Pragmatic Arguments and Belief in God

First published Mon Aug 16, 2004; substantive revision Fri Nov 15, 2013

Pragmatic arguments have often been employed in support of theistic belief. Theistic pragmatic arguments are not arguments for the proposition that God exists; they are arguments that believing that God exists is rational. The most famous theistic pragmatic argument is Pascal's Wager. Though we touch on this argument briefly below, this entry focuses primarily on the theistic pragmatic arguments found in William James, J.S. Mill, and James Beattie. It also explores the logic of pragmatic arguments in general, and the pragmatic use of moral arguments in particular. Finally, this entry looks at an important objection to the employment of pragmatic arguments in belief formation—the objection that evidence alone should regulate belief.

1. Pragmatic Arguments

As with so much in philosophy, the first recorded employment of a pragmatic argument is found in Plato. At Meno 86b-c, Socrates tells Meno that believing in the value of inquiry is justified because of the positive impact upon one's character:

Meno: Somehow or other I believe you are right.

Socrates: I think I am. I shouldn't like to take my oath on the whole story, but one thing I am ready to fight for as long as I can, in word and act—that is, that we shall be better, braver, and more active men if we believe it right to look for what we don't know than if we believe there is no point in looking because what we don't know we can never discover.

Meno: There too I am sure you are.[1]

Paraphrased, Socrates' point is if being better, braver, and more active are among our desires, and if believing that inquiry is permissible facilitates our becoming better, braver, and more active, then we have reason, pragmatic reason, to believe that inquiry is permissible. Socrates' argument is an argument for the permissibility of a certain belief, based on the benefits of believing that certain belief. Pragmatic arguments are practical in orientation, justifying actions that are thought to facilitate the achievement of our goals, or the satisfaction of our desires. If among your goals is A, and if doing such and such results in your achieving A, then, all else being equal, you have reason to do such and such:

  1. Doing α brings about, or contributes in bringing about, β, and
  2. It is in your interest that β obtain. So,
  3. you have reason to do α.

As presented this is a particular kind of pragmatic argument, a prudential argument. Prudential pragmatic arguments are predicated upon one's preferences or goals or self-interest. As we will see, there are pragmatic arguments that are not narrowly prudential but are moral in nature.

Pragmatic arguments are relevant to belief-formation, since inculcating a belief is an action. There are, broadly speaking, two kinds of pragmatic arguments that have to do with belief-formation. The first is an argument that recommends taking steps to believe a proposition because, if it should turn out to be true, the benefits gained from believing that proposition will be impressive. This first kind of pragmatic argument we can call a “truth-dependent” pragmatic argument, or more conveniently a “dependent-argument,” since the benefits are obtained only if the relevant state of affairs occurs. The prime example of a dependent-argument is a pragmatic argument that uses a calculation of expected utility and employs the Expectation Rule to recommend belief:

whenever both probability and utility values are known, one should choose to do an act which has the greatest expected utility.

Among the various versions of his wager argument, Pascal employs this Rule in a version which states that no matter how small the probability that God exists, as long as it is a positive, non-zero probability, the expected utility of theistic belief will dominate the expected utility of disbelief. Given the distinction between (A) having reason to think a certain proposition is true, and (B) having reason to induce belief in that proposition, taking steps to generate belief in a certain proposition may be the rational thing to do, even if that proposition lacks sufficient evidential support. The benefits of believing a proposition can rationally take precedence over the evidential strength enjoyed by a contrary proposition; and so, given an infinite expected utility, Pascal's Wager contends that forming the belief that God exists is the rational thing to do, no matter how small the likelihood that God exists.

The second kind of pragmatic argument, which can be called a “truth-independent” pragmatic argument, or more conveniently, an “independent-argument,” is one which recommends taking steps to believe a certain proposition simply because of the benefits gained by believing it, whether or not the believed proposition is true. This is an argument that recommends belief cultivation because of the psychological, or moral, or religious, or social, or even the prudential benefits gained by virtue of believing it. In David Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, for example, Cleanthes employs an independent argument, “religion, however corrupted, is still better than no religion at all. The doctrine of a future state is so strong and necessary a security to morals that we never ought to abandon or neglect it” (Hume 1776, 87). Perhaps the best-known example of an independent-argument is found in William James's celebrated “Will to Believe” essay in which he argues that, in certain circumstances, it is rationally and morally permissible to believe a proposition because of the benefits thereby generated.[2]

Unlike independent pragmatic arguments, dependent ones are, in an important sense, truth-sensitive. Of course, being pragmatic arguments, dependent-arguments are not truth-sensitive in an evidential sense; nevertheless they are dependent on truth since the benefits are had only if the recommended belief is true. In contrast, independent pragmatic arguments, yielding benefits whether or not the recommended beliefs are true, are insensitive to truth. Independent-arguments, we might say, are belief-dependent and not truth-dependent.

2. Moral Arguments as Pragmatic Arguments

Pragmatic arguments in support of theistic belief can either be predicated on prudence or on morality. By pragmatic arguments predicated on morality I mean arguments that contend that morality, or some proper part of morality, presupposes, or is facilitated by theistic belief. And if morality, or the proper part of morality, is rational, then so too is theistic belief. Put generally:[3]

  1. Doing α helps to bring about β, and
  2. It is morally desirable that β. So,
  3. It is prima facie morally desirable to do α.

Since (4) specifies actions, we should understand accepting theistic propositions as actions, even if believing is not an action (for more on the distinction between acceptance and belief, see the section, “Pragmatic Arguments and Belief,” below).

It is important to recognize the distinction between theoretical moral arguments for theism (arguments intended to show that God exists), and pragmatic moral arguments for the rationality of theistic belief. George Mavrodes, for instance, constructs a theoretical moral argument by contending that it would be extremely odd that we would have moral obligations the fulfillment of which results in a net loss to the agent. Such a world seems absurd (Mavrodes, 1986). His argument is built upon the idea of a Russellian world, a universe in which mental events are products of non-mental events, and in which there's no human post-mortem survival, and extinction is the final end of every biological species. A Russellian world implies atheism. Summarized, Mavrodes’ argument is that there are real moral obligations in the actual world. But, real moral obligations would be absurd in a Russellian world, since fulfilling moral obligations often cause a net loss to the moral agent and there is no deep explanation of real moral obligation in a Russellian world (the deep features of a Russellian world would be things like forces and atoms and chance). But, fulfilling moral obligation is not absurd. So, in this respect, there is reason to think that the actual world is not a Russellian world.

Two recent examples of pragmatic moral arguments are Adams (1979) and Zagzebski (1987). Adams builds his argument on the concept of demoralization—weakening of moral motivation—and the concept of a moral order—roughly, the idea that to achieve a balance of good over evil in the universe requires something more than human effort, yet human effort can add or detract from the total value of the universe. While we cannot do it all on our own, the idea is, we can make a significant difference for better or worse. In short, Adam's argument is that it is demoralizing not to believe that there is a moral order in the universe, and demoralization is morally undesirable. So, there is moral advantage in accepting that there is a moral order, and theism provides the best account of why that is. Hence, there's moral advantage in accepting theism.

Zagzebski builds her argument upon the ideas of moral skepticism and moral efficacy, and, though she does not employ the term, moral order. Morality is efficacious if we can make significant contributions to the production of good in the universe and to the elimination of evil. Moral skepticism is a doubting of our ability to acquire moral knowledge, and a doubting of moral efficacy. Zagzebski argues that it is rational to try to be moral only if it is rational to believe that the probability that the attempt will succeed and will produce a great good is not outweighed by the probability that one will have to sacrifice goods in the course of the attempt. But given what we know of human abilities and history, it is not rational to believe that the attempt to be moral is likely to succeed if there is no moral order. Since it is rational to try to be moral, it is rational to believe that there is moral order in the universe, and Christian doctrine is, in part, an account of there being a moral order in the universe. So, accepting Christian theism is more rational than accepting that there's no moral order in the universe.

Theistic moral pragmatic arguments may face an objection similar to the many-gods objection to Pascal's wager. The many-gods objection contends that the betting options of the wager are not limited to Christianity and atheism alone, since one could formulate a Pascalian Wager for Islam, certain sects of Buddhism, or for any of the competing sects found within Christianity itself.[4] A similar problem arises for theistic moral pragmatic arguments, at least insofar as those arguments are intended to provide strong support for theistic belief. Let's say that a pragmatic argument provides strong support for theism just in case it provides reason for thinking that theism alone provides the benefit; and let's say that a pragmatic argument provides weak support for theism just in case it provides reason for thinking that theism is just one of several alternatives in providing the benefit. Pascal's Wager, for instance, is intended to provide strong support for theism; while James's Will to Believe argument is intended to provide weak support. Pragmatic moral arguments, if they are to provide strong support for theism, must provide reason to think that theistic belief alone is necessary for morality, or that theistic belief best facilitates moral practice. But it's far from clear that theistic belief exceeds its competitors in facilitating moral practice. Until reason for thinking that is forthcoming, it would be premature to hold that theistic moral pragmatic arguments provide strong support.

3. William James's Will to Believe Argument

The argument presented by William James (1842–1910) in his 1896 essay, “The Will to Believe”, extends far beyond the issue of the rationality of theistic belief to include various philosophical issues (for instance, whether to embrace determinism or indeterminism), and even matters of practical life. James's argument, in its attack on the agnostic imperative (withhold belief whenever the evidence is insufficient), makes the general epistemological point that:

a rule of thinking which would absolutely prevent me from acknowledging certain kinds of truth if those kinds of truth were really there, would be an irrational rule. (James 1896, 28)

We might understand the agnostic imperative more fully as follows:

for all persons S and propositions p, if S believes that p is just as likely as not-p, then it is impermissible for S to believe either p or not-p.

If James is correct, then the agnostic imperative is false.

The foil of James's essay was W.K. Clifford (1845–79). Clifford argued that:

…if I let myself believe anything on insufficient evidence, there may be no great harm done by the mere belief; it may be true after all, or I may never have occasion to exhibit it in outward acts. But I cannot help doing this great wrong towards Man, that I make myself credulous. The danger to society is not merely that it should believe wrong things, though that is great enough; but that it should become credulous, and lose the habit of testing things and inquiring into them; for then it must sink back into savagery. (Clifford 1879, 185–6)

Clifford presented evidentialism as a rule of morality: “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for any one, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (Clifford 1879, 186). If Clifford's Rule of morality is correct, then any one who believes a proposition that she does not take to be more likely than not, is, thereby, immoral. It may be worthwhile to note that Clifford's argument here is itself a moral pragmatic argument.

James's primary concern in the “Will To Believe” essay is to argue that Clifford's Rule is irrational (James 1896: 28). James contends that Clifford's Rule is but one intellectual strategy open to us. A proponent of Clifford's Rule advises, in effect, that one should avoid error at all costs, and thereby risk the loss of certain truths. But another strategy is to seek truth by any means available, even at the risk of error. James champions the latter via the main argument of the “Will to Believe” essay. To facilitate matters eight definitions employed by James are paraphrased:

  • Hypothesis: something that may be believed.
  • Option: a decision between two hypotheses.
  • Living option: a decision between two live hypotheses.
  • Live hypothesis: something that is a real candidate for belief. A hypothesis is live, we might say, for a person just in case that person lacks compelling evidence disconfirming that hypothesis, and the hypothesis has an intuitive appeal for that person.
  • Momentous option: the option may never again present itself, or the decision cannot be easily reversed, or something of importance hangs on the choice. It is not a trivial matter.
  • Forced option: the decision cannot be avoided.
  • Genuine option: one that's living, momentous, and forced.
  • Intellectually open: neither the evidence nor arguments conclusively decide the issue.

The main argument might be sketched as follows:

  1. Two alternative intellectual strategies are available:
    • Strategy A: Risk a loss of truth and a loss of a vital good for the certainty of avoiding error.
    • Strategy B: Risk error for a chance at truth and a vital good.
  2. Clifford's Rule embodies Strategy A. But,
  3. Strategy B is preferable to Strategy A because Strategy A would deny us access to certain possible kinds of truth. And,
  4. Any intellectual strategy that denies access to possible truths is an inadequate strategy. Therefore,
  5. Clifford's Rule is unacceptable.

James asserts that “there are…cases where a fact cannot come at all unless a preliminary faith exists in its coming” (James 1896, 25). Among other examples James provides of this particular kind of truth is that of social cooperation:

a social organism of any sort whatever, large or small, is what it is because each member proceeds to his own duty with a trust that the other members will simultaneously do theirs. Wherever a desired result is achieved by the co-operation of many independent persons, its existence as a fact is a pure consequence of the precursive faith in one another of those immediately concerned. (James 1896, 24)

And if James is right that there is a kind of proposition that has as a truth-maker its being believed, what we might call “dependent truths,” then proposition (9) looks well supported.

Of course, accepting proposition (11), and advancing an alternative strategy of seeking truth by any available means, even at the risk of error, does not entail that anything goes. And an important part of James's essay restricts what legitimately might be believed in the absence of adequate evidence. Among the requirements suggested by James the most important is:

Only genuine options that are intellectually open are decidable on passional grounds.

James is not arguing against conforming one's belief to the evidence, whenever there's a preponderance of evidence. Nor is he arguing against the importance of evidence. His is an argument contra the prohibition of believing whenever the evidence is silent, a prohibition implied by Clifford's Rule.

The requirement that an option is intellectually open may be redundant. If the evidence were compelling, or even strongly supportive of, say, hypothesis a, and you recognized this, it may be that you would find only a alive. Since you’re aware that the evidence strongly supports it, you would not find not-a living. In other words, to say that an option is living may imply that it is intellectually open. Nonetheless, let's proceed as if aliveness and openness are logically distinct notions. Additionally, we might ask whether the property of intellectual openness is to be understood as the evidence is lacking, or as the evidence is in principle lacking. That is, is an option intellectually open when the evidence is indeterminate, or when it is essentially indeterminate? James's argument requires only the former. The lack of adequate evidence is sufficient to render an option intellectually open. If more evidence appears so that one hypothesis is supported by a preponderance of the evidence, then a commitment to abide by the evidence is triggered.

The relevance of all of this to theistic belief, according to James, is that:

Religion says essentially two things. …the best things are the more eternal things, the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word…. The second affirmation of religion is that we are better off even now if we believe [religion's] first affirmation to be true… The more perfect and more eternal aspect of the universe is represented in our religions as having personal form. The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou…. We feel, too, as if the appeal of religion to us were made to our own active good-will, as if evidence might be forever withheld from us unless we met the hypothesis half-way. (James 1896, 25–7)

James asserts that there are two affirmations of religion. By affirmation James means something like an abstract claim, devoid of much doctrinal content, and found in the major religions. The first affirmation is that the best things are the more eternal things, while the second is that we are better off even now if we believe the first affirmation. The first affirmation is particularly puzzling, since James does not assert that the best things are the eternal things; he says that the best things are the more eternal things. He explicates this affirmation with three metaphors and a slogan: “the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word. ‘Perfection is eternal,’—this phrase of Charles Secrétan seems a good way of putting this first affirmation of religion” (James 1896, 25). Two ideas are suggested by James's explication: sovereignty and perfection. If we understand “more eternal” as a kind of necessity, or non-contingency, then perhaps the first affirmation may be understood as asserting that the best things are those things that cannot fail to be sovereign and perfect. This interpretation resolves much of the first affirmation's puzzle. The plurality though is still puzzling. We can resolve this puzzle by recognizing that, although he does not explicitly call it a third affirmation, James asserts that “the more perfect and more eternal aspect of the universe is represented in our religions as having personal form. The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou” (James 1896, 26). If we take this as a third affirmation of religion (perhaps at the risk a charge of theistic parochialism), the possibility that the more eternal things are plural is foreclosed. Monotheism, in other words, and not polytheism is established by the third affirmation. Taken together, then, the first and the third affirmations of religion suggest that the supreme good in the universe is the existence of a personal being that is essentially perfect and sovereign. The second affirmation is that we are better off now by believing in the existence of this perfect being. At least in part, we would be better off now by believing the first affirmation because by doing so the possibility of a relationship with this being is established.

According to James, just as one is not likely to make friends if one is aloof, likewise one is not likely to become acquainted with the perfect being, if there is such, if one seeks that acquaintance only after sufficient evidence has been gathered. There are possible truths, James claims, belief of which is a necessary condition of obtaining evidence for them. Let's call the class of propositions whose evidence is restricted to those who first believe “restricted propositions.” Dependent propositions and restricted propositions are James's counterexamples to Clifford's Rule. They are two examples of the kinds of truths that Clifford's Rule would keep one from acknowledging. That is, Clifford's Rule is problematic because following it would preclude access to restricted propositions and dependent propositions. The Cliffordian may be forever cut off from certain kinds of truth.

One might object that James has at best shown that theistic belief is momentous only if God exists. If God does not exist, and, as a consequence, the vital good of eternal life does not obtain, then no vital good is at stake. To answer this objection a Jamesian might focus on what James calls the second affirmation of religion—we are better off even now if we believe—and take that affirmation to include benefits that are available, via pro-belief, even if God does not exist. In The Varieties of Religious Experience James suggests that religious belief produces certain psychological benefits:

A new zest which adds itself like a gift to life, and takes the form either of lyrical enchantment or of appeal to earnestness and heroism…. An assurance of safety and a temper of peace, and, in relation to others, a preponderance of loving affections. (James 1902, 475)

In any case, given that theism is intellectually open and that it's part of a genuine option, and given that there are vital goods attached to theistic belief, James says, the hope that it is true is a sufficient reason to believe. In addition this objection is easily evaded if we revise the notion of a genuine option by removing the requirement that an option is genuine only if momentous, although James himself may have been loath to drop that requirement.

An objection commonly leveled against James's argument is that “it constitutes an unrestricted license for wishful thinking… if our aim is to believe what is true, and not necessarily what we like, James's universal permissiveness will not help us” (Hick 1990, 60). That is, hoping that a proposition is true is no reason to think that it is. A Jamesian might contend that this objection is unfair. As we have noted, James does not hold that the falsity of Clifford's Rule implies that anything goes. Restricting the relevant permissibility class to propositions that are intellectually open and part of a genuine option provides ample protection against wishful thinking.

A more significant objection contends that James's argument fails “to show that one can have a sufficient moral reason for self-inducing an epistemically unsupported belief” (Gale 1990, 283). This objection contends that there is a weighty moral duty to proportion one's beliefs to the evidence, and that this duty flows from moral personhood—to be a morally responsible person requires that one have good reasons for each of one's beliefs. But to believe an epistemically unsupported proposition is to violate this duty and is thus, in effect, a denial of one's own personhood.[5] Or think of it another way, as intellectual beings, we have the dual goal of maximizing our stock of (significant) true beliefs and minimizing our stock of false ones. Clifford's Rule derives its moral validity, one might contend, from that intellectual goal. And from Clifford's Rule flows our duty to believe only those propositions that enjoy adequate evidential support. James's argument would, if operative, thwart our intellectual goal by permitting us to violate Clifford's Rule. Can a morally and intellectually responsible person ever have a moral duty to believe a proposition that lacks adequate evidence, a duty that outweighs the alleged Cliffordian duty of believing only those propositions that enjoy adequate support? To answer this, let's employ what we might call the “ET” thought experiment. Suppose Clifford is abducted by very powerful and very smart extraterrestrials, which offer him a single chance of salvation for humankind—that he acquire and maintain belief in a proposition that lacks adequate evidential support, otherwise the destruction of humankind will result. Clifford adroitly points out that no one can just will belief. The ETs, devilish in their anticipation as well as their technology, provide Clifford with a supply of doxastic-producing pills, which when ingested produce the requisite belief for 24 hours. It's obvious that Clifford would do no wrong by swallowing the pills and bringing about a belief lacking adequate evidential support.[6] Moreover, since one is never irrational in doing one's moral duty, not only would Clifford not be immoral, he would not even be irrational in bringing about and maintaining belief in a proposition lacking adequate evidential support. As we mentioned earlier, given the distinction between (A) having reason to think a certain proposition is true, and (B) having reason to induce a belief in that proposition, it may be that a particular proposition lacks sufficient evidential support, but that forming a belief in that proposition is the rational action to perform.

A very interesting objection to James's argument is that it falls prey to the very principle it invokes against Clifford:

James writes: “A rule of thinking which would absolutely prevent me from acknowledging certain kinds of truth if those kinds of truth were really there would be an irrational rule”. This may sound like sweet reason itself, but a moment's reflection should convince us that it is nothing of the kind. Any rule whatever that restricts belief in any way might conceivably shut us off from some truths. (Wood 2002, 24)

According to James, Clifford's Rule is problematic because, if followed, it would preclude access to restricted propositions and dependent propositions. According to this objection, this alleged flaw of Clifford's Rule is true of any epistemic principle. Every epistemic principle that divides beliefs into those that are permissible and those that are not runs the risk of shutting off access to certain possible kinds of truth. James's restriction of the permissible use of the passional nature only to when one faces a genuine option that's intellectually open is just as guilty of the alleged flaw as is Clifford's Rule. But an alleged flaw found in every possibility is no flaw. Hence, James's objection to Clifford fails.

This objection is interesting since it is in one sense true. It's obvious that any rule that restricts belief in any way might shut us off from certain truths. Still, while interesting, this objection is irrelevant. James's argument is not predicated on the abstract proposition that “any rule whatever that restricts belief in any way might conceivably shut us off from some truths.” It is predicated on the principle that there are dependent propositions, and there are restricted propositions. His examples of social trust, and acquiring friends, and of social cooperation are intended to make that clear. If theism were true, then it is very likely that there would be dependent propositions and restricted propositions in that realm as well. Clifford's Rule would preclude access to any restricted or dependent proposition, whether religious or not. James is not arguing against conforming one's belief to the evidence, whenever there's a preponderance of evidence. He is arguing against the prohibition of believing whenever the evidence is silent. Since James's argument specifies the irrationality of Clifford's Rule's exclusion of dependent and restricted propositions, and not just the abstract possibility of some kind of true belief or other being excluded, it escapes this objection.

William Wainwright has argued that James's argument properly fits within an old Christian tradition, which asserts that:

Mature religious belief can, and perhaps should, be based on evidence but… the evidence can be accurately assessed only by men and women who possess the proper moral and spiritual qualifications. This view was once a Christian commonplace; reason is capable of knowing God on the basis of evidence—but only when one's cognitive faculties are rightly disposed. (Wainwright 1995, 3).

If Wainwright is correct, then James's argument is not just a pragmatic argument, but also an epistemic argument, since he is arguing that one of the pragmatic benefits is a more reliable access to reality. So, the chasm between the epistemic and the pragmatic is not unbridgeable, since James's Will to Believe argument spans the gulf between the pragmatic and the epistemic. Importantly, we should keep in mind that whatever else it is, James's argument is a pragmatic argument, and, moreover, James probably saw his argument as having a similar status as Pascal's Wager, since he offers a positive evaluation of the Wager, very often overlooked by commentators, “Pascal's argument, instead of being powerless, then seems a regular clincher, and is the last stroke needed to make our faith…complete” (James 1896, 11).

4. J.S. Mill's License to Hope

The posthumous publication of Mill's Three Essays on Religion (1874) drew criticism from the faithful, but it also drew a surprising disappointment from those who expected the “saint of rationalism” to argue for agnosticism. The cause of this consternation is found in the third of the three essays, “Theism,” a short work begun in 1868 and unfinished when Mill died in 1870. The faithful found “Theism” objectionable because of Mill's criticism of several of the standard arguments of natural theology. The disappointment of the other side flowed from Mill's endorsement of a position that can be summed up by the principle that where probabilities fail, hope can properly flourish. As Mill expressed this principle when discussing immortality, “…to any one who feels it conducive either to his satisfaction or to his usefulness to hope for a future state as a possibility, there is no hindrance to his indulging that hope” (Mill 1874, 210). Mill thought that belief in a creator of great but limited power was supported by the design argument, and one could certainly erect the superstructure of hope upon the base of a belief in a creator who would extend human existence beyond the grave:

Appearances point to the existence of a Being who has great power over us—all the power implied in the creation of the Kosmos, or of its organized beings at least—and of whose goodness we have evidence though not of its being his predominant attribute; and as we do not know the limits either of his power or of his goodness, there is room to hope that both the one and the other may extend to granting us this gift provided that it would really be beneficial to us. (Mill 1874, 210)

Since we do not know that granting postmortem existence to humans is beyond the capability of the creator, hope is possible. As Mill puts it:

…in the regulation of the imagination literal truth of facts is not the only thing to be considered. Truth is the province of reason, and it is by the cultivation of the rational faculty that provision is made for its being known always, and thought of as often as is required by duty and the circumstances of human life. But when reason is strongly cultivated, the imagination may safely follow its own end, and do its best to make life pleasant and lovely… On these principles it appears to me that the indulgence of hope with regard to the government of the universe and the destiny of man after death, while we recognize as a clear truth that we have no ground for more than a hope, is legitimate and philosophically defensible. The beneficial effect of such a hope is far from trifling. (Mill 1874, 248–9)

For our purposes the item of interest is Mill's claim that “any one who feels it conducive either to his satisfaction or to his usefulness to hope for a future state as a possibility, there is no hindrance to his indulging that hope” (Mill 1874, 210). Mill's license to hope is issued on pragmatic grounds: it is permissible to hope if and only if:

L1. For all one knows or justifiably believes, the object of one's hope could obtain; and,

L2. One believes that hoping contributes to one's own happiness, or to the well-being of others.

The second condition (L2) is straightforwardly pragmatic and restricts hope to those who have goals either of personal happiness, or of contributing to the well-being of others. Believing that hope will result in the increase of happiness or well-being is a necessary condition of permissible hope.

There's little doubt that Mill agreed with Clifford's Rule. Mill was no subjectivist or fideist. But hope and belief are not the same; and the standards for the permissibility of the latter are considerably higher. Mill thought that (L1) and (L2) were the relevant standards for permissible hope. If one believes that Clifford's Rule should govern any and all propositional attitudes and not just belief, then it is easy to see why Mill's liberal treatment of hope would disappoint.

5. James Beattie's Consolation Argument

In 1770 James Beattie (1735–1803) published a long response to Hume entitled An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, in Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism. The essay was a 300 page best seller, which, most commentators agree, was unfair in many respects to Hume. As was his practice, Hume never made an effort to answer Beattie in public; in correspondence, however, Hume referred to Beattie as that “bigoted silly fellow.”[7]

Despite the general weakness of many of his arguments Beattie does offer an interesting pragmatic moral objection to Hume's attack on religious belief:

…they perhaps have little need, and little relish, for the consolations of religion. But let them know that, in the solitary scenes of life, there is many an honest and tender heart pining with incurable anguish, pierced with the sharpest sting of disappointment, bereft of friends, chilled with poverty, racked with disease, scourged by the oppressor; whom nothing but trust in Providence, and the hope of a future retribution, could preserve from the agonies of despair. And do they, with sacrilegious hands, attempt to violate this last refuge of the miserable, and to rob them of the only comfort that had survived the ravages of the misfortune, malice, and tyranny! Did it ever happen, that the influence of their execrable tenets disturbed the tranquility of virtuous retirement, deepened the gloom of human distress, or aggravated the horrors of the grave? Is it possible that this may have happened in many instances? Is it probable that this hath happened, or may happen, in one single instance?—ye traitors to human kind, how can ye answer for it to your own hearts? (Beattie 1776, 322–23).

Beattie argues that Hume's clear cutting of the theistic forest in his attack on the credibility of miracle reports, his criticism of the design argument, and his attack on the cosmological argument resulted in a desolated landscape that does a serious disservice to humankind. Since in some cases, Beattie contends, despair flows from the loss of faith. And he assumes that no justifying good exists for Hume to risk causing despair.

Let's understand desolation as a profound sense of hopelessness and purposelessness. Beattie believed that Christian belief provided consolation, especially to those suffering or oppressed. His argument might be reconstructed as there exists a person S, such that:

  1. Theistic belief provides the great good of consolation for S. And,
  2. S cannot receive a comparable good from any other source. And,
  3. The deprivation of this good is a significant loss for S. So,
  4. Depriving S of the great good of theistic belief renders S significantly worse-off. And,
  5. It is wrong to render someone worse-off without compensation. And,
  6. Public atheistic attacks provide S with no sufficient compensation. Therefore,
  7. Public atheistic attacks are wrong.

While Hume never directly responded to Beattie's Consolation Argument, Mill had it (or something very much like it in mind) when he wrote:

That what is called the consoling nature of an opinion, that is, the pleasure we should have in believing it to be true, can be a ground for believing it, is a doctrine irrational in itself and which would sanction half the mischievous illusions recorded in history or which mislead individual life. (Mill 1874, 204)

This is an odd objection coming from one who argued in Utilitarianism “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness.” If the sole criterion of action is the production of happiness, and if forming a belief is an action, then it is hard to see what answer could be lodged against Beattie's Consolation Argument (or at least some argument very much like it).[8] If happiness and consolation are irrelevant, and if Clifford's Rule that “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for any one, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” is correct, then Beattie's consolation argument can be rejected as being itself an immoral subornation.[9]

6. The Ethics of Belief

Clifford's Rule is a vivid presentation of an influential and long tradition in philosophy that carries the name of Evidentialism. We can understand Evidentialism as the thesis that:

E. For all persons S and propositions p and times t, S ought to believe that p at t if and only if believing p fits S's evidence at t.

Clearly enough, pragmatic arguments run afoul of (E), since pragmatic arguments are employed either when the evidence is inconclusive, or it is conclusively adverse. Consider the latter case first. Earlier it was mentioned that Pascal's Wager is the most famous example of a theistic pragmatic argument. Pascal in fact has not one version of the Wager in his Pensées (1660) but four. The third version of the Wager is what Ian Hacking (1972) entitles the “Argument from Dominating Expectation,” and it employs the Expectation rule. We can represent it by letting p stand for a positive probability greater than zero and less than one-half, and letting EU stand for “expected utility,” and employing F2–F4 as finite values:

God exists
~(God exists)
Believe p, ∞ 1 − p, F2 EU = ∞
~(Believe) p, F3 1 − p, F4 EU = finite value

No matter how unlikely it is that God exists, as long as there is some positive non-zero probability that he does, believing is one's best bet:

  1. For any person S, and alternatives α and β available to S, if the expected utility of α exceeds that of β, S should choose α. And,
  2. Believing in God carries more expected utility than does not believing. Therefore,
  3. One should believe in God.

Because of its ingenious employment of infinite utility, the third version has become what most philosophers think of as Pascal's Wager. The appeal of the third version for theistic apologists is its ready employment as a worst-case device. Suppose there were a compelling argument for atheism. With the third version the theist has an escape: it can still be rational to believe, even if the belief is itself unreasonable, since inculcating theistic belief is an action with an infinite expected utility. This use as a worst-case device is something like a trump card that can be thrown down defeating what had appeared as a stronger hand. Pascal's third version clearly violates (E).

Now consider James's Will to Believe argument. As we saw, James's contention is that any hypothesis that's part of a genuine option, and that's intellectually open, may be believed, even in the absence of sufficient evidence. No rule of morality or rationality, James argues, is violated if one accepts a hypothesis that's genuine and open. If James is correct, then (E) should be replaced with:

E′. For all persons S and propositions p and times t, if believing p fits S's evidence at t, then S ought to believe that p at t.

According to (E′) if the evidence is adequate, then the question is settled. If there's a preponderance of support for p, then one is required to believe p. Where the evidence speaks, one must listen and obey. (E′) differs from (E) in part since it says nothing about those occasions in which the evidence is silent, or is inadequate. If one assigns p a probability of one-half, then there's not a preponderance of evidence in support of p. (E′) says nothing about believing p in that case. Principle (E), on the other hand, forbids believing p in that case. While a proponent of theistic pragmatic arguments cannot swear allegiance to (E), she can, clearly enough, adhere to (E′). Let's call (E) Strong Evidentialism, and (E′) Weak Evidentialism. So, an employer of theistic pragmatic arguments can conform to Weak Evidentialism, but not Strong Evidentialism.

Is there a good reason to prefer Weak Evidentialism to Strong (in addition to James's argument)? A promising argument in support of the moral and rational permissibility of employing pragmatic reasons in belief-formation is erected upon the base of what we might call the Basic Argument (or perhaps more precisely, the Basic Argument scheme):

  1. □(no one is (overall) irrational in doing what he's morally obligated to do). And,
  2. ◊(doing α is a moral obligation). So,
  3. ◊(doing α is (overall) rational).

The Basic Argument employs the box and diamond in the standard fashion as operators for, respectively, conceptual necessity and possibility. The alpha is just a placeholder for actions, or kinds of actions. The locution “(overall) rational” or “(overall) irrational” presupposes that there are various kinds of rationality, including moral rationality, epistemic rationality, and prudential rationality.[10] The idea that there are various kinds of rationality, or put any way, that one can be under conflicting obligations at a particular time, recognizes that dilemmas are possible. One can be obligated to do various things even when it's not possible to do all of them. Overall rationality is the all-things-considered perspective. It is what one ultimately should do, having taken into account the various obligations one is under at a particular time. Overall rationality, or all-things-considered rationality (ATC rationality), is, in W.D. Ross's terms, one's actual duty in the particular circumstances, even if one has other conflicting prima facie duties. The Basic Argument can be formulated without presupposing that there are various kinds of rationality, by replacing the principle that no one is ever irrational in doing her moral duty, with the principle that moral obligations take precedence whenever a dilemma of obligations occurs. In any case the Basic Argument assumes that if in doing something one is not ATC irrational, then it follows that one is ATC rational in doing it.

The relevance of the Basic Argument to the debate is this. The action of forming and sustaining a belief upon pragmatic grounds can replace α. That is, pragmatic belief formation could be one's moral duty. Think back to the ET thought experiment of Section 3. That argument, which is an instance of the Basic Argument, employs a far-fetched but possible scenario in which one is morally obligated to inculcate a belief lacking the support of a preponderance of evidence. Although controversial, the Basic Argument, if sound, would provide strong reason preferring Weak Evidentialism to Strong; and it would provide good reason for thinking that there are occasions in which it is permissible, both rationally and morally, to form beliefs based upon pragmatic reasons even in the absence of adequate evidence.

7. Pragmatic Arguments and Belief

The idea that persons can voluntarily and directly choose what to believe is called “Doxastic Voluntarism”. According to Doxastic Voluntarism, believing is a direct act of the will, with many of the propositions we believe under our immediate control. A basic action is an action that a person intentionally does, without doing any other action. Jones’ moving of her finger is a basic action, since she need not perform any other action to accomplish it. Her handing the book from Smith to Brown is not basic, since she must intentionally do several things to accomplish it. According to Doxastic Voluntarism, some of our belief acquisitions are basic actions. We can will, directly and voluntarily, what to believe and the beliefs thereby acquired are freely obtained and are not forced upon us. In short, one can believe at will. The proponent of Doxastic Voluntarism need not hold that every proposition is a candidate for direct acquisition, as long as she holds that there are some propositions belief in which is under our direct control.

It is widely thought that Doxastic Voluntarism is implausible. Opponents of Doxastic Voluntarism can present a simple experiment against it: survey various propositions that you do not currently believe, and see if any lend themselves, directly and immediately, by a basic act of the will, to belief. Certainly there are some beliefs that one can easily cause oneself to have. Consider the proposition that I am now holding a pencil. I can cause myself to believe that by simply picking up a pencil. Or more generally, any proposition about my own basic actions I can easily enough believe by performing the action. But my coming to believe is by means of some other basic action. Since I lack direct control over what I believe, and there’s no reason to think that my lacking in this regard is singular, Doxastic Voluntarism is implausible. Does the implausibility of Doxastic Voluntarism show that pragmatic belief-formation is also implausible?

Not at all: think of Pascal's advice to act as if one already believes (by going to masses and by imitating the faithful) as a way of inculcating belief. Pragmatic belief-formation neither entails nor presupposes Doxastic Voluntarism. As long as there is indirect control, or roundabout control, over the acquisition and maintenance of beliefs, pragmatic belief-formation is possible. What constitutes indirect control over the acquisition of beliefs? Consider actions such as entertaining a proposition, or ignoring a proposition, or critically inquiring into the plausibility of this idea or that, or accepting a proposition. Each of these involves a propositional attitude, the adoption of which is under our direct control. Indirect control occurs since accepting a proposition, say, or acting as if a proposition were true, very often results in believing that proposition. Insofar as there is a causal connection between the propositional attitudes we adopt, and the beliefs that are thereby generated, we can be said to have exercised indirect, or roundabout, control over belief-formation.

One objection to the foregoing is that pragmatic arguments are, by and large, pointless because beliefs are, by their very nature, psychological states that aim for truth. That is, whenever one believes a proposition, one is disposed to feel that that proposition is probably the case. A person ordinarily cannot believe a proposition that she takes to have a probability of less than one-half or whose probability is uncertain since such propositional attitudes do not aim for truth. The upshot of this objection is that strong evidentialism is unavoidable.

If it is true, as this objection holds, that believing a proposition ordinarily involves being disposed to feel that the proposition is the case then it does appear at first blush that pragmatic belief-formation, as such, is ineffectual. But all that follows from this fact, if such it be, is that some sort of belief-inducing technology will be necessary in order to facilitate the acquisition of a proposition that is pragmatically supported. Now it is true that the most readily available belief-inducing technologies – selectively using the evidence for instance – all involve a degree of self-deception, since one ordinarily cannot attend only to the favorable evidence in support of a particular proposition while neglecting the adverse evidence arrayed against it and, being conscious of all this, expect that one will acquire that belief. The fact that self-deception is a vital feature of the readily available belief-formation technologies leads to another objection.

This second objection is that willfully engaging in self-deception renders pragmatic belief-formation morally problematic and rationally suspect, since willfully engaging in self-deception is the deliberate worsening of one's epistemic situation. It is morally and rationally problematic to engage in pragmatic belief-formation, insofar as belief-formation involves self-deception.

This second objection is powerful if sound, but we must be careful here. First, while self-deception may be a serious problem with regard to inculcating a belief which one takes to be false, it does not seem to be a serious threat involving the inculcation of a belief which one thinks has as much evidence in its favor as against it, nor does it seem to be a threat when one takes the probability of the proposition to be indeterminate, since one could form the belief knowing full well the evidential situation. Even if it is true that believing that p is being disposed to feel that p is the case, it does not follow that believing that p involves being disposed to feel that p is the case based on the evidence at hand. Second, this is an objection not to pragmatic belief-formation per se, but an objection to pragmatic belief-formation that involves self-deception. Although it may be true that the employment of self-deceptive belief-inducing technologies is morally and rationally problematic, this objection says nothing about those belief-inducing technologies that do not involve self-deception. If there are belief-inducing technologies which are free of self-deception and which could generate a belief on the basis of a pragmatic reason, then this objection fails.11

Is there a belief-inducing technology available that does not involve self-deception? There is. Notice first there are two sorts of belief-inducing technologies distinguishable: “low-tech” technologies and “high-tech” ones. Low-tech technologies consist of propositional attitudes only, while high-tech ones employ nonpropositional techniques along with various propositional attitudes. The nonpropositional techniques could include actions like acting as if a certain proposition were true, and morally questionable ones like hypnosis, or indoctrination, or subliminal suggestion. Consider a technology consisting of two components, the first of which is the acceptance of a proposition, while the second is a behavioral regimen of acting on that acceptance. Accepting a proposition, unlike believing, is an action that is characterized, in part, by one's assenting to the proposition, whether one believes it or not. One accepts a proposition, when she assents to its truth and employs it as a premise in her deliberations. One can accept a proposition that one does not believe. Indeed, we do this much of the time. For example, think of the gambler’s fallacy. One might be disposed to believe that the next toss of the fair coin must come up Tails, since it has been Heads on the previous seven tosses. Nevertheless, one ought not to accept that the next toss of a fair coin must come up Tails, or that the probability that it will is greater than one-half. Acceptance, we should remember, unlike believing, is an action that is under our direct control.

If one accepts a proposition, then one can also act upon the proposition. Acting upon a proposition is behaving as though it were true. The two-step regimen of accepting a proposition and then acting upon it is a common way of generating belief in that proposition. And, importantly, there is no hint of self-deception tainting the process.

One might object that employing a belief-inducing technology at all, whether low or high tech, is enough to entangle one in issues implicating the rationality of the belief induced (see, for instance, Garber, 2009). A friend of the pragmatic, however, might argue that that this objection presupposes strong evidentialism and that the DD argument has already provided a dispositive ruling on that issue.

8. Atheistic Pragmatic Arguments

While not as common as theistic arguments, there have been atheistic pragmatic arguments offered from time to time. These arguments often arise within the context of a purported naturalistic explanation of the occurrence of religious belief and practice. Perhaps the earliest proponent of an atheistic pragmatic argument was David Hume (1711–1776). In chapter X of his 1757 The Natural History of Religion, Hume wrote:

Where the deity is presented as infinitely superior to mankind, this belief... is apt, when joined with superstitious terrors, to sink the human mind into the lowest submission and abasement …

The idea of Hume's argument here and elsewhere in his writings (see for instance Dialogue XII of his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, and appendix IV of the second Enquiry) is that theism, or at least theism of the popular sort—that conjoined with “superstitious terrors,” degrades individual morality, thereby devaluing human existence. Theistic belief, Hume contended, inculcates the “monkish virtues of mortification, penance, humility, and passive suffering, as the only qualities which are acceptable…” But not only does theistic belief harm individual morality, according to Hume, it also harms public morality. In chapter IX, Hume suggested that theism (again he qualifies by writing of the “corruptions of theism”) leads to intolerance and persecution.

Another atheistic pragmatic argument is that of Sigmund Freud (1856–1939), who in The Future of an Illusion (1927) contends that religious belief perpetuates psychological immaturity among individuals, and cultural immaturity on the social level. To make sense of Freud's argument requires knowing that he employed the term “illusion” in an idiosyncratic way. An illusion in the Freudian sense is a belief that is caused by and in turn satisfies a deep psychological need or longing. Illusions are not held rationally. Illusions stick even in the absence of any supporting evidence. Indeed, according to Freud, they stick even in the face of strong contra-evidence. An illusion could be true, but often they are not. Delusions are false illusions. Religious belief Freud thought was an illusion. While it may have been a beneficial illusion at an earlier time, it no longer is. The religious illusion now, Freud asserted, inhibits scientific progress, and causes psychological neuroses, among its other pernicious effects.

A contemporary atheistic pragmatic argument is found with Richard Dawkins's contention that religious belief is a “virus of the mind” (Dawkins 1993). One is religious, according to Dawkins, because one has been infected by a faith meme. A meme is Dawkins's imaginative construct, which he describes as a bit of information, manifested in behavior, and which can be copied from one person to another. Like genes, memes are self-replicating vehicles, jumping from mind to mind. One catches a meme by exposure to another who is infected. Dawkins claims that the faith meme has the following traits:

M1. The faith meme seems to the person as true, or right, or virtuous, though this conviction in fact owes nothing to evidence or reason.

M2. The faith meme makes a virtue out of believing in spite of there being no evidence.

M3. The faith meme encourages intolerant behavior towards those who possess rival faiths.

M4. The faith meme arises not because of evidence but because of epidemiology; typically, if one has a faith, it is the same as one's parents and as one's grandparents.

Dawkins's meme idea, and his dismissal of faith as a virus of the mind, is both a purported naturalistic explanation of religious belief and a pragmatic dismissal of it as a harmful phenomenon.


  • Adams, Robert, 1979. “Moral Arguments for Theistic Belief,” in Rationality and Religious Belief, C. Delaney (ed.), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, pp. 116–40. Reprinted in The Virtue of Faith, New York: Oxford University Press, 1979.
  • Beattie, James, 1776. An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism, Part III, Ch. III (first ed. 1770; second 1776), New York: Garland, 1971.
  • Clifford, W.K., 1879. “The Ethics of Belief” in Lectures and Essays, Vol. II. London: Macmillan.
  • Dawkins, Richard, 1993. “Viruses of the Mind,” Dennett and His Critics, B. Dahlbom (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Feldman, Richard, 2000. “The Ethics of Belief,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60(3): 693–95.
  • Freud, Sigmund, 1927. The Future of an Illusion, J. Strachey (trans.), New York: W.W. Norton, 1961.
  • Gale, Richard, 1990. On the Nature and Existence of God, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Garber, Daniel, 2009. What Happens After Pascal's Wager: living faith and rational belief, Milwaukee: Marquett University Press.
  • Hacking, Ian, 1972. “The Logic of Pascal's Wager,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 9: 186–92.
  • Hick, John, 1990. Philosophy of Religion, 4th edition, Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall.
  • Hume, David, 1776. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, H. Aiken (ed.), New York: Hafner Publishing Co., 1948.
  • –––, 1757. The Natural History of Religion, H.E. Root (ed.), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 1957.
  • James, William, 1902. The Varieties of Religious Experience, New York: Modern Library, 1936.
  • –––, 1896. “The Will to Believe,” The Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy, New York: Dover Publications, 1956.
  • Jordan, Jeff, 2002. “Pascal's Wagers” in Midwest Studies in Philosophy: Renaissance and Early Modern Philosophy, P. French & H. Wettstein (eds.), XXVI: 213–23.
  • –––, 2006. Pascal's Wager: Pragmatic Arguments and Belief in God, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Koenig, H., McCullough, M., and Larson, D., 2001. Handbook of Religion and Health, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lachelier, Jules, 1901. The Philosophy of Jules Lachelier, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Mavrodes, George, 1986. “Religion and the Queerness of Morality,” in Rationality, Religious Belief, and Moral Commitment: New Essays in the Philosophy of Religion, R. Audi & W. Wainwright (eds.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press, pp. 213–26
  • Mill, J.S., 1874. “Theism” in Three Essays on Religion, New York: Henry Holt & Co.
  • Moser, Paul, 1985. Empirical Justification, Boston: D. Reidel.
  • Somerville, James, 1995. The Enigmatic Parting Shot, Aldershot, England. Ashgate Publishing.
  • Stark, R., and Fink, R., 2000. Acts of Faith: Explaining the Human Side of Religion, Berkeley, CA: University of California Press.
  • Stove, David, 2003. On Enlightenment, R. Kimball (ed.), New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers.
  • Wainwright, William, 1995. Reason and the Heart, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Wood, Alan, 2002. “W.K. Clifford and the Ethics of Belief,” in Unsettling Obligations: Essays on Reason, Reality and the Ethics of Belief, Stanford, CA: CSLI Publications.
  • Zagzebski, Linda, 1987. “Does Ethics Need God?” Faith and Philosophy, 4(3): 294–303.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

God, arguments for the existence of: moral arguments | James, William | Mill, John Stuart | Pascal's wager

Copyright © 2013 by
Jeff Jordan <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free