confronts a nature which already has emotional qualities. Aspects of nature may be, for example, irritating or comforting. Nature has such qualities even before it has mathematical or secondary qualities. Direct experience is a function of man/nature interaction in which human energy is constantly transformed.
Aesthetic experience involves a drama in which action, feeling, and meaning are one. The result is balance. Such experience would not occur in a world of mere flux in which there was no cumulative change. Nor would it occur in a world that is finished, for then there would be no resolution or fulfillment. It is only possible in a world in which the live being loses and reestablishes equilibrium with its environment.
Passing from disturbance to harmony provides man's most intense experience. Happiness is the result of a deep fulfillment in which our whole being has adjusted to the environment. Any such consummation is also a new beginning. In happiness, an underlying harmony continues through the rhythmic phases of conflict and resolution. Dewey contrasts a life in which the past is a burden to one that sees it as a resource that can be used to inform the present. In this instance, the future is a promise that surrounds the present as an aura. Happy periods, in which memories and anticipations are absorbed into the present, are an aesthetic ideal. Art celebrates these moments with peculiar intensity.
Dewey held that the sources of aesthetic experience are to found in sub-human animal life. Animals often attain a unity of experience that we lose in our fragmented work-lives. The live animal is fully present with all its senses active, especially when it is graceful. It synthesizes past and future in the present. Similarly, tribal man is most alive when most observant and filled with energy. He does not separate observation, action, and foresight. His senses are not mere pathways for storage. Rather, they prepare him for thought and action. Experience signifies heightened life and active engagement with the world. In its highest form it involves an identification of self and world. Such experience is the beginning of art.
Theorists have often supposed that ethereal meanings and values are inaccessible to sense. This presupposes a nature/spirit dualism which Dewey rejects. That people commonly resist connecting fine art and everyday life is explained by the current disorganization of our cultural lives. This disorder is hidden by the apparent order of social classes and the compartmentalization of life in which religion, morals, politics and art all have separate domains, and practice and insight, and imagination and doing, are kept separate.
Dewey thought that the economic institutions of his time (1930s—the Depression) encouraged these separations. Under these conditions, sensations are mere mechanical stimuli that do not tell us anything about the reality behind them, and the various senses operate in isolation from each other. Moralists, at least, see sense as closely related to emotion and appetite. Unfortunately, they see the sensuous as identical with the sensual, and the sensual with the lewd.
The sense organs are carried to their full realization through sense itself, i.e., through meaning embodied in experience. The world is made actual in the qualities so experienced. Here, meaning cannot be separated from action, will, or thought. Experience is not only the result of interaction of subject and world, but also the subject's reward when it transforms interaction into participation. Dualisms of mind and body, by contrast, Dewey believed, come from a fear of life.
Dewey thinks it important here to distinguish mere recognition from perception. Recognition uses matter as means. Perception, by contrast, entails the past being carried into the present to enrich its content. A life that involves merely labeling things is not really conscious. The conscious activity of man develops out of a cooperation of internal needs and external materials that results in a culminating event. Man converts cause and effect into means and end, and thereby makes organic stimulation the bearer of meaning.
Rather than reducing the human to the animal, Dewey holds that man takes the unity of sense and impulse of animal life and infuses it with conscious meaning through communication. Human is more complex than animal life: for humans there are more opportunities for resistance and tension, for invention, and for depth of insight and feeling. The rhythms of struggle and consummation are more varied and long-lasting, and the fulfillments are more intense.
Space and time are also different. For humans, space is not just a void filled with dangers and opportunities. It is a scene for their doings and undergoings. Time, also, is not a mere continuum, but an organized medium of the rhythms of impulse and the processes of growth. These involve pauses and completions that themselves begin new developmental processes. It is form in art that makes clear the organization of space and time in life experience.
In art, man uses the materials and energies of nature to expand life. Art is proof that man can consciously restore the union of sensation, needs, and actions found in animal life. Consciousness adds regulation, selection and variation to this process. The idea of art is, then, humanity's greatest accomplishment. The Greeks distinguished order from matter, and man from the rest of nature, by way of art. Art, for them, was the guiding ideal for humankind. For Dewey, historically, science was developed as a means to generate other arts, and ultimately it is only their handmaiden.
Although it is sometimes helpful to distinguish between fine and useful art, Dewey thinks this extrinsic to art itself. What makes the work “fine” is that the artist lived fully while producing it. Fine art involves completeness of living in perception and making. Whether the thing is put to use is irrelevant. That most utensils today are non-aesthetic is because of the unhappy conditions of their production and consumption.
Dewey thought that those who reject the continuity between everyday experience and fine art fail to see that matter is needed to realize ideals. Nature is man's habitat, and culture endures because men find a support for it in nature. Culture results from prolonged, cumulative interaction with the environment. We deeply respond to art because of its connection with both cultural and natural experience.
Rather than giving art primacy in aesthetic, Dewey believes that humans only feel properly alive when absorbing the aesthetic features of nature. Aesthetic experience of the natural environment can even take the form of ecstatic communion. This is due to ancient habits gained in the relations between the living being and its environment. Sensuous experience can absorb into itself meanings and values that are designated “ideal” or “spiritual.” Dewey observes that belief that nature is full of spirits is closely tied to poetry. The sensuous surfaces of things incorporate not only what is given by the senses but the most profound insight. Many of the arts originate in primitive rituals which were not simply intended as means to get rain, etc., but for the enhancement of experience. Similarly myth was not just an early form of science.
Dewey concludes that the idea of the supernatural is more a function of the psychology that generates works of art than of science or philosophy. This can be seen by the solemn processions and other artistic phenomena in churches. Keats famously wrote “Beauty is truth, truth beauty—that is all ye know on earth, and all ye need to know.” Dewey agrees that any reasoning that excludes imagination and the embodiment of ideas in emotionally charged sense cannot reach truth. For Keats, “truth” meant wisdom, which in turn meant trust in the good. All we need to know then is the insight of imagination exemplified in beauty. It is not surprising then that moments of intense aesthetic perception were Keats's ultimate solace. The philosophy of Keats, shared by Dewey, accepts life with all its uncertainty and turns that experience into art.
This chapter is Dewey's most famous writing in aesthetics. Here he defines the important concept of “an experience.” “An experience” is one in which the material of experience is fulfilled or consummated, as for example when a problem is solved, or a game is played to its conclusion. Dewey contrasts this with inchoate experience in which we are distracted and do not complete our course of action. “An experience,” is also marked off from other experiences, containing within itself an individualizing quality. Dewey believes his talk of “an experience” is in accord with everyday usage, even though it is contrary to the way philosophers talk about experience. For Dewey, life is a collection of histories, each with their own plots, inceptions, conclusions, movements and rhythms. Each has a unique pervading quality.
Dewey then proceeds to offer a more dramatic sense of “an experience.” Two examples of this sort of “an experience” are a quarrel with a friend and that meal in Paris which seemed to capture all that food can be. In “an experience” every part flows freely into what follows, carrying with it what preceded without sacrificing its identity. The parts are phases of an enduring whole. Nor are there any holes or mechanical dead spots in an experience. Rather, there are pauses that define its quality and sum up what has been undergone.
Works of art are important examples of “an experience.” Here, separate elements are fused into a unity, although, rather than disappearing, their identity is enhanced. The unity of an experience, which is neither exclusively emotional, practical, nor intellectual, is determined by a single pervasive quality. Contra Locke and Hume, Dewey holds that the trains of ideas in thought are not just linked by association, but involve the development of an underlying quality. Conclusions in thought are similar to the consummating phase of “an experience.” Thinking has its own aesthetic quality. It differs from art only in that its material consists of abstract symbols rather than qualities. The experience of thinking satisfies us emotionally because it is internally integrated, and yet no intellectual activity is integrated in this way unless it has aesthetic quality. Thus, for Dewey, there is no clear separation between the aesthetic and the intellectual.
Dewey thought that practical action, too, can involve meaning growing towards a consummation. The Greek concept of good conduct as graceful is an example of the aesthetic in the moral. On the other hand, much moral action has no aesthetic quality and is mere half-hearted duty-following.
In aesthetic experience there is concern for the connection between each incident in a series and what went before. Interest controls what is selected or rejected in the developing experience. By contrast, in non-aesthetic experience we drift, evade, and compromise. The non-aesthetic is a function either of loose succession or mechanical connection of parts. Since so much of experience is like one of these we take this to be the norm and place aesthetic experience outside everyday life. But no experience has unity without aesthetic quality.
Still, Dewey does not hold “an experience” to be co-extensive with aesthetic experience. Philosophical and scientific inquiries can have aesthetic quality every bit as much as art. Their parts may link to each other and move to consummation. The consummation may even be anticipated and savored. However, such experiences are mostly intellectual or practical in nature. Also, whereas intellectual effort may be summarized in a “truth” there is no such thing in art.
When Dewey says that every integral experience (another term for “an experience”) moves to a close he means that the energies within it have done the work they are supposed to do. An element of “undergoing” or suffering may occur in this, for incorporating what preceded can be painful, and yet the suffering is part of the complete enjoyed experience.
Dewey holds that aesthetic quality is emotional. Emotions are not static entities with no element of growth. When significant, they are qualities of a complex changing experience, of a developing drama. There are no separate things called emotions. Emotions, rather, are aspects of events and objects. They are not, generally speaking, private. They belong to a self concerned with movement and change. Unlike automatic reflexes, they are parts of an on-going situation.
Emotion is a cementing force that gives diverse things their qualitative unity. This can give an experience aesthetic character. For example, an employee interview can either be mechanical and ordinary or can involve an interplay that turns it into an experience. In the latter case, the events are connected, each changing the underlying quality as they collectively move to consummation. This may involve the employer's imaginative projection of the character of the applicant onto the job, with resultant harmony or conflict.
The structure of “an experience” goes as follows. The subject undergoes something or some properties, these properties determine his or her doing something, and the process continues until the self and the object are mutually adapted, ending with felt harmony. This even holds for the thinker interacting with his or her ideas. When the doing and undergoing are joined in perception they gain meaning. Meaning, in turn, is given depth through incorporating past experience.
Excess of doing, or excess of undergoing, may interfere with experience. For example, desire for action may lead to treating resistance as mere obstacle and not as a moment for reflection. Also, the undergoing may be valued without any perception of meaning. A balance is required between doing and undergoing to achieve an experience.
Dewey does not separate artistic practice from intellect. Intelligence is what perceives the relation between doing and undergoing. The artist thinks as intently as the scientist. Thus, thinking should not be identified with using mathematical or verbal symbols. The artist must respond intelligently to every brush stroke to know where she is going. She must see each element in the creative process in relation to the whole to be produced. The quality of her art depends on the intelligence she brings to bear.
Dewey believed it unfortunate that no term covers the act of production and the act of appreciation combined as one thing. Perception and enjoyment of art are often seen as having nothing in common with the creative act. The term “aesthetic” is sometimes used to designate the entire field and sometimes just the perceptual side. Once we see conscious experience as “doing and undergoing” we can see the connection between the productive and appreciative aspects of art. “Art” denotes the process of making something out of physical material that can be perceived by one of the senses. “Aesthetic” refers to experience as both appreciative and perceptive. It is the side of the consumer. And yet, production and consumption should not be seen as separate. Perfection of production is in terms of the enjoyment of the consumer: it is not a mere matter of technique or execution. Craftsmanship is only artistic if it cares deeply about the subject matter and is directed towards enjoyed perception.
Dewey believed that art brings together the same doing/undergoing relation that makes an experience what it is. Something is artistic when the qualities of the result control the process of production. That the aesthetic experience is connected with the experience of making can be seen in the fact that if we believed a product to be of some primitive people, and then discovered that it was a product of nature, it would be perceived differently. Aesthetic satisfaction must be linked to the activity that gave rise to it. For example the taste of the epicure includes qualities that depend on reference to the manner of production of the thing enjoyed.
The process of artistic production is involved from the start with perception. It entails sensitive awareness of the evolving object and its aesthetic qualities. The artist ends the process when she perceives directly that the product is good. The sensitivity of the artist directs the continuous shaping and reshaping of the work. In the creative process, hand and eye are intimately connected. Both act as instruments of the live creature as a whole. When the potter's actions for example are regulated by a series of perceptions, the bowl is graceful.
The product is aesthetic only if the doing and undergoing are related to form a perceptual whole. This occurs in imagination as well as in observation. The artist must build up a coherent experience continuously through constant change. Even when an author writes down what she had already clearly conceived her work is not private: art is made for public consumption. Similarly, the architect must think in the medium. Even here, doings and perceptions interact and mutually affect each other in imagination.
The activities of the perceiver are comparable to those of the creator. Reception that is full perception, and not mere recognition, is a series of responsive acts resulting in fulfillment. In perception, consciousness becomes alive. Consciousness requires implicit involvement of motor response throughout the organism, which entails that the scene perceived be pervaded by emotion. Although this phase of experience involves surrender, this can only be done through controlled activity, not withdrawal. It is a “going-out” of energy which is also a “plunging” into the subject-matter.
We need apprenticeship to perceive great works of art. Aesthetic experience of art requires a continuous interaction between the total organism and the object. The typical guided tour in a museum does not involve such interaction. In proper appreciation the beholder must create her own experience in such a way as to include relations similar to those perceived by the artist. Re-creation is required for the object to be seen as a work of art. The beholder as well as the producer selects and simplifies according to her interests, gathering details into a whole.
The end of art is significant only as an integration of parts. Dominant in aesthetic experience are the characteristics that cause the experience to be integrated and complete. In integral experience there is a dynamic form that involves growth. This form has three stages: inception, development, and fulfillment. Aesthetic experience converts resistances into movement towards a close. Experiencing is a rhythm of intake and outgiving between which there are pauses each of which, in turn, incorporates within itself the prior doing. Thus the form of the whole is in each part. The consummation phase of experience is not merely located at the end. For an artist is engaged in completing her work at every stage of the process. And this involves summing up what has gone before.
Dewey's theory of creativity is developed within the context of a theory of expressive acts (Dewey 1934, Chapter 4). Leo Tolstoy had featured expression in his theory of art and there are some similarities between Dewey's handling and his. However Dewey begins from a naturalist standpoint. His first move is to claim that every experience begins as an impulsion. “Impulsion,” as distinguished from “impulse,” is a developmental movement of the whole organism in response to a need arising from interaction with the environment, for example a craving for food. It is the beginning stage of a complete experience, whereas impulse is momentary, for example a tongue reacting to a sour taste.
For Dewey, the epidermis is only superficially the limit of the body. In fact, various external things belong to, and are needed by, the body. This includes not only such things as food and air, but tools and other aspects of human culture. In short, the self depends on its environment for its survival, and must secure its materials through forays into the world. Because of this, the initial impulsion meets things that oppose it. The self must convert these obstacles into something useful, thus transforming its blind efforts into purpose and meaning.
Impulsion becomes aware of itself only through overcoming obstacles. When resistance generates curiosity and is overcome, the result is elation. Emotion is then converted into both interest and reflective action through assimilating meanings from the past. In this re-creative act the impulsion gains form and solidity, and old material is given new life. What would otherwise be either a smooth passageway or an obstruction becomes a medium for creativity.
Not all outward activity is expression. Dewey insists that someone who simply acts angrily is not expressing anger. What may seem expressive to an outside observer because it tells us something about the state of the person observed may not be expressive from the standpoint of the subject. Mere “giving way” to impulsion does not constitute expression. Expression requires clarification, which for Dewey means an ordering of impulsion by way of incorporating values of prior experiences. Although emotional discharge is necessary for expression, it is not sufficient. To discharge is to get rid of, whereas to express is to carry to completion.
A baby learns that it gains attention when it cries. As it becomes aware of the meaning of its actions it performs those previously blind acts on purpose. In this way, consequences are incorporated as the meaning of future doings. The baby is then capable of expression. Primitively spontaneous acts, for example smiles, are thereby converted into means of rich human intercourse. Similarly, the art of painting uses paint to express imaginative experience.
Dewey stresses that expression and art require material used as media. An intrinsic connection exists between medium and the act of expression. Tones only express emotion, and hence are musical, when they occur in a medium of other tones, as when they are ordered in a melody. “Expression” etymologically refers to a squeezing out. Yet, even the expression of wine from a wine press is not a mere discharge. It involves interaction between wine press and grapes to transform primitive material into something expressed. The work of art involves a building of experience out of interaction of various conditions and energies in which the thing expressed is wrung from the producer.
For Dewey, the act of expression is a construction in time. It is a prolonged interaction of self and objective conditions that gives form and order to both. The author only comes to recognize what he/she set out to do with raw materials at the end of a process that began with excitement about the subject matter. That excitement in turn stirs up meanings based on prior experience. These, finally, enter a conscious stage. The fire of inspiration results in either painful disruption or the creation of a refined product in expressive action.
Dewey observes that inspiration has often been attributed to a muse or god because it is based on unconscious sources. It involves inner material finding objective fuel to burn. The act of expression brings to completion the act of inspiration by means of this material. For an impulsion to lead to expression there must be conflict, a place where inner impulse meets the environment. The tribal war dance for example requires the uncertainty of an impending raid for its excitement. The emotion is not complete in itself within the individual: it is about something objective. Thus, emotion is implied in a situation, for example a situation may be depressing or threatening.
In the fifth chapter Dewey turns to the expressive object. He believes that the object should not be seen in isolation from the process that produced it, nor from the individuality of vision from which it came. Theories which simply focus on the expressive object dwell on how the object represents other objects and ignore the individual contribution of the artist. Conversely, theories that simply focus on the act of expressing tend to see expression merely in terms of personal discharge.
Works of art use materials that come from a public world, and they awaken new perceptions of the meanings of that world, connecting the universal and the individual organically. The work of art is representative, not in the sense of literal reproduction, which would exclude the personal, but in that it tells people about the nature of their experience.
Dewey observes that some who have denied art meaning have done so on the assumption that art does not have connection with outside content. He agrees that art has a unique quality, but argues that this is based on its concentrating meaning found in the world. For Dewey, the actual Tintern Abbey expresses itself in Wordsworth's poem about it and a city expresses itself in its celebrations. In this, he is quite different from those theorists who believe that art expresses the inner emotions of the artist. The difference between art and science is that art expresses meanings, whereas science states them. A statement gives us directions for obtaining an experience, but does not supply us with experience. That water is H20 tells us how to obtain or test for water. If science expressed the inner nature of things it would be in competition with art, but it does not. Aesthetic art, by contrast to science, constitutes an experience.
A poem operates in the dimension of direct experience, not of description or propositional logic. The expressiveness of a painting is the painting itself. The meaning is there beyond the painter's private experience or that of the viewer. A painting by Van Gogh of a bridge is not representative of a bridge or even of Van Gogh's emotion. Rather, by means of pictorial presentation, Van Gogh presents the viewer with a new object in which emotion and external scene are fused. He selects material with a view to expression, and the picture is expressive to the degree that he succeeds.
Dewey notes that formalist art critic Roger Fry spoke of relations of lines and colors coming to be full of passionate meaning within the artist. For Fry the object as such tends to disappear in the whole of vision. Dewey agrees with the first point and with the idea that creative representation is not of natural items as they literally happen. He adds however that the painter approaches the scene with emotion-laden background experiences. The lines and colors of the painter's work crystallize into a specific harmony or rhythm which is a function also of the scene in its interaction with the beholder. This passion in developing a new form is the aesthetic emotion. The prior emotion is not forgotten but fused with the emotion belonging to the new vision.
Dewey, then, opposes the idea that the meanings of the lines and colors in a painting would completely replace other meanings attached to the scene. He also rejects the notion that the work of art only expresses something exclusive to art. The theory that subject-matter is irrelevant to art commits its advocates to seeing art as esoteric. To distinguish between aesthetic values of ordinary experience (connected with subject-matter) and aesthetic values of art, as Fry wished, is impossible. There would be nothing for the artist to be passionate about if she approached the subject matter without interests and attitudes. The artist first brings meaning and value from earlier experience to her observation giving the object its expressiveness. The result is a completely new object of a completely new experience.
For Dewey, an artwork clarifies and purifies confused meaning of prior experience. By contrast, a non-art drawing that simply suggests emotions through arrangements of lines and colors is similar to a signboard that indicates but does not contain meaning: it is only enjoyed because of what they remind us of. Also, whereas a statement or a diagram takes us to many things of the same kind, an expressive object is individualized, for example in expressing a particular depression.
Chapter Six begins with a discussion of medium. Dewey asserts that there are many languages of art, each specific to the medium. He believes that meanings expressed in art cannot be translated into words. Moreover, language requires not only speakers but listeners. Thus, in art, the work is not complete until it is experienced by someone other than the artist. Artist, work and audience form a triad, for even when the artist works in isolation she is herself vicariously the audience.
Language involves both what is said and how it is said: substance and form. The artist's creative effort is in forming the material so that it is the authentic substance of a work of art. If art were mere self-expression, substance and form would fall apart. Still, self-expression is important. Without it, the work would lose freshness and originality, and although the material out of which the work is made comes from the public world the manner of its making is individual.
Dewey holds that someone who perceives a work aesthetically will create an experience in which the subject is new. A poem is a succession of experiences, and no two readers have the same experience. Indeed each reader creates his or her own poem out of the same raw material. The work of art is only actually such when it lives in a person's experience. As physical object, the work remains identical, but as work of art, it is recreated. It would be absurd to ask the artist what she meant by her work, for she would find different meanings in it at different times. What the artist means in a work, then, is whatever the perceiver can get out of it that is living. This does not mean that any interpretation is as good as any other, as will be seen when we discuss Dewey's chapter on criticism.
In philosophy, “relation” generally refers to something intellectual that subsists in propositions. But, as Dewey observes in his seventh chapter, it refers in everyday discourse to something direct and active. It leads us to think of the clashings and unitings of things, of modes of interaction. For Dewey, the relation that characterizes a work of art is mutual adaptation of the parts to constitute the whole. This is also true for the aesthetic experience of a city. A person who aesthetically perceives New York from a ferry would see the buildings as colorful volumes in relation to each another and to the sky and river. The focus would be on a perceptual whole made up of related parts, the values of each part modifying and modified by the values of the other parts.
Returning to art, Dewey notes that Matisse describes the process of painting in terms of putting down patches of color, which then lose importance as other patches are put down, so that the different colors need to be balanced. Similarly, a homeowner furnishes a room by interrelating the parts in perception. In general, perception consists in a sequence of acts that build up on one another to achieve unity of form. Art only does this more deliberately than ordinary perception. Within art, form is the working of forces that carry an experience of some thing to fulfillment. Thus, form needs to be appropriate to the subject matter.
For fulfillment or consummation there must be a process of building up values. This requires conserving the meaning of what has preceded. There must also be anticipation of the future in each aspect or phase of the process. Consummation is, then, relative. Dewey concludes from his discussion up to this point that continuity, cumulation, conservation, tension and anticipation are the conditions of aesthetic form.
Since resistance or tension is needed for development, intelligence in art-making consists in overcoming difficulties. The perceiver also needs to solve problems in order to better appreciate the work. He or she must remake past experiences so that they may enter into the new one. Rigidly pre-determined products, by contrast, are academic. A true artist cares about the end product as the completion of what went before, not as something conforming to a prior plan.
Dewey believed that the beauty of fine art involves some strangeness or discovery that keeps it from being mechanical. This allows us to experience the thing for its own sake. Unlike mechanical production, in artistic production the consummatory phase recurs throughout the work. Thus the work is both instrumental and final. Art is instrumental not in serving narrow purposes but in giving us a refreshed attitude about ordinary experience and contributing to an enduring sense of serenity.
We admire skill as enhanced expression belonging to the product and not merely to the producer. Dewey believed that technique that emphasizes the artist is obtrusive insofar as it does not carry the object to consummation. Properly, technique is the skill of managing the making of form. Advances in technique come from solving problems that grow out of our need for new modes of experience. Historically, Dewey observes, three-dimensional painting was motivated by the need for something more than depiction of religious scenes. For example, the Venetian painters' use of color for sculptural effect arose from the secularization of values which was characteristic of their time. In general, a new technique passes through three stages: experimentation and exaggeration, incorporation and validation, and imitation and academicism.
Dewey asserts that new materials demand new techniques, and the artist is a born experimenter. Through experimentation, the artist opens up new areas, or reveals new qualities in the familiar. What is now classic is the result of previous adventure, which is why we still find adventure in the classics.
There is in aesthetic experience a rhythm of surrender and reflection. We interrupt the surrender aspect to attend to the above-mentioned formal conditions. The first, pre-analytic, phase of aesthetic experience is one of overwhelming impression. We might, for example, be seized by the glory of a landscape or by the magic of a painting. This seizure is at a high level only to the extent that the viewer is cultivated. Like Hume, Dewey holds that cultivation comes through practice in discrimination. However he also sees aesthetic experience in terms of phases. In this mode, the seizure phase is followed by the discrimination phase, which can either affirm the object's value or convince us that it was not worthy of our initial response. This phase can, in turn, expand into criticism.
Dewey believed that there is objectivity in art evaluation based on several factors. First, works of art are parts of the objective world and are conditioned by materials and energies of that world. Second, for an object to be the content of aesthetic experience it must satisfy objective conditions which belong to that world. This is why the artist shows interest in the world, and in her materials.
The first and most important of these objective conditions is rhythm. Rhythm already exists in nature. The rhythms of dawn and sunset, rain and shine, the seasons, the movements of the moon and the stars, reproduction and death, waking and sleeping, heartbeat and breath, and the rhythms involved in working with materials, were all seen by early men as having mysterious meaning related to their survival. Even more significant were the rhythms involved with preparing for war and for planting. Dramatic events also led men to impose or introduce rhythms that were not previously there.
Reproducing the rhythms of nature generated a sense of drama in life. The essences of animals were brought to life in the rhythms of dance, sculpture and painting. Combining the formative arts and the rhythms of voice and dance led to fine art. Man came to use the rhythms of nature to celebrate his relationship with nature and to commemorate his most intense experiences. At first no distinction was made between art and science in the reproduction of these changes. For example, the first Greek stories about the origins of nature had aesthetic form, and the idea of natural law came from the idea of harmony.
For Dewey, every regular change in nature is a rhythm. Science progresses as we refine our understanding of these changes. Science, however, parts ways with art when it presents rhythms through symbols that mean nothing to perception. Nonetheless, even today science and art have a common interest in rhythm. Man uses rhythms to commemorate his most intense experiences. The rhythms of art are grounded in the basic patterns of the relation of live creature and its environment.
The art product is physical and potential, whereas the work of art is active and experienced. It is what the product does. Dewey gives his definition of art in this, the eighth chapter Art as Experience. (Casey Haskins (1998) makes a case, however, for Dewey's definition of art being found in the chapter titled “The Varied Substance of the Arts.”) Contrary to many interpreters, he neither claims that art is identical to expression or to experience. Moreover, like Nelson Goodman later (1978), he asks “when is art?” rather than “what is art?” For Dewey, a work of art happens when the structure of the object interacts with the energies of the subject's experience to generate a substance that develops cumulatively towards fulfillment of impulsions. To fully understand this definition we must understand the role of rhythm in art. Only when rhythm incorporated into the external object is experienced is it aesthetic. Since rhythm is a matter of perception, not of mere regularity, it includes what is contributed by the self.
It is often thought that there are two kinds of art, spatial and temporal, and that only the latter can have rhythm. But, Dewey argues, perception of rhythm in pictures and sculpture is as essential to their experience as that of music. Rhythm is a matter of bringing about a complete and consummatory experience. The theory that rhythm is literal recurrence, what Dewey calls the tick-tock theory, sees it as merely mechanical. Yet, constant variation is as important to rhythm as is order. Indeed, more variation produces more interesting effects, provided that order is maintained and there is progress towards fulfillment.
Dewey explicates this point through analyzing some lines from Wordsworth's Prelude. He notes that no one word in this poem has the meaning we would find in a dictionary. Rather, the meaning is a function of the situation expressed. He also believes that an individual experience, in this case a feeling of desolation, is constantly built as the poem develops. The meaning of each word both determines, and is determined by, this developing experience. By contrast, a popular gospel hymn is relatively external, physical, and uniform in both matter and form, although even here the process is cumulative. Although rhythm requires recurrence, recurrence is not the same as literal repetition, for it involves relationships that both sum up and also carry forward. These relationships define parts, give them individuality, and connect them to the whole.
Another theory of rhythm, the “tom-tom theory,” sees it as a matter of repetition of beats. On this view, variation comes merely from the piling up of such uniform rhythms. The theory, Dewey believes, is based on a misunderstanding of tribal music in which it is forgotten that such rhythms usually occur in the context of singing and dance and involve development to greater levels of excitement. Also, tribal rhythms are more complex and subtle than those of western music with its emphasis on harmony.
What subject-matter is appropriate to art? Reynolds in the 18th century thought that only instances of heroic action and suffering would count. However in the 19th century such ordinary topics of everyday life as railway-coaches and plates became the subject-matter of painting. The same democratic widening of subject-matter occurred in the other arts. In general, one of art's functions is to question the limitations of subject-matter set by convention and moralism. The only limitation set is by the interest of the artist. However, universality and originality in art depends on the artist's interest being sincere. Whatever narrows the permitted subject-matter of art narrows the artist's ability to be sincere and hinders his or her imagination. This happens for example when the artist is required to work on proletarian subject-matter, as in the Soviet Union. All of this diversity suggests that there is some common substance to the arts. But to say that this common substances is form is to arbitrarily separate form and matter.
Not only is there community of form in the arts but also community of substance, which is the topic of Dewey's ninth chapter. The creative process begins with a “total seizure,” an inclusive qualitative whole (a “mood”) which is then articulated, and even continues after articulation. This qualitative whole determines the development of a poem into parts, and when this does not happen we become aware of breaks.
This element, which he also refers to as a “penetrating quality,” is immediately experienced in all parts of the work. Yet it cannot be described, or even specified. It is so pervasive we take it for granted. It is an emotionally intuited fusion of the different elements of the work— without it, the parts would only be mechanically related. The organic whole is the parts permeated by it. It may be called the spirit of the work. It is also the work's “reality” in that it makes us experience the work as real. It is the background that qualifies everything in the foreground.
For Dewey, this background extends surprisingly far. Although we may assume that experiences have bounded edges like those of their objects, the whole of an experience, and especially its qualitative background, which he calls “the setting,” extends indefinitely. By “setting,” Dewey simply means the background aspect of the experience, that which is not focused in the experience. The margins of our experience shade into that indefinite expanse we call the universe. However, this experiential background is only made conscious in the specific objects that form the focus. Behind every explicit object there is something implicit that, although we call it vague, is not so in the original experience, for it is a function of the whole situation. An experience is mystical, Dewey believes, to the extent that this feeling of an unlimited background is intense, and it is particularly intense in certain works of art, for example in tragedy. Symbolist poets stress it when they say that a work of art must include something not understood.
That the pervasive quality binds together the various elements of the work is shown by the fact that we constantly see things immediately as belonging to a work or not. That art enhances the pervasive quality explains why we experience increased clarity in front of any work of art we experience intensely, and why we experience religious feelings in connection with aesthetic intensity. This sense of a world beyond us gives us an expanded sense of self and a feeling of unity. However, Dewey is not making a metaphysical claim here: although he is speaking of an intuition it is not of the Absolute but of a deeper dimension of ordinary reality as experienced.
Every work of art uses a medium associated with different organs. Art intensifies the significance of the fact that our experience is mediated through these organs. In painting, color gives us a scene without mixture of the other senses. Color must then carry the qualities given by the other senses, thus enhancing its expressiveness. There is something magical in the power of flat pictures to depict a diverse universe, as also in the power of mere sounds to express events. In art media all the possibilities of a specialized organ of perception are exploited. Seeing, for example, operates with “full energy” in the medium of paint. Medium is “taken up” into it and remains within the result.
Aesthetic effects necessarily attach to their medium. When another medium is substituted, as in boards painted to look like stone, the result looks fake. When means and ends are external to each other the experience is non-aesthetic. This also applies to ethics when considered from the standpoint of aesthetics. For example, being good to avoid punishment has no aesthetic value. The Greeks recognized that good conduct has grace and proportion, fusing means and ends.
Sensitivity to a medium is essential both to artistic creation and aesthetic perception. Thus Dewey, like Clive Bell before him (Bell 1914), warns us away from looking at paintings as illustrations. Nor are we to look at them in terms of technique. Both approaches involve separation of means and ends. The medium mediates between the artist and the perceiver. The artist, unlike the ordinary person, is able to transform material into medium. Non-artists, by contrast, require many materials to express themselves, and the results of their efforts are often confused.
In his tenth chapter Dewey insists that art is the quality of a thing and is thus adjectival. To say that tennis is an art is to say that there is art in tennis. The product is not the work of art, rather the work is the enjoyed experience of a human. Since art does not denote objects it is not divided into different classes. It is simply an activity that is differentiated based on the medium used. Artists are concerned with qualities, and qualities are concrete and particular. For a painter, there are no two reds because each is influenced by its context.
Dewey is critical of various classifications of the arts, for instance that between higher and lower sense organs, or between the arts of space and time, or between representative and non-representative art. He also has problems with rigid classification and definition in terms of genus and species when it comes to aesthetics. The idea of fixed classes is associated with the idea of fixed rules which Dewey also rejects. Classification limits perception and inhibits creativity. As a consequence, Dewey spends much time in this chapter discussing specific differences between the various fine art media which will not be surveyed here.
In his eleventh chapter Dewey expresses a wish to overcome what he believes to be false and antiquated psychological theories that hinder aesthetic understanding. For example, he denies the Lockean view that the undergoings of the self are mere impressions stamped on wax. Experience is neither merely physical nor merely mental. Rather, things and events of the world are transformed in the context of the live creature, and the creature itself is transformed through this interaction. Contrary theories hold that experience happens exclusively within the mind, fragmenting the self into sense, feeling, and desire. However, these are actually only different aspects of the interaction of self and environment. The separation, for example, between intellectual and sensual aspects of the soul is based rather on differences in social class. Dewey believed that badly ordered societies exaggerate these distinctions, which is the business of art to overcome.
Theories that assume that aesthetic quality is projected onto the aesthetic object, for example Santayana's idea that art is objectified pleasure, exemplify this separation. Although the separation of self and object has practical importance in everyday life it dissolves in aesthetic experience. Dewey opposes the idea, set forth by I. A. Richards, that a painting causes certain effects in us. Rather, a painting is a total effect arising from the interaction of live creature and such external factors as pigment and light. Its beauty is a part of that effect. Dewey also criticizes Kant's reduction of attentive observation to mere contemplation and his reduction of the emotional element of the aesthetic to pleasure taken in contemplation. The problem with Kant is that he drew distinctions and then made them into compartmental divisions, thus separating the aesthetic from other modes of experience. His notion of pure feeling led to beauty being seen as remote from desire and action. Dewey, by contrast, sees aesthetic experience as incorporation of desire and thought into the perceptual.
The pleasure taken in reading a poem is not in the contemplation but in fulfillment of tendencies in the subject perceived. As opposed to traditional psychology, Dewey holds that impulsion comes first, followed by sensation. The presence of intense sensuous qualities shows the presence of impulsion. Aesthetic appreciation has balance when many impulses are involved. Aesthetic experience may only be said to be disinterested if this means that it contains no specialized interest.
For Dewey, imagination is not a self-contained faculty but a quality that pervades all making and observation. It is a way of seeing that makes old things new. Following Coleridge, he holds that the imagination welds together diverse elements into a new unified experience. Contrary to Coleridge, however, it is not a power. Rather, it is something that happens when various materials come together. Nor is it simply giving familiar experience a new look, for it only happens when mind and material interpenetrate. The role of imagination can be seen in terms of the dialectic of inner and outer vision in creative making in which inner vision seems at first richer, and then outer vision seems to have more energy, although the inner vision controls the outer. Imagination is the interaction of the two.
Dewey's twelfth chapter draws implications from his aesthetic theory for philosophy in general. Continuing his discussion of imagination, he holds that all conscious experience has some element of imagination, for imagination is conscious adjustment of the new and the old. Yet all imaginative experience is not the same. Art is distinguished from reverie and dream in that the meanings of art are embodied in material. Aesthetic experience is distinguished from other imaginative experience by the fact that the meanings embodied are especially wide and deep. Although scientific inventions are also products of imagination, works of art do not operate in the realm of physical existence. A work of art concentrates and enlarges immediate experience, directly expressing imaginatively-evoked meaning. It also encourages its audience to carry out a similar imaginative act.
Aesthetic experience is a challenge to philosophy because it is free to develop as experience. Thus, philosophers must go to aesthetics to find out what experience is. Moreover, a philosopher's aesthetic theory will test his or her ability to understand experience itself. Aesthetic theories have typically taken a single factor and explained aesthetic experience in terms of it, for example, taking imagination as a single element rather than as that which holds all the elements together. The various aesthetic theories may be classified according to which element they emphasize. Dewey believes that each theory imposes preconceived ideas upon the subject matter. The make-believe theory, for example, tends to see the imaginative experience of art in terms of reverie. Although reverie is not absent from art, there are equally essential elements, especially the element of creative control that causes ideas to be embodied in an object. In art, the product must be saturated both with the qualities of the represented object and those of the emotion expressed.
Because art often gives us a sense of increased understanding, some philosophers have seen it as a mode of knowledge, sometimes even as superior to science. There have been many different things suggested as what is known through art. This shows that the philosophers involved were not thinking about art or aesthetic experience. On Dewey's view, the sense of increased understanding in art comes from the fact that knowledge is transformed both in production and in experience by being merged with non-intellectual elements. Life is made more intelligible by art not through conceptualization but through clarification and intensification in experience.
Dewey does not reject essences, he simply rejects previous theories of them. He insists that essences exists even though they are not objects in the mind. For Dewey, essence appears as the quality of intense aesthetic experience which is so immediate as to be mystical. But it is not to be associated with the ultimate essences of traditional metaphysics. Following ordinary language, Dewey notes that “essence” can also mean the “gist” of a thing, what is indispensable. For Dewey, all artistic expression moves towards organization of meaning that captures essences in this sense. An example of this is the painter Courbet who conveys the essence liquidity saturating the landscape. The work of art forms “an experience as an experience” (Dewey 1934, p. 298). The essential is the result of art and of artists having expressed essential meanings in perception, and not something that exists prior to art.
Dewey then turns to various traditional theories of art. Plato, as he noted earlier, unconsciously borrows his idea of essence from the arts. When Croce sees essence as the object of intuition and identifies this with expression he is just imposing his prior philosophical speculations on aesthetic experience. Dewey rejects Croce's idea that the only real existence is mind and that the work of art is a state of mind. (This comment led to Croce's published review of Dewey and to the ongoing reception of Dewey's book mentioned in the introduction and elaborated in the last section of this article.) Schopenhauer is also dismissed as just a dialectical development of Kant. Dewey objects specifically to Schopenhauer's ruling charm out of aesthetic experience and even more to his fixed hierarchies of beauty and of the arts. Dewey's main purpose in these attacks is to show that philosophy also involves imagination and that art controls the imaginative adventures of philosophy through integrating opposites and overcoming isolation in thought.
Dewey's thirteenth chapter addresses the nature of criticism. For Dewey, judgment is an act of intelligence performed on perception for the purpose of more adequate perception. It is development in the medium of thought of deeply realized experience. He rejects therefore judicial criticism in which the verdict is central. Such criticism is produced out a desire for authority on the side of critics, and for protection on the part of the audience.
Dewey holds that there are no infallible touchstones in criticism. In fact, it is harmful to think that there are such. This can be seen in the blunders of the judicial critic, for example the attacks on postimpressionists in the 1913 Armory show. In general, judicial criticism confuses a particular technique with aesthetic form. This is not to say, however, that judgment is arbitrary. Rather, good judgment requires a rich background, disciplined insight, and the capacity to discriminate and to unify. Judicial criticism fails because it cannot handle new movements in art which, by their nature, express something new in human experience.
The opposite extreme is impressionist criticism, which holds that judgment is impossible and that all that is needed is a statement of response. For Dewey, impressions, i.e., unanalyzed qualitative effects, are only the beginnings of judgments. To analyze an impression is to go beyond it to grounds and consequences. Even defining an impression by grounding it in personal history is moving towards judgment. Just as the artist takes objective material from a common world and transforms it by imaginative vision, so too the critic must attend to objective features of the work he or she is studying. The result is perceptive appreciation that is also knowledgeable.
Dewey believes that although there are no standards for critical judgment there are criteria of judgment. Previous discussions of the relation of form and matter, and of the role of medium in art, have addressed this point. These criteria are not rules but rather means of discovering what the work of art is as an experience. The business of criticism is to deepen experience for others through re-educating perception. We fully understand the work only when we go through the same processes the artist went through when producing it, and the critic shares in promoting this process.
Dewey holds that judgment has two main functions: discrimination and unification. The first involves understanding of parts, and the second leads to understanding how they are related to each other and to the whole. The first is analysis, and the second is synthesis. The two are inseparable. The critic gains a capacity for analysis through a long-standing consuming interest in the subject. She should intensely like the subject and also have rich and full experience of it, as well a personal intimacy with the tradition of the subject's art form. Acquaintance with the masterpieces of the tradition will be her touchstone, although they, too, are appreciated only within the context of that tradition. The critic should also be familiar with an international variety of traditions, African, Persian, etc. Lack of such knowledge leads to overestimation of some artists at the expense of others. Since the critic will have knowledge of a wide variety of conditions and materials, she will appreciate a multitude of forms and will not praise work simply for technical skill. This wide knowledge will also allow for discrimination, and for determining the intent of the artist. The critic should also have knowledge of the logical development of the individual artist's work.
As both critics and artists have personal areas of interest, they tend to push the unique modes of vision associated with these areas to their limits. Each mode of vision is associated with a method, and each method has its own failing: for example symbolism can become unintelligible, and abstract art can become a mere scientific exercise. Each tendency succeeds, Dewey believes, when matter and form achieve equilibrium. The critic fails when she thinks that her own tendency is the only legitimate one.
For Dewey, the synthetic or unifying phase of judgment involves the insight of the critic. There are no rules in the synthetic phase, for this aspect of criticism is an art. Parts should be seen in terms of their role within the larger integral whole. The critic must discover some “unifying strand” in the work, one that is not simply imposed on the work. There can be many unifying ideas in a work of art, but the theme and the design described by the critic must be really present throughout.
Danger in criticism includes reduction of an entire work to an isolated element, for example looking at technique apart from form. Also, although one should take into account cultural milieus, it is dangerous to reduce works to economic, political, sociological, or psychoanalytic terms. Certain factors may be relevant to the biography of the artist but not to understanding the work itself. In short, (and anticipating Monroe Beardsley) Dewey believes that the aesthetic merit of a work is within the work, and extraneous material should not substitute for understanding the work itself.
Nor is there any value in judging art by the philosophical position presented. If one valued Milton for this reason one would have to reject Dante, Lucretius and Goethe, each of whom presents a different philosophy. Confusion comes from neglecting significance of the medium. The material of science, philosophy, and the arts is the same: the live creature and its environment. However, whereas science uses its medium to control and predict, art uses its medium to enhance experience. Dewey, in opposition to Santayana, admired Shakespeare for holding that nature offers many meanings. The value of experience is greatest in its ability to reveal many ideals, and the value of ideals is in the experiences they generate.
Dewey also favors poet Robert Browning's view of the relation between the individual and the universal. Nature manifests continuity, i.e., endurance through change. The critic must be sensitive to the signs of change. Although the critic is an individual and hence has his or her own bias, he should transform this bias into a means of sensitive perception and insight while not allowing it to harden. He should also recognize that there are a multitude of other qualities in the world worthy of art. He may then help others to have a fuller appreciation of the objective properties of artworks. Critical judgment depends on deepening the perception of others. Its business is not to evaluate but to re-educate perception, the perfection of perception being the moral purpose of art. We only fully understand the meaning of a work when we have gone through the processes the artist went through, and the critic promotes this experience.
Dewey's last chapter addresses the large issue of art and civilization. He begins by noting that communication is the foundation of all activities that involve “internal” union between human beings. Many relations between persons, for example between investors and laborers, are “external” and mechanical, and hence not really communication. Art is a universal mode of language. It is not affected by the accidents of history in the way that speech is. Music for example can bring people together in loyalty and inspiration. Although each culture is held together by its own individuality, it is still possible to create continuity and community between cultures as long as one does not try to reduce one to the other. One can expand experience to absorb the attitudes and values of other cultures. Friendship is, on a smaller scale, a solution to the same problem, for it comes from sympathy through imagination. We understand others when their desires and aims expand us. To civilize is to instruct others in life, and this requires communication of values by way of imagination. The arts aid individuals in achieving this.
However Dewey believed that today the arts fail to organically connect with other aspects of culture, especially science and industry. The isolation of art is one manifestation of the incoherence of our society. Science gives us a new conception of the physical world. But we also hold a conception of the world which we inherited from older moral and religious traditions. Thus, the moral and physical worlds are separated, resulting in philosophical dualism. Recovering an organic place for the arts in our society is closely tied to this problem.
Dewey believed that as the scientific method has not yet become a natural part of experience its impact will continue to be both external and disintegrating. Yet although science strips things of their value, the world in which art operates remains the same. Thus the death of art is not imminent. Moreover, science shows that man is a part of nature. This helps man to recognize that his ideas are the result of nature within. Also, resistance and conflict contribute to art. So, when science discloses such resistance, it promotes art, as it does when it arouses curiosity, enlivens observation, and gives us respect for experience. A new unity would come with integration of science into the cultural whole.
Dewey observes that the separation between fine art and useful art, although it goes back to the Greeks, is intensified today by mass production and the greater importance of industry and trade. Production of goods is now mechanical, and this is opposed to the aesthetic. Still, integration of art in civilization is not impossible. Although well-constructed objects have form, the aesthetic comes only when external form fits our larger experience. If the parts are efficiently related, as in a well-constructed machine, the result is aesthetically favorable. Dewey was a fan of aesthetics of modernist design. He believed that recent commercial products have improved form and color, train cars are no longer overloaded with silly ornament, and apartment interiors are better adapted to our needs. Although he admits that factories and slums mar the landscape, he observes that the human eye is adapting to the shapes and colors of urban life. Even objects in the natural landscape are perceived in terms of these new forms. But, given that the human organism needs satisfaction through the various organs, the surroundings that have resulted from industrialism are less fulfilling than previously .
Dewey believes that the trouble is with the economic system. The problem cannot be resolved merely through increased wages or reduced work hours. Increasing leisure hours only reinforces the dualism of labor and leisure. A radical social change which would allow for more worker participation in the production and distribution of products is the only thing that would improve the quality of experience. Increased sense of freedom and increased control in the processes of production would give the worker an intimate interest and hence aesthetic satisfaction in his work. Nothing about machine production per se makes worker satisfaction impossible. It is private control of forces of production for private gain that impoverishes our lives. When art is merely the “beauty parlor of civilization,” both art and civilization are insecure. We can only organize the proletariat into the social system via a revolution that affects the imagination and emotions of man. Art is not secure until the proletariat are free in their productive activity and until they can enjoy the fruits of their labor. To do this, the material of art should be drawn from all sources, and art should be accessible to all.
Although this view is similar to Marxist theory Dewey does not favor reducing art to propaganda. Indeed, he asserts that theories that see art as directly moral ultimately fail because they see it in terms of how we personally relate to selected works. They fail to look at the larger context of civilization. Poetry criticizes not directly but by means of an imaginative vision of an alternate reality. Art instructs by way of communicating, but we need to understand such instruction as including imagination. Moral action depends on being able to imaginatively put oneself into another's shoes and art encourages this. Indeed, art is more moral than morality, for morality tends to be bogged down in convention, unless it is the product of moral prophets, who have always been poets. If art were to be recognized as going beyond idle pleasure or luxurious display, and morals were seen as a matter of shared values, then the problem of their relation would be resolved. Art is morally powerful because it is indifferent to moral praise and blame. Dewey agrees with Shelley that morals require going out of ourselves and identifying with the beautiful. The union of the possible and the actual in art is continued in the moral realm.
Dewey's ideas on aesthetics and arts have been frequently both criticized and defended over the seventy-five years following the publication of Art as Experience. These will be reviewed in their order of appearance. Vivas (1937) argues that Dewey holds two theories about the emotions' role in aesthetic experience, one that the esthetic object arouses emotion in the spectator, and the other that the content of meaning of art, objectively speaking, is emotion. But, he argues, experimental aesthetics has shown that emotion is an accidental consequence of aesthetic apprehension, and so should not be included in its definition. The same aesthetic object can arouse different emotional reactions in different spectators. Some trained persons in music even deny that adequate aesthetic experience involves emotion. Dewey also has not given an explanation of the means by which the object expresses emotion. Vivas himself defines aesthetic experience in terms of rapt attention involving apprehension of the object's immanent meanings.
In a second article (Vivas 1938), he asks: Are emotions attached to the material? How is this consistent with the idea that emotion is not expressed in the object? And how are these ideas consistent with the idea that emotion is aroused in the spectator? Vivas insists that not all art arouses emotion in everyone who has effective intercourse with it. Music, for sophisticated listeners, is often not suggestive of emotions. When we find “sadness” in music we would do better to call it an objective character of the music than an emotion. Another problem for Dewey: if the self disappears in experience then how can the object arouse emotion in the self or have emotion attached to it? Also, if the self disappears into harmony, how can there be the kind of disharmony associated with emotion?
I have already mentioned Pepper's objection that Dewey's theory is not sufficiently pragmatic (Pepper 1939). His specific objection is that Dewey's views were eclectic, incorporating elements both of pragmatism and of Hegelian organicism. Pepper believes that both theories, as well as formalism, can be valuable when taken separately, but that the mixture in Dewey hurts pragmatism. Pepper identified organicism with the view that the ultimate reality is The Absolute. Dewey replied (1939b) that he had based his aesthetic theory on examination of the subject-matter and not on any a priori theory. Words he used, such as “coherence,” “whole,” “integration,” and “complete,” were intended to have meaning consistent with his pragmatic empiricism and did not by themselves indicate a commitment to idealism. Moreover, it was one of his main points that although these terms were applicable to aesthetic matters they could not, contra the idealists, be extended to the world as a whole. The terms had a special sense applying only to experiences as aesthetic. Dewey rejected any theory of a great cosmic harmony associated with the Hegelian notion of the Absolute.
In a later work, Pepper (1945) agrees with Dewey that each reading of a poem brings a new experience, but thinks that, since there is also identity of context that can make the differences minor, we can speak of an identical quality running through the different situations. Pepper has many positive things to say about Dewey's “contextualism” (his word for pragmatism in aesthetics), but he insists that there is much more permanence of aesthetic values in the world than Dewey would admit. A great work of art may be appreciated as long as the physical work exists and someone exists to perceive it, and insofar as it appeals to common instincts, it may appeal to people of varied cultures.
The Italian philosopher and aesthetician Benedetto Croce read Dewey's Art as Experience and responded to it. He rightly pointed out many similarities between his own and Dewey's thought. (Croce 1948). There were, however, still three points of serious contention: (1) Croce places significantly more importance on the universality of art than Dewey, (2) he still insists that the material of art consists not of external things but of internal sentiments of human passions: a characteristically idealist position that Dewey vehemently rejects, and (3) whereas he believes that art gives knowledge of a higher reality, Dewey does not. Croce asserts that Dewey is still arguing against Hegelians of his youth who held, for example, to a notion of “the Absolute,” which Croce had rejected. Dewey (1948), in responding to Croce, argues that the list of shared beliefs Croce mentioned in his review were just ideas widely familiar to aestheticians. He thinks that because of Croce's idealism there can be no common ground of discussion between them. He also makes an unsatisfactory distinction between pragmatism, which he claims is a theory of knowledge, and aesthetic theory, which he thinks has nothing to do with knowledge. Also, he seems inconsistently dualist when, in his reply to Croce, he cuts his own system into two parts, pragmatic and aesthetic. His criticism that Croce is simply applying to the domain of aesthetics ideas drawn from a preconceived system of philosophy, seems unfair, since he does this to some extent himself. In his reply, Croce (1952) argues that Dewey is too wedded to empiricism and pragmatism and that it is only because Dewey, contrary to his own claims, is committed to a kind of dualism, that he cannot understand Croce's identification of intuition and expression or recognize how similar Croce's view is to his own. Simoni (1952) argues that neither Croce nor Dewey were Hegelian in the sense of believing in the Absolute. Douglas (1970) agrees with Simoni, finding many similarities between Dewey and Croce. However, Douglas does agree with Pepper (1939) that Dewey never reconciled the pragmatist and historicist (Hegelian) dimensions of his thought.
Romanell (1949) held that Croce and Dewey at least share the view that art is about aesthetic experience. However, Dewey's definition of the subject-matter of philosophy of art as aesthetic experience (which treats it as a special type of experience) is inconsistent with his definition of it as the aesthetic phase of experience. Also, when Dewey speaks of aesthetic experience he is not functionalist and is not consistent with his pragmatism. Dewey should have held that just as there is no such thing as religious experience, there is no such thing as aesthetic experience. Dewey (1950) replied that every normally complete experience is aesthetic in its consummatory phase, that the arts and their experience are developments of this primary phase, and that there is nothing inconsistent in this. Where Romanell sees incompatibility Dewey sees continuity of development. Ames (1953) provides an excellent defense against Dewey's critics up to this point in time.
As mentioned earlier, many attacks on Dewey focused on his views on expression. Although Hospers (1946) does not specifically criticize him, and Bouwsma (1954) does not mention him, their attacks on expression theory can be taken to be indirectly against Dewey. Tormey (1986) fills this gap. He chides Dewey for assuming that an artist is always expressing something and that the expressive qualities in the work are the result of that act. He thinks that Dewey wrongly abandons the distinction between voluntary and involuntary expression, and in doing so, undermines paradigmatic examples of expressive behavior. A work of art may possess expressive qualities of sadness but this is not necessarily the intended consequence of the productive activity of the artist. For Tormey, the artist is not expressing him or herself: he/she is simply making an expressive object. Mitias (1992) defends Dewey against these criticisms.
Scruton (1974) objects mainly to Dewey's naturalism. He thinks that Dewey insists that aesthetic need must underlie all our interest in art, and that he fails to capture what we mean when we say that we are interested in a picture ‘for its own sake.’ Needs can be satisfied by many objects but one cannot substitute pictures for one another. Unlike animal need, interest in a picture involves thought of its object. As a political conservative, Scruton has been opposed to Dewey's views on education. However, his work on architecture (Scruton 1979), with its emphasis on context, unity, functionalism, and the relations between architecture and everyday aesthetics, are remarkably similar to Dewey's views about art in general, although Dewey's name is never mentioned.
Although Beardsley (1982) often speaks positively of Dewey's notion of aesthetic experience, he thinks that Dewey was obsessed with the dangers of dualism and that he talked about “separation” in a misleading way. Dewey thinks the practices of hanging paintings in special buildings would deny continuity between art and life. Yet Beardsley sees no real problem here, for people who see a painting in a museum bring their culture with them. Also, against Dewey's stress on continuity, Beardsley thinks that discontinuity in nature and in culture is required for the emergence of genuine novelty in art. As opposed to Dewey, Beardsley stresses the ways in which art is independent, relatively self-sufficient, and autonomous to a degree. Goldman (2005) argues that Beardsley borrows too much from Dewey's obscure discussion of experience, but articulates better than Dewey the idea that aesthetic experience is a matter of complete engagement of our faculties with both instrumental and intrinsic benefits.
Novitz (1992), who approves of Dewey's ideas that art derives from experiences of everyday life and that the artistic process infuses our daily lives, questions the idea that fine art always embodies consummatory or unified experiences. He thinks Dewey has an idealized view of art that borrows from the very aestheticist theories he criticizes, and that Dewey does not sufficiently question the boundaries of art.
Shusterman (1992, etc., see bibliography) is the most widely known advocate of Dewey's pragmatist aesthetics. He strikingly contrasts Dewey's approach to that of analytic aesthetics. Like Dewey, he stresses the idea that art and aesthetics are both culturally and philosophically central. Some of his most trenchant comments involve similarities between Dewey's thought and such continental thinkers as Foucault and Adorno. However he also has his criticisms of Dewey. He takes Dewey to be redefining art in terms of aesthetic experience, which he believes to be too slippery a concept to explain much. Moreover, he asserts that although Dewey has much to say about aesthetic experience, Dewey also holds that it is indefinable, and this leads to problems with its being a criterion of value in art. On the other hand, Shusterman thinks that Dewey sees defining art in terms of experience as a matter of getting us to have more and better experiences with art, and not of giving a definition in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. So, although he doubts that philosophical theory can redefine art, he suspects Dewey is not trying to do this anyway. Moreover, he thinks it not only possible but valuable to make less dramatic classificatory changes, as for example in legitimating rock music as fine art. He believes that whereas Dewey sought a global redefinition of art, he is simply trying to remedy certain limitations in art practice. Later, he (Shusterman 2000) has said that much art fails to generate Dewey's aesthetic experience. He also observes that art cannot be redefined to be equal to aesthetic experience as we are hardly going to reclassify an incredible experience of a sunset as art. Shusterman also insists on the value of aesthetic experiences that are fragmented and ruptured, contrary to Dewey's emphasis on unity, and notes that Dewey neglected the possibility of lingering reflection after moments of consummation (Shusterman 2004).
Seigfried (1996b) takes a long overdue feminist look at Dewey's aesthetics, finding several aspects that may enrich feminist exploration of women's experiences, including his antidualism, his perspectivalism, his working from concrete experience, his emphasis placed on the role of feeling in experience, his emphasis on doing and making, and his attack on the division between practice and theory. However she notes that Dewey neglected sexism in his analysis, and sometimes made sexist assumptions.
Carroll (2001) thinks Dewey's theory of art fails to cover many contemporary works which then act as counterexamples to his definition of art as experience. For example, as Rothko's paintings can overwhelm us at one shot they may not have Dewey's requisite development and closure. Carroll also thinks that the view that experiences of art must be unified is too narrow. Cage's 4′33″, which Carroll takes to obviously be a work of art, does not consummate or have qualitative unity. Finally, he thinks that if experiences of everyday dispersion can be aesthetic then Dewey's distinction between “an experience” and disconnected daily experience dissolves. However, Jackson (1998) defends Dewey against similar criticisms, especially with respect to Cage's 4′33″ which he sees as fitting Dewey's definition nicely. For Jackson, it is the experience that requires unity, not the physical product.
Dickie (2001) says that Dewey sets forth an expression theory of art without any supporting argument. Lumping Dewey with Collingwood, he thinks such theorists place art in the same domain with the growl of a dog with a bone. They make the creation of art like the bowerbird's production of bowers, i.e., a result of innate natures without a plan in mind. For Dickie, expression of emotion is neither sufficient nor necessary for defining art. He thinks these theories wrongly hold that psychological mechanisms in human nature are sufficient for the production of art, as if the production of artworks is teleologically determined by psychological mechanisms.
Freeland (2001) observes that Dewey held that art is the best window to another culture, that it is a universal language, and that we should try to experience another culture as from within. It is possible for barriers and prejudices to melt away when we enter into the spirit of another culture's art. Although this universalism seems similar to Clive Bell's formalism, Freeland notes that for Dewey art is defined not as form but as expression of the life of community. She thinks however that we must also know many external facts about the community, and that we must recognize that no culture is homogeneous: there may not be one viewpoint in a culture. She also gives a positive nod to Dewey's call for a revolution in which the values leading to intelligent enjoyment of art are incorporated into our social relations. Finally, she classifies Dewey's aesthetics as a cognitive theory since it focuses on art's role in helping people to perceive and manipulate reality, finding continuity between Dewey's and Goodman's approaches to art as a kind of language.
Dewey's thought in aesthetics has also sometimes been brought to bear in analysis of other aspects of his philosophy. Noteworthy in this regard is the ethical work of Pappas (2008), especially his chapter titled “The Intelligent, Aesthetic, and Democratic Way of Life.” Here he discusses Dewey's aesthetic notion of balance as it applies to ethics. Johnson (1994) and Fesmire (1999, 2003) also introduce Dewey's aesthetic theories into discussion of ethics.
Recently there have been lively debates over the Deweyan tradition in the aesthetics of everyday life. Most of the contestants are inspired by Dewey's valuation of everyday aesthetic experience but depart from him in various ways. Irvin (2008a) has argued that the fragmented character of everyday aesthetic experiences might, contra Dewey's emphasis on consummation, be what gives them their distinctive quality. She goes so far as to assert that even scratching an itch can be aesthetically appreciated (Irvin 2008b). Parsons and Carlson (2008) contend that although Dewey's aesthetic theory may seem particularly appropriate to appreciating everyday objects since we interact with them in a more intimate and multi-sensory way than with art objects, this approach, shared by Korsmeyer (1999), Brady (2005), Leddy (2005), Shusterman (2006a), and Saito (2007), fails to honor traditional distinctions between aesthetic and mere “bodily” pleasures. (They might have also mentioned Kuehn (2005) who takes an explicitly Deweyan approach to the aesthetics of food.) They think it wrong that the pleasures of taking a bath, for example, could be considered aesthetic. Rather, the objects of everyday aesthetic should be appreciated mainly for their functional beauty (pleasures of the proximal senses are not aesthetic, although they may still add some value to the overall experience), and knowledge of the function of everyday objects is required for their appropriate appreciation. Soucek (2009) and Dowling (2010) raise criticisms against everyday aesthetics along similar lines.
It is a mark of the endurance and power of Dewey's aesthetic theory that it has been so frequently criticized and defended from so many different angles. Although many of these criticisms rest on an incomplete or distorted understandings of Dewey's thought there are also many that should be answered by anyone who seeks to carry on Dewey's legacy.
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- China Institute, founded in 1926 by John Dewey, Hu Shih, Paul Monroe, and Dr. Kuo Ping-wen.
- Ho, Y., Sept. 2004, “China Institute and Columbia University,” presented at the Columbia's China Connection Conference at Columbia University.
- The Barnes Foundation
- Center for Dewey Studies
- Timeline/Biography of John Dewey Work, maintained at the Center for Dewey Studies.
- Dictionary of Art and Artists, 2011, “Escuelas de Pintura al Aire Libre,” (accessed July 14, 2001).
- Democracy and Education, by John Dewey, free e-book available Project Gutenberg.
- The John Dewey Society.
- Education and Culture, the journal of the John Dewey Society.
- Epistemelinks page on Dewey, This page includes links to electronic texts of some of Dewey's works.
- Excepts from Experience and Nature.
- John Dewey, entry by John Field in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- John Dewey, entry by Jim Garrison in Encyclopedia of the Philosophy of Education.
- John Dewey, American Pragmatist, at pragmatism.org.
- John Dewey, entry in the Wikipedia.