The Ethics of Belief

First published Mon Jun 14, 2010

The “ethics of belief” refers to a cluster of questions at the intersection of epistemology, philosophy of mind, psychology, and ethics.

The central question in the debate is whether there are norms of some sort governing our habits of belief-formation, belief-maintenance, and belief-relinquishment. Is it ever or always morally wrong (or epistemically irrational, or imprudent) to hold a belief on insufficient evidence? Is it ever or always morally right (or epistemically rational, or prudent) to believe on the basis of sufficient evidence, or to withhold belief in the perceived absence of it? Is it ever or always obligatory to seek out all available epistemic evidence for a belief? Are there some ways of obtaining evidence that are themselves immoral or imprudent?

Related questions have to do with the structure of the norms involved, if any, as well as the source of their authority. Are they instrumental norms grounded in contingent ends that we set for ourselves? Are they categorical norms grounded in ends set for us by the very nature of our intellectual faculties? Are there other options? And what are the objects of evaluation in this context—believers, beliefs, or both?

Finally, assuming that there are norms of some sort governing belief-formation, what does that imply about the nature of belief? Does it imply that belief-formation is voluntary or under our control? If so, what sort of control is this? If not, then how is an ethics of belief even possible?

1. The Ethics of Belief: A brief history

1.1 Origins of the debate

The locus classicus for the ethics of belief debate is, unsurprisingly, the essay that christened it. “The Ethics of Belief” was published in 1877 by Cambridge mathematician and philosopher William Kingdon Clifford, in a journal called Contemporary Review. At the outset of the essay, Clifford defends the stringent principle that we are always obliged to have sufficient evidence for every one of our beliefs. Indeed, the early sections of “The Ethics of Belief” are so stern that William James would later characterize Clifford as a “delicious enfant terrible” who defends doxastic self-control “with somewhat too much of robustious pathos in the voice” (1896, 8). James's more permissive view—initially a commentary on Clifford presented to the Philosophy Clubs of Yale and Brown, then published as “The Will to Believe” in 1896—has become a kind of companion piece, and together the two essays constitute the touchstone for subsequent discussion.

Clifford's essay is chiefly remembered for two things: a story and a principle. The story is that of a shipowner who, once upon a time, was inclined to sell tickets for a transatlantic voyage. It struck him that his ship was rickety, and that its soundness might be in question. Knowing that repairs would be costly and cause significant delay, the shipowner managed to push these worries aside and form the “sincere and comfortable conviction that his vessel was thoroughly safe and seaworthy.” He sold the tickets, bade the passengers farewell, and then quietly collected the insurance money “when she went down in mid-ocean and told no tales” (1877, 70).

According to Clifford (who himself once survived a shipwreck, and so must have found this behavior particularly loathsome), the owner in the story was “verily guilty of the death of those men,” because even though he sincerely believed that the ship was sound, “he had no right to believe on such evidence as was before him.” Why did he have no such right? Because, says Clifford, “he had acquired his belief not by honestly earning it in patient investigation, but by stifling his doubts” (1877, 70). After making this diagnosis, Clifford changes the end of the story: the ship doesn't meet a liquid demise, but rather arrives safe and sound into New York harbor. Does the new outcome relieve the shipowner of blame for his belief? “Not one jot,” Clifford declares: he is equally guilty—equally blameworthy – for believing something on insufficient evidence.

Clifford goes on to cite our intuitive indictments of the shipowner—in both versions of the story—as grounds for his famous principle:

(Clifford's Principle) “It is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything on insufficient evidence.”

Despite the synchronic character of this Principle, Clifford's view is not merely that we must be in a certain state at the precise time at which we form a belief. Rather, the obligation always and only to believe on sufficient evidence governs our activities across time as well. With respect to most if not all of the propositions we consider as candidates for belief, says Clifford, we are obliged to go out and gather evidence, remain open to new evidence, and consider the evidence offered by others. If someone violates this diachronic obligation by “purposely avoiding the reading of books and the company of men who call in question” his presuppositions, Clifford warns, then “the life of that man is one long sin against mankind” (1877, 77). The diachronic obligation here is captured by one commentator as the following:

(Clifford's Other Principle) “It is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to ignore evidence that is relevant to his beliefs, or to dismiss relevant evidence in a facile way.” (Van Inwagen 1996, 145)

It is not clear that Clifford's considered position is really as extreme as these principles make it sound. In the later part of his essay Clifford puts forward a view about what it is for evidence to be “sufficient” that suggests a much more moderate stance. Still, the story about the shipowner together with the sternly-worded Principle turned Clifford into the iconic representative of a strict “Evidentialist” position in the ethics of belief—the position, roughly, that we are obliged to form beliefs always and only on the basis of sufficient evidence that is in our possession. (For more on the notion of “evidence” and the varieties of Evidentialism, see §4-§5 below).

James's Non-Evidentialist alternative to Clifford is far more permissive: it says that there are some contexts in which it is permitted to form a belief even though we don't have sufficient evidence for it, and even though we know that we don't. Indeed, James and many of his “pragmatist” followers claim that sometimes we are obliged to form beliefs on insufficient evidence, and that it would be a significant intellectual, prudential or even moral failure to do otherwise. “Our passional nature not only lawfully may, but must, decide an option between propositions, whenever it is a genuine option that cannot by its nature be decided on intellectual grounds” (1896, 11).

As permissive as this sounds, however, James is by no means writing a blank doxastic check. In “The Will to Believe” he lays out a series of strict conditions under which an “option” counts as “genuine” and believing without sufficient evidence is permissible or required. For instance, the option must be between “live” hypotheses—i.e. hypotheses that are “among the mind's possibilities” (thus, belief in the ancient Greek gods is not a live option for us these days). There must also be no compelling evidence one way or the other, the option must be “forced” such that doing nothing is also in effect to make a choice, and the option must concern a “momentous” issue. In the absence of those conditions, James reverts happily to a broadly Evidentialist picture (see Gale 1980, 1999 and Kasser and Shah 2006). (For more on the varieties of Non-Evidentialism, see §6 below).

1.2 The ethics of belief before the 19th-century

The phrase may be of 19th-century coinage, but there were obviously ethics of belief well before Clifford and James. Descartes says in the Meditations that when forming a judgment, “it is clear by the natural light that perception of the intellect should always precede (praecedere semper debere) the determination of the will” (1641, 7:60). In the context of a search for certain knowledge (scientia), Descartes maintains, we have the obligation to withhold assent from all propositions whose truth we do not clearly and distinctly perceive (clear and distinct perceptions themselves, by contrast, will produce belief ineluctably). In other contexts, it may be both permissible and prudent to form a mere “opinion” (opinio) whose truth we do not clearly and distinctly perceive. Even then, however, we are obliged to have some sort of evidence before giving our assent. Thus Descartes advises Elizabeth that “though we cannot have certain demonstrations of everything, still we must take sides, and in matters of custom embrace the opinions that seem the most probable, so that we may never be irresolute when we need to act” (1645, 4:295, my emphasis).

Locke's ethics of belief is at least as strict: in the search for scientific knowledge as well as in all matters of “maximal concernment,” Locke says, it is to “transgress against our own light” either to believe on insufficient evidence, or to fail to proportion our degree of belief to the strength of the evidence. In his discussion of “Faith” in the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Locke famously moralizes:

He that believes without having any Reason for believing, may be in love with his own Fancies; but neither seeks Truth as he ought, nor pays the Obedience due to his Maker, who would have him use those discerning Faculties he has given him, to keep him out of Mistake and Errour. (1690, 687)

To form a belief about important matters without possessing sufficient evidence—or to believe anything with a degree of firmness that is not proportioned to the strength of our evidence—is to misuse our faculties and court all manner of error. It is also, for Locke, to contravene the will of our “Maker.” Given his divine command theory of ethical rightness, it thus appears that such behavior will be morally as well as epistemically peccable.

2. Doxastic Norms

2.1 Kinds of norms: prudential, moral, epistemic

This last point makes it clear that there may be different types of norms governing practices of belief-formation, and that these will correspond to different types of value. A careful ethicist of belief will have to say which type, if any, she means to be advocating, and whether one type has priority over the others.

Clifford and Locke, as we have seen, claim that the issue of whether we have done our doxastic best is an epistemic one and also (given a few further premises) a moral one. James, on the other hand, focuses on the important role played by prudential value in the ethics of belief, saying in one passage that Clifford's Principle not only puts us at “risk of losing the truth” and thus of violating an epistemic norm, but that it articulates an “insane logic”—an “absurdity” that guarantees prudential disaster (1896, 25). The general idea here is that if something is beneficial, and believing that p will help us achieve, acquire, or actualize that thing, then it is prima facie prudent for us to believe that p. This will be true even if we lack sufficient evidence for the belief that p, and even if we are aware of that lack.

A common sort of example involves someone who has read in the psychological literature that people are much more likely to survive a certain cancer if they firmly believe that they will survive it. Upon being diagnosed with the disease himself, and in light of the fact that his goal is to survive, it will be prudent for this person to believe that he will survive, even if he knows that he (and his doctors) lack sufficient evidence for that belief. James refers to such cases as ones “where faith in a fact can help create the fact” (1896, 25).

It would be worth considering in this connection whether the patient's knowledge that his “faith helps create the fact” itself counts as a kind of evidence in its favor; if so, then perhaps the case is not in tension with Clifford's Principle after all. But other cases can be used to make the same point: Pascal famously argues that it is required by prudential rationality that we believe in God, even though we lack sufficient evidence for that belief, and even though such belief clearly plays no role in “creating” the fact that it describes.

For a non-theological sort of case: suppose that you would like to retain a good relationship with your daughter, and you are aware that this requires believing the best of her whenever possible. You have some moderate but not compelling evidence for the proposition that she is using drugs in the house when you are away (in response to your queries, she claims that she has recently taken up meditation, and that the funny smell when you come home is just incense). Still, if your relationship will be seriously damaged by coming to view your daughter as a habitual drug-user, then you seem to violate a prudential norm if you believe that she is. In other words, it is prudent, given your ends, to withhold belief about the source of the aroma altogether, or to believe, if possible, that she is burning incense in your absence.

On the other hand, if you regard the occasional use of recreational drugs as harmless fun that expresses a healthy contempt for authority, then it might be prudent for you—confronted with the telltale odor—to form the belief that your daughter has indeed taken up the habit in question. Either way, the recommendation here aims at a kind of prudential or pragmatic value, and not at the truth per se. (For some recent arguments in favor of prudential evidence for belief, see Reisner 2008 and 2009; for arguments against, see Adler 2002 and Shah 2006).

2.2 Structures of norms: hypothetical vs. categorical

In addition to being sorted according to the type of value involved, doxastic obligations can be sorted according to their structure. The main distinction here is between hypothetical and categorical structure.

Prudential norms are usually taken to have a hypothetical structure: if you have prudential reason to survive the disease, and believing that you are going to do so will help you achieve this end, then other things being equal you should believe that you are going to survive. Likewise, if you want to protect your relationship with your daughter, and believing that she is deceiving you and taking drugs will damage your ability to trust her, then you are prima facie obliged to withhold that belief.

Put more generally: if it is rational for you to have a prudential end E, and the belief that p is likely to make E obtain, then you have a prima facie obligation to believe that p. The obligation will be particularly powerful (though still prima facie) if E cannot be achieved other than through belief that p, and if you are (or should be) aware of that fact. (For more on hypothetical norms generally, see Broome 1999 and Schroeder 2005)

The structure of moral and epistemic norms can also be construed hypothetically in this way. The ends in question will presumably be doing the morally right thing or promoting the moral good, on the one hand, and acquiring significant knowledge or minimizing significant false belief, on the other (see Foley 1987). However, because these ends are putatively set for us not by a contingent act of will but rather essentially—by our nature as morally engaged, knowledge-seeking beings—many philosophers will regard them as categorical rather than instrumental imperatives. In other words, these norms say not merely that if we want to achieve various hypothetical ends, then we have the prima facie obligation to believe in such-and-such ways. Rather, they say simply that we do have these ends as a matter of categorical necessity, and thus that we prima facie ought to believe in such-and-such ways.

Note, however, that the most general prudential end—something like surviving, say—may be thought to have an equal claim to the title of a “necessary” end: it is set for us by our nature as living members of a species that has evolved through natural selection. And so by the same logic it might be taken to underwrite a categorical—albeit still prudential—norm of belief, especially in life-or-death cases such as that of the cancer diagnosis above.

2.3 Degrees of reflective access

So far the norms involved in the ethics of belief have been characterized here without attention to reflective access requirements, or the conditions of such access. In order to see how such requirements might play a role, consider the following prudential norm:

(A) If S has end E, and S's believing that p is likely to make E obtain, then S has a prima facie prudential obligation to believe that p.

This is a purely objective or ‘unreflective’ account of the prudential obligation in question: it is simply concerned with whether the subject in fact has a certain end and whether in fact the belief that p is likely to lead to the accomplishment of that end. If (A) were the right way to articulate obligations in the ethics of belief, then we would have far more prima facie obligations to believe than we typically think.

Reflective or ‘subjective’ components can be added to norms in order to make the results less demanding:

(B) If S knows that she has an end E, and S knows that believing that p is likely to make E obtain, then S has a prima facie prudential obligation to believe that p.

(B) is towards the top of the scale in terms of reflective access. As a sufficient condition for having a doxastic obligation, it may be acceptable, but most ethicists of belief will not want to make the reflective knowledge in the antecedent required for there to be genuine obligations.

Intermediate positions would replace “knows” in one or both parts of the antecedent of (B) with something weaker: “is in a position to know,” “justifiably believes,” “is justified in believing,” and so forth. An ethicist of belief who wants to include some such reflective access condition in a doxastic norm would of course need to do so in a way that doesn't generate a regress.

Note that the norms we are considering govern the positive formation of belief. An account of the plausible conditions of reflective access may be somewhat different for norms of maintaining, withholding, or relinquishing belief.

2.4 Relations between doxastic norms

The three types of value considered above—prudential, moral, and epistemic—may not be the only types that generate doxastic obligations. Perhaps there are aesthetic norms that guide us to beliefs that have some sort of aesthetic merit, or that make us more beautiful in virtue of believing them. Perhaps there are also social-political norms that govern beliefs we form in our various communal roles (as lawyers, priests, psychiatrists, friends, parents, etc. (regarding the doxastic obligations of friends, see Keller 2004 and Stroud 2006)). It's an interesting and open question whether the latter could be cashed out in terms of epistemic, moral, and prudential norms (e.g. being someone's lawyer or being someone's friend underwrites certain moral or prudential norms of belief regarding his or her innocence). In any case, the three types of norms considered above are the ones most frequently discussed under the rubric of the “ethics of belief.”

Norms, and types of norms, can be related in different ways. On the interpretation of Clifford presented above, there is an entailment relation between the epistemic and the moral types: in other words, the fact that there is an epistemic norm to believe always and only on sufficient evidence entails that there is an analogous moral norm. The reasoning here seems to be as follows:

(P1) We have an epistemic obligation to possess sufficient evidence for all of our beliefs;

(P2) We have a moral obligation to uphold our epistemic obligations;

(C) Thus, we have a moral obligation to possess sufficient evidence for all of our beliefs.

This formulation keeps the types of norms distinct while still forging a strong link between them in the form of (P2). Of course, defending (P2) is more difficult than defending (P1). In some places, Clifford seems simply to presume that epistemic duty is a species of ethical duty. That would make sense of why he thinks it just obvious that the shipowner is “equally guilty”—regardless of whether the ship sinks.

Elsewhere Clifford defends (P2) by reference to our need to rely on the testimony of others in order to avoid significant harm and advance scientific progress. No belief is without effect, he claims, and believing on insufficient evidence even with respect to something apparently insignificant is likely to lead to the lowering of epistemic standards in other more important situations.

Elsewhere still Clifford seems not to recognize a distinction between epistemic and moral obligations at all (see Van Inwagen 1996, Haack 1997, Wood 2002, and Zamulinski 2002 for further discussion of Clifford).

It was noted earlier that one way to read Locke is as arguing for (P2) via the independent theoretical premise that God's will for us is that we follow Evidentialist norms, together with a divine command theory of moral rightness (see Wolterstorff 1996). But Locke can also be read as primarily interested in defending (P1) rather than (P2) or (C) (see Brandt Bolton 2009).

A virtue-theoretic approach, by contrast, might defend (P2) by claiming not that a particular unjustified belief causes moral harm, but rather that regularly ignoring our epistemic obligations is a bad intellectual habit, and that having a bad intellectual character is a way of having a bad moral character (Zagzebski 1996; Roberts and Wood 2007).

In addition to using theoretical arguments like these, ethicists of belief sometimes connect norms or types of norms by appeal to explicitly empirical data. If we discover through investigation that being morally good is on the whole prudentially advisable, then the moral norm to follow our evidence will (other things being equal) underwrite a prudential norm to do the same. Similarly, if we discover that following moral norms of belief reliably leads to the acquisition of knowledge, then there will be an empirical route from moral norms to epistemic norms. And if we discover that adhering to epistemic norms promotes the moral good, then there will be an empirical argument from the epistemic to the moral (this would effectively be an empirical argument in support of (P2) above).

Finally, norms and types of norms can be in outright tension. The prudential norm recommending belief that your daughter is not smoking pot when you're gone conflicts with the epistemic norm to follow your olfactory evidence. Likewise, the moral norm to believe the best of others is all too often in tension with the epistemic norm to believe what the evidence supports, with the prudential norm to believe whatever it takes in order to get ahead, and so on.

Tension or conflict can also obtain between doxastic obligations of a diachronic sort. The epistemic norm to gather as much evidence as possible may conflict with the prudential norm to believe in such a way as to save time and effort (example: the fastidious boss who never hires anyone until he has investigated a candidate's entire past, called every reference, and confirmed every qualification). It may also conflict with the moral norm not to believe on the basis of evidence gathered in an immoral fashion (example: the doctor who gathers evidence about human diseases by performing inhumane experiments on prisoners).

Some ethicists of belief claim that there is a way of ordering norms or types of norms in terms of the relative strength or relative ease with which their claims on us can be defeated, and thus that in a given situation there will be a determinate answer about what one ought to believe “all things considered.” Others argue that at least some of the norms are incommensurable, and thus that in many cases there will simply be no answer to the question of what it is right to believe all things considered (Feldman 2000). Still others think that one category of norm collapses into another and that this can give us an all things considered conclusion (for discussion of whether epistemic rationality collapses into prudential rationality, for example, see Kelly 2003)

In sum: a full-blown ethics of belief will say something about the inferential relations between types of norms, about the temporal range of each type of norm, and about what to do when norms conflict. (See Broome 1999 and Kolodny 2005)

3. Belief, its Aims, and Our Control Over It

3.1 The nature of belief

Questions about what belief is and how it is formed have thus far played a marginal role in the ethics of belief debate. There sees to be widespread agreement among analytic philosophers that belief is (roughly) a dispositional affirmative attitude towards a proposition (or state of affairs). To believe that p is to take it to be true that p—to take it that the state of affairs described by the sentence “p” obtains. Note that this doesn't mean that the subject explicitly believes that p is true, however, since the latter is a different and higher order belief (mere belief that p, for instance, doesn't require possession of the concept of “truth” whereas the belief that p is true does). It is also widely agreed that the majority of our beliefs are not occurrent at any given time, and that belief comes in degrees of strength, confidence, or firmness.

After this, however, agreement breaks down. Representationalists regard beliefs as structures in the mind that represent the propositions they affirm—usually in something like a mental language (see Fodor 1975). Behavioralist-dispositionalists regard beliefs as dispositions to act in certain ways in certain circumstances (see Braithwaite 1932–1933). Eliminativists regard talk of “beliefs” as designating convenient fictions that we ascribe to people in folk psychology (see Churchland 1981 and the entry on eliminative materialism). Primitivists think of beliefs as basic mental states which do not admit of analysis. And so on. This disagreement about the nature of belief has (thus far at least) not been taken to impinge on the ethics of belief debate in significant ways. Of course, eliminativists and behavioralists will hold that doxastic norms—if there are any—apply at bottom to non-doxastic states. Still, modulo those kinds of changes, these and other ontological analyses of belief seem consistent with many different accounts of its ethics.

3.2 The aim(s) of belief

By contrast, theories about the aim or goal of belief typically have an immediate and substantive impact on conceptions of its ethics, and can be used, in particular, to answer questions about the relative importance of various norms, whether there are “all things considered” obligations in a given situation, and so on(see Velleman 2000, Wedgwood 2002, and Shah 2003 for general discussion).

Some philosophers and psychologists argue that simply acquiring significant truth while avoiding significant falsehood is the sole aim of belief, and thus that any doxastic obligations will be structured accordingly (see David 2001). Others argue that there are important aims in addition to, or even in lieu of, the aim of truth-acquisition—aims that can underwrite other doxastic norms (Velleman 2000, Sosa 2000, 2003). A common candidate here, of course, is knowledge itself (see Williamson 2002, Pritchard 2007 and the entry on the value of knowledge), but some authors claim that justification (Adler 2002) and/or “virtue” in our beliefs is the aim (Zagzebski 2004), while still others plump for a more structurally complex aim such as “understanding” (Kvanvig 2004). As mentioned earlier, in cognitive science and evolutionary biology circles, it is often assumed that the aim of belief (as well as of almost every other process) is something like “survival.” There are ongoing disagreements, however, about the extent to which that aim is necessarily or even contingently connected to the aim of truth-acquisition (Stich 1990; Plantinga 2002).

A very different kind of candidate for the aim of belief would be something like pleasure broadly-speaking, or perhaps “feeling at home in the world.” If this is the relevant aim, then the norms it underwrites may at times lead us away from truth. For example: suppose Smith is the sort of fellow who feels great pleasure when he believes that everyone he knows thinks highly of him, and pleasure is an aim that underwrites a doxastic norm. Then Smith has a prima facie obligation to believe that his friend Jones thinks the world of him.

This is one of the places where debates about psychological strategies such as self-deception, “bad faith,” wish-fulfillment, “irony,” and the like become germane in the ethics of belief (see Wisdo 1991, Wisdo 1993, Mele 2001). If the aims of belief can plausibly be regarded as wide enough to include truth-neutral states such as pleasure or “feeling at home in the world,” and if these aims can underwrite genuine norms, then Evidentialism clearly delivers a far-too-narrow characterization of its ethics.

Just as our conception of the aim of belief influences our conception of the doxastic norms, so does it affect the extent to which parallels can be drawn between the ethics of belief and the ethics of action generally. If one adopts “value monism” in the ethics of belief, and specifies that single value as truth, then one's position will bear a strong resemblance to monistic consequentialist theories in the ethics of action (DePaul 2001). A remaining difference between these, however, is that a belief's success at achieving its aim is typically evaluated by epistemologists all at once in the moment it is formed, whereas in the case of an action, subsequent consequences are relevant to the evaluation of its moral rightness, and many of these consequences won't be known (if at all) until much later. That said, it is easy to conceive of a diachronic ethics of belief according to which significant truth-acquisition is the sole aim of belief, but one evaluates particular beliefs not just on whether they are true but also on their ability to enable or produce the subsequent acquisition of other (significant) true beliefs.

On a theory according to which the aim of belief is complex, however, then parallels to the ethics of action become more complicated. An ethicist of belief who holds that significant truth acquired in the right way is the aim of belief, and analyzes the “rightness” of a belief-forming practice in terms of its ability to lead to truth, may find that the relevant parallel is to rule-consequentialism instead. By contrast, the view that the aim of belief is simply to believe in the right way, regardless of whether that “right way” reliably leads to signficant truth, looks like the analogue of a deontological position in ethics that valorizes the intentional following of right principles rather than the achievement of some aim external to the act itself. Whether or not these parallels are illuminating, and whether a view in the ethics of belief constrains options in the ethics of actions, is still largely an open question (see Kornblith 1983).

There are many other variations here. It seems possible to defend the view, for instance, that we ought only to believe on sufficient evidence—as the Evidentialists teach—but that our conception of the aims of belief might provide further and more determinate necessary conditions for permissible belief.

Finally, it may be possible to defend the view that belief by its nature has no specific aim, but is rather a state that can constitute or lead to any number of different, external goods. If that is right, then we obviously cannot look to the aim of belief to underwrite an account of its ethics.

3.3 Belief-control

A third foundational issue related to the nature of belief has to do with whether or not belief-formation is in some way voluntary or under the control of the will. This issue, too, has an affect on the ethics of belief. Many philosophers and psychologists have concluded that belief is an involuntary disposition formed in response to perceived evidence. But if a behavior isn't ‘up to us’ in any important sense, then it is hard to see how we could be responsible for performing it (see Alston 1987 for an influential argument along these lines).

In response to this “doxastic involuntarist” challenge , some philosophers argue that we do have direct control over at least some of our beliefs (Ginet 2001, Weatherson 2008); others develop a kind of hybrid view that allows certain kinds of belief-formation to count as free and ‘up to us,’ even if they are also caused in us (see Steup 2000; Ryan 2004), while still others focus on the fact that we can be praised and blamed for beliefs (as well as actions) that are not under our control (Adams 1985, Hieronymi 2006, Southwood and Chuard 2009). Yet another response, compatible with these others, is to develop accounts of indirect ways in which belief-formation counts as voluntary and thus susceptible to normative evaluation (e.g., Pascal 1670, Feldman 2000, Yee 2002, Leon 2002, Audi 2001, 2008b). Other philosophers take the doxastic involuntarist challenge to motivate a new focus on positive propositional attitudes that are by definition voluntary – “acceptances,” for instance (see Cohen 1992, Bratman 1992, Engel 2000, Audi 2008a, and §7 below). Finally, some ethicists of belief seek to argue that there are some obligations on direct belief-formation while also absorbing the putative empirical datum that much of it is not under the control of the will (see Feldman and Conee 1985; Feldman 2000; Adler 2005, Hieronymi 2006 and 2008).

4. Evidentialism: an overview

4.1 Strict vs. moderate

Evidentialism of some sort is far and away the dominant ethic of belief among early modern and contemporary philosophers alike. The central principle, as mentioned earlier, is that one ought only to base one's beliefs on relevant evidence (i.e. evidence that bears on the truth of the proposition) that is in one's possession. Many Evidentialists (Locke, Hume, and Clifford, for example) add the condition that the amount of evidence in one's possession must be proportioned to one's degree of belief, and that one should only firmly believe on the basis of “sufficient” evidence (where “sufficient” involves the evidence being strong enough for the belief to count as knowledge if true). Some also add one of the reflective access conditions mentioned above: for instance, that we ought to know (or being a position to know, or justifiably believe, or be justified in believing) that we have evidence for the original belief or even that the amount of evidence we have is sufficient.

Once a principle along these lines has been chosen, the relative strictness of a given Evidentialist position will be a function of how many exceptions it allows. The strictest sort of Evidentialist—Clifford, at least on standard readings—says that the principle holds “always, everywhere, and for anyone” (though note, again, that Clifford himself qualifies this later in his essay). There are problems with such a strict position, including the threat of the infinite regress that arises if the strict Evidentialist also requires that we believe that we have sufficient evidence for all of our beliefs.

In contrast, Moderate Evidentialists take their principles to be exceptionable; thus they allow that there are some circumstances in which subjects are rationally permitted to form beliefs in the absence of sufficient evidence. They might hold that the Cliffordian view applies, say, to the beliefs formed by a military pilot about the location of a legitimate bombing target in the midst of a residential area, or the beliefs formed by a government health official regarding the efficacy of a pharmaceutical trial, at least insofar as these beliefs lead to morally or prudentially significant actions. But at the same time they might think it permissible to abandon these strict standards in ordinary contexts where not much is at stake—for instance, the everyday belief that there is still some milk in the fridge. If the number of exceptions is very large, then the position ends up looking more like one of the Non-Evidentialist positions described below. As a result, the boundary between a very moderate Evidentialism and full-blown Non-Evidentialism can be quite blurry.

As difficult as it is to defend strict or thoroughgoing Evidentialism, it is even harder to defend the view that Evidentialism is inappropriate in every domain. The cases of the pilot and the health official are ones in which the subject's beliefs (largely as a result of the actions to which they lead) simply must, we think, meet some very high standards of evidence. Accordingly, at least some sort of moderate, restricted Evidentialism seems overwhelmingly plausible.

We have seen that the distinction between strict Evidentialism and moderate Evidentialism is quite sharp. Perhaps the best place to make a distinction between moderate Evidentialism and full-blown Non-Evidentialism is over whether a subject can be not only permitted but also obliged to form a belief on insufficient evidence (or, depending on the reflective access conditions, on what she takes to be insufficient evidence) in certain situations. An ethicist of belief who affirms this, it seems reasonable to say, has thereby abandoned even the most moderate form of Evidentialism and moved into the Non-Evidentialist camp (see §6 below).

4.2 Synchronic vs. diachronic

It was noted earlier that doxastic norms can be either synchronic or diachronic. Clifford's Principle itself is articulated as a synchronic norm, but in the later portions of the “Ethics of Belief,” he is more concerned to articulate diachronic principles regarding evidence-collection and evidence-assessment. It is from these portions of his discussion that we get “Clifford's Other Principle.”

Many early ethicists of belief modeled their accounts on deontological ethical theories that tend to formulate principles synchronically. Recently, however, virtue epistemologists have emphasized what they take to be the diachronic character of our fundamental doxastic obligations, and suggest that synchronic principles requiring sufficient evidence for a belief at a time are plausibly viewed as underwritten by more fundamental diachronic principles enjoining the cultivation of virtuous intellectual character (Zagzebski 1996, Roberts and Wood 2007, Sosa 2007, Audi 2008b).

4.3 Evidence and its possession

Crucial to any theory in the ethics of belief—and especially an Evidentialist theory—will be some account of the nature of evidence itself. Some philosophers construe evidence in terms of demonstrative proof, others in terms of objective and/or subjective probability, and others simply in terms of anything that belief is responsive to (see the entry on evidence). A fully articulate Evidentialism will also provide an account of how evidence supports belief (see the entry on the epistemic basing relation), and of what it is to have or possess such evidence. It will also, perhaps, say something about whether there can be evidence (arguments) in favor of having a belief that p or bringing about the belief that p, in addition to evidence in favor of p itself (see Reisner 2008). Finally, it will presumably have something to say about disagreement between epistemic peers, and the impact of that disagreement on our norms, especially if the disagreement is not based on a difference in evidence (van Inwagen 1996; Kelly 2005).

With respect to reflective access conditions, it was noted earlier that Evidentialists cannot require that a rational subject always base beliefs on sufficient evidence that she knows or justifiably believes she has, for fear of an infinite regress. If that is correct, then another less demanding sort of principle must be in the offing, one according to which at least some beliefs can simply be held on the basis of sufficient evidence, regardless of whether the subject has any beliefs about that evidence.

On the issue of evidence-possession generally: if we regard evidence as wholly constituted by mental states (experiences, beliefs, memories, etc.), then an account of what it is to “possess” evidence will be relatively straightforward—we must simply have these mental states. If evidence is not merely in the head, so to speak, then the possession condition in Evidentialist norms may turn out to be quite complex. What is our evidence for the belief that “it's raining”? Is it our awareness or experience of something, such as the street's being wet? Or is it simply the street's being wet? When asked why we believe that it is raining, we typically say something like “because the street is wet.” Is this merely shorthand or does it say something about the nature of evidence? (For arguments that extra-mental facts in the world often constitute evidence, see McDowell 1994 and Ginsborg 2007; for further discussion see Williamson 2002 and Dancy 2000, ch.6).

5. Varieties of Evidentialism

In light of the fact that there are different types of value underwriting different types of obligation, there must also be different types of Evidentialism: prudential, epistemic, and moral at the very least.

5.1 Prudential evidentialism

Strict prudential Evidentialism doesn't enjoy much of a following; indeed, as with most strict forms of Evidentialism, it is hard to see how it could be motivated. Perhaps it is prudent in general to follow one's evidence, but it seems there will always be cases in which prudential considerations push in the direction of playing fast and loose with the evidence. Wouldn't it be better for the grief-stricken widower to believe that his wife is enjoying life in heaven, or for the devoted spouse to fight off the belief that her husband is unfaithful, even though she regularly finds lipstick on his collar?

One move that the prudential Evidentialist can make in response to such objections is to adopt the doxastic analogue of rule consequentialism. Even if there are particular cases in which it is imprudent to follow one's evidence, the general rule that one should believe on the basis of, and in proportion to, sufficient evidence in one's possession produces the best distribution of prudential outcomes overall.

This kind of moderate prudential Evidentialism can handle a lot of common counterexamples, but there is still the concern that entire classes of beliefs—rather than individual instances—violate the principle and yet seem to produce more beneficial overall results. For instance, wouldn't it be better all around if each of us were as a rule to think more highly of one another's worth, intentions, and capacities than our evidence actually supports?

In response, it might be claimed that the source of the prudential value of always believing on sufficient evidence is that it tends to result in our having knowledge, and that this is what's really prudentially valuable. If that were right, then there would be a clear connection between prudential and epistemic norms (see §2.4 above and §5.3 below). The challenge for such a position, however, is to show that justification adds something of genuine prudential value that mere true belief does not.

5.2 Moral evidentialism

Strict moral Evidentialism is unlikely to be attractive to anyone but the most zealous Cliffordian. In its more moderate forms, however, moral Evidentialism is much more attractive and widespread. “You simply shouldn't believe that about your friend!”—expressed in a context where the friend's disloyalty is not conclusively supported by the evidence—sounds to many ears like the expression of a plausible moral obligation (see Wood 2002, ch. 1–3).

Moral rightness and wrongness is analyzed in many different ways, of course; a moral Evidentialist will presumably either adopt one of those analyses and develop her position accordingly, or show that the ethics of belief swings free of debates between deontologists, consequentialists, virtue theorists, and the like. No matter which theory of moral rightness and wrongness she adopts, however, there will be the usual questions to settle about whether there are thresholds of harm beyond which Evidentialist principles are suspended, whether the fundamental objects of moral appraisal in the doxastic context are acts or rules, and whether there is a ‘unity’ to the moral as well as the intellectual virtues. Again, it is an open question whether these issues need to be dealt with differently in an ethics of belief than they are in an ethics of action.

5.3 Epistemic evidentialism

By far the most influential and widespread variety of Evidentialism is epistemic (see Chisholm 1957; Adler 2002; Conee and Feldman 2004; Shah 2006). The central thesis of epistemic Evidentialism is that the norms of evidence governing belief are somehow based in the nature and aims of theoretical reason itself. To believe on insufficient evidence is at bottom an epistemic failure—a failure to use our cognitive faculties in such a way that we are likely to acquire significant knowledge and avoid significant falsehood. Some philosophers in this tradition also defend Locke's proportionality thesis according to which our degree of belief must be in proportion to the strength of our evidence (see White 2005).

A major challenge facing proponents of epistemic Evidentialism is to find an adequate motivation for it: if there are not sufficient prudential or moral grounds for the obligation to believe on sufficient evidence, then what is the source of its normativity? In response to the challenge, epistemic Evidentialists take a number of different tacks. Some argue that the norms are underwritten by necessary, conceptual truths. On this view, the very concept of belief reveals that it is a truth-aimed attitude that is only properly formed on the basis of sufficient evidence in the possession of the subject. Thus an attitude that is not formed in this way is either not a genuine belief at all, or at best a deficient instance of it (see Adler 2002; Textor 2004).

Other epistemic Evidentialists argue that doxastic norms arise not from analysis of the concept of belief, but rather from reflection on the fact that our belief-forming faculties are simply set up to be sensitive to evidence. The faculties of perception, memory, testimony, introspection, reasoning, and so on, typically generate beliefs on the basis of sufficient evidence, and we usually regard these faculties as malfunctioning, maladjusted, or misused when they generate beliefs in other ways. Pieces of apparent evidence—epistemic reasons, broadly-speaking—reliably provide us with important information about the world, and we have evolved to be sensitive to such reasons in our quest to survive and flourish.

Note that the epistemic Evidentialist does not hold that the acquisition of significant truth—even truth that promotes survival—is the only relevant consideration in this region: our belief-forming faculties are not mere thermometers or motion-detectors. The idea is rather that, as evidence-sensitive believers, we don't merely want to believe significant truths; rather, we want to have good grounds for taking propositions to be true, and to base our belief on those grounds (Feldman 2000; though again see David 2001). This putative fact is then taken to underwrite a norm: we ought to seek not just true belief but knowledge, or, more specifically, we ought to seek widespread significant knowledge without widespread significant error. To seek knowledge in this way is, among other things, to seek to have sufficient evidence for true beliefs and to base them on that evidence.

Yet another kind of defense of epistemic Evidentialism says that the central Evidentialist principle—that we ought to believe on the basis of sufficient evidence that is in our possession—is not an analytic truth drawn from the concept of belief, and not a ‘functional norm’ arising from reflection on the way our faculties are set up or designed, but rather a synthetic principle that we simply rationally intuit in the course of reflecting on concepts and thought-experiments. This approach seems coherent and in some ways attractive, though it has not found many defenders in the literature.

6. Varieties of Non-Evidentialism

We have already seen that there are any number of ways in which one can fail to be a strict Evidentialist. One might hold, for instance, that belief needn't always be based on evidence (though of course the Moderate Evidentialist could agree with that), or that belief requires evidence but its degree needn't be proportioned to the strength of the evidence, or that belief requires evidence but needn't be based on that evidence, or that belief requires that there be evidence even if the subject doesn't possess that evidence. No doubt there are other ways as well, and the question of whether a particular philosopher counts as an Evidentialist will ultimately hang on how Evidentialism itself is construed.

Most important for present purposes, however, is to note that the fact that someone is not a prudential Evidentialist, say, does not entail that she is a Non-Evidentialist for prudential reasons—or for any other reasons. Indeed, she might still be an Evidentialist, but for moral or epistemic rather than prudential reasons. As I will use the term, being a Non-Evidentialist with respect to a certain domain of beliefs requires, as a necessary condition, that one is not an Evidentialist of any sort about that domain of beliefs.

It was suggested earlier that a natural place to draw the line between Moderate Evidentialists and Non-Evidentialists about a domain of beliefs has to do with whether belief on the basis of insufficient evidence can ever be reasonably required. Are we ever obliged to believe even in the absence of sufficient evidence? Moderate Evidentialists will say no, Non-Evidentialists will say yes. Naturally, the reasons that motivate this putative requirement will be different according to different types of Non-Evidentialist. Here the focus will be on the three main types of that are prevalent among contemporary philosophers: Practical Non-Evidentialism (which includes what is sometimes called “pragmatism”), Conservativism, and Fideism.

6.1 Practical non-evidentialism

As noted above, William James famously sniffs at the impracticable stringency of Clifford's Principle, advocating instead the more liberal policy that we sometimes have the “right to believe” even when we lack sufficient evidence (and even when we know that we lack it). In places, James goes further and suggests that in certain cases—especially cases involving religious and moral belief—it is not merely permitted but positively commendable or evenrequired that we believe on insufficient evidence.

When I look at the religious question as it really puts itself to concrete men, and when I think of all the possibilities which both practically and theoretically it involves, then this command that we shall put a stopper on our heart, instincts, and courage, and wait—acting of course meanwhile more or less as if religion were not true—till doomsday, or till such time as our intellect and sense working together may have raked in evidence enough,—this command, I say, seems to me the queerest idol ever manufactured in the philosophic cave. (1896, 11)

We saw earlier that there are difficult conceptual and psychological problems facing an ethics of belief that says, quite strictly, that we must always and only believe what is prudentially beneficial. Thus while pragmatism is sometimes characterized casually as the view that we should believe whatever “works,” most self-described pragmatists are very careful to specify the conditions under which a subject can reasonably depart from, ignore, or go beyond her evidence (see pragmatism). These conditions typically involve the absence of really compelling evidence; thus, as James reminds his reader, pragmatic belief is not simply wild-eyed believing “what you know ain't true” (1896, 29). Pragmatists also typically require the existence of some sort of exigency or “passional” interest on the part of the subject that makes suspension of belief in that context impossible (or at least exceedingly ill-advised). We saw earlier how James defines a “genuine option” in an effort to specify these conditions.

The emphasis on the “primacy of the practical” in James was clearly anticipated by earlier ethicists of belief. Blaise Pascal famously argues in the Pensées that wager-like reasoning should lead us to set the goal of believing in God; thus his focus tends to be less on the moral or epistemic and more on the prudential motives for belief (Pascal 1690; Jordan 2006; Hájek 2003; see also the entries on Pascal, Pascal's Wager, and pragmatic arguments and belief in God). For Immanuel Kant, by contrast, considerations that can justify belief in the absence of sufficient theoretical evidence are typically (though not exclusively) moral. If, for instance, there is no sufficient evidence one way or the other for a certain proposition p (the proposition, say, that the human will is incompatibilistically free), and if one has set a moral end that requires that one take a stand on the truth of p, and if any evidence that one does have points in the direction of the truth of p, then a subject is permitted (and sometimes even required) to take p to be true. This ‘taking-to-be-true’ (German: ‘Fürwahrhalten’) is thereby justified on “moral” rather than “theoretical” grounds, and it counts as “belief” (Glaube) or “acceptance” (Annehmung) rather than ‘knowledge’ (Wissen) (Kant 1781/1787; Chignell 2007).

A convenient label that captures both broadly pragmatist and broadly Kantian theories is Practical Non-Evidentialism, where the pragmatic and the moral are the two main species of “practical” value (for more on moral reasons for belief and whether they count as evidence see Pace 2010).

6.2 Conservative non-evidentialism

Conservatism (sometimes also called dogmatism, though the latter is usually thought to be a view about perceptual belief in particular; see Pryor 2000; White 2006) is the view that one is prima facie justified in believing that p if in fact one does believe that p (Harman 1986; Owens 2000). Another version of it says that one is prima facie justified in believing that p if it seems to one that p is true (Huemer 2007). In order to be all things considered justified on either of these conservatisms, one must be aware of no undefeated defeaters for p. But the absence of undefeated defeaters for p, even if one is aware of it, is not positive evidence for p, and any “impulsional” urge towards p or seeming that p is true is not the kind of evidence that Evidentialists think we should seek (see Conee and Feldman 2004, ch. 3; for impulsional evidence see Plantinga 1993, 192). So on at least most accounts of what “evidence” is, conservatism is an important kind of Non-Evidentialism according to which some justified beliefs—the immediately justified ones—are not based on sufficient evidence.

Conservatism is regarded by some philosophers as a useful tool against skepticism (Christensen 1994; Huemer 2007), and its “dogmatic” flavor is sometimes made more palatable by combining it with various moderate or localized Evidentialisms. Thus, for example, conservatism about beliefs that go into the foundation of our knowledge structure (including beliefs about basic mathematical or moral truths) might very naturally be combined with a kind of Evidentialism about beliefs that are not in the foundation (for more on foundationalism in epistemology, see foundationalist theories of epistemic justification).

Note that conservatives need not say that any of the beliefs we have are infallible or incapable of being undermined. Indeed, they might be quite open to the fallibilist thought that our current justified beliefs can be defeated (either rebutted or undercut) by new evidence. So the view doesn't promote belief that is “dogmatic” or “conservative”in some disparaging sense: it says merely that some beliefs that we have, or some “impelling” beliefs, needn't be based on positive evidential (or practical) support in order to be justified (Harman 1986; Lycan 1988; Chisholm 1989; McGrath 2007).

6.3 Fideistic non-evidentialism

A third Non-Evidentialist position in the ethics of belief, similar to but distinct from dogmatism, is sometimes called fideism, though it needn't have anything to do with religious doctrine in particular. According to the fideist, we can legitimately hold propositions on faith without having any evidence for them, without feeling impelled towards them, and even in the face of strong evidence against them (note that this is just one way of defining “fideism,” see the entry on fideism for others). Someone might hold on the basis of faith, for instance, that there has been at least one bodily resurrection at some point in the past, even though he has never witnessed such a thing first-hand, and his best scientific, testimonial, and everyday inductive evidence constitutes a powerful case against it.

Fideism of this radical sort is not itself a religious doctrine, but is typically associated with religious thinkers like Tertullian in the ancient period (perhaps unfairly: see Sider 1980), and Kierkegaard (1846) in the modern (also perhaps unfairly: see Evans 1998). Apart from wearing its irrationality on its sleeve, fideism is vulnerable to psychological objections about the lack of direct control over belief. If belief just is an attitude that necessarily responds to perceived evidence with a positive ‘direction of fit,’ it is hard to see how a well-functioning subject could believe that p in the face of strong evidence that not-p. There are many things we might say of someone whom we know to have normal sensory faculties and who, despite strong perceptual and testimonial evidence to the contrary, repeatedly declares—without claiming to have any hidden evidence—that there is, say, a huge abyss opening up in front of him. One thing we are unlikely to say is that he really believes that there is an abyss in front of him. If in the end we are convinced by his actions and speech that he has this belief, and we know that his sensory faculties are functioning properly and that he is not completely unhinged, then we are likely to say that the belief is the product of an undesirable state such as self-deception, wish-fulfillment, paranoia.

A more moderate sort of fideism would say that we are permitted to form a “faith”-based belief only if the evidence regarding the proposition in question is not compelling either way, or is absent altogether. Only under those circumstances can we (directly or indirectly) make a “leap of faith” into belief (Adams 1987). Typically, however, those who have recommended “leaps of faith” have cited pragmatic or moral grounds for those leaps, and so given the taxonomy we have so far, they would ultimately count as practical non-Evidentialists rather than bona fide fideists.

If, on the other hand, the claim is that in the complete absence of practical or theoretical reasons in favor, a subject is still permitted to adopt a certain belief, then the view seems to have abandoned aspirations to developing a principled position, and is no longer obviously an “ethics” of belief. That is not a knockdown argument against that kind of fideism, of course: it may be that the fideist can give reasons to think that trying to formulate an ethics of belief is an ill-conceived project in the first place.

A final alternative for the fideist is to admit that he is not really focused on belief at all, but is rather trying to make room for another kind of positive propositional attitude that is not guided by evidence. Many philosophers and religious people who embrace the fideist label construe “faith” (Latin: fides) as something different from belief—hope, perhaps, or something like “acceptance” (see §7 and the entry on fideism). On such a conception, faith that p might very well be able rationally to co-exist with belief that not-p.

7. The ethics of acceptance

This last point shows that Evidentialism about belief—even of a strict and uncompromising sort—can be combined with Non-Evidentialism about some other positive, categorical propositional attitudes in order to make it seem less stern (see Audi 2008a for a list of possible meanings of “faith”). Perhaps the most prominent candidate here is acceptance conceived as a positive categorical attitude towards a proposition that is by definition voluntary and figures significantly in our deliberation, action, argumentation, and assertion. Some philosophers focus on the role that acceptance plays in scientific inquiry, theory-construction, and decision theory (van Fraasen 1984, Stalnaker 1987, Cohen 1992). Others focus on the role that it plays in ethical, juridical, religious, and everyday contexts (Bratman 1992, Cohen 1992, Alston 1996, Audi 2008a). A warning is in order here, however: acceptance is a technical notion and characterizations of its nature and ethics can differ radically. There is also some dispute about whether acceptance is able to play the various roles that its advocates intend (Moore 1994, Radford 1989, Maher 1990).

The ethicist of belief who wants to soften or supplement her view by appealing to some notion of permissible acceptance would need to say how the two sorts of attitude differ, what sorts of norms govern each, and how they interact in a single subject. One of the main advantages of a hybrid view like this is that acceptance is usually taken to be by definition voluntary, and thus it is much easier to see how a genuine “ethics” (complete with praise and blame ascriptions) could be built around it. As we saw earlier, a notion of acceptance (as “faith”) is the sort of thing that a fideist might want to appeal to against those who say that one can't just decide to believe that p in the face of strong opposing evidence. A moderate fideist, by contrast, might argue that we are only permitted to accept that p if we lack strong evidence on the question either way. This is still consistent with our having weak evidence for not-p, and even a (weakly held) belief that not-p.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Ethics of Belief, PhilPapers site, maintained by Asbjørn Steglich-Petersen, University of Aarhus.

Acknowledgments

The author wishes to thank Marian David and Avishai Margalit for discussion, and Robert Audi, Anthony Booth, Rik Peels, Nico Silins, and René van Woudenberg for helpful comments on earlier drafts.

He also thanks Cambridge University Press for permission to re-use a few paragraphs from his portion of the essay “The Ethics of Religious Belief: A Recent History,” in (Dole and Chignell 2005).

Copyright © 2010 by
Andrew Chignell <chignell@cornell.edu>

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