The Equivalence of Mass and Energy

First published Wed Sep 12, 2001; substantive revision Mon Feb 6, 2012

Einstein correctly described the equivalence of mass and energy as “the most important upshot of the special theory of relativity” (Einstein, 1919), for this result lies at the core of modern physics. According to Einstein's famous equation E = mc2, the energy E of a physical system is numerically equal to the product of its mass m and the speed of light c squared. It is customary to refer to this result as “the equivalence of mass and energy,” or simply “mass-energy equivalence,” because one can choose units in which c = 1, and hence E = m.

The two main philosophical questions surrounding Einstein's equation concern how we ought to understand the assertion that mass and energy are in some sense equivalent and how we ought to understand assertions concerning the convertibility of mass into energy (or vice versa).

In this entry, we first discuss the physics E = mc2 and its application (Section 1). In Section 2, we identify six distinct, though related, philosophical interpretations of Einstein's equation. We then discuss, in Section 3, the history of derivations of E = mc2 and its philosophical importance. Finally, in Section 4 we give a selective account of the empirical confirmation of Einstein's equation that focuses on Cockcroft and Walton's (1932) first confirmation of mass-energy equivalence and a very recent, and very accurate confirmation by Rainville et al. (2005).

1. The Physics of E = mc2

In this section, we first present a minimal interpretation of E = mc2(in Section 1.1). The interpretation is minimal in the sense that it makes as few metaphysical and ontological commitments as possible. Furthermore, it is an interpretation with which nearly all physicists and philosophers now agree. We then illustrate the physical implications of Einstein's equation by considering three typical examples of mass-energy equivalence at work (in Section 1.2). We discuss the philosophical interpretation of E = mc2 separately below (in Section 2).

1.1 A minimal interpretation of E = mc2

To interpret E = mc2 we first need to understand the meaning of the symbols E and m. Unfortunately, these symbols are not used univocally by physicists and philosophers. However, a common interpretation, which we shall adopt for now, is that E represents the total energy of a physical system S. The symbol m represents the relativistic mass of S, which is the mass of S as measured by an observer O that moves with a constant velocity v relative to S.

In the special case where O and S are in a state of relative rest the mass of S measured by O is called the rest-mass, which one often designates mo. The rest-mass of S is a measure of the inertia of S, i.e., of the tendency of S to resist changes in velocity. Thus, the rest-mass of S is simply its inertial mass. The rest-mass is related to the relativistic mass by the equation:

m = mo γ(v), (1)

where γ(v) = (1 − v2/c2)−½ is the familiar Lorentz factor.

The value of the energy we obtain from Einstein's equation when S and O are in a state of relative rest is often called the rest-energy and is commonly designated Eo. Significantly, Einstein often called the rest-energy the “energy content [Energieinhalt]” (1905b) of the body, as it is a measure of all of the energy, including the potential energy, of the constituents of S.

We can display the relationships between the various masses and energies we have discussed by writing down Einstein's equation in the following form:

E = mo γ(v) c2, (2)

where we have simply substituted the expression for the relativistic mass from (1) into E = mc2. In the rest frame of S the Lorentz factor is 1, because the velocity v of S relative to its own rest frame is zero. Consequently, when O and S are in a state of relative rest, equation (2) becomes:

Eo = mo c2, (3)

where we write Eo on the left-side of (3) to indicate that we are referring to the rest-energy of S.

We shall henceforth be referring exclusively to the result expressed by (3). Consequently, we shall simply call Eo “the energy of S” and mo “the mass of S” unless we need to qualify these expressions either to avoid ambiguity or to emphasize a particular feature of some result. Furthermore, we shall follow the fairly common practice in the physics literature of dropping the subscript “o” from Eo and mo respectively. Thus, from now on, we will use E to designate rest-energy and m to designate rest-mass.

The result Einstein originally derived in (1905b) is sometimes called (e.g., by Baierlein, 2007) the “incremental” version of (3), which we can now write using our recently adopted conventions for the symbols E and m as:

ΔE = Δm c2, (4)

where ΔE designates a change in the energy of S and Δm designates a change in the mass of S. If we re-write (4) by dividing both sides by c2, we can see that (4) also says that if the energy of S changes by an amount ΔE, its mass changes concurrently by an amount Δm = ΔE/c2.

1.2 Examples of E = mc2 at work

To illustrate the physical implications of (4), physicists tend to use two main types of examples: (i) examples that examine the mass and energy of a single body as an un-analyzed whole, and (ii) examples that examine the mass and energy of a collection of objects, especially, atomic and sub-atomic objects involved in collisions. The latter class of examples is particularly useful for understanding mass-energy equivalence because such examples deal with changes in energies and masses that are detectable. Furthermore, such examples can emphasize the importance of considering all the energy of a physical system, including the potential energy of its constituents, in calculating the total mass (and energy) of that system.

We begin by discussing the mass and energy of a single body (in Section 1.2.1). As a bridge to our discussion of collisions among sub-atomic objects (in Section 1.2.3), we first discuss the mass and energy of an ideal gas (in Section 1.2.2). In each case, we carefully identify the physical system under consideration, because a failure to do so can lead to interpretative confusion.

1.2.1 Mass and energy of a single body

Let us first suppose that our physical system S consists of a 1 Kg. gold bar that absorbs enough heat energy so that its temperature increases by 10°C. As a result of absorbing this much heat energy, the inertial mass of the gold bar increases by 1.4 ×10−14 Kg. The increase in mass is tiny, because of the factor c2 that divides ΔE. Similarly, if the gold bar radiates heat so that its temperature decreases by 10°C, then its inertial mass will concurrently decrease by 1.4 ×10−14 Kg.

In this example, the novel claim made by special relativity is that the inertial mass of a physical system changes when the system either absorbs or emits energy. No such change occurs according to pre-relativistic physics. In pre-relativistic physics, the inertial mass of the gold bar, i.e., the bar's tendency to resist changes in velocity, is the same at all temperatures.

Notice that in this example we have treated the boundaries of the gold bar as the boundaries of our physical system. Thus, as a physical system, the gold bar is not isolated, because it is interacting with its environment. To put it slightly differently, when the gold bar absorbs (or emits) energy its inertial mass increases (or decreases) concurrently, because there is a net energy flow into (or out of) the gold bar.

One can, of course, ask what happens “within” the gold bar that leads to a change in its inertial mass as its energy content changes. To answer this question, one has to examine the gold bar at the atomic level. Clearly, we can perform such an analysis. Since E=mc2 governs the behavior of all physical systems, we can use it to explore more complex physical systems, such as the system of atoms that constitutes the gold bar.

However, for simplicity, let us instead consider analogous changes to the mass and energy of an ideal gas. An ideal gas constitutes a simpler physical system than the gold bar, because in analyzing the former we do not need to take into account the potential energy of the constituents that make up the physical system (which is something we cannot ignore if we analyze the gold bar at the atomic level).

1.2.2 Mass and energy of an ideal gas

Let us now suppose that our physical system S is an ideal gas, i.e., a collection of idealized point-particles that move under the action of no forces and collide with one another inside a massless container. For such a system S, the inertial mass of S is the sum of (i) the rest-masses of all the individual particles that make up the gas and (ii) the sum of kinetic energies of all the particles divided by c2. There is no other component that figures into the inertial mass of S since the particles do not have any potential energy. Consequently, if the average kinetic energy of the gas molecules decreases, say because the gas cools, then the inertial mass of the gas sample decreases. In other words, the tendency of the entire container of gas to resist changes to velocity will decrease as the temperature of the gas decreases. Once again, this is a novel prediction in special relativity that is absent from pre-relativistic physics.

Einstein's equation also says, of course, that if there is a change to the inertial mass of S, then there is a concurrent change to the rest-energy of S. Thus, if we remove one molecule from the gas sample, the rest-energy of the gas sample will diminish by an amount equal to the sum of the molecule's kinetic energy and the mass of the molecule times c2. We can modify our example to make it a bit more telling if we consider the gas sample to be at a temperature of absolute zero, i.e., if we consider the gas sample when all of its molecules are in a state of relative rest. In this case, the rest-energy of S is simply the sum of the masses of the molecules times c2. Let us suppose for simplicity that there are n molecules each of rest-mass m. The rest-energy of S is then simply E = n·mc2. If we remove one of the molecules from the gas, then the rest-energy decreases by an amount ΔE=mc2 and the new rest-energy of S becomes E′ = (n − 1)mc2.

Notice that throughout our discussion of the ideal gas we have implicitly assumed that the boundaries of the system S are the walls of the container. When we saw that the mass of S decreases, it was because S radiates energy in the form of heat. Note well that in this example S is not an isolated system, because there is a net flow of energy out of S and into its surrounding environment. Similarly, if the gas sample were to absorb energy by absorbing, say, electromagnetic radiation through its boundaries, its inertial mass would increase.

Let us now consider two such gas samples S1 and S2 that are spaced some distance apart in a vacuum. Let us further suppose that all of the energy ΔE emitted by S1 is absorbed by S2. In this configuration, the mass M1 of S1 will decrease by an amount ΔE/c2. As S2 absorbs the amount of energy ΔE, its mass increases by an equal amount ΔE/c2. There is a sense, then, in which it can be said that the radiation that “carried” the energy ΔE from S1 to S2 had the effect of transferring some of the inertial mass from S1 to S2, or as Einstein put it “If the theory agrees with the facts, then radiation transmits inertia between emitting and absorbing bodies” (1905b, p. 174).

Let us now consider a different physical configuration. Suppose our original gas sample S is enclosed within a larger container S′. Let us further assume that the interior walls of S′ are perfectly reflecting surfaces, and that the walls of S are one way mirrors with perfectly reflecting exteriors. What happens to the inertial mass of S′ as the gas in S cools?

As the gas in S cools, some of the kinetic energy of its molecules is changed into heat energy. The heat energy released by S escapes into the interior of S′. However, since we are assuming that the interior walls of S′ and the exterior walls of S are completely reflective, the heat energy does not escape S′. Thus, as the gas cools the inertial mass of S′ remains constant. The change that has occurred within S′ is that some of the kinetic energy of the molecules within S became the heat energy trapped outside of S and inside S′. However, this has no effect on the mass of S′, which is simply the sum of the masses of the molecules in S plus the total energy contained within S′ divided by c2. It matters not how the energy is distributed within S′. To put it slightly differently, since we are treating S′ as an isolated system, its inertial mass must remain constant (even according to special relativity).

1.2.3 Mass and energy in collisions of atomic and sub-atomic objects

Perhaps the most common examples used to illustrate Einstein's equation concern collisions among sub-atomic objects. For our purposes, it is safe to treat atomic and sub-atomic objects as particles involved in collisions where the total number of particles may or may not be conserved.

The bombardment of a Lithium nucleus by protons is a historically significant and useful example for discussing mass-energy equivalence in collisions where the number of particles is conserved. Cockcroft and Walton (1932) were the first to observe the release of two α-particles when a proton p collides with a 7Li nucleus. The reaction is routinely symbolized as follows:

p + 7Li → α + α (5)

That the number of particles is conserved in reaction (5) becomes clear when we recognize that the 7Li nucleus consists of three protons and four neutrons and that each α-particle consists of two protons and two neutrons.

In reaction (5), the sum of the rest-masses of the reactants (the proton and the 7Li nucleus) is greater than the sum of the rest-masses of the products (the two α-particles). However, the total kinetic energy of the reactants is less than the total kinetic energy of the products. Cockcroft and Walton's experiment is routinely interpreted as demonstrating that the difference in the rest-masses of the products and reactants (times c2) is equal to the difference in the kinetic energies of the products and reactants (but see Section 4 for further discussion of this experiment as a confirmation of mass-energy equivalence).

Descriptions of collisions among sub-atomic particles such as the one we have given above make it seem as though one must admit that mass is converted into energy. However, influenced perhaps by the widely-known discussion of mass-energy equivalence by Bondi and Spurgin (1987), physicists now explain such reactions not as cases of mass being converted into energy, but merely as cases where energy has changed forms. Typically, in these types of reactions, the potential energy that “contributes” to the rest-mass of one (or possibly) more of the reactants is transformed in a non-controversial way to the kinetic energy of the products. As Baierlein (2007, p. 322) explains, in the case of the bombardment of 7Li with protons and its subsequent decomposition into two α-particles, the apparently “excess” kinetic energy of the α-particles did not simply “appear” out of nowhere. Instead, that energy was there all along as the potential energy and kinetic energy of the nucleons. In other words, one can explain the change in mass and energy in reaction (5) by saying (i) that the potential and kinetic energies of the nucleons that make up the 7Li nucleus contribute to its rest-mass and (ii) that the vast amount of energy of the α-particles was not “created” in the reaction, or “converted” from mass, but was simply transformed from the various forms of energy the nucleons possess. Of course, precisely what it means to say that energy of the nucleons in this example can “contribute” to the mass of the nucleus remains unclear at this stage. We discuss this issue further in Section 2.

Collisions among sub-atomic particles in which the number of particles is not conserved are not quite so easily explained as merely involving the re-arrangement of particles and re-distribution of energy. The most extreme example of this sort, and one that is often used in the physics literature, is pair annihilation. Consequently, let us consider a collision between an electron e and a positron e+, which yields two photons (2γ). Symbolically, the reaction is written as follows:

e + e+  →  γ  +  γ (6)

According to the currently accepted Standard Model of particle physics, electrons and photons are both “fundamental particles,” by which physicists mean that such particles have no structure, i.e., such particles are not composed of other, smaller particles. Furthermore, the photons that are the products in reaction (6) have zero rest-mass. Thus, in reaction (6), the rest-masses of the incoming electron and positron seems to “disappear” and an equivalent amount of energy “appears” as the energy of the outgoing photons. Of course, Einstein's famous equation makes all of the correct predictions concerning the relevant masses and energies involved in reaction (6). So, for example, the total energy of the two photons is equal to the sum of the kinetic energies of the electron and positron plus the sum of the rest-masses of the electron and positron divided by c2.

Finally, although mass and energy seem to “disappear” and “appear” respectively when we focus on the individual constituents of the physical system containing the incoming electron-positron pair and the outgoing photons, the mass and energy of the entire system remains the same throughout the interaction. Before the collision, the rest-mass of the system is simply the sum of the rest-masses of the electron and positron plus the mass-equivalent of the total kinetic energy of the particles. Consequently, the entire system (if we draw the boundary of the system around the reactants and products—which is, of course, a spatial and temporal boundary), has a non-zero rest-mass prior to the collision. However, after the collision, the system, which now consists of two photons moving in non-parallel directions, also has a non-zero rest mass (see, for example, Taylor and Wheeler, 1992, p. 232). We discuss how this type type of annihilation reaction is related to interpretations of E = mc2 below in Section 2.

2. Philosophical interpretations of E = mc2

There are three main philosophical questions concerning the interpretation of E = mc2 that have occupied philosophers and physicists:

  1. Are mass and energy the same property of physical systems and is that what is meant by asserting that they are “equivalent”?
  2. Is mass “converted” into energy in some physical interactions, and if so, what is the relevant sense of “conversion”?
  3. Does E = mc2 have any ontological consequences, and if so, what are they?

Interpretations of mass-energy equivalence can be organized according to how they answer questions (1) and (2) above. As we will see (in Section 2.5), interpretations that answer question (3) affirmatively assume that the answer to question (1) is yes.

The only combination of answers to questions (1) and (2) that is inconsistent is to say that mass and energy are the same property of physical systems but that the conversion of mass into energy (or vice versa) is a genuine physical process. All the other three combinations of answers to questions (1) and (2) are viable options and have been held, at one time or another, by physicists or philosophers as indicated by the examples given in Table 1.

  Table 1: Interpretations of mass-energy equivalence
Conversion No Conversion
Same Property X Torretti (1996), Eddington (1929)
Different Properties Rindler (1977)
(conversion is possible)
Bondi & Spurgin (1987)

In this section, we will describe the merits and demerits of each of the interpretations in Table 1. Beyond these interpretations, we will also discuss two other types of interpretations of mass-energy equivalence that do not fit neatly in Table 1. First, we will discuss Lange's (2001, 2002) recent interpretation, which holds that only mass is a real property of physical systems and that we convert mass into energy when we shift the level at which we analyze physical systems. Second, we will discuss two interpretations (one by Einstein and Infeld, 1938 and the other by Zahar, 1989), which we will call ontological interpretations, that attempt to answer question (3) above affirmatively. However, we begin this section by addressing what has formerly been a fairly common misconception concerning mass-energy equivalence.

We wish to note that the general way in which we categorize and explain interpretations of mass-energy equivalence in this section first appeared in Flores (2005).

2.1 Misconceptions about E = mc2

Although it is far less common today, one still sometimes hears of Einstein's equation entailing that matter can be converted into energy. Strictly speaking, this constitutes an elementary category mistake. In relativistic physics, as in classical physics, mass and energy are both regarded as properties of physical systems or properties of the constituents of physical systems. If one wishes to talk about the physical stuff that is the bearer of such properties, then one typically talks about either “matter” or “fields.” The distinction between “matter” and “fields” in modern physics is itself rather subtle in no small part because of the equivalence of mass and energy. Nevertheless, we can assert that whatever sense of “conversion” seems compelling between mass and energy, it will have to be a “conversion” between mass and energy, and not between matter and energy. Finally, our observation obtains even in so-called “annihilation” reactions where the entire mass of the incoming particles seems to “disappear” (see, for example, Baierlein (p. 323, 2007). Of course, the older terminology of “matter” and “anti-matter” does not really help our philosophical understanding of mass-energy equivalence and is perhaps partly to blame for misconceptions surrounding E = mc2.

2.2 Same-property interpretations of E = mc2

The first interpretation we will consider answers “Yes” to the first interpretative question posed above: mass and energy are the same property of physical systems. Consequently, there is no sense in which one of the properties is ever physically converted into the other.

Philosophers such as Torretti (1996) and physicists such as Eddington (1929) have adopted the same-property interpretation. For example, Eddington states that “it seems very probable that mass and energy are two ways of measuring what is essentially the same thing, in the same sense that the parallax and distance of a star are two ways of expressing the same property of location” (1929, p. 146). According to Eddington, the distinction between mass and energy is artificial. We treat mass and energy as different properties of physical systems because we routinely measure them using different units. However, one can measure mass and energy using the same units by choosing units in which c = 1, i.e., units in which distances are measured in units of time (e.g., light-years). Once we do this, Eddington claims, the distinction between mass and energy disappears.

Like Eddington, Torretti points out that mass and energy seem to be different properties because they are measured in different units. Speaking against Bunge's (1967) view that their numerical equivalence does not entail that mass and energy “are the same thing,” Torretti explains:

If a kitchen refrigerator can extract mass from a given jug of water and transfer it by heat radiation or convection to the kitchen wall behind it, a trenchant metaphysical distinction between the mass and the energy of matter does seem far fetched (1996, p. 307, fn. 13).

For Torretti, the very existence of physical processes in which the emission of energy by an object is correlated with the decrease in the object's mass in accordance with Einstein's equation speaks strongly against the view that mass and energy are somehow distinct properties of physical systems. Torretti continues:

Of course, if lengths and times are measured with different, unrelated units, the ‘mass’... differs conceptually from the ‘energy.’ But this difference can be understood as a consquence of the convenient but deceitful act of the mind by which we abstract time and space from nature (1996, p. 307, fn. 13).

Thus, this footnote in his masterly Relativity and Geometry suggests that, for Torretti, we are misled into using different units for mass and energy merely because of how we perceive space and time. As we have seen, one can use the same units for mass and energy by adopting the convention Torretti himself uses of slecting units in which c=1 (pp. 88–89). However, it may be useful to remember that merely using the same units for spatial and temporal intervals does not entail that space and time are treated “on a par” in special relativity; they are not, as is evident from the signature of the Minkwoski metric.

The main merit of Torretti's view is that it takes very seriously the unification of space and time effected by special relativity and so famously announced in the opening lines of Minkowski (1908). It is also consistent with how mass and energy are treated in general relativity.

Interpretations such as Torretti's and Eddington's draw no further ontological conclusions from mass-energy equivalence. For example, neither Eddington nor Torretti make any explicit claim concerning whether properties are best understood as universals, or whether one ought to be a realist about such properties. Finally, by saying that mass and energy are the same, these thinkers are suggesting that the denotation of the terms “mass” and “energy” is the same, though they recognize that the connotation of these terms is clearly different.

2.3 Different-properties interpretations of E = mc2

As we have displayed in Table 1, interpretations of mass-energy equivalence that hold that mass and energy are different properties disagree concerning whether there is some physical process by which mass is converted into energy (or vice versa). Although superficially Lange's (2001, 2002) recent interpretation seems to fall in this category, as he certainly treats mass and energy as different properties, he differs from others in this category because Lange explicitly argues that only mass is a real property of physical systems. Consequently, we will discuss Lange's interpretation separately below (in Section 2.3.3).

We will begin with a discussion of Bondi and Spurgin's interpretation (in Section 2.3.1). They hold that mass and energy are distinct properties and that there is no such thing as the conversion of mass and energy. We will then discuss Rindler's interpretation (in Section 2.3.2). He maintains that mass and energy are different properties but that genuine conversions of mass and energy are at least permitted by mass-energy equivalence.

2.3.1 Bondi and Spurgin's Different-Properties, No-Connversion Interpretation

Bondi and Spurgin's (1987) interpretation of mass-energy equivalence has been influential especially among physicists concerned with physics education. In an article where they complained about how students often misunderstand Einstein's famous equation, Bondi and Spurgin argued that Einstein's equation does not entail that mass and energy are the same property any more than the equation m = ρV (where m is mass, V is volume, and ρ is density) entails that mass and volume are the same. Just as in the case of mass and volume, Bondi and Spurgin argue, mass and energy have different dimensions. Ultimately, this reduces to a disagreement with philosophers such as Torretti who would argue that time, as a dimension, is no different than any one of the spatial dimensions. Note well that this is not an issue about the units we use for measuring mass (or energy).

Everyone agrees that according to special relativity one can measure spatial intervals in units of time. We can do this because of the postulate of special relativity that states that the speed of light has the same value in all inertial frames. If we perform what amounts to a substitution of variables and take our spatial dimensions to be xn* = xn/c, where c is the speed of light and n = 1, 2, 3, we can select units in which c = 1.

However, one can consistently use units in which c = 1 and hold that there is nevertheless a fundamental distinction between space and time as dimensions. On such a view, which is the view that Bondi and Spurgin seem implicitly to be defending, while time is distinct from any given spatial dimension, the contingent fact that c has the same value in all inertial frames allows us to perform the relevant substitution of variables. However, it does not follow from this that we ought to treat time on a par with any spatial dimension, or that we ought to treat the saptio-temporal interval as more fundamental (in the way Torretti does).

In their influential article, Bondi and Spurgin then examine a variety of cases of purported conversions of mass and energy. In each case, they show that the purported conversion of mass and energy is best understood merely as a transformation of energy. In general, Bondi and Spurgin argue, whenever we encounter a purported conversion of mass and energy, we can always explain what is taking place by looking at the constituents of the physical system in the reaction and examining how energy is proportioned among the constituents before and after the reaction takes place.

As we have seen above, in the minimal interpretation of E = mc2 (Section 1.2.3), explanations of purported “conversions” along the lines suggested by Bondi and Spurgin are now commonplace in the physics literature. These explanations have the merit of emphasizing that in many cases the mysteries of mass-energy equivalence do not concern one physical property magically being transfigured into another. However, the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation of mass-energy equivalence has the demerit that it fails to address reactions such as the electron-positron annihilation reaction (6). In such reactions, not only is the number of particles not conserved, but all of the particles involved are, by hypothesis, indivisible wholes. Thus, the energy liberated in such reactions cannot be explained as resulting from a transformation of the energy that was originally possessed by the constituents of the reacting particles. Of course, Bondi and Spurgin may simply be hoping that physics will reveal that particles such as electrons and positrons are not indivisible wholes after all. Indeed, they may even use annihilation reactions combined with their interpretation of mass-energy equivalence to argue that it cannot be the case that such particles are indivisible. Thus, we witness here explicitly just how closely related interpretations concerning mass-energy equivalence can be to views concerning the nature of matter.

The second demerit of the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation, which it shares with all other interpretations of mass-energy equivalence that hold that mass and energy are different properties, is that it remains silent about a central feature of physical systems it uses in explaining apparent conversions of mass and energy. In order to explain purported conversions along the lines suggested by Bondi-Spurgin, one must make the familiar assumption that the energy of the constituents of a system, be it potential energy or kinetic energy, “contributes” to the rest-mass of the system. Thus, for example, in the bombardment and subsequent decomposition of 7Li, i.e., reaction (5), Bondi and Spurgin must explain the rest-mass of the 7Li in the familiar way, as arising from both the sum of the rest-masses of the nucleons, and the mass-equivalents of their energies. However, the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation offers no explanation concerning why the energy of the constituents of a physical system, be it potential energy or kinetic energy, manifest itself as part of the inertial mass of the system as a whole.

As we shall see, Rindler's interpretation of mass-energy equivalence attempts to address the first demerit of the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation, while Lange's interpretation brings to the foreground that the energy of the constituents of a physical system “contributes” to that system's inertial mass.

2.3.2 Rindler's Different-Properties, Conversion Interpretation

Rindler's interpretation of mass-energy equivalence is a slightly, though importantly, modified version of the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation. Rindler (for example, in 1977), agrees that there are many purported conversions that are best understood as mere transformations of one kind of energy into a different kind of energy. Thus, Rindler too adopts the minimal interpretation of mass-energy equivalence of, for example, the bombardment and subsequent decomposition of 7Li.

However, for Rindler, there is nothing within special relativity itself that rules out the possibility that there exists fundamental, structureless particles (i.e., particles that are “atomic” in the philosophical sense of the term). If such particles exist, it is possible according to Einstein's equation that some or all of the mass of such particles “disappears” and an equivalent amount of energy “appears” within the relevant physical system. Thus, Rindler seems to be suggesting that we should confine our interpretation of mass-energy equivalence to what we can deduce from special relativity. Thus, we should hold that Einstein's equation at least allows for genuine conversions of mass into energy, in the sense that there may be cases where a certain amount of inertial mass “disappears” from within a physical system and a corresponding amount of energy “appears.” Furthermore, in such cases we cannot explain the reaction as merely involving a transformation of one kind of energy into another.

The merit of Rindler's interpretation is that it confines the interpretation of Einstein's equation to what we can validly infer from the postulates of special relativity. Unlike the interpretation proposed by Bondi and Spurgin, Rindler's interpretation makes no assumptions about the constitution of matter.

2.3.3 Lange's One-Property, No-Conversion Interpretation

Lange (2001, 2002) has recently suggested a unique interpretation of mass-energy equivalence. Lange begins his interpretation by arguing that rest-mass is the only real property of physical systems. This claim by itself suggests that there can be no such thing as a physical process by which mass is converted into energy, for as Lange asks “in what sense can mass be converted into energy when mass and energy are not on a par in terms of their reality?” (p. 227, 2002, emphasis in original). Lange then goes on to argue that a careful analysis of purported conversions of mass-energy equivalence reveals that there is no physical process by which mass is ever converted into energy. Instead, Lange argues, the apparent conversion of mass into energy (or vice versa) is an illusion that arises when we shift our level of analysis in examining a physical system.

Lange seems to use a familiar argument from the Lorentz invariance of certain physical quantities to their “reality.” For Lange, if a physical quantity is not Lorentz invariant, then it is not real in the sense that it does not represent “the objective facts, on which all inertial frames agree” (p. 209, 2002). Thus Lange uses Lorentz invariance as a necessary condition for the reality of a physical quantity. However, in several other places, for example when Lange argues for the reality of the Minkowski interval (p. 219, 2002) or when he argues for the reality of rest-mass (p. 223, 2002), Lange implicitly uses Lorentz invariance as a sufficient condition for the reality of a physical quantity. However, if Lange adopts Lorentz-invariance as both a necessary and sufficient condition for the reality of a physical quantity, then he is committed to the view that rest-energy is real for the very same reasons he is committed to the view that rest-mass is real. Thus, Lange's original suggestion that there can be no physical process of conversion between mass and energy because they have different ontological status seems challenged.

As it happens, Lange's overall position is not seriously challenged by the ontological status of rest-energy. Lange could easily grant that rest-energy is a real property of physical systems and still argue (i) that there is no such thing as a physical process of conversion between mass and energy and (ii) that purported conversions result from shifting levels of analysis when we examine a physical system. It is his observations concerning (ii) that force us to face once again the question of why the energy of the constituents of a physical system manifests itself as the mass of the system. Lange's interpretation, unfortunately, does not get us any closer to answering that question, though as we shall suggest below, no interpretation of mass-energy equivalence can do that (see Section 3.2).

One of the main examples that Lange uses to present his interpretation of mass-energy equivalence is the heating of an ideal gas, which we have already considered above (see Section 1.2.2). He also considers examples involving reactions among sub-atomic particles that, for our purposes, are very similar in the relevant respects to the example we have discussed concerning the bombardment and subsequent decomposition of a 7Li nucleus. In both cases, Lange essentially adopts the minimal interpretation we have discussed above. In the case of the ideal gas, as we have seen, when the gas sample is heated and its inertial mass concurrently increases, this increase in rest-mass is not a result of the gas somehow being suddenly (or gradually) composed of molecules that are themselves more massive. It is also not a result of the gas suddenly (or gradually) containing more molecules. Instead, the increased kinetic energy of the molecules of the gas “contributes” to the increase in the gas sample's inertial mass. Lange summarizes this feature of the increase in the gas sample's inertial mass by saying:

... we have just seen that this “conversion” of energy into mass is not a real physical process at all. We “converted” energy into mass simply by changing our perspective on the gas: shifting from initially treating it as many bodies to treating it as a single body [emphases in original] (p. 236, 2002)

Unfortunately, Lange's characterization threatens to leave readers with the impression that if “we” had not shifted our perspective in the analysis of the gas, no change to the inertial mass of the gas sample would have ensued. Of course, it is unlikely that Lange means this. Surely, Lange would agree that even if no human beings are around to analyze a gas sample, the gas sample will respond in any physical interaction differently as a whole after it has absorbed some energy precisely because its inertial mass will have increased.

The merits of Lange's view concerning the “conversion” of mass-energy equivalence are essentially the same as the merits of both the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation and Rindler's interpretation. In all cases, these interpretations agree with the minimal interpretation of E = mc2 that there are important cases where we have now learned enough to assert confidently that purported “conversions“ of mass and energy are merely cases where energy of one kind is transformed into energy of another kind. Aside from the comparatively minor issue concerning the “reality” of rest-energy, the main demerit of Lange's view is that it might potentially mislead unsuspecting readers.

2.4 Interpretations of E = mc2 and hypotheses concerning the nature of matter

The relationship between mass-energy equivalence and hypotheses concerning the nature of matter is two-fold. First, as we have suggested implicitly, some of the interpretations of mass-energy equivalence seem to assume certain features of matter. Second, some philosophers and physicists, notably Einstein and Infeld (1938) and Zahar (1989), have argued that mass-energy equivalence has consequences concerning the nature of matter. In this section, we will discuss the first of these two relationships between E = mc2 and hypotheses concerning the nature of matter. We discuss the second relationship in the next section (Section 2.5).

To explain how some interpretations of mass-energy equivalence rest on assumptions concerning the nature of matter, we need first to recognize, as several authors have pointed out, e.g., Rindler (1977), Stachel and Torretti (1982), and Mermin and Feigenbaum (1990), that the relation one actually derives from the special relativity is:

E = (mq)c2 + K, (7)

where K is merely an additive factor that fixes the zero-point of energy and is conventionally set to zero and q is also routinely set to zero. However, unlike the convention to set K to zero, setting q = 0 involves a hypothesis concerning the nature of matter, because it rules out the possibility that there exists matter that has mass but which is such that some of its mass can never be “converted” into energy.

The same-property interpretation of mass-energy equivalence rests squarely on the assumption that q = 0. Mass and energy cannot be the same property if there exists matter that has mass some of which cannot ever, under any conditions, be “converted” into energy. However, one could argue that although the same-property interpretation makes this assumption, it is not an unjustified assumption. Currently, physicists do not have any evidence that there exists matter for which q is not equal to zero. Nevertheless, it seems important, from a philosophical point of view, to recognize that the same-property interpretation depends not only on what one can derive from the postulates of special relativity, but also on evidence from “outside” this theory.

Interpretations of E = mc2 that hold that mass and energy are distinct properties of physical systems need not, of course, assume that q is different from zero. Such interpretations can simply leave the value of q to be determined empirically, for as we have seen such interpretations argue for treating mass and energy as distinct properties on different grounds. Nevertheless, the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation does seem to adopt implicitly a hypothesis concerning the nature of matter.

According to Bondi and Spurgin, all purported conversions of mass and energy are cases where one type of energy is transformed into another kind of energy. This in turn assumes that we can, in all cases, understand a reaction by examining the constituents of physical systems. If we focus on reactions involving sub-atomic particles, for example, Bondi and Spurgin seem to assume that we can always explain such reactions by examining the internal structure of sub-atomic particles. However, if we ever find good evidence to support the view that some particles have no internal structure, as it now seems to be the case with electrons for example, then we either have to give up the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation or use the interpretation itself to argue that such seemingly structureless particles actually do contain an internal structure. Thus, it seems that the Bondi-Spurgin interpretation assumes something like the infinite divisibility of matter, which is clearly a hypothesis that lies “outside” special relativity.

2.5 Ontological interpretations of E = mc2

Einstein and Infeld (1938) and Zahar (1989) have both argued that E = mc2 has ontological consequences. Both of the Einstein-Infeld and Zahar interpretations begin by adopting the same-property interpretation of E = mc2. Thus, according to both interpretations, mass and energy are the same properties of physical systems. Furthermore, both the Einstein-Infeld and Zahar interpretations use a rudimentary distinction between “matter” and “fields.” According to this somewhat dated distinction, classical physics includes two fundamental substances: matter, by which one means ponderable material stuff, and fields, by which one means physical fields such as a the electromagnetic field. For both Einstein and Infeld and Zahar, matter and fields in classical physics are distinguished by the properties they bear. Matter has both mass and energy, whereas fields only have energy. However, since the equivalence of mass and energy entails that mass and energy are really the same physical property after all, say Einstein and Infeld and Zahar, one can no longer distinguish between matter and fields, as both now have both mass and energy.

Although both Einstein and Infeld and Zahar use the same basic argument, they reach slightly different conclusions. Zahar argues that mass-energy equivalence entails that the fundamental stuff of physics is a sort of “I-know-not-what” that can manifest itself as either matter or field. Einstein and Infeld, on the other hand, in places seem to argue that we can infer that the fundamental stuff of physics is fields. In other places, however, Einstein and Infeld seem a bit more cautious and suggest only that one can construct a physics with only fields in its ontology.

The demerits of either ontological interpretation of mass-energy equivalence are that it rests upon the same-property interpretation of E = mc2. As we have discussed above (see Section 2.4), while one can adopt the same-property interpretation, to do so one must make additional assumptions concerning the nature of matter. Furthermore, the ontological interpretation rests on what nowadays seems like a rather crude distinction between “matter” and “fields.” To be sure, mass-energy equivalence has figured prominently in physicists' conception of matter in no small part because it does open up the door to a description of what we ordinarily regard as ponderable matter in terms of fields, since the energy of the field at one level can manifest itself as mass one level up. However, the inference from mass-energy equivalence to the fundamental ontology of modern physics seems far more subtle than either Enstein and Infeld or Zahar suggest.

3. History of Derivations of Mass-Energy Equivalence

Einstein first derived mass-energy equivalence from the principles of special relativity in a small article titled “Does the Inertia of a Body Depend Upon Its Energy Content?” (1905b). This derivation, along with others that followed soon after (e.g., Planck (1906), Von Laue (1911)), uses Maxwell's theory of electromagnetism. (See Section 3.1.) However, as Einstein later observed (1935), mass-energy equivalence is a result that should be independent of any theory that describes a specific physical interaction. This is the main reason that led physicists to search for “purely dynamical” derivations, i.e., derivations that invoke only mechanical concepts such as “energy” and “momentum”, and the principles that govern them. (See Section 3.2)

3.1 Derivations of E = mc2 that Use Maxwell's Theory

Einstein's original derivation of mass-energy equivalence is the best known in this group. Einstein begins with the following thought-experiment: a body at rest (in some inertial frame) emits two pulses of light of equal energy in opposite directions. Einstein then analyzes this “act of emission” from another inertial frame, which is in a state of uniform motion relative to the first. In this analysis, Einstein uses Maxwell's theory of electromagnetism to calculate the physical properties of the light pulses (such as their intensity) in the second inertial frame. By comparing the two descriptions of the “act of emission”, Einstein arrives at his celebrated result: “the mass of a body is a measure of its energy-content; if the energy changes by L, the mass changes in the same sense by L/9 × 1020, the energy being measured in ergs, and the mass in grammes” (1905b, p. 71). A similar derivation using the same thought experiment but appealing to the Doppler effect was given by Langevin (1913) (see the discussion of the inertia of energy in Fox (1965, p. 8)).

Some philosophers and historians of science claim that Einstein's first derivation is fallacious. For example, in The Concept of Mass, Jammer says: “It is a curious incident in the history of scientific thought that Einstein's own derivation of the formula E = mc2, as published in his article in Annalen der Physik, was basically fallacious. . .   the result of a petitio principii, the conclusion begging the question” (Jammer, 1961, p. 177). According to Jammer, Einstein implicitly assumes what he is trying to prove, viz., that if a body emits an amount of energy L, its inertial mass will decrease by an amount Δm = L/c2. Jammer also accuses Einstein of assuming the expression for the relativistic kinetic energy of a body. If Einstein made these assumptions, he would be guilty of begging the question. Recently, however, Stachel and Torretti (1982) have shown convincingly that Einstein's (1905b) argument is sound. They note that Einstein indeed derives the expression for the kinetic energy of an “electron” (i.e., a structureless particle with a net charge) in his earlier (1905a) paper. However, Einstein nowhere uses this expression in the (1905b) derivation of mass-energy equivalence. Stachel and Torretti also show that Einstein's critics overlook two key moves that are sufficient to make Einstein's derivation sound, since one need not assume that Δm = L/c2.

Einstein's further conclusion that “the mass of a body is a measure of its energy content” (1905b, p. 71) does not, strictly speaking, follow from his argument. As Torretti (1996) and other philosophers and physicists have observed, Einstein's (1905b) argument allows for the possibility that once a body's energy store has been entirely used up (and subtracted from the mass using the mass-energy equivalence relation) the remainder is not zero. In other words, it is only an hypothesis in Einstein's (1905b) argument, and indeed in all derivations of E = mc2 in special relativity, that no “exotic matter” exists that is not convertible into energy (see Ehlers, Rindler, Penrose, (1965) for a discussion of this point). However, particle-antiparticle anihilation experiments in atomic physics, which were first observed decades after 1905, strongly support “Einstein's dauntless extrapolation” (Torretti, 1996, p. 112).

3.2 Purely Dynamical Derivations of E = mc2

Purely dynamical derivations of E =  mc2 typically proceed by analyzing an inelastic collision from the point of view of two inertial frames in a state of relative motion (the centre-of-mass frame, and an inertial frame moving with a relative velocity v). One of the first papers to appear following this approach is Perrin's (1932). According to Rindler and Penrose (1965), Perrin's derivation was based largely on Langevin's “elegant” lectures, which were delivered at the College de France in Zurich around 1922. Einstein himself gave a purely dynamical derivation (Einstein, 1935), though he nowhere mentions either Langevin or Perrin. The most comprehensive derivation of this sort was given by Ehlers, Rindler and Penrose (1965). More recently, a purely dynamical version of Einstein's original (1905b) thought experiment, where the particles that are emitted are not photons, has been given by Mermin and Feigenbaum (1990).

Derivations in this group are distinctive because they demonstrate that mass-energy equivalence is a consequence of the changes to the structure of spacetime brought about by special relativity. The relationship between mass and energy is independent of Maxwell's theory or any other theory that describes a specific physical interaction. We can get a glimpse of this by noting that to derive E = mc2 by analyzing a collision, one must first define relativistic momentum (prel) and relativistic kinetic energy (Trel), since one cannot use the old Newtonian notions of momentum and kinetic energy. In Einstein's own purely dynamical derivation (1935), more than half of the paper is devoted to finding the mathematical expressions that define prel and Trel. This much work is required to arrive at these expressions for two reasons. First, the changes to the structure of spacetime must be incorporated into the definitions of the relativistic quantities. Second, prel and Trel must be defined so that they reduce to their Newtonian counterparts in the appropriate limit. This last requirement ensures, in effect, that special relativity will inherit the empirical success of Newtonian physics. Once the definitions of prel and Trel are obtained, the derivation of mass-energy equivalence is straight-forward. (For a more detailed discussion of Einstein's (1935), see Flores, (1998).)

Finally, we can now appreciate why no interpretation of mass-energy equivalence can explain why the rest-mass of the constituents of a physical system contributes to that system's rest-energy, or why the energy of the constituents contributes to the rest-mass of the system. Given the changes to the structure of spacetime imposed by special relativity, and given the definitions of dynamical quantities one adopts (for well-motivated reasons), one can certainly derive mass-energy equivalence from special relativity. Such a derivation, however, can only show that mass is equivalent to energy in the sense we have struggled to elaborate above. Such a derivation, in other words, is a good candidate for what Kitcher familiarly calls a “top-down” explanation. For further discussion of this point, see Flores (1999, 2005).

4. Experimental Verification of Mass-Energy Equivalence

Cockcroft and Walton (1932) are routinely credited with the first experimental verification of mass-energy equivalence. Cockcroft and Walton examined a variety of reactions where different atomic nulcei are bombarded by protons. They focussed their attention primarily on the bombardment of 7Li by protons (i.e., reaction (5) above).

In their famous paper, Cockcroft and Walton noted that the sum of the rest-masses of the proton and the Lithium nucleus (i.e., the reactants) was 1.0072 + 7.0104 = 8.0176 amu. However, the sum of the rest-masses of the two α-particles (i.e., the products) was 8.0022 amu. Thus, it seems as if an amount of mass of 0.0154 amu has “disappeared” from the reactants. Cockcroft and Walton also observed that the total energy (in the reference frame in which the 7Li nucleus is at rest) for the reactants was 125 KeV. However, the total kinetic energy of the α-particles was observed to be 17.2 MeV. Thus, it seems as if an amount of energy of approximately 17 MeV has “appeared” in the reaction.

Implicitly referring to the equivalence of mass and energy, Cockcroft and Walton then simply assert that a mass 0.0154 amu “is equivalent to an energy liberation of (14.3 ± 2.7) ×106 Volts” (p. 236). They then implicitly suggest that this inferred value for the kinetic energy of the two resulting α-particles is consistent with the observed value for the kinetic energy of the α-particles. Cockcroft and Walton conclude that “the observed energies of the α-particles are consistent with our hypothesis” (pp. 236–237). The hypothesis they set out to test, however, is not mass-energy equivalence, but rather than when a 7Li nucleus is bombarded with protons, the result is two α-particles.

As Stuewer (1993) has suggested, Cockcroft and Walton use mass-energy equivalence to confirm their hypothesis about what happens when 7Li is bombarded by protons. Hence, it does not seem we ought to regard this experiment as a confirmation of E = mc2. However, if we take some of the other evidence that Cockcroft and Walton provide concerning the identification of the products in reaction (5) as sufficient to establish that the products are indeed α-particles, then we can interpret this experiment as a confirmation of mass-energy equivalence, which is how this experiment is often reported in the physics literature.

Much more recently, Rainville et al. (2005) have published the results of what they call “A direct test of E = mc2.” Their experiments test mass-energy equivalence “directly” by comparing the difference in the rest-masses in a neutron capture reaction with the energy of the emitted γ-rays. Specifically, Rainville et al. examine two reactions, one involving neutron capture by Sulphur (S), the other involving neutron capture by Silicon (Si):

n  +  32S  →  33S  +  γ (8)
n  +  28Si  →  29Si  +  γ (9)

In these reactions, when the nucleus of an atom (in this case either 32S or 28Si) captures the neutron, a new isotope is created in an excited state. In returning to its ground state, the isotope emits a γ-ray. According to Einstein's equation, the difference in the rest-masses of the neutron plus nucleus, on the one hand, and the new isotope in its ground state on the other hand, should be equal to the energy of the emitted photon. Thus, Rainville et al. test ΔE = Δmc2 by making very accurate measurements of the rest-mass difference and the frequency, and hence energy, of the emitted photon. Rainville et al. report that their measurements show that Einstein's equation obtains to an accuracy of at least 0.00004%.

5. Conclusion

In this entry, we have presented a minimal interpretation of mass-energy equivalence widely held by both physicists and philosophers. We have also canvassed a variety of philosophical interpretations of mass-energy equivalence some of which go beyond the minimal interpretation with which we began. Along the way, we have presented the merits and demerits of each interpretation. We have also presented a brief history of derivations of mass-energy equivalence to emphasize that the equivalence of mass and energy is a direct result to changes to the structure of spacetime imposed by special relativity. Finally, we have briefly and rather selectively discussed the empirical confirmation of mass-energy equivalence.

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