Supplement to Dewey's Aesthetics

Dewey's Early Aesthetics

Aesthetics and Dewey's Theory of Education.

Much of Dewey's early interest in aesthetics centered around his theory of childhood education. In a work from 1896, “Imagination and Expression,” he stresses the importance of directing the psychical impulse that provides the motive for expression (Dewey 1896). Here, unlike later writings, he emphasizes the distinction between the idea to be expressed and the technique by which it is expressed. He argues that although technique should be subservient to idea, it should not be neglected. He rejects the notion that the idea is spiritual and the technique physical. However, in the idealist vein typical of this period, he insists that the child draws from his or her own image, not from the object, and concludes that teachers should help children to present and construct complete images having their own value.

Throughout his early writings on education Dewey emphasized the importance of aesthetic education. For instance, he writes about the educational role of museums in The School and Society (1902). He locates a museum in the center of his ideal school, his diagram of that school representing his effort to synthesize the arts and sciences in education (Constantino 2004).

In his 1915 book Democracy and Education Dewey stresses that taste is determined by environment. If a child constantly sees harmonious objects she will have a standard of taste, whereas barren surroundings will eliminate her desire for beauty. Standards are determined by the situations in which a person habitually lives. Thus taste cannot be taught consciously through second-hand information.

Dewey here emphasizes the connection between aesthetics and issues of social justice. Those in society who contribute to the maintenance of life or to its decoration cannot today have full and free interest in their work. Instead of transforming things and making them more significant, art today merely feeds fancy and indulgence. Dewey insists that this sad state of affairs is caused by the current separation between laboring and leisure classes.

He then asks what role the fine arts should play in the education of children. Although every adult has certain standards of aesthetic value, a danger exists that they will attempt to teach those standards directly to children. If this happens the values taught will be merely conventional and verbal. Working standards depend on what the individual has appreciated in concrete activity. If the individual has been accustomed to ragtime music (a popular form at this time) then his or her working standards will be fixed at that level.

For Dewey, the scope of appreciation is as broad as that of education itself. Habits are merely mechanical unless they are also tastes. The imagination is needed for appreciation in every field. Thus imaginative activity should not be limited to the world of fairy tales, or even to that of fine art. It is dangerous to associate imagination only with childish play and fancy, while excluding it from goal-directed activity. Even laboratory activities are best seen as dramatizations that may be appreciated aesthetically.

For Dewey, the sharp distinction commonly made between play and work is due mainly to undesirable social conditions. Both involve ends, materials, and processes. In play, the activity is its own end, although the activity may include considerable looking ahead, whereas work involves a longer course of activity with a greater demand for continuous attention (Dewey 1915, p. 202–204). The human demand for play persists in the adult need for recreation. Dewey sees art as meeting this demand. Play and work are prior to the distinction between useful and fine arts. These activities involve emotions, imagination, and skill, which are also required for artistic production. They ground both useful and fine arts, and this shows that the distinction between the two should not be seen as rigid.

Dewey holds that appreciation is intensified valuing. The main function of the fine arts is enhancement of qualities that make ordinary experience appealing: they fix taste for later experience. They also reveal meaning and supply vision. They concentrate aspects of the good that are otherwise scattered. For Dewey, there are no degrees of value apart from a particular situation. Thus, if a man has been starving, and has had enough music for now, he will judge food to be more valuable than music. The only ultimate value is the process of living itself, This is the whole of which the various studies and activities involved in education are merely ingredients.

Dewey insists on not limiting aesthetics to art, or artistic to aesthetic value. Arithmetic and science, as much as poetry, should sometimes be appreciated aesthetically. Dewey believed that only when art is sometimes appreciated for itself can it also be used for other ends. The main value of fine art is not the enjoyment of leisure, but heightening meaning through concentration.

Experience and Nature.

Dewey begins to develop both an aesthetic theory and a theory of art in his 1925 Paul Carus lectures, Experience and Nature (Dewey 1925a). However this needs to be teased out through close reading and is not evident in chapter titles or even in the index. Early in the book, he emphasizes the importance of direct enjoyment of song, dance and story-telling in human experience, noting how even philosophers who stress pleasure, such as utilitarians, have failed to address this domain (p. 78). He observes that early humans were more interested in direct satisfaction than in prudence. Thus bodies were decorated first, and clothed later. Similarly, early men made a game of fishing and hunting. In general, useful labor was transformed by ceremony into enjoyable art. Although the activities of play and ritual were intended to have practical effect, their aesthetic impact was even more important.

Dewey uses these historical claims to support a broadening of the field of aesthetics today. Although some would see popular fiction and other sources of mass entertainment as a travesty of art, these, as well as even more elementary things, such as jokes, beating drums, and blowing whistles, have the same quality of immediate finality as things generally called aesthetic.

A nascent aesthetic theory can be found in Dewey's fifth chapter, “Nature, Communication and Meaning.” Here he presents an aestheticized theory of language and of essences. The heart of language is not expression of something that comes before. Rather, it is participation in communication. Thus meaning is not private. In the process of cooperative action through language the thing referred to gains both meaning and heightened potential. Whereas animism refers this to the immediate relation of thing and person, poetry gives it a legitimate form. The potential of a thing is its essence, and to perceive a thing is to acknowledge that potential. Essence, or pronounced meaning, is the object of aesthetic intuition. Here, feeling and understanding are one (Dewey 1925a, p. 183). The essence of a thing is identified with the “consummatory consequences” and emerges from the various meanings attributed to it.

In communication, then, things reveal themselves to men. Within human experience all natural events are adapted to meet the needs of conversation. The arts are forms of communication. Communication is enjoyed for its own sake in dance, song and drama, where it is both instrumental and final. Art is critical of life because it fixes standards of enjoyment, and thus determines what should be desired. Moreover, the level of the arts in a community determines its direction.

Dewey has the most to say about aesthetics in Chapter Nine, “Experience, Nature and Art.” The structure of the argument is unfortunately, vague when compared to his later masterpiece, Art as Experience (1934). He begins with the Greeks who saw experience as exemplified in technical skill, and hence as equivalent to art, but who unfortunately downgraded experience when compared to reason. For them, everything in experience, and in art, was contingent. Modern thought sees art as simply an addition to nature, although it eulogizes art—especially fine art. Like the Greeks, it denigrates the practical, but it does so because it considers it subjectively distorted.

Dewey has two main points in this chapter: that science is an art, and that art is a “practice.” The only distinction between modes of practice should be between those that are intelligent and give immediate enjoyment through charged meaning, including fine art, and those that do not (Dewey 1925a, p. 358). If this distinction was maintained art would then be seen as the culmination of natural processes, and “science” (improperly so called) as merely a helpful means for achieving this end. The various dualisms of nature and experience, art and science, and so forth, would disappear.

Dewey believed that art unifies the necessary and the free aspects of nature, and thus that artistic acts are both inevitable and spontaneous. Unexpected combination is required for art: order and proportion are not the whole story. The more extensive the uniformities of nature in art, the greater the art, as long as they are fused with our wonder for the new.

Dewey reiterates that there is no real distinction between useful and fine art. The merely useful is not really art, but routine. Also, those arts that are only final are mere amusements. There are of course activities, including much of what we call labor, that have no immediate enjoyable meaning. We call such activities useful, but they are really detrimental to human well-being. Humans have a great need to appreciate the meaning in things and this is hindered by labor as it is structured in our society.

Dewey thinks that what is generally called fine art includes self-indulgent self-expression without regard to communication, experimentation in new techniques that produce bizarre products, and production of commodities for the wealthy. True fine art produces an object that gives us continuously renewed delight. A genuine aesthetic object is not only something that gives consummatory experience but also helps to produce further satisfaction. Any activity that does this, even if not found within the traditional list of arts, is fine art.

Fine art is not just an end in itself: it improves apprehension, enlarges vision, refines discrimination, and creates standards. Both the artistic and the aesthetic involve perception in which the instrumental and the consummatory intersect. Art gives us the object replete with meaning. Aesthetic experience, unlike sensual gratification, is informed with meaning. Artistic sense involves grasping potentialities. And artists are gifted persons who integrate focused and defined perception with skill in a progressive way.

For Dewey, both useful and fine arts involve interpenetration of means and ends. Things are only called “useful” because they are thought to belong to menial arts, or are related to common people. Things called “fine” are often decorative or ostentatious. One might think that things are merely useful when perception of meaning is incidental. However, this may not be helpful, for in art perception is always used for something beyond itself. Moreover, such useful things as pots may be intrinsically enjoyable. The basic distinction is between good and bad art: good art requires interpenetration of fulfillment and usefulness, and bad art fails in this.

Dewey holds that thinking itself is an art. Propositions that express knowledge are as much works of art as statues and symphonies. Conclusions are matters of condensed meaning, while premises result from analysis of conclusions into their grounds. Scientific method is the art of constructing true perceptions. Science is not seen as art in our society because it is artificially protected, is limited to a particular class of persons, and is seen as brutal and mechanical. This is coupled with the view that criticism a pedantic expression of merely personal taste. Dewey believes that this dichotomy needs to be overcome, and that to do this we need discriminating judgment.

Dewey rejects the theory that art is a mere medium for emotion. This does not mean he believes that emotion is irrelevant to art. Emotion is evoked by objects, and is a response to an objective situation. The origin of artistic creation is in emotional response to a situation. Contrary to Clive Bell (1914), he holds that significant form can only refer to forms that give significance to everyday subject-matters. Art does not create these forms. The forms that give us pleasure do so because of their structure. Dewey was not anti-formalist, however. Although formalist art-works can be sterile or pedantic, they may also enlarge and enrich our world by way of training our perception.

The following and final chapter, “Existence, Value and Criticism,” develops Dewey's theory of criticism. There, he argues against putting values in a separate realm from nature, and against understanding nature in simply mechanistic terms. Instead, he advises a return to Greek concepts of potentiality and actuality, although without the Greek tendency to see natural ends as perfections. He thinks it important to develop a theory of criticism that would allow us to discriminate amongst goods. This theory would not be limited to the arts. Criticism is also found in morals and in religious belief. Philosophy, he argues, is a form of criticism too: it is criticism of criticism. Indeed, as soon as one begins to talk about values, and to define them, one is doing criticism. Criticism requires inquiry into the conditions and consequences of the object valued. It is needed to enhance perception and to allow for appreciation of the same thing over time. It accomplishes this by uncovering new meanings.

Dewey insisted that criticism is not just a matter of formal writings. It happens every day in every aspect of our experience. Formal criticism simply develops the element of criticism found in appreciation. Philosophy shows that there is no difference in principle between scientific, moral and aesthetic appreciation. Each involves a transition from natural goods to goods reflectively validated.

Dewey rejects the idea that values, including aesthetic values, are merely personal affairs. There is no consensus in aesthetic theories because aesthetic phenomena have been segregated from other aspects of life. Standards may be used to judge immediate goods, but standards are just likings on the part of specific creatures, and it is meaningless to ask which of them is stronger. Common sense tells us that there are immediate goods and that there are principles by which they may be judged. It does not accept a rigid separation of knowledge and aesthetic appreciation. But it fails to see that system is needed for adequate judgments. Aesthetic criticism allows us to choose knowingly, for it reveals conditions and consequences, and it allows our likings to be expressed in an informed way.

Dewey has two main points in this chapter: that science is an art, and that art is a “practice.” The only distinction between modes of practice should be between those that are intelligent and give immediate enjoyment through charged meaning, including fine art, and those that do not (Dewey 1925a, p. 358). If this distinction was maintained art would then be seen as the culmination of natural processes, and “science” (improperly so called) as merely a helpful means for achieving this end. The various dualisms of nature and experience, art and science, and so forth, would disappear.

Dewey believed that art unifies the necessary and the free aspects of nature, and thus that artistic acts are both inevitable and spontaneous. Unexpected combination is required for art: order and proportion are not the whole story. The more extensive the uniformities of nature in art, the greater the art, as long as they are fused with our wonder for the new.

Dewey reiterates that there is no real distinction between useful and fine art. The merely useful is not really art, but routine. Also, those arts that are only final are mere amusements. There are of course activities, including much of what we call labor, that have no immediate enjoyable meaning. We call such activities useful, but they are really detrimental to human well-being. Humans have a great need to appreciate the meaning in things and this is hindered by labor as it is structured in our society.

Dewey thinks that what is generally called fine art includes self-indulgent self-expression without regard to communication, experimentation in new techniques that produce bizarre products, and production of commodities for the wealthy. True fine art produces an object that gives us continuously renewed delight. A genuine aesthetic object is not only something that gives consummatory experience but also helps to produce further satisfaction. Any activity that does this, even if not found within the traditional list of arts, is fine art.

Fine art is not just an end in itself: it improves apprehension, enlarges vision, refines discrimination, and creates standards. Both the artistic and the aesthetic involve perception in which the instrumental and the consummatory intersect. Art gives us the object replete with meaning. Aesthetic experience, unlike sensual gratification, is informed with meaning. Artistic sense involves grasping potentialities. And artists are gifted persons who integrate focused and defined perception with skill in a progressive way.

For Dewey, both useful and fine arts involve interpenetration of means and ends. Things are only called “useful” because they are thought to belong to menial arts, or are related to common people. Things called “fine” are often decorative or ostentatious. One might think that things are merely useful when perception of meaning is incidental. However, this may not be helpful, for in art perception is always used for something beyond itself. Moreover, such useful things as pots may be intrinsically enjoyable. The basic distinction is between good and bad art: good art requires interpenetration of fulfillment and usefulness, and bad art fails in this.

Dewey holds that thinking itself is an art. Propositions that express knowledge are as much works of art as statues and symphonies. Conclusions are matters of condensed meaning, while premises result from analysis of conclusions into their grounds. Scientific method is the art of constructing true perceptions. Science is not seen as art in our society because it is artificially protected, is limited to a particular class of persons, and is seen as brutal and mechanical. This is coupled with the view that criticism a pedantic expression of merely personal taste. Dewey believes that this dichotomy needs to be overcome, and that to do this we need discriminating judgment.

Dewey rejects the theory that art is a mere medium for emotion. This does not mean he believes that emotion is irrelevant to art. Emotion is evoked by objects, and is a response to an objective situation. The origin of artistic creation is in emotional response to a situation. Contrary to Clive Bell (1914), he holds that significant form can only refer to forms that give significance to everyday subject-matters. Art does not create these forms. The forms that give us pleasure do so because of their structure. Dewey was not anti-formalist, however. Although formalist art-works can be sterile or pedantic, they may also enlarge and enrich our world by way of training our perception.

The following and final chapter, “Existence, Value and Criticism,” develops Dewey's theory of criticism. There, he argues against putting values in a separate realm from nature, and against understanding nature in simply mechanistic terms. Instead, he advises a return to Greek concepts of potentiality and actuality, although without the Greek tendency to see natural ends as perfections. He thinks it important to develop a theory of criticism that would allow us to discriminate amongst goods. This theory would not be limited to the arts. Criticism is also found in morals and in religious belief. Philosophy, he argues, is a form of criticism too: it is criticism of criticism. Indeed, as soon as one begins to talk about values, and to define them, one is doing criticism. Criticism requires inquiry into the conditions and consequences of the object valued. It is needed to enhance perception and to allow for appreciation of the same thing over time. It accomplishes this by uncovering new meanings.

Dewey insisted that criticism is not just a matter of formal writings. It happens every day in every aspect of our experience. Formal criticism simply develops the element of criticism found in appreciation. Philosophy shows that there is no difference in principle between scientific, moral and aesthetic appreciation. Each involves a transition from natural goods to goods reflectively validated.

Dewey rejects the idea that values, including aesthetic values, are merely personal affairs. There is no consensus in aesthetic theories because aesthetic phenomena have been segregated from other aspects of life. Standards may be used to judge immediate goods, but standards are just likings on the part of specific creatures, and it is meaningless to ask which of them is stronger. Common sense tells us that there are immediate goods and that there are principles by which they may be judged. It does not accept a rigid separation of knowledge and aesthetic appreciation. But it fails to see that system is needed for adequate judgments. Aesthetic criticism allows us to choose knowingly, for it reveals conditions and consequences, and it allows our likings to be expressed in an informed way.

Qualitative and Affective Thought.

Dewey wrote two essays in the early 1930s, “Qualitative Thought,” and “Affective Thought,” both included in Philosophy and Civilization (Dewey 1931), which developed his nascent aesthetics further. Much like the phenomenologists of his time, Dewey held that the world in which we live is mainly a qualitative world. The concept of “pervasive quality” which is so central to Art as Experience is explicated here. Dewey considered works of art to be particularly good manifestations of pervasive quality. A painting that is a work of art has a quality that separates it from other paintings and pervades it in all details. The underlying pervasive quality also regulates both the creative production and the appreciation of the work. Dewey's concept of quality extends far beyond aesthetics. Generally, situations are held together by a single quality. Since the situation is metaphysically primary, objects and their relations can only be explained by referring to it. The object of thought is a quality that is directly and unreflectively had. The total pervasive quality is the “given.” It is that to which all thought refers, and this is true even though it is not directly present to thought.

Dewey also develops further his theory of evaluation. Evaluative responses such as “Yes,” “No,” “Good,” and “Beautiful,” can be symbols of our attitude towards the quality of a situation. For example, “Good!” may indicate that we perceive the quality of a performance on stage. Such pronouncements may reflect a judgment better than lengthy writings. Some of them, when not immature, sum up previous experience and bring to culmination a long process of reflection. Such statements are not limited to the art expert's appreciation of art, but are also found in science.

Dewey thinks that the refusal to admit that there is thought in artistic construction is a failing of traditional logic. For something to be a true work of art the parts must hang together, reinforcing each other and the pervasive quality. Although analysis of works of art often uses terms like symmetry and harmony, which may in turn be formulated mathematically, it is not necessary for either the artist or the viewer to perceive these relations. The underlying quality demands distinctions, and this gives the work its necessity. We may see a picture by Goya and recognize it instantly as by Goya because of the quality it has as a whole. Although further analysis may cause us to reject our initial recognition, that recognition is, when appreciative, more dependable than analysis.

In “Affective Thought,” Dewey argues against separation between physiological processes and high culture, between art and science, and between thought and emotion. When these dualisms hold, the resultant compartmentalization leaves little room for living life for its own sake. Psychology shows that reasoning is not just intellectual but is based on a play of intellectual and affective activities. When the organism's (e.g., a human's) relation to its environment is disturbed it desires activity. The disturbance is only resolved when the organism reaches a new equilibrium. Reasoning is a phase in this process. It finds material to satisfy needs in our habits and in past experience. Ends are to be understood in terms of the needs of the organism, not by referring to some higher power. Although there are no deep differences between science and art, the logic of art is especially characterized by subtlety and scope. Art-viewers respond strongly to art because the generation of art is guided by unconscious activities. Deep habits are used in new ways, and this causes art to be liberating and expansive.

Dewey follows Barnes in holding that integration of the aesthetic object (of which painting is the focus example) allows for integration of the activities of the person perceiving it. Merely conventional painting, by contrast, will eventually tire us out. Dewey holds that Barnes has set forth an objective criterion of value in paintings which will eventually allow for adequate psychological analysis of aesthetic experience. Following this path, appreciation will no longer be merely private. Barnes has also shown that the history of art must be based on what is distinctive to painting, i.e., color. Although more recent examples of using color to render action has led to distortions disliked by many (think of Picasso), these will eventually be accepted. Dewey believed that the fully harmonized experience achieved by participants in Barnes Foundation activities will set the standard for other experience and thus will counter the various disruptions of our compartmentalized lives.

Copyright © 2013 by
Tom Leddy <tle403@aol.com>

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