Essential vs. Accidental Properties

First published Tue Apr 29, 2008; substantive revision Mon Oct 21, 2013

The distinction between essential versus accidental properties has been characterized in various ways, but it is currently most commonly understood in modal terms: an essential property of an object is a property that it must have while an accidental property of an object is one that it happens to have but that it could lack. Let's call this the basic modal characterization where a modal characterization of a notion is one that explains the notion in terms of necessity/possibility. In the characterization just given of the distinction between essential and accidental properties, the use of the word “must” reflects the fact that necessity is invoked, while the use of the word “could” reflects that possibility is invoked. The notions of necessity and possibility are interdefinable: to say that something is necessary is to say that its negation is not possible; to say that something is possible is to say that its negation is not necessary; to say that an object must have a certain property is to say that it could not lack it; and to say that an object could have a certain property is to say that it is not the case that it must lack it.

Many would say that each individual human could not fail to be human; if so, then the basic modal characterization counts the property of being human as an essential property of each human. And, too, many would say that although someone, say X, is in fact fond of dogs, X could have lacked that property; if that is right, then the basic modal characterization counts the property of being fond of dogs as an accidental property of X.

A modal characterization of the distinction between essential and accidental properties is taken for granted in nearly all work in analytic metaphysics since the 1950s. Advocates of the modal characterization have included Ruth Barcan Marcus (1967) and Saul Kripke (1980), among others. However, some other characterizations of the distinction (see §2) have recently gained currency. It is worth stressing here at the outset that although there is now some disagreement about just how the distinction between essential and accidental properties is to be properly drawn, there is nevertheless some agreement about cases. Most would agree that however the distinction is drawn, it should come out that being human (or being human if existent) is an essential property of X while being fond of dogs is a merely accidental property of X.

Essentialism in general may be characterized as the doctrine that (at least some) objects have (at least some) essential properties. This characterization is not universally accepted (see §3), but no characterization is; and at least this one has the virtue of being simple and straightforward. As for specific essentialist claims, we have already encountered one—the claim that the property of being human is essential to X. Another example is the claim that X's biological origin—X's parents, or more particularly, the sperm and egg from which X arose—is essential to X. The first example is a brand of sortal essentialism while the second is a brand of origin essentialism. Both of these kinds of essentialisms have figured prominently in the philosophical literature.

1. The Modal Characterization of the Essential/Accidental Property Distinction

According to the basic modal characterization of the distinction between essential and accidental properties, which is the characterization given at the outset,

P is an essential property of an object o just in case it is necessary that o has P, whereas P is an accidental property of an object o just in case o has P but it is possible that o lacks P.

Putting this into the language of possible worlds that philosophers often adopt,

P is an essential property of an object o just in case o has P in all possible worlds, whereas P is an accidental property of an object o just in case o has P but there is a possible world in which o lacks P.

Although the basic idea behind the modal characterization is clear enough from these statements, a moment's reflection reveals a little bit of trouble. Many properties (some philosophers would say all properties) are such that in order for an object to possess them, that object must exist. According to the basic modal characterization, any such property, if possessed by a contingently existing object, will be counted as an accidental property of that object. But this seems wrong. Consider the property of being a dog. It is plausible (and for present purposes we assume it is true) that an object must exist in order to possess this property. Now consider a particular dog named ‘Emma’, who in fact exists but who might not have existed. There is a possible world in which Emma does not exist. And in this world (given our assumption) Emma is not a dog, since Emma does not exist there. So, according to the basic modal characterization, being a dog is an accidental property of Emma. But however we characterize the distinction between essential and accidental properties, the characterization should not by itself rule out the intuitively compelling claim that Emma is essentially a dog. So the basic modal characterization seems flawed.

In response to this point, it is tempting to turn to a variant of the basic modal characterization, the existence-conditioned modal characterization, according to which

P is an essential property of an object o just in case it is necessary that o has P if o exists, whereas P is an accidental property of an object o just in case o has P but it is possible that o lacks P and yet exists.

But this formulation too is less than satisfactory. A widely noted problem for this way of drawing the distinction is that it makes existence into an essential property of each object, since no object could lack existence and yet exist. Thus this characterization of the essential/accidental property distinction effectively rules out a theist's claim that only God has existence as an essential property. But a good characterization of the distinction should not rule on a substantive matter in this way.

Arguably neither of these problems is devastating. Those who favor the basic characterization can say that typically when someone claims, for example, that Emma is essentially a dog, what is really meant is not that Emma has essentially the property of being a dog, but instead that Emma has essentially the property of being a dog if existent. Existence will be treated specially on this approach: the claim that an object has existence as an essential property will not be taken as the claim that the object has as an essential property the property of being existent if existent; instead the claim will be taken at face value. Those who favor the existence-conditioned characterization can say that when someone says that only God has existence as an essential property, what is really meant is that only God has existence as a necessary property, where a necessary property of an object is a property that the object possesses in all possible worlds. (According to the basic modal characterization, an essential property is the same as a necessary property.) Both approaches may be faulted for making a special case of the property of existence. But that is not perhaps such a great fault, given that existence does seem to be a special case and that it is treated specially in other areas of philosophy as well. (It is perhaps worth pointing out that according to many philosophers—Kant, Russell, and Frege to name three—existence is not a property at all. If this is right, then existence is indeed a very special case.) In what follows, we shall not be concerned with the details arising from the need for some sort of existence condition—either in the statement of the definition of an essential property (as on the existence-conditioned modal characterization) or in the properties that are taken to be essential (as on the basic modal characterization). There are other ways of explaining the distinction between essential and accidental properties of objects in modal terms (see Zalta (2006), for example), but what we have called the basic modal characterization and the existence-conditioned modal characterization are the standard ways. Together, usually indiscriminately, these amount to what we call the modal characterization.

The central notion involved in any modal characterization of the distinction between essential and accidental properties is that of metaphysical necessity/possibility. But, since there are a number of notions that correspond to the many ways that we use the words ‘necessity’ and ‘possibility’, it is helpful to contrast the relevant notion of necessity/possibility with some other notions with which it might be confused.

If one claims that something is possible, it's sometimes natural to take this to mean that one doesn't know it to be false. For example, suppose that you ask someone whether Socrates ever went to Sparta and she answers that it's possible. It's natural to understand her as saying that she doesn't know that Socrates did not go to Sparta. Thus the possibility that is expressed here is a kind of epistemic possibility (in particular, one according to which p is epistemically possible for an agent X just in case not-p is not known by X). This notion of epistemic possibility is clearly distinct from the notion of metaphysical possibility, since there are cases of epistemic possibilities that are not metaphysical possibilities. Of Goldbach's Conjecture (that every even number greater than two is the sum of two primes) and its denial, each is epistemically possible but one (we know not which) is not metaphysically possible. And there are cases of metaphysical possibilities that are not epistemic possibilities. That there are only two planets in our solar system is metaphysically possible but not epistemically possible for most of us, given that most of us know that there are not only two planets in our solar system. (This is not to deny that there are some notions of epistemic possibility—for example, maximally complete ways the universe can coherently be conceived to be—for which it is at least plausible to suppose that every metaphysical possibility is also an epistemic possibility. Even if this is so, the notions of metaphysical possibility and epistemic possibility are distinct.)

In addition to various notions of epistemic possibility, philosophers have been concerned with three particular notions of possibility that are generally regarded as non-epistemic: logical possibility, metaphysical possibility, and physical possibility. On one common view, the physical possibilities are a subset of the metaphysical possibilities, which in turn are a subset of the logical possibilities. (But see Fine (2002) for an opposing view.) Here are a couple of examples of things that are logically possible but neither metaphysically nor physically possible: the Eiffel Tower's being red all over and green all over at the same time; the Eiffel Tower's being red but not extended. (The distinction between logical and metaphysical possibility is sometimes talked about as the distinction between narrowly logical possibility and broadly logical possibility. That there is genuinely a distinction here is attested to by the fact that typical mathematical claims—such as Goldbach's Conjecture that every even number greater than two is the sum of two primes, that there are infinitely many primes, that two plus two is four, and so on—are metaphysically but not logically necessary, if they are true at all. Similarly, typical philosophical claims—such as that personal identity consists in a certain kind of continuity of consciousness, that torturing innocent people is wrong, and so on—are metaphysically but not logically necessary, if they are true at all.) Here is an example of something that is logically and metaphysically possible but not physically possible: the Eiffel Tower's traveling faster than the speed of light. The Eiffel Tower's being both red and not red at the same time is possible in none of the senses while its traveling faster than a speeding bullet is possible in all of them.

To supplement these examples, it would be nice to give characterizations of the three notions that are free from controversy. That is easier said than done. Nonetheless, we offer some characterizations that are relatively uncontroversial. Metaphysical possibility is often taken as a primitive notion that figures into the idea of a physical possibility: a proposition is physically possible if and only if it is metaphysically compossible with the laws of physics. (Other nomological possibilities, such as chemical or biological possibility, can be understood similarly.) Assuming that the notion of a logical truth is understood, then the logical necessities are simply the logical truths, so that the logical possibilities are those things whose negations are not logical truths.

We end this overview of the modal characterization of the essential/accidental property distinction by mentioning a notion that is close to but different from that of an essential property. It is easy to confuse the notion of an essential property—a property that a thing that could not lack—with the notion of a property that a thing could not lose, so it is worth taking a minute to reflect on the difference. Of course, any property that a person could not lack is one that that person could not lose, since by losing a property the person comes to lack it. Still, the “reverse” does not hold. There are properties that a person could not lose—like the property of having spent Christmas 2007 in Tennessee—that are nevertheless not essential to that person.

2. Two Other Ways of Characterizing the Essential/Accidental Property Distinction

The modal characterization of an essential property of an object as a property that an object must have fits well with (at least one aspect of) our everyday understanding of the notion of essentiality, which often seems simply to be the notion of necessity. To say that something is essential for something else is typically just to say that the first is necessary for the second. But however well this account accords with (this aspect of) our everyday understanding of essentiality, it has some consequences that may be surprising: this characterization classifies a property such as being such that there are infinitely many primes—or perhaps being such that there are infinitely many primes if (the object in question is) existent—as essential to Socrates (as well as to all other things), since he (like all other things) must have this property, given that it is necessary that there are infinitely many primes; so too, it classifies the property of being the sole member of the unit set {2} as essential to the number 2, given that it is necessary that 2 is the sole member of the unit set {2}.

Some philosophers, most prominently Kit Fine (1994), have found these results disturbing: Fine thinks that the notion of an essential property of a thing should be bound up with the notion of what it is to be that thing, but, Fine thinks, being such that there are infinitely many primes intuitively has nothing to do with what it is to be Socrates. And although it seems that having the number 2 as its sole member is part of what it is to be the unit set {2}, it does not seem that being this unit set's sole member is part of what it is to be the number 2. With these observations in mind, Fine offers a definitional characterization of essential properties. According to this characterization, the essential properties of an object are those of its properties that are part of the object's “definition”. What exactly is a “definition” of an object? This is a difficult question. At first sight, it seems to be a category mistake: it is words and perhaps concepts—but not objects—that have definitions. Even so, it must be admitted that some objects—such as the number 2 and the unit set {2}—do seem to be definable: it is plausible to think that the number 2 is defined as being the successor of the number 1; and it is plausible to think that the unit set {2} is defined as being the set whose sole member is the number 2. But other objects—such as Socrates—do not seem to admit so readily of definition. So even if the notion is understood well enough for some objects (never mind that not everyone would allow that the number 2, for example, is an object), a major challenge for the advocate of the definitional characterization is to provide a respectable general understanding of the notion of a definition for an object.

Another way of characterizing the notion of an essential property of an object agrees with the definitional characterization that the modal characterization is too liberal in what it counts as an essential property of an object, but it avoids appeal to the notion of a definition of an object. On the explanatory characterization, the essential properties of an object are the object's deepest explanatory properties—those properties that figure fundamentally into explanations of the object's possessing the other properties it does. (For example, having six protons might count as an essential property of a carbon atom because this property figures fundamentally into explanations of its possession of other properties, like its bonding characteristics.) This sort of account threatens to make the essential/accidental property distinction subjective, since what counts as explanatorily primary seems to depend on the interests and abilities of the explainers. Acknowledging this point, some advocates of the explanatory characterization, such as Copi (1954) and Gorman (2005), hold that there is a more “metaphysical” and less “epistemic” understanding of the notion of explanation, according to which one thing explains another thing just in case there is a certain mind-independent relation that holds between them. Just as the advocate of the definitional characterization is challenged to provide a respectable understanding of the relevant notion of definition, the advocate of the explanatory characterization is challenged to provide (or to borrow from the philosophy of science) a respectable understanding of the relevant notion of explanation.

The distinction between accidental and essential properties is, at least on the most basic version of each account, both exclusive and exhaustive. (On some more refined versions of these accounts, the distinction remains exclusive, but not exhaustive. Exhaustiveness is lost when certain properties—like the property of being such that there are infinitely many primes—are not counted as properties to which the essential/accidental distinction applies. See the discussion of Della Rocca (1996a) in §3.) In addition, it seems that the root of each of the characterizations goes back at least to the work of Aristotle. (For the modal characterization, see Topics 102b5ff; for the definitional, see Metaphysics 1031a12; and for the explanatory, see Posterior Analytics 74b5ff. For more on the notion of essence in Aristotle's work, see the entry on Aristotle's Metaphysics.) It is not clear whether these three characterizations should properly be thought of as competing characterizations of a single notion or instead as ways of trying to capture three related, but different, and equally legitimate, notions. Since the modal characterization has been the most common in the last fifty years, the modal characterization will dominate the concerns of this entry.

3. Four Ways of Characterizing Essentialism

There are at least four fairly standard ways of characterizing essentialism, and by considering two extreme views, we can easily see the differences among these four characterizations. According to the first extreme view—one that it is natural to call maximal essentialism

all of any given object's properties are essential to it.

According the other extreme view—one that it is natural to call minimal essentialism

there are virtually no limits to the ways in which any given object might have been different from the way that it actually is, so that the only essential properties of an object are what we might think of as its trivial essential properties—properties like being either F or non-F (for any property F) and being self-identical.

Should so-called minimal essentialism really count as a form of essentialism? And should so-called maximal essentialism really count as a form of essentialism? There are four positions in logical space with respect to these questions: yes and yes; yes and no; no and yes; and no and no. Each of these positions is occupied by some reasonably prominent characterization of essentialism. (Note that the phrase “any given object” is used to convey existential commitment — that is, the presupposition that there are objects. Without this commitment, neither “minimal essentialism” nor “maximal essentialism” will count as a form of essentialism, given that essentialism, as it was characterized at the outset, implies that some objects do have essential properties.)

The first position—according to which both “minimal essentialism” and “maximal essentialism” count as genuine forms of essentialism—is occupied by the characterization of essentialism that was offered at the outset:

the doctrine that (at least some) objects have (at least some) essential properties.

We are inclined to think that this simple and straightforward characterization is the most common understanding of essentialism, although it is rarely explicitly stated. (Mackie (2006, p. 1) provides an example of someone who does explicitly use this characterization.)

The second position—according to which “minimal essentialism” but not “maximal essentialism” counts as a genuine form of essentialism—is occupied by the characterization that Quine (1953b/1976, pp. 175–6) very famously offered:

the doctrine that some of the attributes of a thing (quite independently of the language in which the thing is referred to, if at all) may be essential to the thing, and others accidental.

In more formal terms, essentialism, Quine (1953b/1976, p. 176) says, is the doctrine that there are true sentences of this form: ∃x(□Fx & Gx & ~□Gx) (where ‘□’ may be read as ‘it is necessary that’). According to “maximal essentialism” any given object has only essential properties. It has no accidental ones. That means that according to “maximal essentialism”, there will be no properties to “go in for” the ‘G’ in Quine's sentence schema; and so, “maximal essentialism” is no form of essentialism at all on Quine's characterization.

The third position—according to which “maximal essentialism” but not “minimal essentialism” counts as a form of essentialism—is occupied by the characterization of essentialism as

the view that (at least some) objects have (at least some) non-trivial necessary properties.

Della Rocca (1996a) thinks of essentialism in this way, and so counts “maximal essentialism” but not “minimal essentialism” as a form of essentialism. (It is natural to suppose that Della Rocca thinks that essential properties are non-trivial necessary properties, so that he can say things like, “Essentialism is the view that some objects have some essential properties.” If that is what Della Rocca thinks, then on his view, the essential/accidental distinction would not be exhaustive, since trivial necessary properties, like being such that there are infinitely many primes, would be neither accidental nor essential.)

The fourth position—according to which neither “minimal essentialism” nor “maximal essentialism” counts as a form of essentialism—is occupied by the characterization of essentialism as

the view that the accidental/essential property distinction is robust in the sense that (at least some) objects have (at least some) non-trivial essential properties and (at least some) objects have (at least some) accidental properties.

Yablo (1998) has this characterization in mind, and so he characterizes both “minimal essentialism” and “maximal essentialism” as forms of anti-essentialism.

In the remainder of this entry, essentialism will be understood in the first of the four ways—so maximal essentialism and minimal essentialism will both be viewed as forms of essentialism.

4. Some Varieties of Essentialism

A variety of particular forms of essentialism have been advocated. Starting at one extreme, there is maximal essentialism. Although Leibniz famously held this view, it nearly goes without saying that this view has had relatively few adherents. According to a less extreme and correspondingly more popular form of essentialism, origin essentialism, an object could not have had a radically different origin than it in fact had. The view that a particular table could not have been originally made from completely different material than the material from which it was actually originally made and the view that a person could not have originated from a different sperm and egg than those from which he or she actually originated are both forms of origin essentialism. Origin essentialism has been defended by Kripke (1980) Salmon (1981), and Forbes (1985), among others. According to another moderate form of essentialism, sortal essentialism, an object could not have been of a radically different kind—at least for certain kinds—than it in fact is. Both the view that being human (or being human if existent) is an essential property of person X and the view that X could not have been a credit card account are forms of sortal essentialism. The mildest form of essentialism is minimal essentialism. Mackie (2006) offers a sustained defense of roughly this view.

In addition to these sorts of claims about the essential properties of ordinary individuals, claims about the essential properties of natural kinds have figured prominently in the literature, since Kripke (1972/1980) and Putnam (1975) made essentialist claims concerning, for example, cats and water. The core intuitions are that in any possible world anything that is not an animal is not a cat and that in any possible world anything that is not composed of molecules of H20 is not water. Since we discovered empirically that cats are animals (and not, for example, robots) and that water is H20 (and not some other type of molecule), each of these claims asserts a necessary a posteriori connection between two properties. In the first case, what is asserted is that it is necessary that anything that is a cat is an animal. In the second case, what is asserted is that necessarily anything that is (a sample of) water is composed of molecules of H20. It is natural to construe these claims on the model of the essentialist claims we have so far considered: it is essential to a particular object, namely the species cat, to be such that all of its instances are also instances of the kind animal; it is essential to a particular object, namely the kind water, to be such that all samples of it are composed of molecules of H20. Notice that one may hold that cats are essentially animals in the sense that there is a necessary a posteriori connection between the property of being a cat and the property of being an animal, without holding that any particular cat is essentially an animal. In other words, from the fact that it is necessary that every individual that is a cat is an animal, it does not follow that every individual that is in fact a cat is such that necessarily it is an animal. In still other words, this type of essentialism about natural kinds does not entail sortal essentialism. (It is perhaps worth mentioning that similar remarks apply to the case of a necessary a priori connection between properties. It is a necessary a priori truth that all mathematicians are rational. Following our model, we can say that it is essential to the kind mathematician to be such that all of its instances are also instances of the kind rational (thing). It does not follow that Andrew Wiles, who is in fact a mathematician, could not fail to be rational—in which case he would also fail to be a mathematician. To give an even more perspicuous example, it is a necessary a priori truth that all bachelors are unmarried. It does not follow that Michael, who is in fact a bachelor, could not be married.)

Philosophers have thought not only about whether an object has this or that particular property essentially but also about whether an object has a special kind of essential property, an individual essence, a property that in addition to being essential to the object is also unique to it in the sense that it is not possible that something distinct from that object possesses that property. The claim that there are substantive examples of individual essences has had few defenders. Leibniz was one, and he thought that such essences could be given by purely qualitative properties. Forbes (1985) is another, but he disagrees with Leibniz that an individual essence can be given by a purely qualitative property. The haecceity or thisness of an object, the property of being (identical to) that very object, provides a trivial example of an individual essence for each object.

5. Suspicions about Essentialism

In §3, we passed over without comment the parenthetical phrase from Quine's characterization of essentialism. Adding that phrase to the first view of essentialism from §3 yields:

essentialism is the doctrine that (at least some) objects have independently of how they are referred to (at least some) essential properties.

The added phrase stresses that the essentialist thinks that it at least makes sense to ask of an object (“in itself”) whether it must have a particular property. Skeptics about essentialism have doubted the very intelligibility of such a question. Here is one prominent thought behind such anti-essentialism. (See Quine 1960, pp. 195-200.) Since it is necessary that seven plus two is greater than seven, when the number nine is referred to as ‘seven plus two’ it is essentially greater than seven. But, since it is not necessary that the number of planets is greater than seven, when the number nine is referred to as ‘the number of planets’ it is not essentially greater than seven. The point is supposed to be that it makes no sense to say of the number nine, independently of any way of referring to it, that it is or is not essentially greater than seven. Similarly, an anti-essentialist might say that when a person who is both a mathematician and a cyclist is thought of as a mathematician, being rational is essential to him, while being two-legged is not; but when the very same person is thought of as a cyclist, then although being two-legged is essential to him, being rational is not. Again, the point is supposed to be that it makes no sense to say of the very person who is the mathematical cyclist, independently of any way of thinking about him, that he is or is not essentially rational (or two-legged). According to the anti-essentialist, asking whether Andrew Wiles (who we may suppose is a cycling mathematician) could fail to be rational is like asking whether Andrew Wiles is taller than—both questions demand another relatum. Could he fail to be rational, relative to what way of referring to him? Is he taller than whom?

In response the essentialist will point out that the anti-essentialist's thought does not square very well with intuition. Consider the object that is referred to by all these phrases: ‘nine’, ‘seven plus two’, ‘the number of planets’. Could that very object have failed to be greater than seven? Intuitively the question seems intelligible, and the answer seems to be that it could not have failed to be greater than seven. According to intuition then, the very object that is referred to by ‘the number of planets’ (which is the very same object that is referred to by ‘seven plus two’ and ‘nine’) is essentially greater than seven. Intuition also has it that the claim that the number of planets is greater than seven is not itself necessary. To add some jargon: Intuition has it that the claim that it is necessary that the number of planets is greater than seven is true read de re (“of the thing”), but false read de dicto (“of the dictum” or “of the statement”). (The de re reading is this: the number of planets has the property of being necessarily greater than seven. The de dicto reading is this: the claim that the number of planets is greater than seven has the property of being necessary.) The essentialist is pointing out that the anti-essentialist's argument asserts that the latter intuition undermines the former, but does not say why.

6. The Epistemology of Essentialist Claims

Assuming that we have knowledge of some essentialist claims, how might we account for that knowledge? For the purposes of the present discussion, let us assume that we know that being such that there are infinitely many primes, being human, and originating from sperm s and egg e are essential properties of Socrates. The first example is different from the last two in that it seems that we can know a priori that being such that there are infinitely many primes is essential to Socrates whereas it seems that we can know only a posteriori that being human and originating from s and e are also essential to him.

While it is a vexed philosophical issue just how to account for a priori knowledge of necessary truths such as logical truths, mathematical truths, and the homelier necessary truths like the truth that nothing can be red all over and green all over at the same time, accounting for our knowledge of the necessary truth that Socrates is such that there are infinitely many primes, does not seem to be problematic in some extra special way. If we had a good account of our a priori knowledge of the necessary truth that there are infinitely many primes, then it would take little more to account for our knowledge of the necessary truth about Socrates that he is such that there are infinitely many primes.

Kripke (1972/1980) suggests that our knowledge of some other essentialist claims is based in part on a bit of a priori knowledge and in part on a bit of empirical knowledge. For example, our knowledge that originating from s and e is essential to Socrates is based in part on our a priori knowledge that every organism has its origin essentially and in part on our empirical knowledge that Socrates (is an organism that) originated from s and e. (Similarly our knowledge that Socrates is essentially human appears to be based in part on our a priori knowledge that everything has its kind essentially and in part on our empirical knowledge that Socrates is (of the kind) human.) Thus our knowledge of the claim that originating from s and e is essential to Socrates should be no more problematic epistemologically than our knowledge of the two claims on which it is based and our knowledge of the validity of the argument from those two claims. As we have already mentioned, although there are difficult philosophical issues concerning our knowledge of logical truths, our knowledge of the validity of the argument in question does not seem to add any special problems of its own. Similarly, although there are philosophical issues concerning empirical knowledge, our knowledge that Socrates originated from s and e does not appear to add any special problems. However our a priori knowledge that every organism has its origin essentially does seem to have special problems over and above the problems associated with accounting for our a priori knowledge of logic, mathematics, and the homelier necessary truths. The latter claims are generally supported by universally held intuitions or by arguments that are universally accepted whereas the former, like most philosophical claims, is supported by a less robust intuition and by a more controversial argument. To see in some detail how philosophers have gone about defending origin essentialism, see the

Supplement on Arguments for Origin Essentialism.

For more about arguments for sortal essentialism, see Wiggins (1980) and Mackie (2006, chapters 7 and 8). The entry on the epistemology of modality is useful on general issues in modal epistemology.

7. Essentialist Claims in Arguments for Nonidentities

Leibniz's Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, according to which, if “two” things are identical, then they share all their properties, can be used to argue for various claims of nonidentity. If you know, for example, that Charles is a philosophy major and that Yoko is not, then you can safely infer that Charles is not identical to Yoko. Essentialist claims have played a role in some prominent Leibniz Law arguments for nonidentity theses. A certain brand of mind-body dualism may be argued for in the following way: X is essentially a thinking thing; X's body is not essentially a thinking thing; so X is not (identical to) X's body. A similar argument can be given for the conclusion that a statue is not identical with the lump of material (wax, clay, marble, or what have you) that constitutes it. Consider a human-shaped statue—call it ‘Goliath’—and the lump of wax that composes it—call it ‘Lump1’. Goliath, we may imagine, is throughout its entire existence composed of Lump1 while Lump1 throughout its entire existence composes Goliath. In this case, Goliath and Lump1 are spatiotemporally colocated, which is just to say that they occupy the exact same spatial region at any given time whenever either of them exists. This being the case, they share most of their properties: Goliath weighs 17 kilograms and so does Lump1; Goliath has a white surface and so does Lump1; and so on. In fact, it may seem curious that we are writing as though there are two things at all. Why not say simply that Goliath and Lump1 are identical? Well, it at least seems that a pretty straightforward argument—one that relies on essentialist claims—establishes their nonidentity:

  1. Goliath is essentially human-shaped.
  2. Lump1 is not essentially human-shaped.
  3. So, Goliath is not identical to Lump1.

The plausibility of the two premises seems undeniable, given that we think, for example, that if the room containing Goliath/Lump1 were to get really hot (hot enough to melt the wax) and then to cool again (so that what was left was a lump of wax in the shape of something like a mountain), then Goliath would be destroyed while Lump1 would still exist. And the reasoning looks impeccable: if Goliath were Lump1, then each would have to have all of the same properties as “the other”; since they have different properties, they must not be identical. (Few things in philosophy are as uncontroversial as Leibniz's Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, though there has been some dispute about the proper way of formulating it.) Figuring out how to reconcile our intuitions that (1) and (2) are true with our tendency to think that Goliath and Lump1 are not really two things but just one is a version of the problem of material constitution. There are a wide variety of ways to deal with this problem. A “two-thinger”—one who thinks that there really are two things, a statue and a lump of wax, in one location— may simply eschew the tendency to identify Goliath and Lump1. Other responses suggest that there is something amiss with Leibniz Law arguments for nonidentities when there is this kind of an appeal to essential properties: Della Rocca (1996c) holds that such arguments are question begging; Lewis (1971) holds that they are invalid; and Burke (1994) and Rea (2000) hold that in any such argument, at least one of the premises is false. For those who are interested, Rea (1997) is a good place to start to delve more deeply into this problem.

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