Ontological Commitment

First published Mon Nov 3, 2014

Ontology, as etymology suggests, is the study of being, of what there is. The ontologist asks: What entities or kinds of entity exist? Are there abstract entities, such as sets or numbers, in addition to concrete entities, such as people and puddles and protons? Are there properties or universals in addition to (or instead of) the particular entities that, as we say, instantiate them? Questions such as these have divided philosophers down the ages, and divide them no less to this day.

Meta-ontology concerns itself with the nature and methodology of ontology, with the interpretation and significance of ontological questions such as those exhibited above. The problem of ontological commitment is a problem in meta-ontology rather than ontology proper.[1] The meta-ontologist asks (among other things): What entities or kinds of entity exist according to a given theory or discourse, and thus are among its ontological commitments? Having a criterion of ontological commitment for theories is needed, arguably, if one is to systematically and rigorously attack the problem of ontology: typically, we accept entities into our ontology via accepting theories that are ontologically committed to those entities. A criterion of ontological commitment, then, is a pre-requisite for ontological inquiry.

On its face, the notion of ontological commitment for theories is a simple matter. Theories have truth conditions. These truth conditions tell us how the world must be in order for the theory to be true; they make demands on the world. Sometimes, perhaps always, they demand of the world that certain entities or kinds of entity exist. The ontological commitments of a theory, then, are just the entities or kinds of entity that must exist in order for the theory to be true. End of story (compare Rayo 2007: 428).

But complications arise as soon as one tries to specify a theory's truth conditions: different accounts of truth conditions lead to different accounts of ontological commitment. Moreover, theories couched in ordinary language do not wear their truth conditions—or their ontological commitments—on their sleeves. Thus, the need arises to find a criterion of ontological commitment: a test or method that can be applied to theories in a neutral way to determine the theory's ontological commitments. For example, perhaps the theory should first be translated into a canonical formal language, such as the language of first-order predicate logic, where truth conditions, and thus ontological commitments, are easier to specify. But whenever these translations are controversial, so will be the verdicts as to ontological commitment. And, even when translated into a formal language, such as the language of first-order predicate logic, different ontological standpoints may disagree as to the existential presuppositions of the theory. The notion of ontological commitment, introduced to help resolve disputes in ontology, becomes hostage to those very disputes. Strife over the ontological commitments of theories begins to appear inevitable.

The following article canvasses and evaluates the most prominent approaches to ontological commitment. It starts with Quinean approaches that focus on the existential quantifier and the values of the variables. It then contrasts Quinean approaches with more general entailment approaches that drop the preoccupation with the quantifier. It then considers a strengthening of the entailment approach that requires that ontological commitments of a theory be truthmakers for that theory. It then steps back to examine how, and to what extent, the notion of ontological commitment can be applied to ordinary language. The article concludes by considering less orthodox views associated with Frege and with Carnap.

1. Quantifier Accounts of Ontological Commitment

1.1 Quine's Criterion, Preliminaries

Quine's criterion of ontological commitment has dominated ontological discussion in analytic philosophy since the middle of the 20th century; it deserves to be called the orthodox view. For Quine, such a criterion played two distinct roles. First, it allowed one to measure the ontological cost of theories, an important component in deciding which theories to accept; it thus provided a partial foundation for theory choice. Moreover, once one had settled on a total theory, it allowed one to determine which components of the theory were responsible for its ontological costs (see Quine (1960: 270) for the purported benefits of such ontological bookkeeping). Second, it played a polemical role. It could be used to argue that opponents' theories were more costly than the theorists admitted (see Church (1958), who wields the criterion polemically against Ayer, Pap, and Ryle). And it could be used to advance a traditional nominalist agenda because, as Quine saw it, ordinary subject-predicate sentences carry no ontological commitment to properties or universals.

The locus classicus for Quine's criterion is “On What There Is”. Quine writes:

A theory is committed to those and only those entities to which the bound variables of the theory must be capable of referring in order that the affirmations made in the theory be true. [2] (Quine 1948: 33)

To illustrate: if a theory contains a quantified sentence ‘∃x Electron(x)’, then the bound variable ‘x’ must range over electrons in order for the theory to be true; and so the theory is ontologically committed to electrons. (For an introduction to the logic of quantifiers and bound variables, the basics of which are presupposed in this article, see Shapiro (2013).)

Talk of “commitment” has an unfortunate connotation: it applies more naturally to persons than to theories. But Quine's criterion should be understood as applying to theories primarily, and to persons derivatively by way of the theories they accept (Quine 1953: 103). It would be more perspicuous to speak simply of the existential implications, or ontological presuppositions, of a theory. But ‘ontological commitment’ is well entrenched, and it would be pointless to try to avoid it.

It is important to note at the start that Quine's criterion is descriptive; it should not be confused with the prescriptive account of ontological commitment that is part of his general method of ontology. That method, roughly, is this: first, regiment the competing theories in first-order predicate logic; second, determine which of these theories is epistemically best (where what counts as “epistemically best” depends in part on pragmatic features such as simplicity and fruitfulness); third, choose the epistemically best theory. We can then say: one is ontologically committed to those entities that are needed as values of the bound variables for this chosen epistemically best theory to be true. Put like this, the account may seem circular: ontological commitment depends on what theories are best, which depends in part on the simplicity, and so the ontological commitments, of those theories. But there is no circularity in Quine's ontological method. The above account of ontological commitment is prescriptive, and applies to persons, not to theories. What entities we ought to commit ourselves to depends on a prior descriptive account of what entities theories are committed to. The prescriptive account of ontological commitment serves as a crucial premise in the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument for the existence of abstract entities (the locus classicus is Putnam 1971). This article, however, will focus entirely on descriptive criteria of ontological commitment.

It is also important to distinguish at the outset the ontological commitments of a theory from its ideological commitments (following Quine 1951a). The ontological commitments of a theory are, roughly, what the theory says exists; a theory is ontologically committed to electrons, for example, if the truth of the theory requires that there be electrons. The ideological commitments of a theory are, roughly, those concepts, logical or non-logical, that are expressible within the theory. Ontological commitment and ideological commitment are largely independent of one another. For example, a theory may be ontologically committed to there being Ks, even if the concept of being a K is not expressible in the theory. In the other direction, a theory may be ideologically committed to relational concepts that add structure to the entities posited by the theory without adding new kinds of entity to the ontology. There has been a trend in recent metaphysics to take ideological commitment to be as important—if not more important—than ontological commitment with respect to providing a criterion of theory choice, at least for fundamental theories (see especially Sider 2011: 12–15). In this article, however, only ontological commitment will be discussed.

1.2 Relata of Ontological Commitment

Ontological commitment, on its face, is a relation between theories and entities, or kinds of entity. Before attempting to explicate and evaluate Quine's criterion of ontological commitment, it is important to specify more carefully the relata. A theory, for Quine, is just a set of sentences (or a single sentence) of some language. But what language? Strictly speaking, Quine's criterion is only to be applied to theories couched within the following especially austere form of first-order predicate logic: there are first-order existential and universal quantifiers but no other variable-binding operators; there are predicates, including identity, but no function symbols or individual constants. Thus, all names and definite descriptions have been eliminated from the language; reference rests entirely with the variables. The elimination of singular terms serves both to simplify the criterion and to avoid age-old confusions. Unlike bound variables, singular terms sometimes do and sometimes do not carry ontological commitment: ‘Socrates is wise’ presumably does; but ‘Pegasus does not exist’ presumably does not. Whenever singular terms do carry ontological commitment, it will be reflected in the assignment to the variables of the regimented theory. Thus, whenever a sentence containing a definite description is ontologically committed to some entity satisfying the description, so will be the regimented sentence that results from applying Russell's theory of descriptions (which was endorsed by Quine). Whenever a sentence containing a name is ontologically committed to some entity denoted by the name, so will be a regimented sentence that contains a predicate applying exclusively to that entity. For example, if instead of using the name ‘Socrates’ we use a predicate ‘Is-Socrates’ interpreted to mean is-identical-with-Socrates (sometimes abbreviated ‘Socratizes’), the ontological commitment incurred by the name is transferred without loss to the bound variable in ‘∃x Is‑Socrates(x)’ (or ‘∃x Socratizes(x)’).[3]

Unless noted otherwise, ‘theory’ will always mean ‘interpreted theory’; uninterpreted theories say nothing and have no ontological commitments. When the theory is couched within first-order logic, the interpretation is given by standard Tarskian semantics. In particular, each monadic predicate of the language of the theory has been assigned a class as its interpretation; each n-ary predicate has been assigned a class of n-tuples; the quantifiers are interpreted objectually by way of assignments to the variables. On the other hand, it is not supposed that the domain of the quantifiers has been fixed once and for all. Sometimes, in applying the criteria, alternative domains are considered, and the theory is evaluated for truth under the various alternatives.

The restriction to theories couched within first-order predicate logic is severe. Philosophers have been no less interested in the ontological commitments of theories couched within other logical frameworks, such as higher-order or intensional logics (see §1.7.2 and §1.7.3). Worse, if the criterion is to have application to the actual ontological debates among philosophers, it will have to apply to theories couched within ordinary language as well. This led Quine—at least sometimes—to endorse an extended criterion of ontological commitment: a theory is ontologically committed to an entity or kind of entity if and only if every acceptable paraphrase of the theory into (austere) first-order predicate logic is ontologically committed to that entity or kind of entity. This provides philosophers with a method for avoiding ontological commitment: find an acceptable paraphrase of the theory into first-order predicate logic that is not ontologically committed to the questionable entities (Quine 1948: 32, 1953: 103–104). (What counts as an “acceptable paraphrase”, and whether any sort of “paraphrase” should be required, is discussed in §4.2.)

What about the second relatum? What is it that theories are committed to? Sometimes we say that a theory is committed to a particular entity. For example, we say that the sentence ‘Socrates exists’ (or, in our austere language, ‘∃x Socratizes(x)’) is committed to Socrates. But more often we speak of ontological commitment to some entities in the plural, or to some kind of entity. For example, we speak of theories being committed to universals, or numbers, or electrons. But ontological commitment to some entities plurally, or some kind of entity, is clearly not the same as ontological commitment to each of the entities singly. Consider a theory that contains ‘∃x Elephant(x)’. It is ontologically committed to elephants, or to the kind elephant, but not to any particular elephant: no particular elephant need be the value of the variable ‘x’ in order for the sentence to be true. A theory is committed to Ks, or a kind K, just in case the values of the variables must include at least one K in order for the theory to be true, in which case the existence of Ks is in some sense entailed by the theory. (More on different relevant senses of entailment in §1.5 and §2 below.)

But there is a problem (Cartwright 1954; Scheffler and Chomsky 1958; Jackson 1989; Michael 2008). Suppose first that ontological commitment takes a plural argument in its second place, that a commitment to Ks is a relation to the Ks themselves. Then, on plausible assumptions, the meta-ontologist cannot assert that a theory is ontologically committed to Ks without being committed to Ks herself; for the meta-ontologist's own domain of quantification must include at least one K in order for ‘T is ontologically committed to Ks’ to be true. And that is wrong. Suppose instead, then, that ontological commitment is a relation, not to the Ks, but to the kind K. If a kind K can exist without Ks existing, this may help. But, on plausible assumptions, it still has the untoward consequence that the meta-ontologist cannot herself assert that a theory is ontologically committed to a kind K without being committed to kinds. And, whether kinds are construed as properties, or sets of possibilia, or taken to be sui generis, that still seems wrong. This suggests that the logical form of statements attributing ontological commitment is misleading, and that ontological commitment is not a genuine relation at all; only then will meta-ontological claims about ontological commitment themselves be ontologically neutral, or as ontologically neutral as possible.[4] In this article, the locutions ‘ontological commitment to Ks’ and ‘ontological commitment to the kind K’ will be used without presupposing that ontological commitment is a relation to the Ks plurally, or to the kind K, or, indeed, that it is a relation at all. The different accounts of ontological commitment will treat the matter differently.

Finally, it will be useful in what follows to interpret ‘K’ and ‘kind’ broadly. So, for example, not-being-an-electron is a kind, and being-an-electron-or-a-chair is a kind, and so is being one of some random collection of entities. We may not be interested in asking whether a theory is ontologically committed to negative, or disjunctive, or gerrymandered kinds; but it is harmless to allow the criterion to supply answers. Moreover, this allows us to assimilate ontological commitment to single entities to ontological commitment to kinds of entity: to be ontologically committed to a single entity, a, is just to be ontologically committed to the kind, is-identical-with-a.

1.3 Quine's Criterion: Extensional Versions

We turn now to the task of providing a precise formulation of Quine's criterion. This task is none too easy: formulations that keep within the strictures of Quine's overall philosophy are woefully inadequate; the farther one is allowed to stray from Quinean strictures, the better things look; but, by the time one gets to a defensible criterion, one has left Quine far behind. I will consider in turn extensional, metalinguistic, and modal formulations.

Quine's statement of his criterion (quoted above) appears to be modal. It asks: what entities must be taken to be values of the bound variables in order for the sentences of the theory to be true? But given Quine's general hostility to modality (e.g., in Quine 1953: 139–159), it is all but certain that he thought the ‘must’ was eliminable. Moreover, Quine explicitly claimed that his account of ontological commitment was within the theory of reference, not the theory of meaning (Quine 1953: 130–131). This suggests that Quine had in mind a purely extensional criterion, and an extensional individuation of kinds. Indeed, Quine provides an extensional criterion for a special case: the ontological commitments of an existential sentence.[5] He writes:

To say that a given existential quantification presupposes objects of a given kind is to say simply that the open sentence which follows the quantifier is true of some objects of that kind and none not of that kind. (Quine 1953: 131)

This criterion seems to give reasonable results for true existential sentences. Thus, ‘∃x Elephant(x)’ is committed to (“presupposes”) elephants because the open sentence ‘Elephant(x)’ applies to all and only elephants, and there are some. It is likewise committed to any kind that contains all the elephants: to mammals, to animals, to living things. (It has these commitments whether or not these kinds are expressible in the object language.) And it is not committed to any kind that leaves out any elephants, such as male elephant. The kind elephant is the smallest kind to which ‘∃x Elephant(x)’ is committed. So far, so good.

But when the criterion is applied to false existential sentences, trouble immediately arises. For example, since there are no centaurs, the open sentence ‘Centaur(x)’ is not true of any objects of any kind, and so ‘∃x Centaur(x)’ is not ontologically committed to any kind of entity. The same goes for ‘∃x Unicorn(x)’, and all other false existential sentences. But, then, all false existential sentences have the same ontological commitment, namely, none. And that's wrong on two counts: ‘∃x Centaur(x)’ and ‘∃x Unicorn(x)’ are ontologically committing; and their ontological commitments are not the same.

Let us return, then, to Quine's favored formulation of the criterion involving the ‘must’ and explore whether it is compatible with an extensionalist account. Indeed, ordinary uses of ‘must’ and other modals are often used to signal generality without making the content of what is asserted modal. Consider the following example: “A set of five numbers between 1 and 9, inclusive, must contain at least one odd number”. The content is simply that every set of five numbers between 1 and 9, inclusive contains at least one odd number. (Perhaps the ‘must’ is also epistemic, but not in a way that affects the content of what is asserted.) Similarly, Quine's criterion can be interpreted as innocent quantification:

Quine's Criterion, Extensional Version. A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff every domain of quantification that makes the theory true contains at least one K.

(In considering whether a domain makes the theory true, the interpretation of the predicates occurring in the theory is restricted to the domain if need be.) This account is purely extensional: if a theory is committed to a kind K, and K′ has exactly the same members as K, then the theory is also committed to kind K′. And that will be its downfall. For, as above, ‘∃x Centaur(x)’ and ‘∃x Unicorn(x)’ will have the same ontological commitments. The only difference is that, because the condition is universal rather than existential, the criterion will have both of these sentences be (vacuously) committed to every kind of entity. No improvement there.[6]

What to do? Of course, this result could be avoided by populating domains of quantification with centaurs, unicorns, and all manner of fictional being. That would allow one to charge a profligate opponent with an ontological commitment to centaurs, and a distinct ontological commitment to unicorns—but only by taking on these very same ontological commitments in the metalanguage. For Quine, at least, the cure is as bad as the disease.

Alternatively, one could restrict the criterion to true theories. That would still allow the criterion to be used to allocate ontological costs, to say which theories are responsible for which costs. Polemical uses of the criterion would have to be foresworn; but perhaps they are problematic in any case. The primary role for the criterion, however, would have to be given up: its role in providing a foundation for theory choice. For if the criterion of ontological commitment is to be applied only to true theories, then one would have to determine which theories are true prior to applying the criterion. One might as well have as one's criterion of theory choice: “Choose true theories!” So, the idea of restricting ontological commitment to true theories is a non-starter. Could one instead restrict the criterion to the theories one takes to be true? That wouldn't so much solve the problem of false existentials as merely hide it from view. But, in any case, one would be no better off with respect to theory choice. One would have to determine which theories one takes to be true prior to applying the criterion. And so, again, ontological commitment could not serve as a foundation for theory choice. One might as well have as one's criterion of theory choice: “Choose theories you take to be true!” Restricting the application of the criterion of ontological commitment is not the solution to the problem of false existentials.

1.4 Quine's Criterion: Metalinguistic Versions

If Quine is to avoid the problem of false existentials without exiting the theory of reference, he will need to resort to semantic ascent. Ontological commitment to a kind K must somehow involve the predicate ‘K’. That will allow ontological commitment to centaurs and ontological commitment to unicorns to be distinguished, even though ‘centaur’ and ‘unicorn’ are co-extensional. Indeed, Quine does suggest “withdrawing to a semantical plane” when the ontological commitments of the theory one is addressing outrun the ontological commitments of one's own theory. He writes, referring to the ontologically profligate philosopher McX:

So long as I adhere to my ontology, as opposed to McX's, I cannot allow my bound variables to refer to entities which belong to McX's ontology and not to mine. I can, however, consistently describe our disagreement by characterizing the statements which McX affirms. Provided merely that my ontology countenances linguistic forms, or at least concrete inscriptions and utterances, I can talk about McX's sentences. (Quine 1948: 35)

One way of implementing this retreat to a semantical plane would be to interpret Quine's criterion as the following schema (with ‘K’ now a schematic letter ranging over predicates of the object language):

Quine's Criterion, Metalinguistic Version. A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff T logically entails ‘∃x Kx’ iff, for every interpretation that makes T true, there is some entity in the domain of the interpretation that is in the extension of ‘K’.[7]

Indeed, this captures some sense in which the truth of T requires that there be Ks among the values of the variables. For example, any interpretation that makes ‘∃x Unicorn(x)’ true will have some entity in its domain also be in the extension of ‘Unicorn’. This entity needn't be a unicorn, of course. But that's all to the good. It is the price one pays, the non-believer in unicorns might say, if one wants to be able to say that a theory is ontologically committed to unicorns. But note that the notion of ontological commitment is now entirely formal. Because interpretations are generalized over, the actual interpretation of ‘K’ plays no role. Ontological commitment is essentially intra-linguistic, rather than a relation between language and the world.

Suppose, for the moment, that one could live with the world being well lost. There are still objections to the adequacy of the metalinguistic criterion.[8] First, there is the problem that, in making entailment purely formal, all interconnections between kinds have been lost: ontological commitment to bachelors won't carry with it ontological commitment to males; ontological commitment to elephants won't carry with it ontological commitment to animals. There are no constraints on the joint interpretation of ‘bachelor’ and ‘male’, or of ‘elephant’ and ‘animal’. One can get these connections back, however, by adding additional postulates to T, such as ‘∀x(Bachelor(x) ⊃ Male(x))’, or ‘∀x(Elephant(x) ⊃ Animal(x))’. (These might or might not be taken to be meaning postulates, or metaphysically necessary postulates; for Quine they would just be more theory.) This has the awkward result that the original theory T is not ontologically committed to males if it just contains ‘∃x Bachelor(x)’, or to animals if it just contains ‘∃x Elephant(x)’; only T with the postulates added is so committed. But perhaps one can live with that.

A second, more serious problem is that ontological commitment is entrapped in the object language: if ‘K’ is not a predicate of the object language, we have no way of assigning ontological commitment to Ks. Say that the explicit ontological commitments of a theory are given by the existential sentences that the theory logically entails.[9] The metalinguistic criterion above takes all ontological commitment to be explicit ontological commitment. But ontological commitment can fail to be explicit—or so it appears—in one of two ways. A theory may have implicit ontological commitments by entailing existential sentences or propositions according to some entailment relation more generous than logical entailment (see §1.5 and §2). Or a theory may have implicit ontological commitments by entailing existential propositions that are not expressible in the language of the theory. For example, a theory containing ‘∃x Elephant(x)’, one might hold, is ontologically committed to animals, whether or not the language of the theory contains the predicate ‘Animal’. A defender of the metalinguistic criterion, however, should simply deny that there are implicit ontological commitments.[10] As with the previous objection, we can enhance the theory by adding new predicates and new postulates involving the new predicates. Indeed, we can suppose that the object language is as rich as the metalanguage with respect to non-semantical predicates. Again, it is awkward to have to say that only the enhanced theory in the enhanced language, not the original theory in the original language, carries ontological commitment to animals. But, again, perhaps we can live with that. (For more on the problem of implicit commitment, see 1.7 and §2.1)

The real problem lies elsewhere. Although there is a sense in which according to the criterion a theory that is ontologically committed to Ks must have Ks among the values of its variables, it appears to be the wrong sense. If the interpretation of ‘K’ is not held fixed, then the elements of the domain that are in the extension of ‘K’ have nothing to do with whether Ks exist, as ‘K’ is actually interpreted. It may seem a good thing that ontological commitment to unicorns has nothing to do with unicorns—since there aren't any. But now ontological commitment to elephants also has nothing to do with elephants, and that's wrong. The ontological commitments of a theory should depend on the meanings of its terms, not just on its logical form. Could one instead go for a hybrid criterion, metalinguistic for empty kinds, extensional for non-empty kinds? (This is suggested by Quine's talk of “retreating to a semantical plane”.) That would only compound the problem. For then we could not know which criterion to apply to a theory prior to knowing what exists, and the criterion could not play a foundational role in ontology.

1.5 Modal Quantifier Criteria

It is high time to take the ‘must’ seriously when considering what entities must be taken to be values of the bound variables in order for the theory to be true. The resulting criteria would not be endorsed by Quine. But, as long as they tie ontological commitment to the values of the bound variables of theories couched within first-order logic, they are still Quinean in spirit; they are still versions of the quantifier account of ontological commitment.

We begin by interpreting the ‘must’ as metaphysical necessity, and interpreting metaphysical necessity as quantification over all metaphysically possible worlds. According to the simplest modal account, a theory is (perhaps implicitly) committed to Ks whenever the existence of Ks is necessarily implied by the theory. This account isn't even Quinean in spirit—it makes no mention of the values of the variables—but it serves as a useful foil to Quinean accounts, and will come in for later discussion (§2.2). It is assumed that each possible world has an associated domain of entities: roughly, all the entities that exist in the world. (These entities, however, need not all be in the range of the first-order quantifiers.) Moreover, it is assumed that when sentences of first-order predicate logic are evaluated relative to a possible world, the sentences' quantifiers range only over entities in the domain of the world in question. This leads to what will be called a modal entailment criterion (other entailment criteria make use of entailment relations other than metaphysical necessitation):

Modal Entailment Criterion. A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff, for every world w, T is true at w only if the domain of w contains at least one K.

In other words, a theory is ontologically committed to Ks just when it necessarily implies that Ks exist.[11]

Unlike extensional criteria, the modal entailment criterion has no problem with (contingently) false existentials. The sentence ‘∃x Unicorn(x)’ is ontologically committed to unicorns because, at every world at which it is true, the domain of that world contains at least one unicorn. In saying this, the meta-ontologist may or may not herself be ontologically committed to unicorns depending on how the meta-ontologist construes talk of possible worlds and possible individuals. A modal realist—someone who takes possibilia to be concrete—will be so committed. But an ersatz modal realist—someone who takes possibilia to be in some sense abstract—will interpret “the domain of that world contains at least one unicorn” in a way that does not commit the meta-ontologist to unicorns; abstract worlds can represent unicorns as existing whether or not unicorns exist.[12]

The modal entailment criterion, however, appears to be inadequate with respect to the vast majority of philosophical applications, at least as metaphysical necessity is standardly interpreted (but see §2.2 for possible lines of defense). This is because many philosophically controversial kinds of entity are taken to exist necessarily if they exist at all, for example, numbers, or universals. But necessarily existing kinds of entity make trouble for the criterion: for any theory T, any world at which T is true is a world whose domain contains numbers. So any theory T is ontologically committed to numbers, whether or not the content of T, intuitively, has anything to do with numbers. This suggests that we return to a Quinean criterion that ties ontological commitment directly to the values of the variables; numbers need not be values of the variables for a theory T that has nothing to do with numbers. To make the variable assignments relevant, we can quantify doubly over worlds and sub-domains of worlds. This leads to the modal quantifier criterion:

Modal Quantifier Criterion. A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff, for every world w and every sub-domain of the domain at w, T is true at w with its variables ranging over that sub-domain only if that sub-domain contains at least one K.

(This criterion requires, in effect, that whenever a theory is true of some part of a world, considered in isolation, the theory is ontologically committed to Ks only if that part contains at least one K.) The modal quantifier criterion takes care of the problem of irrelevant necessary existents. In effect, it introduces a narrower modal entailment relation that is more sensitive to the content of T. Only if T entails the existence of Ks according to this narrower entailment relation is T ontologically committed to Ks.[13]

But some less pressing objections remain that suggest that metaphysical necessity is too blunt an instrument to capture the notion of ontological commitment. Three will be mentioned here. First, just as extensional criteria could not distinguish between ontological commitments to co-extensional kinds, the modal criteria cannot distinguish between ontological commitments to co-intensional kinds. A theory that is committed to triangular polygons will also be committed to trilateral polygons, and vice versa, because, necessarily, a polygon is triangular if and only if it is trilateral. A theory that is committed to round squares will also be committed to even prime numbers greater than two, and vice versa, because, necessarily, (it is vacuously true that) something is a round square if and only if it is an even prime number greater than two. Second, metaphysically impossible theories, theories that are true at no world, will be (vacuously) committed to every kind of entity. But that seems wrong: naïve set theory is committed to sets, but not to angels that dance on the head of a pin. Third, the modal criteria may introduce spurious commitment if there are metaphysically necessary connections between distinct kinds of entity. For example, if whales are necessarily mammals, then a theory committed to whales would automatically be committed to mammals, even if the theory explicitly claims that there are no mammals and that whales are fish. A theory committed to Hesperus would automatically be committed to Phosphorus, assuming the necessity of identity, even if the theory explicitly claims that Hesperus exists and that Phosphorus doesn't.

All of these objections to modal criteria for ontological commitment have a common source: ontological commitment appears to be sensitive to distinctions that metaphysical necessity cannot accommodate. One solution, then, would be to seek a more discriminating entailment relation. Thus, the third objection suggests that a priori entailment should replace metaphysically modal entailment. In the modal quantifier criterion, one could quantify over domains and sub-domains of worlds that are conceptually, rather than metaphysically, possible.[14] That won't help with the first two objections, however, since the existence of triangular polygons is a priori entailed by the existence of trilateral polygons, and, assuming classical logic is a priori, the existence of angels (and everything else) is a priori entailed by naïve set theory (or any inconsistent theory). For these, we can retreat further to some sort of relevant entailment relation within a paraconsistent logic. The quantifier criterion could be expressed by quantifying over domains and sub-domains of worlds that are both conceptually and metaphysically impossible.[15] Alternatively, one could revert to an entailment account, since relevant entailment by itself can handle the problem of irrelevant necessary existents. It is not the case that any theory relevantly entails that numbers exist.

Perhaps the retreat to a sufficiently weak entailment relation will result in a workable criterion. Another response, however, holds the line at modal entailment.[16] It claims that all the above objections are based on a confusion between the ontological commitments of a theory and the ontological beliefs of someone who holds the theory. Although there needs to be some hyper-intensional notion of belief according to which someone could believe that trilateral polygons exist without believing that triangular polygons exist, or believe that naïve set theory is true without believing that angels exist, or believe that whales are fish, we should not identify the ontological commitments of a theory with the ontological beliefs of those that accept the theory. On this account, even an ideally rational person might accept a theory without being able to determine its ontological commitments. More worrisome, if the ontological commitments of theories do not parallel the ontological beliefs of a person who accepts the theory, then the foundational role of ontological commitment in theory choice will be diminished. (For an extended discussion of entailment accounts, see §2.)

1.6 Evaluating Quantifier Accounts: Sufficiency

This section and the next provide an evaluation of quantifier accounts of ontological commitment. It is still assumed, following Quine, that the target theory is couched within first-order predicate logic. (For discussion of ontological commitment in ordinary language, see §4.) The critique is divided into two parts: in this section, it is asked whether the quantifier criterion is sufficient for ontological commitment; in the next section, it is asked whether it is necessary. Objections that were considered above in presenting specific versions of the quantifier criterion will not be repeated.

A criterion fails to be sufficient for ontological commitment if it overgenerates, if it sometimes holds that a theory is committed to some kind of entity that the theory should not be committed to. I suppose that any quantifier criterion introduces some sort of entailment relation between theories and existence claims, an entailment relation that depends upon the values of the bound variables of the sentences of the theory. (That's what distinguishes “quantifier accounts” from the broader “entailment accounts” to be discussed in §2.) Now ask: How could a theory entail that Ks exist without being ontologically committed to Ks? How could the sufficiency of the quantifier criterion fail to be entirely trivial? Is there room to deny that existential consequences of a theory, as given by sentences of first-order logic with the existential quantifier, do not amount to ontological commitments of the theory? Four ways that one might challenge sufficiency will be considered. The first two require only clarifications or minor adjustments to a quantifier criterion. The third and fourth, however, raise philosophically substantial issues.

1.6.1 Inclusive Logic/Free Logic

The first objection to sufficiency is not so much a critique of the criterion, but of the logic to which it is applied. For Quine first-order predicate logic excludes the empty domain: its valid formulas are those that come out true under all interpretations of the non-logical symbols over all non-empty domains. It follows from this that, on the quantifier account, universal sentences carry the exact same ontological commitments as their existential counterparts. It follows because, in classical first-order predicate logic, universal sentences have existential import: ‘∀x φ(x)’ logically entails ‘∃x φ(x)’. If we want to allow ‘∀x φ(x)’ to be true even when there are no φs (because there is nothing at all), then we do not want it to carry any ontological commitment. Ontological commitments should reside entirely with the existential quantifier. Implementing this is easy. We simply do logic so as to include interpretations with an empty domain—so-called, inclusive logic. According to the truth conditions for quantifiers in inclusive logic, all universal sentences are true in an empty domain, and all existential sentences are false. Once we have made the shift to inclusive logic, we can also say, what seems right, that conditional existential sentences—such as, ‘∃x φ(x) ⊃ ∃x y(x)’—carry no ontological commitment.

Consider now Quine's insight, on which the quantifier account is based, that it is bound variables rather than singular terms that carry ontological commitment. To implement this insight, Quine simply eliminated singular terms from the language. But suppose one wanted to be able to apply the quantifier criterion to theories containing singular terms. One could instead switch from standard first-order predicate logic to free logic. In free logics, because one cannot in general derive the existential generalization ‘∃x φ(x)’ from ‘φ(t)’, for singular term ‘t’, singular terms fail to carry ontological commitment. Arguably, then, an inclusive, free logic provides the ideal logical environment for applying the quantifier account.[17]

1.6.2 Substitutional vs. Objectual Quantifiers

A second objection to the sufficiency of the quantifier account relates to the interpretation of the quantifiers of first-order logic. If the quantifiers are interpreted substitutionally, instead of objectually, the criterion may overgenerate. According to the objectual interpretation (due to Tarski), an existentially quantified sentence ‘∃x φ(x)’ is true if and only if the open formula ‘φ(x)’ is satisfied by some object in the domain. According to the substitutional interpretation, ‘∃x φ(x)’ is true if and only if ‘φ(t)’ is true, for some singular term ‘t’ of the language. When the quantifiers are given a substitutional interpretation, Quine's criterion will overgenerate if the language has empty singular terms. For example, a theory that contains (a symbolic translation of) the sentence ‘Sherlock Holmes is a fictional detective’ would be ontologically committed to fictional objects, and that seems wrong.

This objection might have force against the application of a quantifier criterion to ordinary language if it could be argued that the quantifiers of ordinary language are sometimes (or always) substitutional.[18] But it is not in any way an objection to a quantifier criterion as Quine conceived of it. Quine stipulated that the quantifiers of the first-order language were to be interpreted objectually—indeed, the substitutional interpretation cannot be applied to Quine's austere language with no singular terms—and he explicitly acknowledged that, if interpreted substitutionally, all questions of ontological commitment are moot (Quine 1968: 106, 1974: 139). Thus, this could only be a critique of a quantifier account of ontological commitment if it could be argued that the objectual interpretation were somehow incoherent, or somehow had to be reduced, ultimately, to the substitutional interpretation. That would undermine the quantifier criterion, to be sure; it would reverse the Quinean order of things, requiring that names, not bound variables, be the primary locus of reference. But justifying such a position would be a tall order.

1.6.3 Meinongian Quantifiers

According to the third objection to sufficiency, the quantifiers of first-order logic, properly understood, do not carry existential commitment; they are not “existentially loaded”. Indeed, calling ‘∃x’ the “existential quantifier” is a misnomer; it would be better to call it the “particular quantifier” in contrast with the “universal quantifier”. Ordinary language, on its face, supports the view that quantification need not be existentially loaded (see §4). For example, if we assert “some fictional detective is smarter than Sherlock Holmes”, we do not ordinarily take ourselves to be committed to the existence of fictional entities. Similarly, the objection claims, the straightforward translation of this into first-order logic using ‘∃x’ for ‘some’ should carry no existential import. One only gets existential import when one restricts the quantifier, explicitly or implicitly, with an existence predicate. Thus, the correct translation into first-order logic of “dragons exist” is not ‘∃x Dragon(x)’, but ‘∃x (Exists(x) and Dragon(x))’. The quantifier ‘∃x’, by itself, is neutral with respect to existence. (Pronounce ‘∃x’ “for some x”, not “there exists an x”.)

Distinguishing a restricted quantifier that has existential import from an unrestricted quantifier that does not only has a point if existence is a substantial property that some things have and other things lack. Barack Obama has it; Sherlock Holmes does not. The planet Venus has it; the postulated planet Vulcan does not. This objection to Quine's criterion, then, is based on the Meinongian view that some things do not exist.[19] These things that do not exist typically are taken to include fictional entities, postulated entities of science, and all manner of intentional objects; sometimes (mere) possibilia, impossibilia, and various abstract entities are also included among the non-existent. Non-existent entities can be quantified over, referred to, and truly attributed properties. Existence is not a prerequisite for being talked about.

Quine and his followers claim not to understand this substantial property of existence, a property that is conceptually independent of the quantifiers (Quine 1948; van Inwagen 1998). For Quine, the existence predicate, ‘Exists(x)’, should be defined simply as ‘∃y y = x’. Thus, for Quine, to say that some thing doesn't exist is to say that some thing is such that no thing is identical with it—a logical contradiction. But, Quine claimed, whether or not to accept the Meinongian account of existence is a sideshow when it comes to the question of ontological commitment. In responding to the fictional Meinongian Wyman, Quine offers “to give Wyman the word ‘exist’. I'll try not to use it again; I still have ‘is’” (Quine 1948: 23). That is to say, theories are ontologically committed to Ks if they entail that there are Ks, whether or not they entail that Ks exist. Indeed, Quine could also have given the (radical) Meinongian the word ‘is’ and any other predicate that purports to impose an ontological restriction on the quantifier; for what is central to Quine's criterion is that one cannot quantify over entities without incurring ontological commitment to those entities. To use quantifiers to refer to entities while denying that one is ontologically committed is to fail to own up to one's commitments, and thereby engage in a sort of intellectual doublethink. Quantification is the basic mode of reference to objects, and reference to objects is always ontologically committing.

A Meinongian need not quarrel with any of this; she could accept that the unrestricted quantifier is ontologically committing, even though it carries no existential import. In that case, the Meinongian view would not be a challenge to the sufficiency of Quine's criterion. But some Meinongians (e.g., Routley 1982) explicitly deny that they are ontologically committed to what they quantify over when their quantifiers are not existentially loaded; they explicitly reject the orthodox Quinean doctrine of ontological commitment. In trying to understand this claim, the Quinean faces a problem of interpretation. Since the Quinean rejects the distinction between existentially loaded and existentially unloaded quantifiers, he has to decide which of these to translate as his one and only quantifier. Routley assumes that his loaded quantifier should be identified with Quine's one and only quantifier, because that quantifier is likewise loaded for Quine. If we take him at his word, then we say that, when using his unloaded quantifier, he quantifies without incurring ontological commitment; but that is to make his statements incoherent by Quinean lights, since for the Quinean it is constitutive of the quantifier that it is bound up with ontology. (As Lewis (1990: 27) says, he “quantifies without quantifying”.) It is better, then, to translate his existentially unloaded quantifiers as unrestricted quantifiers, and his existentially loaded quantifiers as quantifiers restricted by an existence predicate. That does not eliminate the mystery in his view: the Quinean still claims not to understand the property that the existence predicate supposedly expresses. But this is preferable to attributing the outright incoherence that comes with saying he has a radically different understanding of the quantifier. On this second, better interpretation, the Meinongian has a radically expansive ontology filled with fictional entities, possibilia, and perhaps impossibilia as well. Although the Meinongian may claim to be a “noneist”, the Quinean's best way of understanding him makes him an “allist”. On this way of understanding the Meinongian, the quantifier account of ontological commitment emerges unscathed.

1.6.4 Realism and Reduction

A fourth objection to sufficiency has to do with how the criterion relates to issues of realism and reduction, to the distinction between kinds of entity that are fundamental and kinds that are derived. It might seem that in cases of ontological reduction the quantifier criterion sometimes imputes ontological commitments where there should be none. Consider a view that identifies chairs with sums of particles, and takes only the particles, not their sums, to be fundamental. Consider the sentence ‘∃x Chair(x)’, and ask: is it ontologically committed to chairs? The answer, on the quantifier criterion, is “yes”: chairs must be among the values of the variable ‘x’ in order for the sentence to be true.[20] But, one might object, since chairs are not fundamental on the view in question, they should not be counted among the sentence's ontological commitments. One can hold that there are chairs without being ontologically committed to chairs.

The objection is misguided if directed at the quantifier criterion as it has standardly been interpreted (and was interpreted by Quine). The quantifier criterion was not designed to be sensitive to whether the entities assumed by a theory are fundamental or derived (see §3.2 below). If the values of the bound variables must include Ks, then the theory is ontologically committed to Ks, whether Ks are fundamental or derived. That is simply how the criterion is to be understood. If we want a way to distinguish between ontological commitments to fundamental kinds and ontological commitments to derived kinds, we need to look elsewhere.

Fine has argued, however, that qua ontologists we do need to look elsewhere.[21] Suppose, with Fine, that there is a primitive distinction between those entities that are “fundamentally real”, and those that are not. Let ‘Real(x)’ be a predicate that marks this distinction. (Unlike the Meinongian existence predicate considered in §1.7.3, this predicate is not derived from a special quantifier.) The ontologist's task, then, is to determine which entities and kinds of entity are fundamentally real. But the quantifier account, being insensitive to this distinction, will be of no use in carrying out this task and should therefore be rejected. The quantifier account provides at best a criterion for ordinary or scientific commitment, but not the specifically ontological commitment of interest to metaphysicians. Indeed, since ordinary and scientific theories do not contain the predicate ‘Real(x)’, they do not by themselves carry any ontological commitment. Only philosophical theories that make claims about what entities or kinds of entity are fundamentally real carry such commitment. Ontology is an autonomous discipline; it cannot (as Quine would have it) be subsumed by science.

Once one accepts that a “reality” predicate is needed to characterize ontological commitment, a puzzle about the logic of ontological commitment admits of a natural solution. The puzzle is this (from Fine 2009). Because the natural numbers are included within the integers, an ontological commitment to the integers, it seems, should be a stronger commitment than a commitment to the natural numbers. But quantifier accounts of ontological commitment get this backwards: since commitment to Ks is associated with the existential claim, ‘∃x Kx’, a commitment to natural numbers entails, and is thus stronger than, a commitment to integers. This can be set right, Fine holds, by associating ontological commitment to Ks with a universal claim: ∀x (K(x) ⊃ Real(x). Quantifier accounts, because they lack a “reality” predicate, are unable to capture the logic of ontological commitment.

A defender of the quantifier account, however, can respond by noting that there is a distinction between ontological commitment to Ks and ontological commitment to the Ks; the quantifier account aims only to analyze the former. Indeed, it seems plausible to say (as noted in §1.3) that an ontological commitment to elephants carries with it an ontological commitment to mammals, just not an ontological commitment to the mammals. An ontological commitment to the Ks, on the quantifier account, can be understood as an ontological commitment to each and every particular K.

1.7 Evaluating Quantifier Accounts: Necessity

A criterion fails to be necessary for ontological commitment if it undergenerates, if it sometimes fails to hold that a theory is committed to some kind of entity that the theory should be committed to. Quantifier criteria will undergenerate if they fail to account for all the implicit ontological commitments of theories. Whereas the problems canvassed in §1.6 for the sufficiency of a quantifier account can all be addressed by a devoted Quinean, the problems with necessity are more serious. Indeed, they suggest that Quinean approaches that focus on the values of the variables of quantification should be jettisoned for a more general entailment approach to ontological commitment (§2).

1.7.1 Commitment to Properties or Universals

To play its appointed role, a criterion of ontological commitment should be ontologically neutral: it lets the theory speak for itself, as it were, without imposing ontological assumptions from the outside. Quinean criteria, however, by focusing only on the values of the (individual) variables, have been accused of being ontologically biased against realism about properties or universals because they fail to attach ontological significance to the predicate.[22] Consider ‘∃x Swims(x)’. According to Quinean criteria, this sentence is committed to entities that swim, but not to a property of swimming; for no property of swimming need be among the values of the bound variables in order for the sentence to be true. One way to ensure ontological neutrality is to switch to an entailment criterion. An entailment criterion—such as the modal entailment criterion in §1.5—avoids bias by allowing any component of a sentence to contribute to its ontological commitments, not just the (first-order) quantifiers and bound variables. If universals must exist in order for a theory to be true, then the theory is ontologically committed to universals; if not, not. And the same goes for particulars, or any other ontological category. This neutrality, however, comes at a price. The ontological commitments of a theory—indeed, of a simple subject-predicate sentence—cannot be determined prior to resolving the debate between nominalists and realists. Ontological commitments will not be transparent. Even a professed nominalist may in fact be committed to universals, willy-nilly. (For more on entailment accounts, see §2.)

In response to the charge of ontological bias, the Quinean might try to turn the tables on the objector: to take predicates to carry ontological commitment would be to be biased against nominalism. If even ‘∃x Swims(x)’ were committed to properties or universals, no theory would be compatible with nominalism. In any case, the Quinean will reject the charge of ontological bias. Ontological commitment to universals is not excluded by the quantifier criteria; a theory couched in a first-order language whose variables range over universals can be so committed. For example, the sentence ‘∃xy (Universal(y) & y=Swim & Instantiates(x,y)’ is committed to universals, as is, more simply, ‘∃y Universal(y)’. The Quinean, then, simply asks that the commitment to universals be made explicit in the same way that the commitment to particulars is made explicit: by quantifying.

1.7.2 Second-Order Languages

Another reason for refusing to allow predicates to carry ontological commitment parallels Quine's reason for refusing ontological commitment to names: just as there can be empty names, there can be empty predicates. (An empty predicate is not a predicate with the null set for its extension; it is a predicate with no extension.) If I introduce the name ‘Herman’ stipulating that it refers to the one and only monster under my bed, I introduce an empty name; and sentences containing ‘Herman’ should not thereby be ontologically committed to monsters. Similarly, if I introduce a predicate ‘whish’ stipulating that it expresses a biological kind property that applies to whales and fish but excludes rabbits and rhinoceri, I introduce an empty predicate; and sentences containing ‘whish’ should not thereby be ontologically committed to any biological kinds. Parallel problems admit of parallel solutions: we can eliminate predicates in favor of second-order variables, and take ontological commitment, if any, to be carried by the second-order variables rather than the predicates. (But we cannot make our second-order language too austere: we need to have some non-logical descriptive vocabulary to express the (non-logical) content of the theory.) The charge of ontological bias against Quinean criteria is simply shifted: why allow first-order variables to carry ontological commitment, but not second-order variables?

For Quine, this question simply doesn't arise. Second-order logic is illegitimate because it treats predicates as if they were names:

Predicates have attributes as their “intensions” or meanings (or would if there were attributes), and they have sets as their extensions; but they are names of neither. Variables eligible for quantification therefore do not belong in predicate positions. (Quine 1970: 67)

Second-order logic is “set theory in sheep's clothing”: the ontological commitments of set theory have been hidden under the guise of logic. To make ontological commitment transparent, Quine holds, second-order theories must be transformed into first-order theories by replacing second-order variables with first-order variables ranging over sets, and taking predication to be set membership.

For the proponent of second-order theories, no such transformation is needed: the quantifier criterion can be applied directly to the values of the second-order variables. The ontological commitments of second-order theories will then depend on how the second-order variables are interpreted. If the second-order variables range over properties (“attributes”), then second-order theories are committed to properties; if instead they range over sets, then second-order theories are committed to sets. On either interpretation, any world at which a second-order theory is true will have either properties or sets in its domain, and so the modal quantifier criterion (from §1.5) can be applied without amendment. Extending the quantifier criterion to second-order theories, then, would seem to be within the spirit, if not the letter, of Quine's account of ontological commitment.

If the (monadic[23]) second-order quantifiers are interpreted as plural quantifiers, as recommended by Boolos (1984), then, arguably, they carry no additional ontological commitments beyond those already carried by the first-order quantifiers. Plural quantification is ontologically innocent according to Boolos: to refer to some things plurally—some books, for example—is not to refer to a plural entity—a set, or set-like entity, with books as members—but to refer to the things—the books themselves—in an irreducibly plural way. [24] Individual and plural quantifiers range over the same domain. Since quantifier criteria attribute ontological commitment based on the domain of quantification, they reveal no hidden ontological cost to theories couched in an extension of first-order logic that includes plural quantification. To get this result, we simply extend quantifier criteria to apply to plural as well as individual variables. In slogan form: “to be is to be the value of some variable or the values of some variables” (Boolos 1984). A plural variable takes as its semantic value a plurality of entities, not a plural entity (such as a set or class). Plural entities are not needed to serve as semantic values—not, in any case, if the language in which the semantics is done is itself a plural language.

Within the framework of plural logic, however, there are two distinctively different ways that a theory can be ontologically committed to entities, or kinds of entity, corresponding to the distinction between distributive and collective predication (see Rayo (2007: 435–7), who calls the latter “plethological commitment”). Suppose that ‘K’ is a predicate that applies to plural terms. If ‘K’ applies distributively, then a theory that affirms the plural quantification “there are some things such that they are Ks” introduces no commitment beyond that of the singular quantification “there is something such that it is K”. But if ‘K’ is a predicate that applies collectively, then the plural quantification “there are some things such they are Ks” is committed to Ks in a distinctively plural way that, in general, cannot be captured in terms of its ontological commitments. For example, the mereological nihilist who holds that “there are simples arranged chairwise” is thereby ontologically committed only to simples, not to any plural entity containing simples; but she is also committed, in an irreducibly plural way, to there being simples arranged chairwise.

1.7.3 Intensional Languages

Quine's criterion is silent on the ontological commitments of theories couched within intensional languages—languages with intensional operators such as ‘it is possible that’ or ‘it will be that’ or ‘it is believed that’. If it were directly applied to such languages, it would run the risk of undergenerating ontological commitments: perhaps there are commitments hidden by the intensional operators, as would be the case if they are disguised quantifiers. Quine's extended criterion involving paraphrase can be applied; but now there is a danger of overgenerating. For paraphrases of theories couched within an intensional language into first-order predicate logic will almost inevitably have to treat the intensional operators as disguised quantifiers, and it may be that any adequate domain for those quantifiers will require controversial entities that do not correctly represent the ontological commitments of the original intensional theory. For example, if modal theories are “translated” into first-order logic in the standard way, where ‘possibly’ means ‘at some possible world’ and ‘necessarily’ means ‘at all possible worlds’, they will be ontologically committed to possible worlds according to the extended quantifier criterion. But this seems to just beg the question against the modalist who does not think she is so committed. (For problems with the extended criterion, see §4.2.)

Entailment accounts of ontological commitment (§2) get this right, but only by dodging the hard questions. Thus, if modal operators are disguised quantifiers over possible worlds, then modal theories will be ontologically committed to possible worlds according to an entailment account: possible worlds must exist in order for the theories to be true. If modal operators are not disguised quantifiers over possible worlds, then modal theories need not be ontologically committed to possible worlds according to an entailment account. An entailment account will accurately reflect the ontological truth; but it does nothing to help us discover that truth.

1.7.4 Implicit Commitment: Extrinsic Properties

Consider the sentence ‘∃x Parent(x)’. Any criterion that focuses on the question—what entities need to be among the values of the variable ‘x’ in order for this sentence to be true?—appears to get the ontological commitments of the sentence wrong (see Rayo 2007: 431–2). For the sentence appears to be ontologically committed to children no less than to parents; but children do not need to be taken to be values of the variable in order for the sentence to be true (assuming, that is, that it is possible for a parent not also to be a child). We have here, it seems, a stark division between two approaches to ontological commitment: the quantifier approach, which looks only to the values of the variables of the sentences of a theory, and the entailment approach, which looks to the existential entailments of the theory, and ignores whether or not the entities whose existence is entailed are values of the theory's variables. In cases where predicates express extrinsic properties, the quantifier approach undergenerates; it misses ontological commitments.

Before addressing the objection from extrinsic properties, it is important to note an ambiguity in the informal expression of the quantifier account. When we ask, following Quine, “what entities must be values of the variables” in order for a theory T to be true, we might mean: what entities must be assigned to the variables of the sentences in T in order for T to be true. Or we might mean: what entities must be included in the domain of the interpretation of T in order for T to be true, whether or not those entities must be assigned to the variables of the sentences in T. When predicates of the theory express extrinsic properties, this difference matters. In this article, Quine's criterion—and quantifier criteria more generally—have always been understood in the first, stronger way. But those philosophers who take Quine's criterion to be compatible with an entailment approach to ontological commitment are best understood as interpreting him in the second, weaker way.

There are two ways that one might try to defend the quantifier account, neither very satisfactory. First, one might simply restrict the predicates of the language of the theory to those that express intrinsic properties (and relations). Perhaps one could argue that the theories Quine had primarily in mind, theories of mathematics and natural science, obey this restriction already with respect to their primitive predicates (though this has been contested even for physics, and is not plausible for the special sciences). But this would be a rather severe restriction; and there is no evidence that Quine had intended the criterion to be restricted in this way. Moreover, it would needlessly inject controversies over which properties and relations are intrinsic into the application of the criterion, threatening both its foundational and polemical roles.

Second, one might dig in one's heels and deny that ‘∃x Parent(x)’ is committed to children. One familiar gloss on “the ontological commitments of a theory” takes this to include only “what the theory says there is”. If “says” is interpreted narrowly, a theory that contained only ‘∃x Parent(x)’ does not say that children exist, even though this follows analytically from the theory. In defense of the view, one can point out that the intuitive judgment that ‘∃x Parent(x)’ is ontologically committed to children comes from including the definitions of ‘Parent(x)’ and ‘Child(x)’ as an unspoken part of the theory. (Compare the defense of the metalinguistic criterion in §1.4.) Thus, if we suppose the language contains, in addition to the unary predicate ‘Parent(x)’, the unary predicate ‘Child(x)’ and the binary predicate ‘Parent(x,y)’; and we suppose the theory contains, in addition to ‘∃x Parent(x)’, the sentences ‘∀x (Parent(x) if and only if ∃y Parent(x,y))’ and ‘∀x (Child(x) if and only if ∃y Parent(y,x))’, then the modal quantifier account gets the ontological commitments of the beefed-up theory right: for every world and sub-domain of the domain of that world such that the theory is true at that world with its variables ranging over that sub-domain, children are in the sub-domain. Perhaps the existence of children is an implicit commitment of ‘∃x Parent(x)’; but, on the view being considered, the quantifier account should not be required to capture all the implicit commitments of the theory.

One problem with this view, at least as a defense of the modal quantifier account, is that it requires an invidious distinction between different sorts of analytic entailment; for, although ‘∃x Parent(x)’ is not committed to children according to the modal quantifier criterion, ‘∃x Bachelor(x)’ is committed to males. The chief problem, however, with accepting a criterion that omits implicit ontological commitments is that it undermines the philosophical use of the criterion. Surely, the implicit ontological commitments of the theory must be included in tabulating the ontological costs of a theory. Enjoining the theorist to “make all implicit ontological commitments explicit” does not solve the problem because the theorist may not know, and may be in no position to know, the implicit commitments of her theory. Such ignorance, however, does not make the theory less costly. It seems, then, that the problem of extrinsic properties—and, more generally, the problem of capturing implicit ontological commitment—provides a genuine counterexample to quantifier accounts of ontological commitment.

1.7.5 Implicit Commitment: Sets and Wholes

The problem of extrinsic properties arises because there are analytic connections between one predicate holding of a thing and another predicate holding of some other thing. Similar problems arise for quantifier criteria if there are metaphysically necessary connections between non-identical things. Thus, if a set cannot exist without its members existing, then it appears that a theory that contains ‘∃x x = {a, b}’ is ontologically committed to the existence of a. But a need not be assigned as a value to the variable ‘x’ in order for the theory to be true. Similarly, if a whole cannot exist without one of its parts existing, then there appears to be implicit commitment. Suppose, for example, that a human cannot exist without his head. Then a theory that contains ‘∃x x = Obama’ is ontologically committed to Obama's head. But, again, Obama's head need not be assigned as a value to the variable ‘x’ in order for the theory to be true.

Responses can be given that parallel the responses to the problem of extrinsic properties. And a parallel conclusion applies: to capture these cases of implicit ontological commitment, one must switch from a quantifier account to an entailment account.

2. Entailment Accounts of Ontological Commitment

2.1 Overview

According to an entailment account of ontological commitment: A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks if and only if T entails that Ks exist. One must speak of an entailment account because different entailment relations lead to different accounts of ontological commitment; the challenge is to find the right entailment relation. But in any case, entailment accounts do not “look to the values of the variables” for the ontological commitments of a theory. Quantifiers and variables have no privileged role; they figure into the ontological commitments of a theory only to the extent that they figure into the entailments of the theory, just as with other components of the sentences of the theory.

Entailment accounts, as understood here, have the feature that ontological commitment depends only on the content of a theory, not on its logical form. (Thus, the metalinguistic account discussed in §1.4 is not included.) Two theories that have the same content, then, have the same ontological commitments. If we say that theories have the same content just when they mutually entail one another, then each entailment account comes with its own notion of content; the problem of finding the right entailment relation is just the problem of finding the right notion of content, the notion that is relevant to ontological commitment.

It is convenient, though not obligatory, to hypostasize content and speak of the propositions expressed by the sentences of the theory. That allows us to neatly separate the problem of determining the ontological commitments of a theory (set of sentences) into two components: What propositions are expressed by the sentences of the theory? And, what are the ontological commitments, that is, the existential entailments, of those propositions? Indeed, we could then choose to construe theories as sets of propositions and treat all talk of sentences as outside the bounds of an account of ontological commitment proper. But propositions are controversial entities, not accepted by all parties to the debate. To maintain neutrality, we will continue to apply ontological commitment to theories construed as sets of sentences, but with the understanding that, for the friend of propositions, the ontological commitment of sentences is just the ontological commitment of the propositions those sentences express.

The principle advantage of entailment accounts over quantifier accounts is that they have no problem with implicit ontological commitment. (Or, more exactly, since different entailment accounts will differ as to what counts as implicit content, entailment accounts have no problem with what counts as implicit ontological commitment by that account's own standards.) If ‘∃x Human(x)’ entails not only that humans exist, but that humanity exists, then it is ontologically committed to properties or universals, even though no property or universal is the value of any quantified variable. If ‘∃x Parent(x)’ entails that children exist, then ‘∃x Parent(x)’ is ontologically committed to children, again, even though it need not “quantify over” any children. An entailment account, unlike the quantifier account, gets these cases right—supposing, that is, we want our account to capture implicit ontological commitment.

For a stark illustration of the difference between entailment and quantifier accounts, consider a theory T that contains the single sentence ‘∃x K(x)’ and the theory T* that contains the single sentence ‘True(T)’ (see Peacock (2011: 81–2), who calls T* a “meta-theory”). T and T* mutually entail one another (assuming ‘K’ is not a semantical predicate); they thus have the same ontological commitments on an entailment account. And this seems right. Surely, a philosopher cannot eliminate her commitment to Ks by switching from T to T*; it matters not that T*'s commitment to Ks is only implicit. But this implicit ontological commitment is invisible to the quantifier account because T* has no quantificational structure. Once again, by missing implicit commitments, the quantifier account fails to capture the ontological costs of a theory.

The principle disadvantage of an entailment account as compared with a quantifier account is that it fails to provide a neutral platform for assessing the ontological costs of theories: disagreements over ontology will often reappear as disagreements over the existential entailments of a theory. Here it is important to distinguish two things that might be meant by “criterion of ontological commitment”. (This isn't always done; but Jackson (1989) and Rayo (2007) are clear on the distinction.) One might mean a test by which ontological commitments can be discovered. Or one might mean an analysis that says what ontological commitment consists in. An adequate test would be a procedure that could be applied by all parties in a neutral way, independently of those parties' prior ontological beliefs. Quine believed that the quantifier criterion provided such a test. He was aware, of course, that there would be disputes over how best to regiment theories within first-order logic. But—or so he thought—once theories were regimented, the quantifier criterion would supply unequivocal verdicts.

A correct analysis of ontological commitment, however theoretically valuable, might do nothing towards providing an adequate test. Such an analysis, unaccompanied by a test, would be of little help in determining the ontological costs of theories, or resolving ontological disputes. Entailment accounts have good claim to providing a correct analysis of ontological commitment; but they do not provide a test. For one thing, the parties to an ontological dispute will often disagree as to what propositions are expressed by the sentences of a theory, that is, as to what the truth conditions of those sentences are. Quine's criterion bypasses this problematic step by applying the criterion only to already regimented theories. For a second thing, parties to an ontological dispute will often disagree over the existential entailments of a theory (see §2.2 below). Quine's criterion (as he understood it) avoids this problem by focusing on the formal relation of logical entailment between sentences, a relation that is well understood. The material relations of entailment between the propositions, however—be they modal, or conceptual, or a priori—are matters of much dispute. If the goal is to find an adequate test for ontological commitment, entailment accounts fall short.

Initially, one might have hoped to combine an entailment account, qua analysis, with a quantifier account, qua test. (Arguably, this is the best way to understand Quine's project.) But the problems with implicit commitment suggest that the entailment analysis and the quantifier test do not match up, that the test will undergenerate with respect to the analysis. One could dampen one's ambitions, and be content with a one-sided test, a test that in general provides only a sufficient condition. (This is suggested by Rayo (2007: 432) as a response to the problem of extrinsic properties.) But a one-sided test won't be of much help in comparing the ontological costs of theories. Such comparisons require that all costs be put on the table.

2.2 Modal Entailment Criteria

The problem of applying an entailment account to ontological disputes is especially acute if the entailment relation is taken to be necessary implication. That choice results in the following criterion (introduced above in §1.5):

Modal Entailment Criterion. A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff T necessarily implies that Ks exist iff, for every (metaphysically) possible world w, T is true at w only if the domain of w contains at least one K.[25]

On this criterion, every theory is ontologically committed to every necessarily existing kind of entity, what was called above (§1.5) the problem of irrelevant necessary existents. The problem can be ignored when comparing the ontological costs of theories that disagree only over contingently existing kinds: the irrelevant commitments are the same for both theories, and cancel one another out. But many traditional ontological disputes are over the existence of necessarily existing kinds of entity, such as mathematical entities or intensional entities. Consider, for example two theories that disagree only over whether numbers exist. On the modal entailment criterion, these theories have the same ontological commitments; moreover, supposing numbers do exist, the theory that explicitly denies the existence of numbers is nonetheless committed to numbers. Clearly, the modal entailment criterion fails to capture the intuitive notion of ontological commitment. Applying the criterion in this case will do nothing to further the ontological enterprise.

Jackson (1989) highlights the problem of irrelevant necessary existents by comparing the following two arguments:

  • B1. Materialism is true.
  • B2. Materialism is ontologically committed to non-actual possible worlds.
  • BC. Therefore, non-actual possible worlds exist.
  • C1. Modal Realism is true.
  • C2. Modal Realism is ontologically committed to non-actual possible worlds.
  • CC. Therefore, non-actual possible worlds exist.

Suppose, for the sake of argument, that non-actual possible worlds necessarily exist. Then the second premises, B2 and C2, are both true on the modal entailment account. Moreover, on the modal entailment account, both of these arguments are necessarily truth preserving. It seems to follow that the conclusion that non-actual possible worlds exist can be supported either by arguing for B1, that modal realism is true, or by arguing for C1, that materialism is true. But, surely, an argument for materialism provides no support for the claim that possible worlds exist. Or, to turn this around, an objection to the claim that possible worlds exist does not cast doubt on materialism.

Jackson defends the modal entailment account in the following way. Although the two arguments are on a par with respect to validity, and the truth of their premises,

there is an enormous epistemological difference between the arguments. … doubts about the existence of non-actual possible worlds cannot cast doubt on B1, but can cast doubt on C1. (Jackson 1989: 197–8)

Thus, there is an epistemological relation between propositions, “casts doubt on”, which holds between CC and C1 but not between CC (=BC) and B1. Or, turning this around once again, there is an epistemological relation—presumably some sort of a priori entailment relation—according to which modal realism entails that non-actual possible worlds exist, but materialism does not entail that non-actual possible worlds exist. Jackson says nothing to further characterize this relation, let alone provide a semantic analysis. But, however the relation is precisely characterized, the natural question to put to Jackson is: why not use that relation, in place of modal entailment, to characterize ontological commitment? For, clearly, this “epistemological” entailment relation better tracks our judgments as to the ontological commitments of theories; and it is the “epistemological” relation, not modal entailment, that will have to be brought to bear when comparing the ontological costs of theories positing necessary existents.

Peacock (2011) also defends the modal entailment account from the problem of irrelevant necessary existents. In particular, he argues that the ontological costs of theories positing necessary existents can be compared by considering, not the theories' actual commitments (which cannot be known prior to determining the truth of the theories), but by considering “what ontology we would regard a theory as implicitly committed to, were it true” (Peacock 2011: 93). This suggests that there is some counterfactual relation between propositions according to which—to return to Jackson's example—non-actual possible worlds would have to exist if modal realism were true, but it is not the case that non-actual possible worlds would have to exist if materialism were true. This counterfactual relation, of course, could not be given a standard possible worlds analysis lest it apply vacuously to impossible antecedents. But even supposing a semantics for such a counterfactual relation could be given, the natural question to put to Peacock is: why not use that relation, in place of modal entailment, to characterize ontological commitment? For it is this counterfactual relation, not modal entailment, that will have to be brought to bear when comparing the ontological costs of theories positing necessary existents.[26] In sum: neither Jackson nor Peacock give any positive reason to hold on to a modal entailment account, which is puzzling in light of the fact that each is committed to there being an entailment relation—be it epistemological or counterfactual—that better fits the role that the notion of ontological commitment was introduced to play.

2.3 A Priori Entailment Criteria

If the notion of ontological commitment is to play a role in theory choice or clarifying ontological disputes, then the ontological commitments of a theory must be rationally accessible; failure to acknowledge the ontological commitments of one's theory must be a rational failing (see Michael 2008). That puts the following epistemic constraint on the entailment relation that is invoked by an entailment account of ontological commitment: the entailments of a theory must be knowable by any ideally rational agent, that is to say, must be knowable a priori. Does modal entailment meet this constraint? With respect to the examples considered thus far—theories positing necessary existents—it may depend on how “ideally rational” and “a priori” are understood; some philosophers would argue that entities that necessarily exist can be known a priori to exist. But if (following Kripke 1980) we accept that there are necessary propositions that cannot be known a priori, then modal entailment will run afoul of the epistemic constraint. Suppose, for example, that ‘Water is H2O’ is (metaphysically) necessary but not knowable a priori. Then the theory containing the single sentence, ‘Water exists’, modally entails that hydrogen exists. But, according to the epistemic constraint, the existence of hydrogen should not be an entailment on an entailment account of ontological commitment. It appears that some sort of a priori entailment relation must take the place of modal entailment in the analysis of ontological commitment:

A Priori Entailment Criterion. A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff T a priori entails that Ks exist iff, for every conceptually possible world w, T is true at w only if the domain of w contains at least one K.[27]

Switching to an a priori entailment relation goes partway towards restoring the applicability of an entailment account to ontological disputes. It allows that philosophers—if ideally rational—will be able to agree on the ontological commitments of propositions. But there is still the problem of determining what propositions are expressed by the sentences of a theory, that is, what the truth conditions of those sentences are. If the sentences are couched within ordinary or philosophical English, so that their truth conditions are not just a matter of stipulation, there may be no resolving the dispute, even among ideally rational philosophers (see §4).

3. Truthmaker Accounts of Ontological Commitment

3.1 Overview

Quantifier accounts of ontological commitment, we have seen, are liable to miss the implicit ontological commitments of theories because they look exclusively to the values of the variables of quantification. Entailment accounts succeed in capturing implicit commitments, but are liable to overgenerate if the entailment relation fails to be sensitive to relevant ontological distinctions. According to truthmaker accounts of ontological commitment, being a truthmaker for a theory is just such a relevant ontological distinction: to find the ontological commitments of a theory, we should look towards the truthmakers for that theory; a theory is ontologically committed to Ks only if Ks are needed in order to make the theory true. According to truthmaker theorists, focusing on truthmakers will eliminate spurious ontological commitments of an entailment theory. The problem for a truthmaker account, however, is how to do this without also eliminating genuine ontological commitments.[28]

Truthmaker accounts, like entailment accounts, have the feature that ontological commitment depends only on the content of a theory, not on its logical form. That will be so if the primary truthbearers are taken to be non-linguistic propositions (individuated by content) rather than sentences. In that case, ontological commitment applies directly to the propositions, or to theories construed as sets of propositions, and only indirectly to the sentences, or sets of sentences, that express those propositions. That has the benefit, as with the entailment account, of freeing the notion of ontological commitment from language (see §2.1). But taking propositions to be truthbearers will not be to every truthmaker theorist's liking. Moreover, different views on the nature of propositions—possible worlds accounts, Russellian accounts, Fregean accounts, to name a few—lead to somewhat different truthmaker accounts. To remain neutral in what follows with respect to the existence and nature of propositions, sentences will be taken to be the bearers of truth, and ontological commitment will continue to be applied to theories construed as sets of sentences.[29]

Say that an entity makes true (or is a truthmaker for) a sentence or theory if the existence of that entity is, in some sense, sufficient for the truth of the sentence or theory. (It is left open for now just how to understand this notion of sufficiency.) In some cases, truthmakers are easy to come by. For example, the sentence ‘Socrates exists’ has Socrates as a truthmaker (assuming, at any rate, that Socrates has real existence; see §3.2 below). The sentence ‘Elephants exist’ has multiple truthmakers: each and every particular elephant (assuming elephants are necessarily elephants; see §3.3 below). Other cases are more problematic. Consider the conjunction: ‘Socrates exists and Plato exists’. Neither Socrates nor Plato, by himself, is a truthmaker for the conjunction; we need the pair of Socrates and Plato. But how should we understand ‘pair’ here? There are three options. If one is a universalist about mereological composition—for any things, there is a mereological sum composed of just those things—then perhaps the sum of Socrates and Plato can serve as a truthmaker for the conjunction. If one is a realist about sets—and sets exist “in the world” when their members do—then perhaps the set with Socrates and Plato as its members can serve as a truthmaker. But if we reject mereological universalism and set theoretic realism, then we will have to allow that the truthmaker relation takes a plural argument: Socrates and Plato together are truthmakers for the conjunction, but there is no single entity that is a truthmaker. In what follows, it will be simplest to speak as if, whenever a theory has truthmakers, it has a single entity as a truthmaker; but only minor emendations would be needed to allow for plural truthmaking.

Some sentences, it is natural to think, have neither singular nor plural truthmakers (see Lewis 2001). For example, a negative existential sentence such as ‘There are no unicorns’ is made true, it seems, not by what exists, but by what fails to exist: it is true for lack of any falsemakers. And whether a (contingent) predication such as ‘the ball is red” is made true by the ball in question will depend on how the notion of sufficiency is understood (see Supplement to §3.3). Truthmaker maximalists hold that every truth (or at least every contingent truth) has a truthmaker. Typically, truthmaker maximalists will introduce states of affairs or facts to serve as the required truthmakers: totality states of affairs can serve as truthmakers for negative existentials (see Armstrong 2004: 72–5); the state of affairs of the ball's being red, not the red ball itself, is the truthmaker for ‘the ball is red’ (see Armstrong 1997: 115–6). There is a danger here that truthmaking could be trivialized: could any true sentence S be said to have the state of affairs that S as its truthmaker? Typically, truthmaker maximalists avoid such trivialization by holding to a sparse theory of states of affairs. For example, a disjunctive sentence ‘S or T’ is not made true by a disjunctive state of affairs: there are none. Rather, the truthmakers for S (if any) and the truthmakers for T (if any) are separately truthmakers for the disjunction ‘S or T’. In any case, truthmaker maximalism is not required for the truthmaker approach to ontological commitment. What matters, rather, is that the truthmakers and the ontological commitments of a theory are aligned.

How might a truthmaker criterion for ontological commitment be formulated? It will be useful to separately consider two versions, one for ontological commitment to particular entities, the other for ontological commitment to kinds:

Truthmaker Criterion for Particulars: A theory T is ontologically committed to a particular a iff, necessarily, if T is true, then a is a truthmaker for T.

Truthmaker Criterion for Kinds: A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff, necessarily, if T is true, then Ks are among the truthmakers for T.

Note that in the criterion for particulars the necessity is de re. The particular a itself must be a truthmaker for T in any world where T is true. But in the criterion for kinds the necessity must be taken to be de dicto (with respect to ‘K’) if the criterion is to give the desired results. For example, ‘there are elephants’ is ontologically committed to elephants according to the criterion if some elephant or other is a truthmaker for ‘there are elephants’ in any world in which it is true, whether or not any actual elephant is a truthmaker in those worlds.

How should we understand the truthmaking relation, and the way in which the existence of the truthmaker is sufficient for the truth of the theory? On the orthodox necessitation approach to truthmaking (Fox 1987; Bigelow 1988: 125; Armstrong 1997: 115; Lewis 2001), this sufficiency is analyzed in modal terms as follows: x is a truthmaker for T iff T is true and, necessarily, if x exists, then T is true. (A plural version replaces the singular variable ‘x’ with a plural variable ‘xx’ (read “the xs”).) This leads to a familiar problem when truthmakers are sought for necessary theories: any entity (or plurality of entities) is a truthmaker for any necessary theory on the analysis. And there is the familiar fix: replace modal entailment (in the analysis of truthmaking) with a more discriminating entailment relation, perhaps some sort of relevant entailment (Restall 1996). But for many truthmaker theorists, no entailment relation will be able to capture the idea that truthmakers must be fundamental entities, and must ground the theories they make true. This drives these truthmaker theorists to introduce a primitive grounding or in-virtue-of relation to characterize the truthmaking relation: x is a truthmaker for T iff T is true and, necessarily, Ts truth is grounded in x (or T is true in virtue of the existence of x) (see Schaffer 2010 and Cameron forthcoming). Call this the grounding account of truthmaking.[30]

According to truthmaker necessitarianism, the existence of the truthmaker necessitates the truth of the sentence: any possible world in which the truthmaker exists is a world in which the sentence is true. Truthmaker necessitarianism is automatic on the necessitation analysis of truthmaking. On a grounding account, truthmaker necessitarianism can be upheld by endorsing an axiomatic constraint on the notion of grounding: if an entity grounds the truth of a sentence, then, necessarily, if the entity exists, then the sentence is true. The problems to be discussed (in §3.3 and §3.4) apply to any truthmaker account of ontological commitment that endorses truthmaker necessitarianism.[31]

3.2 Deep vs. Shallow Ontological Commitment

The truthmaker criterion for ontological commitment to kinds, as formulated above, strengthens the modal entailment criterion (§2.2) since, necessarily, if Ks are among the truthmakers for T, then Ks exist. Thus, on a truthmaker account, for a theory to be ontologically committed to Ks, it is required not only that there exist Ks if the theory is true, but that there exist Ks that are truthmakers for the theory, if the theory is true. The chief reason given for the strengthening (Cameron 2008, 2010) is this: if the Ks are not fundamental entities, if they lack real existence, then a theory can entail that Ks exist without thereby incurring ontological commitment to Ks. For example, suppose one holds that, although it can truly be said that chairs exist, only (mereological) simples (or states of affairs involving those simples) are fundamental, or have real existence. Moreover, suppose that only entities that are fundamental, or have real existence, can play the truthmaking role, in line with the grounding account of truthmaking. Then, the (true) sentence ‘chairs exist’ is made true, not by chairs, but only by simples arranged chairwise. It then follows on the truthmaker account of ontological commitment that ‘chairs exist’ is committed only to simples arranged chairwise, not to chairs. And, arguably, this is the right result: chairs should not be counted among the ontological commitments of ‘chairs exist’ because, on the view being supposed, they do not add to the ontological cost of accepting ‘chairs exist’. In Armstrong's memorable phrase: they are “an ontological free lunch” (Armstrong 1997: 12–3). This result cannot be had by the quantifier account or the entailment account because these accounts are both insensitive to the crucial distinction between existence and real existence. These accounts inevitably overgenerate commitments, thus ruling out by fiat a minimal ontology that accepts only simples.

Much more would have to be said in a defense of the truthmaker account about the distinction between existence and real existence.[32] But let us suppose for what follows that the distinction is legitimate, and has the ontological significance attributed to it. Still, one might wonder whether we have just changed the subject. On the traditional notion of ontological commitment, as introduced by Quine, it is supposed to be trivially true that ‘Ks exist’ is ontologically committed to Ks (see §1.6.4). Instead of providing an account of a theory's ontological commitment as traditionally understood, the truthmaker account is an account of a theory's fundamental ontological commitments. Looked at in this way, the quantifier account and the truthmaker account are not in competition, and can live side by side (see Schaffer 2008).

Even if the dispute is partly terminological, however, sometimes the choice of terminology matters. It is important to be clear on what the different notions of ontological commitment are, and how they fit in to the general project of ontology. Given a distinction between existence and real existence, the notion of ontological commitment bifurcates into two distinct notions, one shallow and one deep. On the shallow notion, entities that exist but do not really exist are to be counted among the ontological commitments of a theory: it is trivial or analytic that ‘Socrates exists’ is committed to Socrates, and that ‘elephants exist’ is committed to elephants, whether or not Socrates or elephants have real existence. On the deep notion, only entities that really exist count towards the theory's ontological commitments. Ontological commitment, arguably, has traditionally been given the shallow interpretation; but that is because, within the orthodox Quinean setting, there simply is no ontologically relevant distinction between existence and real existence. Once the distinction is accepted, however, and the project of ontology is construed to be the project of discovering not what there is, but what there really is, then it is only the deep notion of ontological commitment that resonates with the ontological enterprise.[33] It is an analysis of this deep notion, as given by the truthmaker account, that matters for ontology.

Just as there are shallow and deep notions of ontological commitment, so there are shallow and deep notions of truthmaking. On the necessitation account of truthmaking, truthmaking is shallow: Socrates is a truthmaker for ‘Socrates exists’ and elephants are truthmakers for ‘elephants exist’, whether or not Socrates or elephants have real existence. On the grounding account of truthmaking, truthmaking is deep: only real existents can serve as truthmakers. Clearly, if we pair a shallow interpretation of ontological commitment with a deep interpretation of truthmaking, then a truthmaker account of ontological commitment is off the table: the ontological commitments and the truthmakers of a theory will not be aligned. In evaluating a truthmaker account, then, it must be supposed from the start that either both notions are taken to be shallow or both notions are taken to be deep. In what follows, both will be taken to be deep in accord with the truthmaker theorist's intentions.

3.3 The Problem of Inessential Predication

Let us begin an evaluation of the truthmaker account with a problem for the truthmaker criterion for ontological commitment to particulars: the problem of inessential predication. Consider the sentence ‘Socrates is wise’, and suppose that Socrates really exists. (If not, switch to an inessential predication whose subject is an entity that really exists.) Then it seems undeniable that ‘Socrates is wise’ is ontologically committed to Socrates. But, given truthmaker necessitarianism and the orthodox understanding of essential properties, Socrates will not be a truthmaker for ‘Socrates is wise’ on the truthmaker account. Wisdom, presumably, is not an essential property of Socrates; and so Socrates' mere existence does not necessitate his being wise. But, then, the truthmaker account of ontological commitment for particulars wrongly claims that ‘Socrates is wise’ is not ontologically committed to Socrates. Note that this problem doesn't arise for essential predications. Suppose, for example, that Socrates is essentially human. Then Socrates' mere existence necessitates his being human, and ‘Socrates is human’ has Socrates both as a truthmaker and as an ontological commitment. But pointing this out only seems to make matters worse for the truthmaker account: why should ‘Socrates is human’ but not ‘Socrates is wise’ be ontologically committed to Socrates? Essential and inessential predications should be treated on a par with respect to ontological commitment.

An analog of the problem of inessential predication applies to the truthmaker criterion of ontological commitment to kinds. Consider the sentence ‘philosophers exist’, and suppose that philosophers really exist. Then it seems undeniable that ‘philosophers exist’ is ontologically committed to philosophers. Presumably, however, philosophers are not essentially philosophers. And so, given truthmaker necessitarianism, no philosopher is a truthmaker for ‘philosophers exist’: any philosopher is such that he or she could have existed in a philosopher-less world. The truthmaker criterion for kinds, then, wrongly claims that ‘philosophers exist’ is not ontologically committed to philosophers. Call this the problem of inessential generalization.

Different accounts of truthmaking—of which entities are truthmakers, and what their essential properties are—will lead to different responses. Since adequate responses appear to be available to the truthmaker theorist, these responses are relegated to the supplementary document.

3.4 The Problem of Sufficiency: Implicit Commitment Revisited

The truthmaker account of ontological commitment—like the quantifier account, but for an entirely different reason—has a problem with capturing implicit commitment. The problem arises because the truthmakers for a theory, but not the ontological commitments of a theory, are entities whose existence is sufficient for the truth of the theory. The problem afflicts both the truthmaker criterion for particulars, and for kinds. Indeed, assuming truthmaker necessitarianism, it follows from the former criterion that a theory is ontologically committed to a particular only if the existence of the particular is both necessary and sufficient for the truth of the theory; it follows from the latter criterion that a theory is ontologically committed to a kind only if the existence of some members (or other) of the kind is both necessary and sufficient for the truth of the theory. But the examples of implicit commitment considered in §1.7.4 and §1.7.5 suggest that sufficiency is not required for ontological commitment. The truthmaker account, like the quantifier account, undergenerates commitments.[34]

To illustrate the problem of sufficiency, consider the following examples. Suppose, as is standard, that the existence of a set necessitates the existence of any of its members. Then, intuitively, the sentence ‘{a, b} exists’ is implicitly committed to a, a result that is captured by entailment accounts of ontological commitment. But since the existence of a is not sufficient for the existence of {a, b}, a is not a truthmaker for ‘{a, b} exists’, and the truthmaker criterion for particulars fails to capture this commitment. For a second example, suppose that, necessarily, elephants have trunks, but that any trunk could exist without there existing any elephants. Then, intuitively, the sentence ‘elephants exist’ is ontologically committed, not only to elephants, but to elephants' trunks, a result that is captured by entailment accounts. But since trunks are not among the truthmakers for ‘elephants exist’, the truthmaker criterion for kinds fails to capture this commitment. For a final example, consider the sentence ‘bachelors exist’. Since it is analytic (suppose) that males exist if bachelors exist, this sentence, intuitively, is ontologically committed to males, a result that is captured by both quantifier and entailment accounts. But no male is a truthmaker for ‘bachelors exist’, since any male could exist without there existing any bachelors. So, again, the truthmaker criterion for kinds fails to capture an implicit commitment.

How might a defender of the truthmaker account respond?[35] It won't do to claim that the notion of ontological commitment targeted by the truthmaker account doesn't include the missing implicit commitments. For one thing, the truthmaker criterion will let in those implicit commitments that pass the sufficiency test, and there seems to be no principled reason for admitting these implicit commitments, but not the others. More importantly, excluding implicit commitments does not sit well with the chief motivation for a truthmaker account, viz., that ontological commitments should reflect fundamental ontology; for commitments are no less fundamental for being implicit. The mismatch between the notions of ontological commitment and truthmaking—that the ontological commitments of a theory are entities whose existence is necessary, given the truth of the theory, whereas the truthmakers of a theory are entities whose existence is sufficient for the truth of the theory—seems to be a serious problem for a truthmaker account of ontological commitment, at least as presented above.

Perhaps the best response to the problem of sufficiency for a truthmaker theorist who wants to capture a deep notion of ontological commitment is to omit the requirement that the ontological commitments of a theory be truthmakers for that theory. It is enough that they are truthmakers for some theory or other, that is, that they are entities that really exist. This leads to the following criteria:

Weakened Truthmaker Criterion for Particulars: A theory T is ontologically committed to a particular a iff T entails that a really exists.

Weakened Truthmaker Criterion for Kinds: A theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff T entails that Ks are among the entities that really exist.[36]

But it is doubtful that this is properly called a truthmaker account of ontological commitment. The (deep) ontological commitments of a theory are no longer being analyzed in terms of the truthmaker commitments of the theory, but instead in terms of its fundamental commitments, its commitments to entities that really exist. And these, we have seen, are not the same.

4. Ontological Commitment in Ordinary Language

4.1 Overview

If a quantifier account of ontological commitment is to be applied directly to ordinary language, we need to know which ordinary language quantifiers or uses of quantifiers (if any) are ontologically committing. The same goes for entailment and truthmaker accounts, notwithstanding our relaxed attitude in applying the accounts to ordinary language examples. For on both accounts ontological commitment depends on the entailment of existentially quantified sentences, and we need to know whether the quantifiers of the entailed sentences carry ontological commitment.

Quine's considered view was that his criterion of ontological commitment cannot be applied to theories couched in ordinary language. Before applying the criterion, the theory must be paraphrased into first-order predicate logic (without names); and then, strictly speaking, it is only the first-order theory that carries ontological commitment, not the ordinary language theory. [37] (The proponent of the theory can be convicted of holding the ontological commitment if—and only if—she accepts the paraphrase.) For Quine, this view reflected his general approach to ordinary language and ontology: the speakers of ordinary language, typically, are not ontologically serious; it is the task of philosophers, not ordinary folk, to determine which prima facie commitments are genuine. There were also specific reasons why a direct application of his criterion to ordinary language might lead to erroneous results. For one thing, theories couched in ordinary language containing non-extensional constructions might have ontological commitments not revealed by quantificational structure (see §1.7.3). For another thing, quantification in ordinary language might fail to carry ontological commitment if it is not objectual, not amenable to the standard Tarskian model-theoretic semantics (see §1.6.2). Only the quantifiers of first-order logic, Quine held, are guaranteed to be objectual (because we stipulate their semantics); and only objectual quantification carries ontological commitment.[38]

On closer inspection, however, Quine is in no position to claim that theories couched in ordinary language never carry ontological commitment. In giving the truth conditions for the quantifiers of first-order logic, Quine explicitly makes use of ordinary language quantifiers (see, for example, Quine 1970). Thus, his claim that the first-order quantifiers are objectual, and carry ontological commitment, can't help but carry over to the ordinary language quantifiers from which they derive their meaning. There must, then, be some portion of ordinary language that can do all the work, vis-à-vis ontological commitment, that the first-order language was introduced to do.[39] This doesn't eliminate the need to seek paraphrases of ordinary language theories (see §4.2 below). But such theories need not be paraphrased into the language of first-order predicate logic; it is enough if they are paraphrased into that regimented portion of ordinary language that can be counted on, in appropriate contexts, to be ontologically serious. The problem that needs to be addressed by the Quinean is then: how to recognize which quantifiers, or which uses of quantifiers, make up this ontologically serious portion of ordinary language. Those who reject the Quinean approach to ontological commitment, on the other hand, need to argue that there is no principled way to separate out those quantifiers, or uses of quantifiers, that carry ontological commitment in ordinary language; or, more radically, that quantification in ordinary language is never ontologically committing.

There is a wide spectrum of views on whether ordinary language quantification is ontologically committing. On one end of the spectrum is the view that all ordinary assertive uses of the quantifiers ‘there is’ and ‘some’ are ontologically committing, a view that may be dubbed “allism” (see Lewis 1990, and §1.6.4 above). On this view, discovering the ontological commitments of ordinary speakers is easy. In asserting that “some prime numbers are greater than 100”, we commit ourselves to the existence of numbers; in asserting that “there are properties that all great leaders have in common”, we commit ourselves to the existence of properties. Ontological commitment cannot be avoided by paraphrasing these sentences into the ontologically serious portion of our language because these ordinary assertions are already ontologically serious.[40]

Hofweber (2005) agrees that quantification in ordinary language is sometimes ontologically committing, but not always, and not when we quantify over abstract entities, such as numbers and properties, in ordinary (i.e., non-philosophical) contexts. Hofweber claims that there are two distinct readings of ordinary language quantifiers, readings that make different contributions to truth conditions and perform different communicative functions. One reading, which he calls the “domain conditions reading”, is tied to ontology: it places conditions on what exists in reality. If I say “something fell on my head” (in a standard context), I am thereby committed to the existence of an object meeting the condition “fell on my head”. But, Hofweber argues, there is another reading of ordinary language quantifiers that is not tied to ontology, what he calls the “inferential role reading”. On this reading, the inference from F(t) to F(something) is trivially valid, even in cases where we do not take the term t to refer to anything in reality. On this reading, I can infer “there is someone whom I admire” from “I admire Sherlock Holmes” without my quantified assertion conveying any ontological commitment.

Yablo (1998) holds that the distinction between quantified statements that are ontologically committing and those that are not—if it can be made out at all—will rest not on different readings of the quantifiers, but on the distinction between literal and figurative uses of language. Indeed, all parties agree that figurative language can fail to be ontologically committing; one can assert, truly, that she has butterflies in her stomach without thereby being committed to the existence of butterflies. But figurative language is very widespread, even in the sciences. A case can be made, for example, that ordinary talk of numbers is merely a pretense we engage in to more easily communicate facts about the concrete world; and similarly for talk of other abstract entities. The project of applying ontological commitment to ordinary language theories, then, is none too easy: it depends upon being able to demarcate language that is literal from language that is partly figurative; and it depends on there being a stripped-down core of ordinary language that, when interpreted literally, has the representational capacity for fully describing the world.

On the far end of the spectrum is the view that ordinary language quantifiers, by themselves, are never ontologically committing. A Carnapian might hold this view as a consequence of her general view that ontological commitment, in a metaphysically loaded sense of the term, is incoherent (see §5.1). A Meinongian might hold this view on the grounds that it is only the existence predicate, not the quantifier, that conveys ontological commitment. The Meinongian, however, is in a weak position when she claims that quantification over non-existent objects fails to be ontologically committing (see §1.6.3); for non-existent objects don't differ from existent objects in their instantiation of properties, or their having natures independent of our theorizing. Azzouni (2004), like the Meinongian, takes the existence predicate to be what conveys ontological commitment; but, unlike the Meinongian, he denies that our talk of non-existent objects requires that they have any sort of independent being. The tie between ontology and quantification is completely severed. All quantification—like Hofweber's “inference role” reading of the quantifier—is ontologically neutral.

How do the various views along this spectrum impact the Quinean project of using paraphrase to provide substitutes for ordinary language theories that can be evaluated for ontological commitment? For Quine, as already noted, there is no presumption that ordinary language quantification is ontologically serious. But it is crucial to Quine's project that some portion of ordinary language can be used for ontologically serious discourse, and that when so used, quantification holds the key to ontological commitment. The allist view, although compatible with the Quinean project, will lead to attributions of ontological commitment wildly different from Quine's own. It makes ontological commitment hard to avoid, leading to overpopulated ontological slums; the desert landscape favored by Quine will be hard to come by. Hofweber's view is more congenial to the Quinean project, so long as the “domain conditions” reading of the quantifiers can be stipulated to be in effect. That can be done, Quine seems to presuppose, merely by taking an appropriately serious attitude to the discourse in question. Inside the philosophy room—or, better, the ontology room—that attitude is pervasive. Outside the philosophy room, the philosopher is no less free than other speakers to engage in ontologically frivolous discourse (see Quine 1960: 210). Yablo's view would be congenial to the Quinean project if it were possible to make out the line between literal and figurative discourse: Quine's ontologically serious discourse could then be identified with thoroughly literal discourse, assertively uttered. But Yablo is skeptical that any such project can succeed, and sees that as dooming the Quinean approach to ontology. Azzouni's view, of course, is outright incompatible with the Quinean project. It leads towards a substantially different account of ontological commitment in which quantification plays no role (see Azzouni 2004: ch. 4).

4.2 The Method of Paraphrase, and its Problems

If criteria of ontological commitment cannot be applied directly to ordinary language, then attributions of ontological commitment to philosophers—or ordinary folk, but we will focus on philosophers—cannot be made just by examining the statements or theories that they accept. Those statements or theories may have prima facie ontological commitments, to be sure, in virtue of their quantificational or referential apparatus. But some method is needed to determine which prima facie commitments count as genuine commitments. Enter here the method of paraphrase endorsed by Quine and his modern day followers. According to this method, we must first ask the philosopher to provide paraphrases of her statements into the regimented portion of our language, paraphrases that are acceptable by standards agreed to in advance. We then apply our criterion of ontological commitment to the regimented paraphrases. If the philosopher provides acceptable paraphrases that are not ontologically committed to Ks, then she is acquitted of commitment to Ks. If the paraphrases she provides are ontologically committed to Ks, then she is guilty of such commitment. If she opts out, refusing to provide paraphrases into the regimented portion of language, then attributions of ontological commitment are moot.

The method of paraphrase dominated ontological discussion throughout much of the twentieth century. For a detailed illustration of the method from its heyday, one can do no better than to turn to David and Stephanie Lewis's article “Holes” (Lewis and Lewis 1970), a dialogue between two philosophers, a nominalist and a realist about abstract objects. Suppose that the nominalist accepts statements that are prima facie committed to (immaterial) holes, such as “there are holes in this piece of cheese”. To be acquitted of this prima facie commitment, the nominalist seeks a paraphrase that avoids it—not just for this one sentence, but for ordinary discourse about holes generally. To be acceptable, the paraphrases should preserve the truth of those statements about holes, and the validity of those arguments about holes, that are endorsed by ordinary speakers. As a first stab, she might make use of the predicate ‘perforated’ and paraphrase “there are holes in this piece of cheese” as “the cheese is perforated”. This allows the nominalist to continue to “speak with the vulgar” without taking on a commitment to holes. But the predicate ‘perforated’ won't help in providing paraphrases for statements that count holes, such as “there are seventeen holes in this piece of cheese”. Here the nominalist could introduce a separate predicate, ‘n-perforated’, for each n. That, however, would violate strictures against infinitely many primitive predicates in the regimented language; and it wouldn't be of much help in paraphrasing numerical comparisons such as “there are as many holes in this piece of cheese as there are crackers on this plate”. In the case of discourse about holes, the nominalist does better to turn to a different strategy of paraphrase: ontological reduction.[41] An ontological reduction maintains the quantificational structure of the discourse, but restricts the underlying domain to uncontroversial entities, in this case, material objects. For example, “there are holes in this piece of cheese” can be taken to quantify, not over immaterial holes, but over material hole-linings; talk of holes is interpreted as talk of the hole-linings that, intuitively, surround the holes. Problems persist: identity conditions for holes and hole-linings do not agree, making trouble for the paraphrasing of identity statements involving holes. But let us end the story here: enough has been said to illustrate how the method of paraphrase might used to avoid prima facie ontological commitments.

Avoiding ontological commitment, however, is not the only role that paraphrase plays in ontological disputes. The method of paraphrase has also been used to bring hidden ontological commitments of ordinary discourse to the fore. One prominent example is Davidson's (1967) argument that action sentences are committed to an ontology of events. For example, to explain the logical inference from “John walked slowly” to “John walked”, we should treat the adverb ‘slowly’ as a description of an event over which these sentences tacitly quantify. Paraphrases of action sentences into the regimented portion of our language will thus be ontologically committed to events. A second well-known example is Lewis's argument from Counterfactuals that modal discourse, as he understands it, is committed to possible worlds:

It is uncontroversially true that things might be otherwise than they are. … Ordinary language permits the paraphrase: there are many ways things could have been besides the way they actually are. … I believe permissible paraphrases of what I believe; taking the paraphrase at its face value, I therefore believe in the existence of entities that might be called ‘ways things could have been’. I prefer to call them ‘possible worlds’. (Lewis 1973: 84)

In both of these cases, a version of the method of paraphrase is used to support, rather than avoid, commitment to controversial ontology.

The method of paraphrase provides a clear, well-defined strategy—some would say the only such strategy[42]—for determining the ontological commitments of the two parties to an ontological dispute. But there have been objections to the method, both early and late. Early on, Alston (1958) posed more or less the following dilemma (see also Jackson 1980). Either the paraphrase and the sentence being paraphrased have the same truth conditions, or they do not. If they do, then they cannot differ in their ontological commitments; for the role of truth conditions, in part, is to specify what must exist in order for the sentence to be true. But then the method of paraphrase cannot be used to avoid ontological commitment. Suppose then that the paraphrase and the sentence being paraphrased do not have the same truth conditions. Then the paraphrase does nothing to support the claim that the original sentence can be used without incurring ontological commitment. Indeed, whatever the precise relation between the paraphrase and the sentence being paraphrased, nothing justifies reading the ontological commitments of the original sentence off the paraphrase rather than the other way around (compare the neo-Fregean account in §5.2).

The best response on behalf of the defender of the method of paraphrase is to reject the assumption that the goal of paraphrase is to capture the truth conditions, or the ontological commitments, of the original. For Quine, an acceptable paraphrase is just a sentence that “serves any purposes [of the original] that seem worth serving” (Quine 1960: 214). A stronger notion of paraphrase is ruled out because the truth conditions, and so the ontological commitments, of sentences in ordinary language are, for the most part, semantically indeterminate. In applying the method of paraphrase, we ask the philosopher to make her ordinary language theory precise through the process of regimentation, not to uncover the hidden commitments of the original theory.[43] If she complies, then the ontological commitments of the regimented theory can be attributed to her. But there is no going back to assign ontological commitments to the original theory couched in ordinary language.[44]

More recent critics of the method of paraphrase see the search for paraphrase as fundamentally misguided. Sider (1999), for example, suggests that the project of discovering the ontological commitments of ordinary language should proceed by searching, not for paraphrases, but for underlying truths (see also Melia 1995 and Yablo 1999 for related critiques). Suppose some sentence in ordinary language that we use in describing the world is prima facie committed to Ks. Nonetheless, the attitude that we take to the sentence may be something weaker than believing the sentence true. In that case, our use of that sentence need not commit us to Ks, even if all acceptable paraphrases are committed to Ks. To get at our commitments, we should look, not to paraphrases, but to the truths that underlie the descriptive role of the sentence; our commitment is the commitment of those underlying truths. Roughly, we can say that the underlying truths are true propositions that would still have been true and would have been sufficient for the truth of the original sentence, if there had been Ks (see Sider 1999: 332–3). To illustrate with a simple example, consider the sentence: “the number of moons of Jupiter is sixty-seven”. Suppose a philosopher uses this sentence to describe the world, but does not want to accept its prima facie commitment to numbers. If, as seems plausible, the underlying truths for the sentence are just propositions stating what physical objects are in the vicinity of Jupiter and what their motions are, then the sentence is ontologically committed only to those physical objects, not to numbers. We may not know what these underlying truths are, or be able to express them in ordinary language. That matters not. For, unlike the method of paraphrase, the philosopher is under no obligation to provide the underlying truths in order to acquit herself of the prima facie commitments. She can justify her use of sentences that are prima facie committed to numbers as long as she holds that there are underlying truths, and that the underlying truths are not so committed.

5. Frege and Neo-Fregeanism

5.1 Frege

Although explicit discussion of ontological commitment postdates Frege's writings, an account of ontological commitment can be garnered from his defense of arithmetical platonism in The Foundations of Arithmetic (Frege 1884). That account is embedded in the following argument for the claim that numbers exist as “self-subsistent objects” (see Wright (1990), who calls the argument “deceptively simple”). The semantic role of singular terms (Frege's proper names) is to refer to objects. When singular terms occur in true sentences of an appropriate kind­—extensional sentences generally, and identity sentences in particular—they cannot help but to refer; for that is their contribution to the truth of the sentence. Appropriate sentences involving numerical singular terms are sometimes true; witness ‘the number of planets is nine’ and ‘1+1=2’. Therefore, these singular terms refer to objects. Moreover, the argument may be continued, since some of these singular terms—those of the form ‘the number of Fs’—figure in the identity condition definitive of the concept of number (Hume's Principle, see below), the objects referred to are properly called “numbers”. Therefore, numbers exist.

This argument might be challenged in two different ways. First, one might deny that sentences containing numerical singular terms are (literally) true; one might, for example, endorse a fictionalist account of mathematics (Field 1980). For our purposes, we can sidestep this objection and focus on the other premise of the argument, that extensional sentences containing numerical singular terms, if true, refer to numbers—which is to say, in other words, that such sentences, whether true or not, are ontologically committed to numbers. If this is to serve as a criterion of ontological commitment, there must be some purely syntactic way of determining which expressions are genuine singular terms; if genuine singular terms are characterized semantically—for example, as expressions that refer to objects when they occur in true extensional sentences—then the account of ontological commitment goes in a circle. Thus, Fregean accounts are committed to a syntactic priority thesis: ontology depends on ontological commitment plus truth; and ontological commitment in turn depends on syntax (see Wright 1983 for extended discussion).

In various scattered remarks, Frege appears to endorse the syntactic priority thesis. For example, he writes (1884: §57): “we say ‘the [number] 1’, and by means of the definite article, set up 1 as an object”. And he notes that numerals occur, not only attributively, for example, in ‘Jupiter has four moons’, but also in identity statements, such as ‘the number of Jupiter's moons is four’; and the sense of such an identity statement is just that “the expression ‘the number of Jupiter's moons’ denotes the same object as the word ‘four’”. The difficulty of identifying the appropriate use of the definite article, or when ‘is’ signals a genuine identity statement, was, perhaps, not sufficiently appreciated by Frege. But recent work (especially Dummett (1973) and Hale (1996)) has given some reason to think that genuine singular terms in English can be recognized syntactically in terms of their inferential role.

Suppose that the task of providing syntactic criteria for identifying genuine singular terms can be accomplished. Suppose, moreover, that there are syntactic criteria for saying when a genuine singular term purports to refer to objects of kind K. Then the Fregean can put forth the following sufficient condition for ontological commitment:

Fregean Account. Suppose that t is a singular term purporting to refer to objects of kind K. Then, any extensional theory containing the term t is ontologically committed to Ks.

Note that, unlike the criteria for ontological commitment considered heretofore, this is intended only as a sufficient condition for ontological commitment. For one thing, just as Frege took singular terms to be a vehicle for commitment to objects, he took incomplete expressions to be a vehicle of commitment to concepts and (more generally) functions. Unlike Quine, Frege treated all meaningful expressions on a par with respect to ontological commitment. But even if we restrict our attention to ontological commitment to objects, there is no reason to think that Frege's criterion is necessary as well as sufficient. Frege could well have allowed existentially quantified sentences to be ontologically committed to objects, whether or not they were equivalent to disjunctions of sentences containing singular terms.

In one important respect, Frege's approach to ontological commitment is in agreement with Quine's. Both hold that the smallest unit of ontological commitment is the complete sentence. For Frege, this can be seen as an uncontroversial application of his famous Context Principle: “it is only in the context of a proposition that words have any meaning” (Frege 1884: §62). It follows that attribution of ontological commitment to persons always goes by way of the theories (sentences) that they accept. This approach to ontological commitment is common to all mainstream views in contemporary analytic philosophy. It could be denied, however, by a philosopher who holds that we stand in intentional relations, not only to propositions, but also to objects. For such a philosopher, plausibly, a person is ontologically committed to the objects of her thought, and the kinds they exemplify, independently of what propositions she takes to be true of those objects, or even whether there are any such propositions.

The Fregean approach to ontological commitment differs from orthodox Quinean approaches most obviously in its emphasis on singular terms as opposed to quantifiers and variables. But this may reflect more a difference in their accounts of singular terms than a substantial difference in their accounts of ontological commitment; both approaches, after all, focus on the referential apparatus of the language. Quine eliminated all singular terms prior to assessing ontological commitment: definite descriptions were eliminated via Russell's theory of descriptions; names were eliminated in favor of predicates satisfied by at most one thing. This allowed Quine to sidestep issues arising from ostensibly empty names (see §1.2 above). Frege, on the other hand, took singular terms to be the locus of commitment to objects. In Frege 1892, he writes: “when we say ‘the moon’ … we presuppose a reference”. Singular terms, then, are ontologically committing in this sense: they presuppose reference to objects. This applies no less to empty names that in fact fail to refer. Frege writes:

anyone who seriously took the sentence [“Odysseus …”] to be true or false would ascribe to the name “Odysseus” a reference.

This has a couple of awkward consequences. For one, it follows that denials of existence cannot be made with empty names: “Odysseus never existed” is neither true nor false. But perhaps these denials won't much be missed, since we can always say instead that the name ‘Odysseus’ doesn't refer. For another, sentences with fictional names are always ontologically committing. But, ultimately, it is the ontological commitment of persons that we care about, not sentences. A person may use a sentence containing a singular term—for example, an actor on the stage—without inheriting the sentence's ontological commitments. Only when a person judges the sentence to be true is she committed to an object as referent of the singular term, and to the kinds of entity to which the object belongs.

Another difference between Frege and Quine (but not all Quineans) is that Frege's account of ontological commitment applies directly to sentences of ordinary language. Quine's account applies only indirectly to sentences of ordinary language via the method of paraphrase, or, in what seems to be his “official” view, not at all. This difference leads to different, and more onerous, demands being placed on the Fregean. As already noted, the Fregean must discover syntactic criteria for identifying genuine singular terms in ordinary language. Quine never engaged in the corresponding project: finding syntactic criteria for identifying objectual quantifiers in ordinary language. As we saw in §4.2, that task is none too easy, and there is substantial disagreement even over basic cases. But, contra Quine, it is a task that must be carried out if quantifier approaches to ontological commitment are to have philosophical application. Philosophers, after all, do not often speak or write in Quine's target language: first-order predicate logic. Quinean approaches—if they are to provide a theory-neutral criterion of ontological commitment applicable to ordinary language—are no less beholden to the syntactic priority thesis than Fregean approaches.

5.2 Neo-Fregeanism

Thus far, we have canvassed Frege's argument that, if sentences containing numerical singular terms are true, then those terms refer to numbers. The last step in the argument—that the objects referred to by numerical singular terms satisfy the sortal concept of number—invoked the following identity criterion for numbers:

Hume's Principle. The number of Fs is identical with the number of Gs if and only if there is a one-to-one correspondence between the Fs and the Gs.

Frege considered, but rejected, the idea that Hume's Principle, by itself, could be taken to define the concept of number. His rejection was based on what has come to be known as the “Caesar Problem”: Hume's Principle allows one to decide whether the number of Fs is identical with q, when q is given in the form ‘the number of Gs’, but it fails to do so when q is not given in that form. Thus, Frege (1884: §56) requires that we be able to

decide by means of our definitions whether any concept has the number Julius Caesar belonging to it, or whether that same familiar conqueror of Gaul is a number or not.

Frege thus opted instead to define numbers explicitly in terms of extensions: the number of Fs = the extension of the concept ‘equal to the concept F’ (where F is equal to G just in case the Fs are in one-to-one correspondence with the Gs). These explicit definitions arguably allow Frege to maintain the logicist thesis that arithmetic is logic: they define numbers as logical objects in the sense that their existence can be justified on the basis of (Frege's) logic alone. But, as is well known, these explicit definitions foundered on the inconsistency of Frege's underlying theory of extensions, in particular, the naïve comprehension principle embodied in his Basic Law V.

The Neo-Fregean seeks to defend arithmetical platonism and logicism by taking a different tack: Hume's Principle by itself is taken to provide a contextual definition of numbers. The viability of this approach is secured by the result now called Frege's Theorem: Hume's Principle, when added to a suitable system of second-order logic, suffices for the proof of the basic laws of arithmetic, Peano's axioms (see Wright 1983: 158–69). Arithmetical logicism is secured if Hume's Principle can be shown to be analytic in an appropriate sense. Arithmetical platonism, with numbers as logical objects, is secured because, when logical truths are substituted for the right-hand side of Hume's Principle, the resulting instance on the left-hand side is also logically true, and explicitly refers to numbers.

For our purposes, the main interest of the Neo-Fregean approach is that it leads to a conception of ontological commitment more liberal than any yet considered. This conception arises from the Neo-Fregean's particular way of understanding Hume's Principle. First, since Hume's Principle is to define the concept of number, the left- and right-hand sides of the principle must at least have the same truth conditions. Second, sentences with the same truth conditions have the same ontological commitments. This second assumption amounts to a sense in which being supervenes on truth: circumstances cannot differ with respect to what there is without differing with respect to what is true. It follows from these two assumptions that the left- and right-hand sides of Hume's Principle have the same ontological commitments. But that still leaves open three different ways that Hume's Principle can be viewed (Wright 1990). First, one might reject it on the grounds that the left- and right-hand sides clearly do not have the same ontological commitments: the numerical identity on the left-hand side is committed to numbers; the claim that two concepts are equal on the right-hand side is not. On this view, only a conditionalized version of Hume's Principle could be accepted: “if there are numbers, then …” (Field 1984). In response, the neo-Fregean can say that this confuses “having the same truth conditions” with some more fine-grained equivalence such as “expressing the same thought”. Only the latter requires that both sides refer to the same objects, where reference is a kind of explicit ontological commitment.[45]

A second response takes Hume's Principle to provide an ontological reduction of numbers to concepts, and relations between concepts. On this view, Hume's Principle is true, but ontological commitments should be read off of the right-hand side. Since the right-hand side, it is supposed, is not ontologically committed to numbers, the left-hand side—being truth-conditionally equivalent—cannot be ontologically committed to numbers either; surface grammar is deceptive here. This response is in line with the standard Quinean approach to paraphrase as a means of eliminating ontological commitment. But, as noted in §4.2, it is unclear what justifies the asymmetric attitude with respect to commitment. Granted, there is no explicit ontological commitment to numbers by the right-hand side; but once one allows that ontological commitment can be implicit, it is unclear why one cannot say that it is the surface grammar of the right-hand side that is deceptive with respect to ontological commitment.

The third response, that of the Neo-Fregean, is to say that ontological commitments should be read off of the left-hand side, and that therefore both sides are ontologically committed to numbers. This is no idle preference. It is backed up by the Fregean argument considered above that the left-hand side is ontologically committed to numbers in virtue of containing numerical singular terms. The symmetry is broken.

The neo-Fregean thus endorses a sufficient condition for ontological commitment much weaker than the Fregean account:

Neo-Fregean Account. Suppose that t is a singular term purporting to refer to objects of kind K. Then any theory truth-conditionally equivalent to a theory containing the term t is ontologically committed to Ks.

To illustrate: “there are exactly as many forks as knives” is ontologically committed to numbers because it is truth-conditionally equivalent to “the number of forks is identical with the number of knives”, which contains a singular term ‘the number of forks’ which purports to refer to numbers.

The liberality of the neo-Fregean account of ontological commitment is best appreciated by considering its application to abstraction principles for which, unlike Hume's Principle, the right-hand side appears to be entirely about concrete entities, and so appears to be acceptable to a nominalist. For example, consider the abstraction principle for directions: the direction of line a is identical to the direction of line b if and only if a is parallel to b (where a and b are concrete). According to the neo-Fregean account, the claim that concrete lines a and b are parallel is committed, by itself, to abstract objects, directions.[46] Moreover, it has this commitment whether or not any mind ever grasps the concept of direction, or formulates the corresponding abstraction principle. In general, commitments to abstracta are concomitant with certain commitments to concreta, and inseparable from them, regardless of our ways of conceptualizing.[47]

6. Carnap and Neo-Carnapianism

6.1 Carnap

Carnap was a deflationist about traditional ontological disputes, such as whether numbers exist, or physical objects exist. He held that existence questions could be interpreted in two different ways, internally or externally. When interpreted internally, the question was to be answered relative to a linguistic framework. If the framework was mathematical, existence questions, such as whether there are prime numbers greater than 1000, were to be answered by means of proof, given the axioms and rules of logic introduced by the framework. If the framework was empirical, existence questions, such as whether electrons exist, were to be answered through observation according to the rules of confirmation and disconfirmation introduced by the framework. When the existence questions involved the most general kinds introduced by the framework, the answers were trivial. In the framework of numbers, it is trivial that numbers exist; in the framework of physical objects, it is trivial that physical objects exist. For it is stipulated in introducing these frameworks that the variables range over numbers, or physical objects.

When existence questions are interpreted externally, they purport to be about “reality” independent of any particular linguistic framework. So interpreted, according to Carnap, these questions—such as “do numbers exist?” or “do physical objects exist?”—are pseudo-questions lacking any cognitive meaning. Since metaphysicians engaging in ontological disputes over these questions evidently have the external interpretation in mind—they do not take them to be trivial—much of traditional metaphysics for Carnap was cognitively meaningless as well. The best one can do to make sense of external existence questions is to re-construe them as pragmatic questions as to which frameworks to accept. The question, “do numbers exist”, for example, could be re-construed as the question, “is it useful to introduce the number framework”. A framework could be deemed useful, for example, if it facilitated factual communication in ways that were “efficient, fruitful, and simple” (Carnap 1950).

One might wonder whether it is coherent to interpret all meaningful existence questions as internal: don't we need the concept of existence to introduce and meaningfully discuss the frameworks themselves, and their pragmatic virtues? Can it be frameworks “all the way down”? But, for purposes of this article, it suffices to ask how the notion of ontological commitment fits in to Carnap's scheme. One might expect Carnap to tie talk of ontological commitment to external questions, and reject it accordingly: if it is cognitively meaningless to say that Ks exist in reality, then it is cognitively meaningless to say that a theory presupposes or assumes that Ks exist in reality. But that is not what Carnap did. Rather, he endorsed Quine's quantifier account of ontological commitment, applying it internally; his only reservation had to do with Quine's use of the word ‘ontological’.[48] For Carnap, a theory always comes packaged with a linguistic framework for interpreting the theory. To say that a theory is ontologically committed to Ks, then, is just to say that according to the rules of the framework-cum-theory, it is true that Ks exist. A philosopher can be said to “accept a kind of entities” when he introduces a linguistic framework that, first, introduces a general term satisfied by all and only entities of that kind and, second, introduces variables to range over all and only those entities (see Carnap 1950: 213).

How do Carnap's views relate to Quine's? First, it might well be asked, which of the quantifier accounts canvassed above is Carnap endorsing when he claims to be in agreement with Quine? Since Carnap clearly allows a philosopher who has not accepted (for pragmatic reasons) some kind of entity to attribute acceptance of that kind to another philosopher, Carnap's view would appear to be closest to the metalinguistic version of Quine's quantifier account. We are making claims about linguistic frameworks, and what follows from the rules of those frameworks; and these claims, at least for Carnap, do not make problematic assertions about “reality”. Second, a consequence of Carnap's view is that theories with different ontological commitments should not be thought of as conflicting. This contrasts sharply with Quine. Because Quine has a single, all-purpose logico-linguistic framework—austere first-order predicate logic—within which all theories are couched for purposes of examining their ontological commitments, theories with differing existential presuppositions genuinely conflict; a philosopher must choose which theory to accept. For Carnap, theories with differing ontological commitments are ipso facto couched within different linguistic frameworks. If there is disagreement, it can only be over the relative pragmatic virtues of the frameworks in question. In this way, Carnap's deflationary approach to ontology carries with it a deflationary approach to ontological commitment. Carnap is a pluralist; a philosopher can choose to accept multiple theories, with differing ontological commitments, without pain of contradiction. Let many flowers bloom (see Carnap 1950: 221).

6.2 Neo-Carnapianism: Quantifier Variance

According to Carnap, each linguistic framework comes with its own unrestricted existential quantifier, and thus its own notions of object and existence. No one of these quantifiers is logically or metaphysically privileged over any of the others; there is no neutral standpoint from which one framework can be judged correct and another incorrect. When frameworks appear to disagree—as when one says that arbitrary fusions exist, and another denies it—the dispute is merely verbal; they are using quantifiers with different meanings. This is a form of the doctrine of quantifier variance. One might well wonder: don't we get a single, privileged quantifier by combining all linguistic frameworks, and considering a quantifier that ranges over the union of all the domains of these frameworks? But the question presupposes, in effect, that the notion of “all linguistic frameworks” is meaningful, and there is no reason why Carnap would accept that. Any attempt to introduce a single all-inclusive quantifier that ranges over absolutely everything would be rejected by Carnap. For what does everything mean here, if not “everything in reality? And that, for Carnap, is cognitively meaningless.

Eli Hirsch (2002) is a neo-Carnapian proponent of the doctrine of quantifier variance, but he differs from Carnap in at least two respects (see also Putnam 1987). First, Hirsch applies the doctrine of quantifier variance not just to the quantifiers in artificial languages, as was Carnap's way, but to ordinary language quantifiers. Instead of Carnap's many linguistic frameworks, we have many possible languages including English and (Hirsch would say) the somewhat bizarre variations on English spoken by some contemporary metaphysicians. For example, Lewish, the language spoken by mereologists (and named after its defender, David Lewis) quantifies over arbitrary fusions, whereas English, Hirsch claims, does not. Second, Hirsch's brand of quantifier variance is meant to be compatible with realism, that there is a single reality in virtue of which our theories, with their various quantifiers, are made true or false. This reality cannot, in and of itself, be ontologically structured; it cannot have a metaphysically privileged division into objects, lest one quantifier be privileged over the others. Reality consists rather of unstructured facts that we carve up differently with our different quantifiers.

Hirsch's realism contrasts sharply with Carnap's anti-realism. For Carnap, different linguistic frameworks are incommensurable. They peacefully coexist, logically isolated from one another. Apparent ontological disputes are meaningless for lack of a common subject matter, a single “reality” that is being disputed. For Hirsch, on the other hand, each side in an ontological dispute is speaking truly of the one and only reality. The appearance of a genuine dispute arises because they are speaking different languages whose quantifiers have different meanings. Each side of the dispute can translate the others claims into his own language to see that both are speaking truly, and that the dispute is merely verbal. The disagreement is over the meaning of words, not the nature of reality.

This claim of intertranslatability is difficult to maintain (see Hawthorne 2009). But suppose it can be made good: what would that say about ontological commitment? Since theories that assert “there are Ks” and theories that assert “there are no Ks” need not conflict, one cannot simply look to the quantifiers for ontological commitment. Moreover, since no language, and no quantifier, is ontologically privileged, it would not help to first translate into a single language. We could relativize the notion of ontological commitment to languages; but given that reality itself, for Hirsch, isn't ontologically structured, none of these relativized notions of ontological commitment would be getting at something of ontological significance (including the one that gave ontological commitment relative to ordinary language, and ordinary language quantifiers). All theories, it appears, are ontologically committed to the single reality, and the unstructured facts that comprise it; but that commitment does not come from quantification. Where it comes from is not addressed.


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