Supplement to Essential vs. Accidental Properties

Arguments for Origin Essentialism

Claims of origin essentialism have a great deal of intuitive plausibility, but not everyone shares the intuition, so it is fitting that a number of philosophers have tried to offer accounts of these claims.[1] Very broadly speaking, these accounts fall into two categories—those that suggest that such claims are grounded in a “branching conception of possible worlds” and those that suggest that such claims are grounded in “constitutional sufficiency principles”—both of which were mentioned by Kripke (1972/1980, pp. 112-114) when he endorsed the view that an object could not have had a radically different origin from the one it actually had.

Accounts of the first sort (offered by J. L. Mackie (1974) and P. Mackie (2006)) have aimed not so much to argue for origin essentialism as to explain why we find such claims attractive. It is in accounts of the second type (offered by Forbes (especially 1985 and 1986), McGinn (1976), Noonan (1983), and Salmon (especially 1979 and 1981), among others) that we find full-fledged arguments for origin essentialist claims. The most sustained defenses have come from Forbes and Salmon. Forbes has concentrated (though far from exclusively) on the claim that a given human being could not have originated from a different zygote (that is, the immediate product of a sperm cell's fertilizing an egg cell) than the one from which she actually originated, while Salmon has concentrated on the claim that a given artifact could not have been originally made from completely different material than that from which it was actually originally made. Their defenses, though quite different in some ways, are similar enough in certain important respects that discussion of just one of the arguments will serve to highlight the difficulties both face.

Before beginning the main discussion, there is a minor problem to finesse. The claim that every organism and artifact has its origin essentially is a universally quantified claim and not an existentially quantified one, so it does not by itself make an essentialist claim, on any of the characterizations of essentialism given in §3 of the main entry. Nonetheless, its essentialist import is clear, since it is hardly controversial that there are in fact organisms and artifacts. So, in an extended sense, the claim that every organism and artifact has its origin essentially counts as an essentialist claim.

1. The Argument(s) from Sufficiency

We first present Salmon's argument fairly formally and without explication.[2] Immediately afterward, we walk through the argument with explication. (So, if the argument makes little sense on first reading, hang on; it will make sense soon enough.) The phrase “x is originally made from y” is to be understood to mean that x is originally formed entirely from all of y, which is just to say that there is none of y that is not used to make x and no matter other than y is used to make x. Where ‘y’ and ‘z’ appear together in a premise, it is to be understood that y and z do not “overlap”, which is to say that they do not have any matter in common.

Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 1

Compossibility1. If a table x is originally made from matter y and it is possible for a table to be originally made from matter z, then it is also possible for table x to be originally made from matter y and in addition some table or other x′ to be originally made from matter z.

Origin Uniqueness. It is impossible that a single table x is originally made from matter y and in addition is originally made from matter z.

Sufficiency1. If it is possible that a table x′ is originally made from matter z, then necessarily any table originally made from matter z is the very table x′ and no other.

Therefore

Origin Essentialism1. If a given table is originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the given table is not originally made from any non-overlapping matter.

Consider a table, a, which was originally made from matter m. Consider too some matter m* that has no matter in common with m, but which could itself be made into a table. Here we have satisfied the antecedent of Compossibility1. What Compossibility1 says then is that it is possible for a to be originally made from m while in addition m* is itself made into a table. And this seems right: surely there is some possible world in which this happens. Origin Uniqueness says that in any such world, the two tables are distinct from one another. And that too seems right: surely no table has two completely different material origins in a single possible world. Now consider some particular possible world in which all this happens, and let ‘b’ name the table there that is originally made from m*. Sufficiency1 says that any possible table that is originally made from m* is b and not some other table. Since we have already established that a is distinct from b, this means that a could not have been made from m*. (Here the argument uses the necessity of identity/distinctness—the claim that (necessarily) if x and y are identical/distinct then necessarily x and y are identical/distinct.) Since there is nothing special about a, b, m, and m*, the general conclusion seems warranted on the basis of this reasoning, provided Sufficiency1 is true. It turns out that this particular sufficiency premise is not true, as Salmon himself points out. But perhaps—as Salmon believes—some modified version of the claim is true.

Since the argument gets a bit more complicated when it is modified, it is good to reflect now on the simple intuitive motivation that underlies it: “If a is F, then it could not instead have been G; for any G would have to be something else again. Here, ‘F’ and ‘G’ must be certain contrary predicates, for which the premise ‘If a is F, then any G would have to be something else’ is intuitively plausible” (Salmon 2005, Ap. VI, p. 374). In the particular case we are considering F is ‘is originally made from m’ and G is ‘is originally made from m*’. (Salmon speculates that this may be the canonical form of arguments for essentialism. So, for example, the number nine could not have been even, for any even number would have to be some number other than nine.)

Here is the problem with Sufficiency1 as it stands. Consider again the table a, which is originally made from matter m. The table a is a table of a particular kind—a pedestal table, as it turns out. Matter m could have been made into a different kind of table—a folding table, say. Intuitively that table would not have been the table a. But Sufficiency1 says it is. It is clear that the premise must be modified so that the plan according to which the table was made figures in. Here is the resulting argument.

Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 2

Compossibility2. If a table x is originally made from matter y and it is possible for a table to be originally made from matter z according to plan u, then it is also possible for table x to be originally made from matter y and in addition some table or other x′ to be originally made from matter z according to plan u.

Origin Uniqueness. It is impossible that a single table x is originally made from matter y and in addition is originally made from matter z.

Sufficiency2. If it is possible that a table x′ is originally made from matter z according to plan u, then necessarily any table originally made from matter z according to plan u is the very table x′ and no other.

Therefore

Origin Essentialism2. If a given table is originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the given table is not originally made from any non-overlapping matter according to any plan.

Since every table must be made according to some plan or other, Origin Essentialism2 is not substantively different from Origin Essentialism1.

Trouble is not over for the sufficiency premise. As Salmon again points out himself, the mere possibility of a Ship of Theseus type of case provides a counterexample. Suppose there is a table, c, that is originally made from matter n according to some plan p. As time goes by, c undergoes various repairs until finally it is constituted by matter that is wholly distinct from the matter from which it was originally constituted. At this point matter n is gathered together and made into a table, d, according to the same plan by which c was made. Sufficiency2 incorrectly identifies c and d.

Salmon responds by further weakening the sufficiency premise, giving us the following argument.

Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 3

Compossibility3. If a table x is originally made from matter y and it is possible for a table to be the only table originally made from matter z according to plan u, then it is also possible for table x to be originally made from matter y and in addition some table or other x′ to be the only table originally made from matter z according to plan u.

Origin Uniqueness. It is impossible that a single table x is originally made from matter y and in addition is originally made from matter z.

Sufficiency3. If it is possible that a table x′ is the only table originally made from matter z according to plan u, then necessarily any table that is the only table originally made from matter z according to plan u is the very table x′ and no other.

Therefore

Origin Essentialism3. If a given table is originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the given table is not the only table originally made from any non-overlapping matter according to any plan.

2. The Recycling Problem

This conclusion is less than originally hoped for, leaving open the possibility that a particular table is one of two tables made from matter that does not overlap the matter from which it was actually originally made. But, more importantly, even this sufficiency premise is not without problems. Consider again the tables c and d in the “Table of Theseus” case. It seems that c could have been the only table to have been originally made from n according to plan p: the world could have come to an end before d ever gets made. It also seems that instead d could have been the only table to have been originally made from n according to plan p: the person who made c could have given up her project before c was made and yet matter n might still have been gathered together years later to make d. Sufficiency3 incorrectly identifies c and d. This problem, pointed out by McKay (1986) and others, has come to be known as the recycling problem.

Salmon (2005, Ap. VI, p. 373) responds to this case by saying that although c could have existed without d, d could not have existed without c. Forbes (1997, p. 528) responds in a similar way when confronted with an analogous challenge to the sufficiency premise involved in his argument for origin essentialism. He explicitly embraces the essentiality of order according to which it is essential to c to be the first table made from n according to p and essential to d to be the second table so made.

The fact that the advocate of this general line of argumentation for the essentiality of origin can defend against the recycling problem by adopting the essentiality of order (or less robustly, just the claim that d could not have existed without c) should not lead one to underestimate the significance of the recycling problem. If the best defense against it is to adopt a brand of essentialism that has less support from intuition than origin essentialism itself already enjoyed, then the argument for origin essentialism seems to offer little more support for the claim than the intuition did in the first place.

3. The Tolerance Problem

There is another challenge that these kinds of arguments face. It is in fact a challenge that threatens not only the arguments (in particular, the sufficiency premise) but also the conclusions themselves. It arises from the intuition that even if an object could not have had a completely different origin from the one it actually had, it could have had a slightly different origin. Kripke's original formulations of origin essentialism reflect this intuition of modal tolerance for origins: he says that the wooden table in the room in which he spoke could not have been made from a “completely different block of wood”; similarly, he says that Queen Elizabeth could not have originated from a “totally different sperm and egg” (1972/1980, p. 113, our changes of emphasis). Salmon's argument, as we have seen, has a similarly modest conclusion. And Forbes too has been concerned to allow for some degree of modal tolerance when it comes to an object's origin. But, since little differences add up to big differences, the threat of paradox looms large.

Recall the table a that was originally made from matter m. Let n be the number of molecules in m. Let m, m1, m2, … mn be a sequence of different (hunks of) matter, each differing from its immediate predecessor only by one molecule of the same type, so that m and m2 have all but two molecules in common and m and mn have no molecules whatsoever in common. Since a was originally made from m, modal tolerance for origins tells us that a could have been manufactured from m1. In other words, there is a possible world in which a was originally made from m1. This is just to say that there is a world that is possible relative to (or, in other terminology, accessible from) the actual world in which a was originally made from m1. Let w1 be a particular possible world—one as like the actual world as is compatible with the difference specified—in which a was originally made from m1. If modal tolerance for origins is true, it is natural to think that it holds in w1 as well as in the actual world. This is because, intuitively, modal tolerance for origins is not a claim that simply happens to be true at the actual world, but is something more like a conceptual truth. So there is a world, possible relative to w1, in which a was originally made from m2. In still other words, there is a world, which is possible relative to a world that is itself possible relative to the actual world, in which a was originally made from m2. Let w2 be a particular possibly possible world—one as like w1 and the actual world as is compatible with the difference specified—in which a was originally made from m2. If modal tolerance for origins is true, then it is natural to think that it holds at w2 as well. We can continue on in this way until we reach a world, wn, which is possible relative to wn-1, in which a was originally made from mn. If the relation of being possible relative to is transitive, that is, if whatever is possibly possible is also possible, then wn is possible relative to the actual world, which is just to say that a could have been originally made from mn. But mn has no matter at all in common with the matter from which a was originally made, and so according to origin essentialism a could not have been originally made from mn.

(To see modal tolerance as a direct threat to the sufficiency premise of the argument for origin essentialism rather than as a direct threat to the thesis of origin essentialism itself, just start from its being possible for a to be the only table originally made from m according to plan p and its being possible for b to be the only table originally made from mn according to plan p. In the case of a, repeated applications of modal tolerance for origins together with the assumption that whatever is possibly possible is possible gets us to a possible world in which it is the only table originally made from mn/2 according to plan p. In the case of b, repeated applications of modal tolerance for origins together with the assumption that whatever is possibly possible is possible gets us to a possible world in which it is the only table originally made from mn/2 according to plan p. The sufficiency premise then incorrectly identifies a and b.)

Very broadly speaking, there are two general approaches to dissolving the modal paradox. One simply denies the transitivity of possibility. The other embraces the transitivity of possibility so that the modal paradox can be assimilated to standard sorites paradoxes and solved in whatever manner one solves those. Salmon (especially 1981, 1986, and 1989), following Chandler (1976), advocates the first approach while Forbes (especially 1983 and 1984) advocates the second. (This simple taxonomy becomes complicated by the fact that there are in the literature two ways to handle modal semantics: the standard way and the counterpart theoretic way. Each of the two general approaches can be modeled in each of these two ways. So logical space provides four potential solutions: deny transitivity in the standard style; deny transitivity in the counterpart style; assimilate to sorites paradoxes in the standard style; and assimilate to sorites paradoxes in the counterpart style. Salmon advocates the first while Forbes advocates the fourth. The second was advocated by Lewis (1986) while the third lacks an advocate.)

In order to explain the two approaches, it is useful to write the paradox out in the language of quantified modal logic.

[MP]: A Modal Paradox

(‘□’ is read ‘It is necessary that’ and ‘◊’ is read ‘It is possible that’. The superscripted numerals indicate the number of times a given operator is repeated. ‘Mam1’ is read ‘a is originally made from m1’ or ‘m1 originally materially constitutes a’.)

(MP-1) ◊Mam1
(MP-2) □ (Mam1 ⊃ ◊Mam2)
(MP-3) □□ (Mam2 ⊃ ◊Mam3)
.
.
.
(MP-n) □n-1 (Mamn-1 ⊃ ◊Mamn)
(MP-C1) ◊n Mamn
(MP-C2) ◊Mamn
(MP-n+1) ~◊Mamn

In order to understand how this version of the paradox relates to the informal version presented earlier, one need only bear in mind that, for example, a “2 stacked diamond” statement says that there is a possibly possible world in which the relevant statement is the case while a “2 stacked box” statement says that on all possibly possible worlds the relevant statement is the case. And similarly for other “stacked diamond” and “stacked box” statements. (It may help one to see the relation between the informal and formal versions of the paradox by noting that from (MP-1) and (MP-2), an intermediate conclusion ‘◊◊Mam2’ can be derived. And from that intermediate conclusion, together with (MP-3), another intermediate conclusion, ‘◊◊◊Mam3’ can be derived. And so on.)

On the first approach to solving [MP], the move from (MP-C1) to (MP-C2) is illegitimate, since the relation of being possible relative to is not transitive. The intuition supporting this line is fairly strong. If there is a sharp division between what matter a could and what matter a could not have originated from, then wherever that dividing line may be, there would be some matter mk that is such that it is actually impossible that a was originally made from it, but which is close enough to being a possible material origin for a that had a been originally made from some other matter mj, which in fact a could have been, then it would have been possible for a to have originated from mk, even though it is not actually possible. Thus it is an easy matter to argue from the existence of a sharp cutoff point to the denial of the transitivity of possibility. And even if there is no sharp line to be drawn, then supposing there is an interval of vagueness instead of a dividing line between what matter is and what matter is not a possible material origin for a, there will still be some matter mk such that a determinately could not have originated from mk while the claim that this is itself necessary is not determinately true. (And similarly for other proposals for dealing with vagueness, such as degree of truth approaches.)

The main problem for this approach is that it is accepted as orthodoxy that the relation of being possible relative to is transitive. That whatever is possibly possible is possible (or in other words that whatever is necessary is necessarily necessary) is the characteristic axiom schema of S4 modal logic. The theorems of S4 are a subset of the theorems of S5. According to S5, the relation of being possible relative to is an equivalence relation (that is to say that it is reflexive, symmetric, and transitive). And it is S5 that is the generally accepted system of logic for metaphysical modality. So solving the paradox in accordance with the first approach requires a deviation from the standard view about the logic of metaphysical modality.

The second approach to solving [MP] accepts the orthodox view that the relation of being possible relative to is an equivalence relation, and this allows [MP] to be recast as [MSP], which has the form of a standard sorites paradox. When we say that [MP] can be recast as [MSP] on the assumption that being possible relative to is an equivalence relation, we mean that the like-numbered premises of each argument are equivalent to one another on that assumption, which is to say that they are equivalent in S5.

[MSP]: A Modal Sorites Paradox

(MSP-1) ◊Mam1
(MSP-2) ◊Mam1 ⊃ ◊Mam2
(MSP-3) ◊Mam2 ⊃ ◊Mam3
.
.
.
(MSP-n) ◊Mamn-1 ⊃ ◊Mamn
(MSP-C) ◊Mamn
(MSP-n+1) ~◊Mamn

[MSP] has only one conclusion, (MSP-C) whereas [MP] has two, (MP-C1) and (MP-C2), because in S5, (MP-C1) and (MP-C2) are equivalent. [MSP] is straightforwardly a sorites paradox—one in which the vague predicate is ‘◊Ma’ (that is, ‘possibly originally constitutes a’).

The main problem for this approach—aside from the obvious fact that there is no definitive solution to standard sorites paradoxes—is that it requires the predicate ‘possibly originally constitutes a’ to be vague. Any vagueness in this predicate, it seems, would have to derive either from vagueness in the accessibility relation (so that a world in which a was made from, say m10, is neither determinately possible nor determinately impossible) or from vagueness in the identity relation (so that the possible table originally constituted from say m10 is neither determinately identical to a nor determinately distinct from a). It is not clear whether either of these types of vagueness is ultimately plausible.

4. The Generality Problem

We have already mentioned in passing that Origin Essentialism3 is less than originally hoped for, since it leaves open possibilities—such as a table's being one of two tables originally made from matter that does not overlap the matter from which it was actually originally made—that are at odds with the intuition of origin essentialism. Let us call this problem, which was highlighted by Robertson (1998) and Hawthorne and Gendler (2000), the generality problem.

Once order essentialism has been embraced as a solution to the recycling problem, it becomes natural to offer yet another version of the argument for origin essentialism—one that evades the generality problem.

Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 4

Compossibility4. If a table x is originally made from matter y and it is possible for a table to be the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u, then it is also possible for table x to be originally made from matter y and in addition some table or other x′ to be the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u.

Origin Uniqueness. It is impossible that a single table x is originally made from matter y and in addition is originally made from matter z.

Sufficiency4. If it is possible that a table x′ is the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u, then necessarily any table that is the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u is the very table x′ and no other.

Therefore

Origin Essentialism4. If a given table is originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the given table is not (the nth table for any n) originally made from any non-overlapping matter according to any plan.

Unfortunately this version of the argument (as well as the previous version) faces a problem that arises from the possibility of recycling matter together with the intuition of modal tolerance for origins. Consider a case that is very nearly a “Table of Theseus” case. Suppose that there is a table, e, that is the first and only table originally constructed according to plan p from matter n′, which has all but a few molecules in common with matter n. As time goes by, e undergoes various repairs until finally it is constituted by matter that is wholly distinct from matter n. (That's not a typo or a “thinko”. We do mean n and not n′.) Matter n is gathered together, and a table, f, is the first and only table originally constructed from n according to plan p. Clearly it is possible for f to be the first and only table originally constructed from n according to plan p, since that is just what f is in the world described. Modal tolerance for origins suggests that it is possible for e to be the first and only table originally constructed from n according to plan p, since n differs from the matter that actually originally constituted e by only a few molecules. Sufficiency4 (as well as Sufficiency3) incorrectly identifies e and f.

This problem is not devastating, since there is an obvious line of response that results in the following argument.

Sufficiency Argument for Origin Essentialism, Version 5

Compossibility5. If a table x is originally made from matter y and it is possible for a table to be the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z, then it is also possible for table x to be originally made from matter y and in addition some table or other x′ to be the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z.

Origin Uniqueness. It is impossible that a single table x is originally made from matter y and in addition is originally made from matter z.

Sufficiency5. If it is possible that a table x′ is the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z, then necessarily any table that is the nth table originally made from matter z according to plan u while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z is the very table x′ and no other.

Therefore

Origin Essentialism5 If a given table is originally made from certain matter, then it is necessary that the given table is not (the nth table for any n) originally made from any non-overlapping matter z according to any plan while no table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z.

Although this argument is immune from the problem posed by the possibility of recycling of matter together with modal tolerance for origins, it faces the generality problem, since it leaves open possibilities—such as a table's being originally made from matter z that does not overlap the matter from which it was actually originally made, provided that some other table is made from matter that only partially overlaps z—that are at odds with the intuition of origin essentialism.

Just as it is difficult to say just how serious a problem the recycling problem is, it is also difficult to say just how serious a problem the generality problem is. However the recycling problem and the generality problem make clear that origin essentialists should welcome a new route to origin essentialism—a route that does not demand the acceptance of order essentialism and that serves up a fairly general origin essentialist claim as its conclusion.

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Copyright © 2013 by
Teresa Robertson <trobertson@philosophy.ucsb.edu>
Philip Atkins <philipatkins@umail.ucsb.edu>

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