#### Supplement to Essential vs. Accidental Properties

## Arguments for Origin Essentialism

Claims of origin essentialism have a great deal of intuitive
plausibility, but not everyone shares the intuition, so it is fitting
that a number of philosophers have tried to offer accounts of
these
claims.^{[1]}
Very
broadly speaking, these accounts fall into two categories—those
that suggest that such claims are grounded in a “branching
conception of possible worlds” and those that suggest that such
claims are grounded in “constitutional sufficiency
principles”—both of which were mentioned by Kripke
(1972/1980, pp. 112-114) when he endorsed the view that an object could
not have had a radically different origin from the one it actually had.

Accounts of the first sort (offered by J. L. Mackie (1974) and P. Mackie (2006)) have aimed not so much to argue for origin essentialism as to explain why we find such claims attractive. It is in accounts of the second type (offered by Forbes (especially 1985 and 1986), McGinn (1976), Noonan (1983), and Salmon (especially 1979 and 1981), among others) that we find full-fledged arguments for origin essentialist claims. The most sustained defenses have come from Forbes and Salmon. Forbes has concentrated (though far from exclusively) on the claim that a given human being could not have originated from a different zygote (that is, the immediate product of a sperm cell's fertilizing an egg cell) than the one from which she actually originated, while Salmon has concentrated on the claim that a given artifact could not have been originally made from completely different material than that from which it was actually originally made. Their defenses, though quite different in some ways, are similar enough in certain important respects that discussion of just one of the arguments will serve to highlight the difficulties both face.

Before beginning the main discussion, there is a minor problem to finesse. The claim that every organism and artifact has its origin essentially is a universally quantified claim and not an existentially quantified one, so it does not by itself make an essentialist claim, on any of the characterizations of essentialism given in §3 of the main entry. Nonetheless, its essentialist import is clear, since it is hardly controversial that there are in fact organisms and artifacts. So, in an extended sense, the claim that every organism and artifact has its origin essentially counts as an essentialist claim.

- 1. The Argument(s) from Sufficiency
- 2. The Recycling Problem
- 3. The Tolerance Problem
- 4. The Generality Problem

### 1. The Argument(s) from Sufficiency

We first present Salmon's argument fairly formally and
without
explication.^{[2]}
Immediately afterward, we walk through the argument with explication.
(So, if the argument makes little sense on first reading, hang on; it
will make sense soon enough.) The phrase “*x* is
originally made from *y*” is to be understood to mean that
*x* is originally formed entirely from all of *y*, which
is just to say that there is none of *y* that is not used to
make *x* and no matter other than *y* is used to make
*x*. Where ‘*y*’ and ‘*z*’
appear together in a premise, it is to be understood that *y*
and *z* do not “overlap”, which is to say that they
do not have any matter in common.

#### Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 1

**Compossibility _{1}**. If a table

*x*is originally made from matter

*y*and it is possible for a table to be originally made from matter

*z*, then it is also possible for table

*x*to be originally made from matter

*y*and in addition some table or other

*x*′ to be originally made from matter

*z*.

**Origin Uniqueness**. It is impossible that a single
table *x* is originally made from matter *y* and in
addition is originally made from matter *z*.

**Sufficiency _{1}**. If it is possible that a table

*x*′ is originally made from matter

*z*, then necessarily any table originally made from matter

*z*is the very table

*x*′ and no other.

Therefore

**Origin Essentialism _{1}**. If a given table is
originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the
given table is not originally made from any non-overlapping matter.

Consider a table, *a*, which was originally made from matter
*m*. Consider too some matter *m** that has no matter in
common with *m*, but which could itself be made into a table.
Here we have satisfied the antecedent of
Compossibility_{1}. What Compossibility_{1} says then
is that it is possible for *a* to be originally made from
*m* while in addition *m** is itself made into a
table. And this seems right: surely there is some possible world in
which this happens. Origin Uniqueness says that in any such world, the
two tables are distinct from one another. And that too seems right:
surely no table has two completely different material origins in a
single possible world. Now consider some particular possible world in
which all this happens, and let ‘*b*’ name the
table there that is originally made from
*m**. Sufficiency_{1} says that any possible table that
is originally made from *m** is *b* and not some other
table. Since we have already established that *a* is distinct
from *b*, this means that *a* could not have been made
from *m**. (Here the argument uses the necessity of
identity/distinctness—the claim that (necessarily) if *x*
and *y* are identical/distinct then necessarily *x* and
*y* are identical/distinct.) Since there is nothing special
about *a*, *b*, *m*, and *m**, the general
conclusion seems warranted on the basis of this reasoning, provided
Sufficiency_{1} is true. It turns out that this particular
sufficiency premise is not true, as Salmon himself points out. But
perhaps—as Salmon believes—some modified version of the
claim is true.

Since the argument gets a bit more complicated when it is modified,
it is good to reflect now on the simple intuitive motivation that
underlies it: “If *a* is *F*, then it could not
instead have been *G*; for any *G* would have to be
something else again. Here, ‘*F*’ and
‘*G*’ must be certain contrary predicates, for which
the premise ‘If *a* is *F*, then any *G*
would have to be something else’ is intuitively plausible”
(Salmon 2005, Ap. VI, p. 374). In the particular case we are
considering *F* is ‘is originally made from
*m*’ and *G* is ‘is originally made from
*m**’. (Salmon speculates that this may be the canonical
form of arguments for essentialism. So, for example, the number nine
could not have been even, for any even number would have to be some
number other than nine.)

Here is the problem with Sufficiency_{1} as it
stands. Consider again the table *a*, which is originally made
from matter *m*. The table *a* is a table of a
particular kind—a pedestal table, as it turns out. Matter
*m* could have been made into a different kind of table—a
folding table, say. Intuitively that table would not have been the
table *a*. But Sufficiency_{1} says it is. It is clear
that the premise must be modified so that the plan according to which
the table was made figures in. Here is the resulting argument.

#### Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 2

**Compossibility _{2}**. If a table

*x*is originally made from matter

*y*and it is possible for a table to be originally made from matter

*z*

*according to plan u*, then it is also possible for table

*x*to be originally made from matter

*y*and in addition some table or other

*x*′ to be originally made from matter

*z*

*according to plan u*.

**Origin Uniqueness**. It is impossible that a single
table *x* is originally made from matter *y* and in
addition is originally made from matter *z*.

**Sufficiency _{2}**. If it is possible that a table

*x*′ is originally made from matter

*z*

*according to plan u*, then necessarily any table originally made from matter

*z*

*according to plan u*is the very table

*x*′ and no other.

Therefore

**Origin Essentialism _{2}**. If a given table is
originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the
given table is not originally made from any non-overlapping matter according to any plan.

Since every table must be made according to some plan or other,
Origin Essentialism_{2} is not substantively different from Origin
Essentialism_{1}.

Trouble is not over for the sufficiency premise. As Salmon again
points out himself, the mere possibility of a Ship of Theseus type of
case provides a counterexample. Suppose there is a table, *c*,
that is originally made from matter *n* according to some plan
*p*. As time goes by, *c* undergoes various repairs
until finally it is constituted by matter that is wholly distinct from
the matter from which it was originally constituted. At this point
matter *n* is gathered together and made into a table,
*d*, according to the same plan by which *c* was
made. Sufficiency_{2} incorrectly identifies *c* and
*d*.

Salmon responds by further weakening the sufficiency premise, giving us the following argument.

#### Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 3

**Compossibility _{3}**. If a table

*x*is originally made from matter

*y*and it is possible for a table to be

*the only table*originally made from matter

*z*according to plan

*u*, then it is also possible for table

*x*to be originally made from matter

*y*and in addition some table or other

*x*′ to be

*the only table*originally made from matter

*z*according to plan

*u*.

**Origin Uniqueness**. It is impossible that a single
table *x* is originally made from matter *y* and in
addition is originally made from matter *z*.

**Sufficiency _{3}**. If it is possible that a table

*x*′ is

*the only table*originally made from matter

*z*according to plan

*u*, then necessarily any table that is

*the only table*originally made from matter

*z*according to plan

*u*is the very table

*x*′ and no other.

Therefore

**Origin Essentialism _{3}**. If a given table is
originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the
given table is not

*the only table*originally made from any non-overlapping matter according to any plan.

### 2. The Recycling Problem

This conclusion is less than originally hoped for, leaving open the
possibility that a particular table is one of two tables made from
matter that does not overlap the matter from which it was actually
originally made. But, more importantly, even this sufficiency premise
is not without problems. Consider again the tables *c*
and *d* in the “Table of Theseus” case. It seems
that *c* could have been the only table to have been originally
made from
*n* according to plan *p*: the world could have come to
an end before *d* ever gets made. It also seems that instead
*d* could have been the only table to have been originally made
from *n* according to plan *p*: the person who made
*c* could have given up her project before *c* was made
and yet matter *n* might still have been gathered together years
later to make *d*. Sufficiency_{3} incorrectly identifies
*c* and *d*. This problem, pointed out by McKay (1986)
and others, has come to be known as the *recycling problem*.

Salmon (2005, Ap. VI, p. 373) responds to this case by saying that
although *c* could have existed without *d*, *d*
could not have existed without *c*. Forbes (1997, p. 528)
responds in a similar way when confronted with an analogous challenge
to the sufficiency premise involved in his argument for origin
essentialism. He explicitly embraces the *essentiality of order*
according to which it is essential to *c* to be the first table
made from *n* according to *p* and essential to
*d* to be the second table so made.

The fact that the advocate of this general line of argumentation for
the essentiality of origin can defend against the recycling problem by
adopting the essentiality of order (or less robustly, just the claim
that *d* could not have existed without *c*) should not
lead one to underestimate the significance of the recycling problem. If
the best defense against it is to adopt a brand of essentialism that
has less support from intuition than origin essentialism itself already
enjoyed, then the argument for origin essentialism seems to offer
little more support for the claim than the intuition did in the first
place.

### 3. The Tolerance Problem

There is another challenge that these kinds of arguments face. It is
in fact a challenge that threatens not only the arguments (in
particular, the sufficiency premise) but also the conclusions
themselves. It arises from the intuition that even if an object could
not have had a *completely* different origin from the one it
actually had, it could have had *a slightly* different
origin. Kripke's original formulations of origin essentialism reflect
this intuition of *modal tolerance for origins*: he says that
the wooden table in the room in which he spoke could not have been
made from a “*completely* different block of wood”;
similarly, he says that Queen Elizabeth could not have originated from
a “*totally* different sperm and egg” (1972/1980,
p. 113, our changes of emphasis). Salmon's argument, as we have seen,
has a similarly modest conclusion. And Forbes too has been concerned
to allow for some degree of modal tolerance when it comes to an
object's origin. But, since little differences add up to big
differences, the threat of paradox looms large.

Recall the table *a* that was originally made from matter
*m*. Let *n* be the number of molecules in *m*.
Let *m*, *m _{1}*,

*m*, …

_{2}*m*be a sequence of different (hunks of) matter, each differing from its immediate predecessor only by one molecule of the same type, so that

_{n}*m*and

*m*have all but two molecules in common and

_{2}*m*and

*m*have no molecules whatsoever in common. Since

_{n}*a*was originally made from

*m*, modal tolerance for origins tells us that

*a*could have been manufactured from

*m*. In other words, there is a possible world in which

_{1}*a*was originally made from

*m*. This is just to say that there is a world that is possible relative to (or, in other terminology, accessible from) the actual world in which

_{1}*a*was originally made from

*m*. Let

_{1}*w*be a particular possible world—one as like the actual world as is compatible with the difference specified—in which

_{1}*a*was originally made from

*m*. If modal tolerance for origins is true, it is natural to think that it holds in

_{1}*w*as well as in the actual world. This is because, intuitively, modal tolerance for origins is not a claim that simply happens to be true at the actual world, but is something more like a conceptual truth. So there is a world, possible relative to

_{1}*w*, in which

_{1}*a*was originally made from

*m*. In still other words, there is a world, which is possible relative to a world that is itself possible relative to the actual world, in which

_{2}*a*was originally made from

*m*. Let

_{2}*w*be a particular possibly possible world—one as like

_{2}*w*and the actual world as is compatible with the difference specified—in which

_{1}*a*was originally made from

*m*. If modal tolerance for origins is true, then it is natural to think that it holds at

_{2}*w*as well. We can continue on in this way until we reach a world,

_{2}*w*, which is possible relative to

_{n}*w*, in which

_{n-1}*a*was originally made from

*m*. If the relation of

_{n}*being possible relative to*is transitive, that is, if whatever is possibly possible is also possible, then

*w*is possible relative to the actual world, which is just to say that

_{n}*a*could have been originally made from

*m*. But

_{n}*m*has no matter at all in common with the matter from which

_{n}*a*was originally made, and so according to origin essentialism

*a*could not have been originally made from

*m*.

_{n}
(To see modal tolerance as a direct threat to the sufficiency
premise of the argument for origin essentialism rather than as a direct
threat to the thesis of origin essentialism itself, just start from its
being possible for *a* to be the only table originally made from
*m* according to plan *p* and its being possible for
*b* to be the only table originally made from
*m _{n}* according to plan

*p*. In the case of

*a*, repeated applications of modal tolerance for origins together with the assumption that whatever is possibly possible is possible gets us to a possible world in which it is the only table originally made from

*m*according to plan

_{n/2}*p*. In the case of

*b*, repeated applications of modal tolerance for origins together with the assumption that whatever is possibly possible is possible gets us to a possible world in which

*it*is the only table originally made from

*m*according to plan

_{n/2}*p*. The sufficiency premise then incorrectly identifies

*a*and

*b*.)

Very broadly speaking, there are two general approaches to dissolving the modal paradox. One simply denies the transitivity of possibility. The other embraces the transitivity of possibility so that the modal paradox can be assimilated to standard sorites paradoxes and solved in whatever manner one solves those. Salmon (especially 1981, 1986, and 1989), following Chandler (1976), advocates the first approach while Forbes (especially 1983 and 1984) advocates the second. (This simple taxonomy becomes complicated by the fact that there are in the literature two ways to handle modal semantics: the standard way and the counterpart theoretic way. Each of the two general approaches can be modeled in each of these two ways. So logical space provides four potential solutions: deny transitivity in the standard style; deny transitivity in the counterpart style; assimilate to sorites paradoxes in the standard style; and assimilate to sorites paradoxes in the counterpart style. Salmon advocates the first while Forbes advocates the fourth. The second was advocated by Lewis (1986) while the third lacks an advocate.)

In order to explain the two approaches, it is useful to write the paradox out in the language of quantified modal logic.

[MP]: A Modal Paradox

(‘□’ is read ‘It is necessary that’ and
‘◊’ is read ‘It is possible that’. The
superscripted numerals indicate the number of times a given operator
is repeated. ‘*Mam _{1}*’ is read
‘

*a*is originally made from

*m*’ or ‘

_{1}*m*originally materially constitutes

_{1}*a*’.)

(MP-1) ◊*Mam _{1}*

(MP-2) □ (

*Mam*⊃ ◊

_{1}*Mam*)

_{2}(MP-3) □□ (

*Mam*⊃ ◊

_{2}*Mam*)

_{3}.

.

.

(MP-n) □

*(*

^{n-1}*Mam*⊃ ◊

_{n-1}*Mam*)

_{n}(MP-C1) ◊

^{n}Mam_{n}(MP-C2) ◊

*Mam*

_{n}(MP-

*n*+1) ~◊

*Mam*

_{n}
In order to understand how this version of the paradox relates to
the informal version presented earlier, one need only bear in mind
that, for example, a “2 stacked diamond” statement says
that there is a possibly possible world in which the relevant statement
is the case while a “2 stacked box” statement says that on
all possibly possible worlds the relevant statement is the case. And
similarly for other “stacked diamond” and “stacked
box” statements. (It may help one to see the relation between the
informal and formal versions of the paradox by noting that from (MP-1)
and (MP-2), an intermediate conclusion
‘◊◊*Mam**2*’ can be derived.
And from that intermediate conclusion, together with (MP-3), another
intermediate conclusion,
‘◊◊◊*Mam**3*’ can be
derived. And so on.)

On the first approach to solving [MP], the move from (MP-C1) to (MP-C2) is
illegitimate, since the relation of *being possible relative to*
is not transitive. The intuition supporting this line is fairly strong.
If there is a sharp division between what matter *a* could
and what matter *a* could not have originated from, then
wherever that dividing line may be, there would be some matter
*m _{k}* that is such that it is actually impossible that

*a*was originally made from it, but which is close enough to being a possible material origin for

*a*that had

*a*been originally made from some other matter

*m*, which in fact

_{j}*a*could have been, then

*it would have been possible*for

*a*to have originated from

*m*, even though

_{k}*it is not actually possible*. Thus it is an easy matter to argue from the existence of a sharp cutoff point to the denial of the transitivity of possibility. And even if there is no sharp line to be drawn, then supposing there is an interval of vagueness instead of a dividing line between what matter is and what matter is not a possible material origin for

*a*, there will still be some matter

*m*such that

_{k}*a*determinately could not have originated from

*m*

_{k}_{}while the claim that this is itself necessary is not determinately true. (And similarly for other proposals for dealing with vagueness, such as degree of truth approaches.)

The main problem for this approach is that it is accepted as
orthodoxy that the relation of *being possible relative to* is
transitive. That whatever is possibly possible is possible (or in other
words that whatever is necessary is necessarily necessary) is the
characteristic axiom schema of *S4* modal logic. The theorems of
*S4* are a subset of the theorems of *S5*. According to
*S5*, the relation of *being possible relative to* is an
equivalence relation (that is to say that it is reflexive, symmetric,
and transitive). And it is *S5* that is the generally accepted
system of logic for metaphysical modality. So solving the paradox in
accordance with the first approach requires a deviation from the
standard view about the logic of metaphysical modality.

The second approach to solving [MP] accepts the orthodox view that
the relation of *being possible relative to* is an equivalence relation,
and this allows [MP] to be recast as [MSP], which has the form of a
standard sorites paradox. When we say that [MP] can be recast as [MSP]
on the assumption that *being possible relative to* is an
equivalence relation, we mean that the like-numbered premises of each
argument are equivalent to one another on that assumption, which is to
say that they are equivalent in *S5*.

[MSP]: A Modal Sorites Paradox

(MSP-1) ◊*Mam _{1}*

(MSP-2) ◊

*Mam*⊃ ◊

_{1}*Mam*

_{2}(MSP-3) ◊

*Mam*⊃ ◊

_{2}*Mam*

_{3}.

.

.

(MSP-n) ◊

*Mam*⊃ ◊

_{n-1}*Mam*

_{n}(MSP-C) ◊

*Mam*

_{n}(MSP-

*n*+1) ~◊

*Mam*

_{n}
[MSP] has only one conclusion, (MSP-C) whereas [MP] has two, (MP-C1)
and (MP-C2), because in *S5*, (MP-C1) and (MP-C2) are
equivalent. [MSP] is straightforwardly a sorites paradox—one in
which the vague predicate is ‘◊*Ma*’ (that
is, ‘possibly originally constitutes *a*’).

The main problem for this approach—aside from the obvious fact
that there is no definitive solution to standard sorites
paradoxes—is that it requires the predicate ‘possibly
originally constitutes *a*’ to be vague. Any vagueness in
this predicate, it seems, would have to derive either from vagueness in
the accessibility relation (so that a world in which *a* was
made from, say *m _{10}*, is neither determinately
possible nor determinately impossible) or from vagueness in the
identity relation (so that the possible table originally constituted
from say

*m*is neither determinately identical to

_{10}*a*nor determinately distinct from

*a*). It is not clear whether either of these types of vagueness is ultimately plausible.

### 4. The Generality Problem

We have already mentioned in passing that Origin
Essentialism_{3} is less than originally hoped for, since it
leaves open possibilities—such as a table's being one of
two tables originally made from matter that does not overlap the
matter from which it was actually originally made—that are at
odds with the intuition of origin essentialism. Let us call this
problem, which was highlighted by Robertson (1998) and Hawthorne and
Gendler (2000), the *generality problem*.

Once order essentialism has been embraced as a solution to the recycling problem, it becomes natural to offer yet another version of the argument for origin essentialism—one that evades the generality problem.

#### Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 4

**Compossibility _{4}**. If a table

*x*is originally made from matter

*y*and it is possible for a table to be

*the n*originally made from matter

^{th}table*z*according to plan

*u*, then it is also possible for table

*x*to be originally made from matter

*y*and in addition some table or other

*x*′ to be

*the n*originally made from matter

^{th}table*z*according to plan

*u*.

**Origin Uniqueness**. It is impossible that a single
table *x* is originally made from matter *y* and
in addition is originally made from matter *z*.

**Sufficiency _{4}**. If it is possible that a table

*x*′ is

*the n*originally made from matter

^{th}table*z*according to plan

*u*, then necessarily any table that is

*the n*originally made from matter

^{th}table*z*according to plan

*u*is the very table

*x*′ and no other.

Therefore

**Origin Essentialism _{4}**. If a given table is
originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the
given table is not (

*the n*for any

^{th}table*n*) originally made from any non-overlapping matter according to any plan.

Unfortunately this version of the argument (as well as the previous
version) faces a problem that arises from the possibility of recycling
matter together with the intuition of modal tolerance for origins.
Consider a case that is very nearly a “Table of Theseus”
case. Suppose that there is a table, *e*, that is the first and
only table originally constructed according to plan *p* from
matter *n*′, which has all but a few molecules in common
with matter *n*. As time goes by, *e* undergoes various
repairs until finally it is constituted by matter that is wholly
distinct from matter *n*. (That's not a typo or a
“thinko”. We do mean *n* and not *n*′.)
Matter *n* is gathered together, and a table, *f*, is
the first and only table originally constructed from *n*
according to plan *p*. Clearly it is possible for *f* to
be the first and only table originally constructed from *n*
according to plan *p*, since that is just what *f* is in
the world described. Modal tolerance for origins suggests that it is
possible for *e* to be the first and only table originally
constructed from *n* according to plan *p*, since
*n* differs from the matter that actually originally
constituted *e* by only a few
molecules. Sufficiency_{4} (as well as
Sufficiency_{3}) incorrectly identifies *e* and
*f*.

This problem is not devastating, since there is an obvious line of response that results in the following argument.

#### Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 5

**Compossibility _{5}**. If a table

*x*is originally made from matter

*y*and it is possible for a table to be the

*n*table originally made from matter

^{th}*z*according to plan

*u while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z*, then it is also possible for table

*x*to be originally made from matter

*y*and in addition some table or other

*x*′ to be the

*n*table originally made from matter

^{th}*z*according to plan

*u*

*while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z*.

**Origin Uniqueness**. It is impossible that a single
table *x* is originally made from matter *y* and
in addition is originally made from matter *z*.

**Sufficiency _{5}**. If it is possible that a table

*x*′ is the

*n*

^{th}^{}table originally made from matter

*z*according to plan

*u*

*while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z*, then necessarily any table that is the

*n*table originally made from matter

^{th}*z*according to plan

*u*

*while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z*is the very table

*x*′ and no other.

Therefore

**Origin Essentialism _{5}** If a given table is
originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the
given table is not (the

*n*table for any

^{th}*n*) originally made from any non-overlapping matter

*z*according to any plan

*while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z.*

Although this argument is immune from the problem posed by the
possibility of recycling of matter together with modal tolerance for
origins, it faces the generality problem, since it leaves open
possibilities—such as a table's being originally made from
matter *z* that does not overlap the matter from which it was
actually originally made, provided that some other table is made from
matter that only partially overlaps *z*—that are at odds
with the intuition of origin essentialism.

Just as it is difficult to say just how serious a problem the recycling problem is, it is also difficult to say just how serious a problem the generality problem is. However the recycling problem and the generality problem make clear that origin essentialists should welcome a new route to origin essentialism—a route that does not demand the acceptance of order essentialism and that serves up a fairly general origin essentialist claim as its conclusion.

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