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Pregnancy, Birth, and Medicine
When philosophers have turned their attention to the ethics of reproduction, they have mostly focused on abortion, and to a lesser extent on various assisted reproductive technologies used to create a pregnancy. However, a number of thorny ethical issues can arise during the course of a continuing pregnancy, labor, and birth, and these are receiving growing attention in bioethics. This article is restricted to a discussion of such issues. (Abortion and assisted reproduction receive separate planned encyclopedia entries.)
Pregnancy and birth can be approached from many philosophical angles. Pregnancy raises interesting issues in philosophy of law, such as the appropriate legal status of the fetus and whether pregnancy ought to be legally classified as a disability. Some authors have discussed pregnancy in phenomenological terms, and others have used pregnancy and/or birth as a springboard for more theoretical reflections on the nature of selfhood, care, embodiment, and personal identity. In this article, however, we will focus on pregnancy and birth insofar as they are treated as medical processes and situated within a medical context. (The boundary around this topic is necessarily imperfect, since medical, legal, metaphysical, experiential, and other contexts intersect. For instance, one cannot responsibly examine the ethics of treating the fetus as a medical patient without at least considering the legal ramifications of doing so.) For better or for worse, in most developed countries, including the United States and Canada, normal pregnancy and birth are highly ‘medicalized’. Furthermore, it is not uncommon for women to experience problems during pregnancy that require medical care and intervention. The medical management of both ‘normal’ pregnancies and those that face complications raises a variety of complex ethical issues, and these will be our topic.
We will begin with a general discussion of pregnancy and childbirth as medicalized processes. We will then move on to three categories of ethical issues: (1) issues arising in the course of obstetrical care for women who are taken to be competent and capable of autonomous decision-making; (2) issues that arise when women are decisionally incompetent or when their right to decisional autonomy is in question; (3) issues concerning the management and communication of reproductive risk.
- 1. Medicalization
- 2. Ethical Issues in Obstetrical Care
- 3. Compromises of Pregnant Women's Autonomy
- 4. Managing and Communicating Reproductive Risk
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Pregnancy and childbirth have become increasingly medicalized in most parts of the world since the early twentieth century. That is, they are increasingly processes that—in fact and as a social ideal—are managed and overseen by medical professionals, typically involve a high degree of technological medical intervention and contact with clinics and hospitals, and are assessed by medical experts who are the authorities on their progress. Amy Mullin explains that medicalized pregnancy “involves interpreting pregnancy itself as a disruption to health that necessarily requires expert medical intervention, and thinking of pregnancy as primarily about health and illness” (Mullin 2005, 54). The concept of medicalization is helpful in making clear how this sort of insertion into a medical context is not (or not simply) a response to fixed biological facts, but rather a contingent social and institutional process. Death, depression, and short attention span are other examples of processes or conditions that have undergone intense medicalization. In general, medicalization comes with both benefits and burdens, and the medicalization of pregnancy and birth is no exception. Increasingly few obstetricians would claim that intense medicalization straightforwardly promotes good birth outcomes for mothers and infants; rather, almost all would acknowledge that while medical interventions have lessened many risks (e.g. death from placenta previa and ectopic pregnancy), other medical interventions have become routine despite having no proven benefit and some proven added risks for patients (e.g. routine fetal monitoring, normalization of the lithotomy position for childbirth, and episiotomies).
The medicalization of pregnancy and birth takes many forms. North American births typically involve a variety of technological interventions, regularly including labor-inducing drugs, spinal epidurals, fetal monitoring, and—in roughly one third of births—surgical delivery. Prior to birth, most pregnancies will involve medical interventions such as genetic testing, ultrasound screening, prescriptions to control various symptoms and risks, and—with increasing frequency—technological assistance for conception. But some dimensions of the medicalization of pregnancy do not directly involve medical interventions. Both inside and outside the clinic, pregnancy is treated as a medical event requiring intense risk management, monitoring, and appeals to expert medical knowledge: pregnant women are expected to regulate and monitor their eating, drinking, fetal kicks, weight gain, sleeping position, emotions, exposure to basic household products, exercise, sexual activity, and many other aspects of their lives according to standards established by medical professionals (Kukla 2005). Recently, there has been a vigorous mandate to involve medical professionals in helping women regulate their bodies in accordance with medical standards for minimizing reproductive risk even prior to conception. The CDC now recommends that all primary care for all women who may eventually become pregnant (including prepubescent girls) be treated as ‘preconception care’ (Kuehn 2006). A majority of women embrace at least some aspects of medicalization; many take it as part of responsible motherhood to maximize the expert management of their pregnancies and to follow risk-minimization advice carefully.
The general trend towards medicalizing pregnancy and birth has had several ethically noteworthy effects (Davis-Floyd 2004, Duden 1993, Mitchell 2001, Morgan 1998, Sherwin 1992). First, medicalization has encouraged us to imagine pregnancy and birth as inherently high-risk, pathological processes that it is irresponsible to undertake without large amounts of expert help and surveillance. Second, when medical professionals become the primary managers of reproduction, women are arguably reduced to playing passive roles in their own pregnancies and births. Third, some have argued that medicalization has rendered pregnancy in general, and labor and birth in particular, more alienating and stressful for women, burdening them with constant and complicated responsibilities for elaborate risk management and bodily and behavioral surveillance.
Among the voices pushing back against the medicalization of reproduction are those that insist that pregnancy is a ‘natural’ process that generally needs no technological assistance, and advocate ‘natural’ childbirth, free of labor-inducing and pain medications and attended by midwives rather than doctors. There are reasons for philosophers to be as wary of the ‘natural’ birth movement as of uncritical, unchecked medicalization (Kukla 2005, Lyerly 2006, Purdy 2001). Typically, its advocates do not specify a clear concept of the ‘natural’—for example, they have no account of why prescription pain medications are ‘unnatural’ while acupuncture or pain-relieving herbs are ‘natural’. Nor do they explain why the ‘natural’ is prima facie better or more ethical.
Frank Chervenak and Laurence McCullough (2006) contrast medicalization, not with an absence of technological interventions, but with the co-option of these technological interventions by the non-medical sphere of commodification. They focus on the recent upsurge in “boutique” fetal ultrasound centers that offer expectant parents “pictures of the baby”, without any pretense that these pictures serve a diagnostic medical role. They argue that such non-medical, social imaging is ethically unacceptable, as it raises concerns about informed consent, psychosocial risks to women, false senses of security in the health of the baby, and economic conflicts of interest. They conclude that medical professionals ought to retain control and authority over the use and interpretation of fetal imaging technology. Their argument could easily be extended to other technologies used in obstetrics.
Chervenak and McCullough may overestimate the authority that medical professionals are generally able to exercise over the meaning and use of technology. For instance, ultrasound imaging is already viewed by pregnant women as playing much more of a social than a medical role; whether it occurs in a medical clinic or at a boutique parlor, it is primarily understood as the first opportunity to “meet the baby”, and women are caught off guard when this event yields substantive medical information (Mitchell 2001, Kukla 2005a). All the same, their argument raises an important point: the alternative to medicalized pregnancy is not, in practice, ‘natural’ pregnancy. Instead, medicine is one institution among many that vies for control over the cultural use and significance of this technology, and pregnancy is likely to continue to be technologically intensive no matter how his struggle plays out.
In this section, we examine ethical issues that can arise in the course of obstetrical care for women whose decisional autonomy and competence are not in question.
It is becoming increasingly routine to test fetuses for a variety of genetic and other anomalies. Ultrasound screening for various morphological anomalies and the Maternal Serum Alpha-Fetoprotein Test (MSAFP) that screens for trisomy chromosomal disorders such as Down syndrome are routine parts of prenatal care; indeed, ultrasound screening does not even require formal informed consent from patients. Other tests such as amniocentesis (which diagnoses rather than screens for trisomy disorders) and genetic testing for Tay-Sachs disease are common. More arcane tests are available, and it seems clear that the range of conditions and traits for which prenatal testing is possible will continue to grow rapidly. The rise in prenatal testing allows parents and society at large new forms of control over what sorts of children are born, and it enhances the level of medicalization and surveillance during pregnancy. These tests raise a variety of ethical issues.
Because all prenatal testing is voluntary, and because the tests give prospective parents a form of increased control over their reproductive lives, many writers have seen the advent of prenatal testing as straightforwardly enhancing women's reproductive autonomy. For instance, John Robertson (1996) has argued that women should have access to any technologically available prenatal test as part of their right to reproductive autonomy and privacy. On his account, reproductive autonomy rights cover not only when and whether and how we reproduce, but what kind of child we have, and the availability of prenatal tests increases this autonomy.
There are reasons to doubt, however, that increased access to prenatal testing translates directly into an increase in women's autonomy. For example, soon after Robertson argued for women's autonomous control over which tests they use, Julian Savulescu appealed to what he dubbed the principle of “procreative beneficence” in order to argue that pregnant women are morally required to utilize available tests for serious fetal anomalies (and to abort fetuses with these anomalies), because they are required to select the child, of the possible children they could have, who is expected to have the best possible life given the available information (Savulescu 2001, 2007).
Virtually all women undergo routine ultrasound testing and accept MSAFP testing when it is offered to them. Nancy Press and Carole Browner (1995) have used qualitative evidence to argue that women tend to see the choice to accept MSAFP tests as the “responsible” choice that “protects the health” of their babies, even though the only intervention available in the case of a positive test is abortion. When a test becomes routine and medically legitimized, choosing against it can be difficult. In light of such considerations, Press and Browner and others have questioned the extent to which choices to test are really informed and autonomous, and whether women are really prepared for making the difficult decisions that they may confront after testing. Many authors have also pointed out that as testing and abortion for fetal anomalies becomes more common, women who choose not to test, or who choose to carry an impaired fetus to term, may face diminished support and increased blame for their choice (see for instance Lawson 2003). Thus the availability and routinization of prenatal testing may compromise women's autonomy in some ways while increasing it in others.
Several authors have pointed out that increased routine medical surveillance during pregnancy has put new pressure on women to shoulder the responsibility for producing socially acceptable, productive citizens, and for disciplining their own bodies and laying them open to medical intervention and surveillance in accordance with this goal (Tremain 2006; Kukla 2005). Prenatal testing joins forces with a host of other cultural pressures to portray pregnancy as an inherently risky and perilous process (Duden 1993). It can create unrealistic pressures on women to emotionally bond with or disengage from their fetuses on cue (Kukla 2007a, Kukla 2008, Mitchell 2001), and to keep their relationship to the pregnancy ‘tentative’ until tests come back negative (Katz-Rothman 1993).
A variety of ethical concerns have been raised with respect to how prenatal testing may impact future children. Some authors worry that prenatal testing helps to inculcate an inappropriate stance towards parenting: perhaps parents will come to desire or expect “designer children” built to their specifications, and this may translate into an overly controlling attitude towards their children later in life, or an expectation that children will match an advance set of idealized expectations about what they will be like (Rothschild 2005, Introduction to Parens and Asch 2000). A related concern is that when carrying pregnancy to term becomes conditional upon the fetus having certain traits, our love for our children once they are born may become similarly conditional. At the moment, almost all prenatal testing screens or diagnoses well-defined medical disorders such as Down syndrome and Tay-Sachs disease, but, the reasoning goes, these threats will become yet more acute if we develop and make available prenatal tests for traits that are not clearly disorders, such as homosexuality, aggression, or a propensity to obesity. It is important to note, however, that such reservations are not backed up by any empirical evidence showing distinctive parenting styles in parents who undergo or desire prenatal testing.
Prenatal testing is often presented, in medical practice and in some bioethical literature, as protecting the well-being of children. It is often argued that it is unfair to bring a child with a disability into the world if we can prevent doing so (i.e. Savulescu 2001, Davis 2001). However, this claim faces the much discussed “nonidentity problem”, which finds its origins in Parfit (1984) and has been adapted to the reproductive ethics context by many authors (e.g., Brock 1996) (see the entry on “The Nonidentity Problem”). In short, the problem is that you cannot harm a non-existent person by bringing it into existence, unless the person's life is so dreadful that nonexistence is preferable. That life with a disability or chronic illness is predictably worse than non-existence is not plausible for most of the defects for which we test—notably including Down syndrome, which is the most common target for testing and abortion, and for which a happy disposition is actually a characteristic trait. Hence, typically, bringing a child into existence cannot count as harming it.
This may sound like a straightforward point, but it leads quickly to results that many find philosophically puzzling or implausible. For example, if a woman is carrying twins and requires a selective abortion, and one of the fetuses is known to have a serious anomaly while the other does not, many people feel it would be cruel to choose to keep the fetus with the anomaly. And yet, the fetus with the anomaly does not itself have the option of becoming an anomaly-free child; it will either become a child with a disability or not exist at all. We can be doing this child no harm by choosing it over its healthy twin, and its twin, if it counts as a being that can be harmed at all by being aborted, is not harmed in any extra way in virtue of having a twin who will live with an anomaly. Even more counterintuitively: imagine that a woman is taking a medication that is almost sure to cause substantial limb deformities if she gets pregnant while taking it, but that leaves her system completely within 24 hours. Imagine also that she takes her last dose on Tuesday morning. She wants a child, and finds herself with an opportunity to have unprotected sex on Tuesday evening. She will have the same opportunity on Wednesday. If she has sexual intercourse and conceives on Tuesday, her child will almost certainly suffer from limb deformities. If she waits 24 hours, her child suffers no unusual risks. Most of us feel that it would be callous and unethical of her to have unprotected sex on Tuesday. But why, exactly? Any child she conceives on Tuesday will have limb deformities, but its other ‘option’ is nonexistence, and limb deformities, while burdensome perhaps, certainly don't make a life not worth living. She does not wrong the child by having unprotected sex on Tuesday. Nor does she harm any nonexistent child that she might have brought into existence, limbs intact, on Wednesday, for you cannot harm a nonexistent being.
Indeed, even going out of one's way to create a disabled child (through genetic engineering, selective abortion, or preimplantation genetic diagnosis) cannot count as harming the child, since that particular child has no options for existing other than as disabled. (This issue has most often come up with respect to deaf parents, who sometimes prefer to have a deaf child.) And yet, many writers have the strong intuition that intentionally creating a disabled child is a wrong done to the child—for instance, Dena Davis (2001) argues that since disabilities generally close down possible ways of living, intentionally creating a disabled child violates the child's right to an open future. The non-identity problem forces us to search for an explanation of what sort of wronging or rights violation this could be, given that this child could have no non-disabled future open to her to start with.
In response to the non-identity problem, we must either conclude that (1) indeed there is no wrong done by bringing someone into the world in a way that compromises her opportunities for flourishing (Heyd 2009), or that (2) the wrong involved is not one done to the child—for instance, it might be wrong on roughly consequentialist grounds (Brock 1995), because it promotes problematic values or reflects unacceptable motivations (Kumar 2003), or because it fails to promote the interests of an alternative possible child (Holtug 2009), or (3) that the nonidentity problem is illusory, and that someone can indeed be harmed by being brought into existence (Harman 2004). Benatar (2006) defends the extreme view that we are always harmed by coming into existence and hence that all childbearing is immoral. (See the separate encyclopedia entry on The Nonidentity Problem for more details.)
Many have worried that the increasing routinization of prenatal testing is tantamount to eugenics. As the term is paradigmatically used, eugenics involves an intentional, top-down planned social program for engineering an entire population so as to eliminate or universalize particular traits. John Robertson (1996, 2003), who as we saw defends a strong version of the right to procreative liberty, defends prenatal testing against charges that it should be understood as ethically equivalent to eugenics by emphasizing the role of individual, autonomous parental choices in controlling this technology. However, others have argued that as our culture increasingly values and takes for granted the power to control whether our offspring have particular traits, a kind of bottom-up eugenics will be instituted. Declining control and accepting devalued traits in our children will become a less socially acceptable choice for prospective parents, and some homogenization of the gene pool and elimination of diversity will emerge regardless of whether this is anyone's planned agenda (Tremain 2006, Rothschild 2005). Furthermore, while individual parents may be free to decide whether or not to avail themselves of tests, which tests we make available will almost surely reflect and entrench existing social norms that tell us what count as valuable and disvaluable traits. Thus, the argument goes, individual decisions to use these tests will collectively instantiate a eugenic project of designing a population that reflects these values, even if this project does not belong to any centralized intentional agent. On the other hand, it seems that we already engage in such ‘bottom-up’ eugenics by taking steps to have children with valued traits: pregnant women take folic acid in order to avoid having a child with Spina Bifida, we try to find successful and attractive mates, and so forth. Hence we need to settle whether making prenatal testing widely available introduces eugenics in a new and problematic way, and if so, whether this worry is sufficient to override its advantages.
There are additional reasons to worry about the distortion of the gene pool that may result from long-term, routine prenatal testing. In a classic paper, “Moral Issues in Human Genetics”, Ruth Macklin (1977) points out that homogenizing or otherwise manipulating the gene pool may have dangerous effects that we do not presently understand and can't foresee. We don't know enough about how specific genes and mutations work to understand how they may be advantageous or disadvantageous at the population level. Furthermore, in eliminating a particular individual with some specific trait, we might be accidentally eliminating someone who has other traits that would have made her an exceptionally valuable member of society and contributor to the gene pool. (What if we had selectively aborted Abraham Lincoln in virtue of his Marfan syndrome, she asks? The fact that Lincoln probably did not have Marfan syndrome is beside the point.)
Assuming that we believe that some, but not all, prenatal tests should continue to be available, at least in certain circumstances, we need to ask a host of more specific questions. We need to decide which traits and conditions we ought to be testing for (perhaps incurable and painful life-shortening diseases such as Tay-Sachs; perhaps a broader set of traits) and which traits it is permissible to test for (perhaps less serious conditions such as Down syndrome and Huntington's disease; perhaps a wide variety of non-medical traits). We need to settle which, if any, of these tests will be covered by insurance (as prenatal testing for Down syndrome, ultrasound screening, and other tests currently are), and how we want to manage the consequences of prenatal testing for later insurability. We need to decide whether procreative liberty and privacy rights give parents the right to test their fetuses for what we might consider morally unacceptable reasons—for example, in order to abort their fetus if it has a ‘gay gene’, should such a thing be discovered. We also need to consider the consequences of prenatal testing for genes that probabilistically raise the risk of developing a condition (such as obesity or breast cancer) rather than determining that it will be present. Finally, we must decide how we will manage and control the genetic information that results from prenatal tests, which can have significant consequences for other, genetically related family members who might have a strong stake in knowing or in not knowing this information. (All of these questions are receiving vigorous discussion in bioethics—a classic source that discusses all of them is (Buchanan, et al 2000)).
The disability critique of prenatal testing constitutes a large, loosely bound cluster of arguments that draw upon disability rights theory and activism in order to critically question the increased routinization of prenatal testing and selective abortion (Parens and Asch 2000). In general terms, the disability rights critique raises the worry that prenatal testing and selective abortion risk further stigmatizing disabled people, reducing them to a single defining trait, and harming disability communities. It points out that the offer of a prenatal test for a particular trait is never neutral, but rather implies that a reasonable person might wish to know whether her fetus has this trait, and that this information might reasonably be the basis for a decision not to continue the pregnancy. Although many contributors to the disability rights critique of prenatal testing consider themselves firmly in favor of general abortion rights, they share at least a prima facie worry about the ethics of aborting fetuses on the basis of tests for future disability.
The disability critique of prenatal testing encompasses at least four types of arguments:
Entrenchment of the Medical Model of Disability
Disability theorists have distinguished between the medical and the social model of disability. According to the medical model, a disability is a pathology or impairment of an individual body, in virtue of which the disabled person is less able to perform various functions than the able-bodied person. Accordingly, since it is the job of medicine to fix bodies or at least minimize the undesirable effects of their medical conditions, it is appropriate for doctors to fix or mitigate disability when they can. According to the social model, on the other hand, disability is inherently a relational property: it concerns a more problematic than normal fit between a body and its social and material environment. Someone who used a wheelchair in an environment in which all spaces accessible to any normal person are wheelchair accessible, the argument goes, would be no more disabled than is a resident of a sprawling American suburb who cannot obtain food or make a living without driving her car. Myopia was a serious, even a life-threatening disability in the hunter-gatherer era, but in the age of easily accessible effective eyeglasses most of us never even think to conceptualize our myopia as a disability.
If disability is a relational misfit between body and environment, then mitigating or eliminating disability can be accomplished by changing the body, the environment, or both. On this view, making spaces accessible to people with different means of mobility, ensuring that everyone has access to text-based communication options, and working to remove social stigmas concerning abnormal anatomy, for example, literally lessen or remove disabilities such as mobility impairment, deafness, and cleft palate rather than merely accommodating them. (This is not to say that all disabilities are such that we could design an environment that would substantially mitigate them.) In the proper environment, what might otherwise be a disability can just be a difference, a human variation that can enhance the diversity of our culture. Once we accept this, then we are faced with a choice when it comes to managing a particular disability: we can try to change bodies, social and material environments, or a combination of these, and it is an open question in each case which is the most effective and ethical approach.
The routinization of prenatal testing arguably institutionalizes the idea that disability is a medical condition detected at the level of the individual body. Furthermore, insofar as the standard response to prenatal testing is abortion, it entrenches the practice of ‘fixing’ disability through a medical intervention—specifically, the extreme intervention of simply eliminating the disabled body. According to the disability rights critique, this limits our ability to imagine addressing and alleviating disability at the social level. Yet in at least some cases, social approaches to disability have proven enormously effective. Consider Down syndrome, which is the main condition for which prenatal testing has become routine: Due to increased integration into families and schools, better support and education, changing expectations, and other social changes, people with Down syndrome now often have life spans and a level of independence and educational achievement that were inconceivable fifty years ago. We cannot assume that prenatal testing and abortion should be the default ‘solution’ to disability.
Weakening the Disability Community
To the extent that prenatal testing and abortion for a particular condition become routinized, there will be fewer people born with that condition. Insofar as prenatal testing and abortion are generally cheaper and easier than social interventions, over the long term they may come to be seen as the only responsible and socially supported option. This threatens the quality of life and availability of resources for those who remain. They may be faced with increased stigmatization, less possibility for community, and less tolerance and understanding. The rarer a condition is, the less social and political motivation will exist to provide resources, support, tailored educational activities, and the like for those who have it.
Our Current Counseling Practices Distort Decision-Making
Currently, a large majority of pregnant women who are offered standard prenatal screens and tests accept them, and the majority of those who receive abnormal test results proceed to abort. However, current counseling surrounding the tests does not include any exposure to people who have the tested-for conditions or any discussion of the social resources available for families with children with the conditions. Furthermore, even supposedly nondirective counseling often uses stigmatizing language to talk about disability and about the choice not to abort a fetus with a disabling trait (Asch 2000). Different forms of counseling might enable more informed decision-making and yield fewer choices to test and fewer choices to abort after testing. Bonnie Steinbock (2007) argues that prenatal testing practices for some conditions could be geared towards helping parents prepare for the birth of a child with that condition, rather than framed as preludes to a decision about abortion.
The Expressivist Argument
This argument holds that any given case of prenatal testing, particularly as linked with selective abortion, has expressive meaning for everyone with that condition. Abby Lippman writes: “That the birth of certain babies should be avoided is announced merely by making testing available” (1994, 24). If we abort a fetus on the basis of a single trait, this symbolically suggests that not only this fetus's life but the life of anyone who has this trait is not worth living or preserving.
In response, James Lindemann Nelson (2000) tells the story of choosing to get a vasectomy after his third child. He argues it seems implausible to understand his act as having an expressive significance that devalues all fourth-children. Rather, his act may just ‘mean’ that, in context, having a fourth child is not the best choice for his family. Whenever we decide not to have a child, he argues, we always do so based on some specific features it would have, such as adding to a large family with strained resources. Likewise, he claims, choosing not to carry a pregnancy to term after a prenatal test revealing a particular condition may reflect a judgment about particular circumstances rather than expressing a general attitude towards people with that condition.
Adrienne Asch (2000) responds that one cannot relevantly compare the property of being a fourth child to the property of having a specific disabling trait, because the latter is an inherent rather than a relational property of the child. Hence to abort on the basis of the disabling trait is to reject that kind of person in a different and stronger way. But Asch's response seems to push against one of the main points of the social model of disability, which she otherwise defends: the view that disabilities are also relational rather than inherent properties. It seems we might decide against bearing a child who has a property that in context will make that child more difficult to raise (whether it is deafness, a chromosomal disorder, or fourth-childness), and we can do this without devaluing all people with that property in any decontextualized way.
One general concern about the disability critique of prenatal testing is that it asks too much from prospective parents. Even if there are good reasons to worry about the impact of widespread testing, it is hard to deny that for many people, given the level of support and acceptance available for families with disabled children, raising a child with a disability can be a serious challenge. Asking parents to take on this challenge so as to promote larger social goals may be unreasonable. Another concern is that it seems nearly impossible to draw a line in practice between acceptable and unacceptable tests. Nearly all scholars agree that testing for Tay-Sachs or other diseases that lead to a short life filled with intense suffering and no hope of a cure is ethically acceptable, and nearly all agree that testing for vanity traits such as eye color would be unacceptable. But when it comes to deciding which conditions are ‘serious’ enough to warrant the availability of prenatal tests, there is little agreement. Anywhere this line is drawn risks stigmatizing those with ‘serious’ conditions and belittling the challenges faced by those with ‘unserious’ conditions (Parens and Asch 2000, Introduction). It also risks treating the ‘seriousness’ of a condition as a fixed medical fact rather than as a potentially socially malleable state of affairs.
As discussed above, birth has been heavily medicalized in contemporary North America, while at the same time a vocal ‘natural birth’ movement has pushed against medicalization. The disagreement between these two camps often circulates around whether birth is best thought of as a dangerous and abnormal process best managed by medical experts in an institutional setting, or as a ‘natural’ or ‘normal’ bodily function that requires formal medical intervention only in unusual cases. Proponents of ‘natural’ childbirth point out that current norms of hospital birth often result in a cascade of interventions (with the majority of births involving labor inducing drugs and fetal monitoring, for instance, both of which in turn raise the chance that the labor will end with a cesarean section). In contrast, proponents of the medical model of birth argue that while serious complications during labor are reasonably rare, they can occur quickly and their effects can be catastrophic, and it is simply good risk reasoning to have the expertise and resources of high-tech medicine available during labor.
There is no clear scientific method for assessing the overall benefits or detriments of normalizing highly technologically mediated, medicalized birth. Most of the standard interventions during labor have never been tested in any systematic fashion, but are rather part of a folk culture of medicine. The rhetorical valuation of either ‘natural’ or medically managed birth as safer, more responsible, more maternal, etc. can function to enforce a set of social norms that are for the most part cut free from scientific evidence about the medical soundness of various birth decisions and paths (Kukla 2008, Lyerly 2006).
Lyerly (2006) argues that the problem with modern birthing practices is not the use of technology or the lack of it per se, for technology itself has no inherent meaning or import. Rather, the problem lies in a culture of birth that is expert-centered rather than patient-centered. She draws on phenomenological work by Sandra Bartky in order to show how “female shame is reinforced by dominant strains of birthing practice—both hospital-based obstetrics and midwifery” (Ibid, 103). She writes, “Analyses that focus on models of birthing rather than women's emotional lives fail to capture the substance of the insult that women have recently incurred in giving birth. In holding technology culpable, these analyses are not only inaccurate but also threaten to disenfranchise women for whom sensitively applied medical practices can enhance both the safety and agency so important to a good birth” (Ibid, p. 117). When misused, technology can subjugate women to medical authority, undercut their sense of dignity and control, and alienate them from the birth process. But it can also be used to enhance women's agency (such as when pain medication enables a woman to maintain her dignity and presence of mind at her birth, or when a scheduled cesarean allows a woman to feel confident that she will have her partner who is about to deploy overseas present at her birth). Meanwhile, a relatively ‘natural’ birth that does not get caught up in a cascade of medical interventions can be empowering. But natural childbirth advocates often paint an idealized picture of how birth is supposed to proceed (see also Crossley 2007), and treat ‘success’ at natural childbirth as a mark of maternal character (see also Kukla 2008). Women who for various reasons—including pre-existing medical conditions or various complications during labor—do not manage to have a vaginal delivery free of pain medication and medical intervention may feel that they have ‘failed’ to give birth properly.
Ethical debate surrounds when and how women ought to be able to choose to have a cesarean delivery for non-medical reasons. Because there is no validated and universal medical code to indicate such deliveries, we do not know whether elective cesareans (typically referred to as Cesarean Deliveries on Maternal Request, or CDMRs) significantly impact the overall cesarean rate or are a rare novelty. Nevertheless, in light of several notorious cases of celebrity CDMRs, the issue has sparked intense controversy. Women who choose cesarean deliveries are often stereotyped as “too posh to push”, and seen as privileging their own convenience over their children's well-being and their maternal responsibilities. And yet, a 2006 NIH State of the Science conference assessed the available scientific evidence concerning the short and long term risks to women and infants of vaginal and surgical delivery, and concluded that there was insufficient evidence to issue a recommendation concerning the relative safety of planned vaginal and cesarean births. The most comprehensive meta-analyses reveal different risks in each case that are hard to commensurate and a dearth of high-quality data. Thus from a narrowly medical evidence-based point of view there is no justification for recommending one approach to delivery over the other (Minkoff 2006).
There is a clear sense in which expanding women's voluntary access to cesarean deliveries increases women's autonomy: it gives women more options. Some of the ethical literature on this issue (Minkoff and Chervenak 2003, Schwartz 2004) takes it as obvious that incorporating CDMR into obstetrical practice would enhance patient autonomy, and then asks whether this advantage is offset by the harm of unnecessary surgery. But others have argued that autonomy consists of more than choice, and that in social context, making CDMR routinely available might actually impede women's autonomy (Bergeron 2007, Kukla et al 2009). In a context where doctors have high cognitive and social authority, and technological intervention and management are associated with safety, the offer of CDMR will not be a neutral offer but one that has performative force and a normative valence: it will not merely report on an option, but may well alter the woman's preferences and her understanding of what counts as a socially sanctioned choice. Furthermore, the act of offering CDMR may itself contribute to the normalization of technologically intensive birth and medicalization. If, over time, cesarean section is routinely offered as an option, then it may become the norm, as women will feel that the more predictable and expertly managed option is the more responsible choice. And, as cesarean deliveries become increasingly normalized, obstetricians' skills at vaginal delivery might attenuate, in turn creating more need for cesarean deliveries and eventually perhaps making vaginal delivery a choice out of reach for most women (Little et al 2008).
Medical care for pregnant women generally impacts fetuses, whether by design or as a side effect. Likewise, direct attempts to provide medical assistance to fetuses inevitably impact the women in whose bodies they reside. A recurring issue in obstetrical ethics concerns whether and when the fetus should be conceptualized as a patient in its own right. Doing so has substantive and complex implications for doctors, who have distinctive duties to their patients, as well as other possible legal and ethical consequences.
In several papers, Chervenak and McCullough have argued that late-term, viable fetuses ought to be conceived of as patients who are owed beneficence and respect for their (future) autonomy. A pre-viable fetus, in their view, should become a patient if and only if the pregnant woman autonomously chooses to grant it such status. Once the fetus is a patient, they argue, the doctor has a duty to try to protect its well-being and balance its needs against the needs of the pregnant woman (e.g., Chervenak and McCullough 1996). They point out that they are not committed to viewing fetuses as persons. The question of whether the fetus is a patient is distinct from (though in various ways intertwined with) the well-worn question of whether it is a person. It is by no means obvious that only people can be patients, nor that all people become patients just by being impacted by a medical procedure.
Nevertheless, many feminist bioethicists (i.e., Duden 1993, Lyerly and Mahowald 2001) have been concerned that conceiving of the fetus as a separate patient tends to imaginatively bolster the personification of the fetus, as well as giving it a practical status that ought to be reserved for persons. Furthermore, understanding the fetus as a patient in its own right encourages conceiving of the mother and fetus as beings with entirely separate interests, which may then be in conflict as easily as aligned. While at times the interests of the woman and the fetus may diverge, typically these interests are inextricably related, both because expectant mothers usually care intensely about fetal well-being, and because protecting the health of the pregnant woman is typically the best way to protect the health of the fetus (Mattingly 1992, Lyerly, Little and Faden 2008).
Maternal-fetal surgery to correct serious fetal anomalies such as severe Spina Bifida is a small but growing experimental field of medicine. Until fairly recently, such procedures were known as ‘fetal surgery’—a label that made it invisible that in all fetal surgeries the pregnant woman underwent invasive surgery herself. Early assessments of ‘fetal surgery’ considered only the risks and potential benefits to fetuses, while the medical consequences for women were understudied and received short shrift in the informed consent process (Lyerly and Mahowald 2001). At a 2000 conference on ‘fetal surgery’ at Vanderbilt University, Susan Wolf suggested the switch to the term ‘maternal-fetal surgery’, and this terminology was adopted by the NIH, and by many—though not all—practitioners and commentators (Ibid). Lyerly and Mahowald argue that even the switch to conceiving the surgeries as involving two patients whose well-being must be weighed separately is insufficient; rather, they think, we should understand maternal and fetal well-being and interests as tightly intertwined, and the woman as the sole patient.
In this section, we take up ethical issues that arise in the medical management of pregnant women who are severely decisionally impaired, as well as the question of whether it is ever ethically justifiable to override a pregnant woman's autonomous refusal of medical intervention for the sake of the well-being of her fetus.
When a patient is decisionally impaired or incapacitated, ethical dilemmas concerning medical decision-making arise: Should the patient be included in decision-making in a limited way, to the best of her abilities, or should paternalistic decision-making take over? Should a proxy decision-maker make choices on the basis of the patient's best interest, or by simulating as best she can the autonomous decision that the patient would have made, had she been in a position to make one? Such issues are familiar in the context of end of life care and care for children and the cognitively impaired.
When a pregnant woman is decisionally impaired or incompetent, however, there are extra layers of ethical complexity to contend with, because her treatment typically affects not only her, but also her child-to be. The developing fetus clearly has welfare (or at least future welfare) but no capacity for autonomous choice, and we have no formula for combining its interests and moral claims with those of the mother. For extra complication, the well-being of the child-to-be is typically not independent of the interests of its mother. Thus doctors must balance autonomy-based and beneficence-based obligations to the pregnant woman, along with beneficence-based obligations to the fetus (Coverdale, et al 2004). When a pregnant woman is decisionally competent, we strongly privilege her right to make final treatment decisions in complicated cases where her interests may conflict with those of her future child (although see section 3.2 below). But when the woman has diminished or no autonomy, the situation is murkier.
Cases have arisen in which a pregnant woman has zero decisional capacity and no hope of future agency, for instance when she is in a long-term persistent vegetative state or has suffered frontal brain death and is being kept alive artificially. Is it ethical to keep her alive for the sole purpose of continuing the pregnancy (and who should make this determination and how)? In 1992, a pregnant German woman suffered brain death in a car accident that did no apparent damage to the fetus, and debate ensued over whether to keep her alive artificially so that the ‘Erlanger baby’ could continue to gestate (Anstötz 1993). (The woman miscarried while the debate was still in progress.) In these cases, questions about how to include the woman's voice or respect her agency are off the table, and her welfare interests, if any, are minimal. She has no conscious experience or future narrative to protect. We may, however, believe that she still has interests in dignity and in having her former narrative and values respected. Some feel that it is unacceptable to use her body as a mere means by continuing her life solely for its incubation function; others will argue that if the father-to-be wants to raise his child, it is callous to deny the child-to-be its chance at life and the father his chance at parenthood in virtue of abstract concerns about instrumentalism and respect, given that the woman will experience no extra suffering, no thwarting of her autonomous preferences (assuming she left no advance directive), etc. Anstötz (1993) argues that the fetus has a right to life sufficiently strong to mandate that the woman be kept alive to enable the fetus to become viable. Fost (1994) argues that a brain-dead pregnant woman ought not be counted as a person with interests relevant to the moral calculation, and he urges moving moral attention away from the ‘interests’ of the fetus as well. Instead, he urges that the next of kin ought to have the right to decide when to remove life support, as they would in normal cases of non-pregnant patients.
Hilde Lindemann (writing as Hilde Lindemann Nelson, 1994) and Laura Purdy (1994) argue that keeping a brain dead woman alive for the singular purpose of continuing her pregnancy is problematic. Lindemann argues that the woman no longer exists as a person of the sort that can have agent-relative duties towards her fetus. Furthermore, keeping her alive as an incubator grossly misrepresents the significance of pregnancy, reducing it to a passive biological process rather than a creative, cooperative process involving the woman's agency. Similarly, Purdy (1994) argues that such postmortem pregnancies contribute to a problematic view of pregnant women as mere fetal ‘containers’. On the other hand, in these cases pregnancy is clearly not a creative or active project for the woman, and, while it may be symbolically problematic not to acknowledge women's creative, agential role in typical pregnancies, it seems odd to argue that we should prevent pregnancies that do not fit this typical profile from existing in order to symbolically protect the myth that they always do so.
Purdy also points out that sustaining such pregnancies is ethically problematic because it involves extreme interventions on women's bodies without their consent. Both Lindemann and Purdy question whether such extraordinary and expensive medical interventions, aimed at saving a fetus who is not yet a baby, are a just or reasonable use of medical resources (especially if the fetus stands a low chance of survival and normal development). Lindemann worries, furthermore, that such extraordinary measures help enforce an image of the fetus as already a person with a claim on resources as large as or even larger than that of existing persons.
Pregnant women with limited capacity for autonomous agency and decision-making (due to cognitive disability, mental illness, drug use, etc.) still have the right to have their (limited) autonomy respected and fostered to the largest extent possible; at the same time, both they and their future children must be protected somehow from harms that bad choices stemming from decisional impairment could cause. To complicate matters further, such women are often particularly socially vulnerable and vulnerable to manipulation, and so protecting their agency and well-being as well as the well-being of their future children can be a delicate negotiation. Furthermore, physicians and family members may not be neutral parties when it comes to assessing a pregnant woman's level of decisional competence: if they disagree with her expressed desires concerning her own care (for example, her opposition to abortion, or refusal of medication or bed rest) or believe her choices put her fetus at unacceptable risk, they may be motivated to overestimate her level of decisional impairment, thereby justifying paternalistically overriding her expressed wishes.
Douglas Diekema (2003) points out that decisional capacity is not a threshold capacity, and it may fluctuate with timing, context, and type of decision. Hence, in settling on how much paternalism is appropriate in managing a decisionally impaired patient, doctors have a responsibility to try to find a time and approach that will promote and assist rather than foreclose the possibility of the patient's meaningful autonomous participation in medical decision making. Likewise, Coverdale, et al (2004) argue that respecting the autonomy of decisionally compromised patients involves actively working towards removing or diminishing circumstantial and reversible barriers to participation in decision-making. This might include education, creative forms of involvement in decision-making from loved ones, postponing a medical decision until after psychotropic medication has had time to become effective, accommodating a patient's special needs for an environment conducive to making a decision, etc. The presence of a fetus should not serve as ground for detracting from our duty to protect a pregnant woman's right to participate in decisions about her own care to whatever extent she is capable (which is not to say that paternalistic interventions on behalf of her or her fetus's welfare are never appropriate for decisionally impaired women).
When a pregnant woman refuses an intervention that doctors judge provides a substantial benefit to her fetus, is overriding her refusal ever ethically justified? It is typically a sacrosanct principle in medical ethics that patients have an absolute right to refuse medical interventions, including life-saving interventions, if they make an autonomous, informed, competent choice to do so. However, in the case of pregnant women, this principle has been questioned and sometimes violated by force in the name of protecting the fetus. Examples have included forced cesarean deliveries, mandatory HIV testing, and life-saving blood transfusions performed despite religious objections.
The 1987 case of Angela Carder, a 27-year-old woman who had cancer that had gone into remission but recurred during her pregnancy, brought these issues to a head. Fully competent, Carder made clear that she wanted everything possible done to save her life. However, during the 25th week of gestation, it became clear that Carder was dying. George Washington University Medical Center, where she was a patient, tried to insist upon an early cesarean section delivery in order to save her fetus. She refused the intervention, which was nearly certain to kill her, with the support of her family, husband, and doctors, but the hospital obtained a court order and forced the delivery. Both Carder and her extremely premature baby survived the operation only very briefly. In 1990, the D.C. Court of Appeals posthumously vacated the court-ordered cesarean section, holding that Carder had the right to make health care decisions for herself and her fetus, and that only in the most exceptional circumstances should a pregnant woman's right to refuse interventions be called into question (Thornton and Paltrow, 1991).
Legal and ethical consensus in light of the Carder case is that pregnant women, as autonomous adults and full citizens, do not lose their constitutional rights to privacy and bodily integrity in light of their pregnancy (Pollitt 1990). Even when a fetus's survival depends on a woman undergoing some intervention, she can no more be compelled to consent to it than anyone else could be compelled to undergo a medical intervention to save another person. In no other circumstances do we take anyone to be compelled to undergo medical treatments even if he is the sole contender for saving a life (for example if he is the only known match for a bone marrow transfusion or organ donation); pregnant women ought not to be an exception. Some authors have expressed concern that forcing interventions on pregnant women for the sake of the fetus contributes to our cultural imagining of the fetus as a full-fledged person who functions as a patient with rights and medical needs equivalent to the woman's own (Nelson and Milliken 1988, Roth 2003). In fact, since we do not force medical interventions on anyone in order to save another fully developed, rights-bearing person, a double standard that allows forced interventions on pregnant women seems to enshrine the fetus as more valuable and deserving of protection than born persons (Minkoff and Paltrow 2004).
Even if forced interventions on competent pregnant women are virtually never justified, there may be good moral reasons why pregnant women ought not to refuse various interventions. One might argue that, at least in the case of voluntary pregnancy, the pregnant woman has taken on a special duty to protect the well-being of her future child in continuing to be pregnant. Savulescu (2007a) argues for a ‘duty of easy rescue’—regardless of whether the fetus counts as a person, he claims, a pregnant woman has a duty to allow acts that do not significantly harm her while protecting her future child from significant harm (see also Draper 1996). Chervenak and McCullough (1991) argue that sometimes refusal of treatment can be expected to result in further medical complications, and hence constitutes an implicit positive demand for alternative treatment that may be more costly. While we typically take refusals of treatment to be sacrosanct, our respect for autonomy does not extend to recognizing an unlimited right to demand particular interventions at will. If a pregnant woman's refusal of a treatment that would stave off premature birth, for instance, implicitly involves demand for expensive care for her premature infant, it is unclear that she has the moral right to refuse treatment. On the face of it, this argument is not specific to pregnant women. However, non-pregnant citizens who shoulder extra risk by refusing treatment could in principle commit to refraining from using future medical resources, whereas pregnant women arguably have no moral or legal right to do so on behalf of their future children. Hence they may have special moral responsibilities not to refuse interventions.
On the other hand, as we learned from Judith Jarvis Thomson's classic (1971) analysis of abortion rights (among other sources), the question of the ethical responsibilities of pregnant women ought to remain separable from the question of what they can be compelled to do by law, medical authority, or brute force (Draper 1996, Nelson and Milliken 1988). Even if pregnant women sometimes have a moral duty not to refuse interventions, this does not count against the conclusion that, as full citizens, they have the same privacy and bodily integrity rights as all other citizens, even when their exercise of these rights involves morally problematic behavior.
In the wake of the Carder ruling, cases of forcing a manifestly competent pregnant woman to undergo an intervention over her objections have been rare. However, forced interventions are still sometimes performed on women who are vulnerable due to poverty, mental illness, immigration status, racism, etc. (Roth 2003, Roberts 1996). These vulnerable women, whose contact with the health care system is more likely to be fragmented, are more open to being assessed as incompetent when their expressed decision differs sharply from the judgment of medical professionals responsible for their care. Social marginalization can create the appearance of incompetence, and it can also genuinely hamper competence when it comes to negotiating physician-patient interactions.
Cases involving possible forced interventions on pregnant women are often framed as cases of ‘maternal-fetal conflict’, in which doctors or courts must adjudicate between the wishes of the woman and the well-being or rights of the fetus (Draper 1996, Van Bogaert 2006). Such a framing positions the fetus as in need of rescuing from a callous mother. Several authors have argued, however, that we ought to presume that almost all expectant mothers are concerned about the well-being of their future children and do not take an adversarial stance towards them (Minkoff and Paltrow 2004, Finn 1998). In this light, we ought to first try to understand disagreements between pregnant women and their doctors over potential interventions in terms of different understandings of what would best promote maternal and fetal well-being. Such disagreements are perhaps better cast as maternal-physician conflicts than as maternal-fetal conflicts. Furthermore, the fact that vulnerable women are most frequently the ones that find themselves in an adversarial relationship with their caregivers suggests that we ought to look for social factors that create miscommunication and conflict rather than simply casting such women as bad mothers whose fetuses must be protected from their selfish decisions (Finn 1998).
Many commentators have pointed out that we live in a ‘risk society’ (Beck 1992). The language of risk pervades our public discourse. Cost-benefit analyses serve as paradigms of rationality and hallmarks of efficiency, and we frame many social problems as exercises in risk management. While most pregnancies in developed countries yield healthy mothers and babies, pregnancy unavoidably involves risk for women and fetuses alike. Women generally care deeply about the well-being of their future children, and hence are typically concerned with managing reproductive risk. More broadly, as a social body, we have a strong collective interest in the health and welfare of our future community members, and hence reproductive risk is a matter of public concern.
Pregnancy is portrayed in our culture as fraught with risk on all sides, while at the same time even minimal risks to fetuses are treated as intolerable (Kukla 2005, Lyerly et al 2007, Lyerly et al 2009). Furthermore, many have argued that pregnant women (as opposed to policy makers, fathers, industrial manufacturers, etc.) are disproportionately burdened with the responsibility for managing reproductive risk (i.e., Armstrong 2003, Kukla 2005). The combined force of these factors is that pregnant women are often expected to survey and discipline virtually all aspects of their bodies and lives, from each bite they eat, to which products they use, where they work and recreate, how they lie in bed, which emotions they feel, and much more, in accordance with elaborate, ever-proliferating, ever-changing rules of risk minimization (Duden 1993, Lupton 1998, Kukla 2005, Lyerly et al 2009).
In managing and communicating about reproductive risk, we face several challenges. First and perhaps most obviously, while pregnant women and fetuses are inextricably physically intertwined, the risks and potential benefits to each of them of various actions, situations, and interventions are typically different and can even be in tension. Managing risk can be especially complicated and ethically charged given this entwinement of two different sets of risks and potential benefits. Second, as will be discussed below, there are various reasons why good-quality evidence about reproductive risk is hard to come by, and hence we often must make decisions about how to manage such risk under a great deal of uncertainty. Third, features of our cultural context can distort our perceptions of reproductive risk. Such distortions become ethically relevant to the extent that they either lead us to decisions that are not, as they purport to be, in the best interests of babies or their mothers, or that place inappropriate burdens and responsibilities on pregnant women that are not responsive to reality. The following sections survey some ethical issues that highlight these barriers to high-quality reasoning about reproductive risk.
Pregnant women who use alcohol and drugs violate deeply held cultural visions of appropriate motherhood. We tend to frame any level of drinking or drug use during pregnancy as indicating serious maternal irresponsibility. The United States and Canada advocate total abstinence from drinking during pregnancy, or even when becoming pregnant is a possibility. The United Kingdom and other countries have recently followed suit. And yet, while we know that alcoholic women, particularly those who smoke and experience social stress such as poverty, are at risk for giving birth to babies with Fetal Alcohol Syndrome, the risk to fetuses from light to moderate maternal drinking as part of a healthy lifestyle is merely theoretical. Researchers have repeatedly failed to find any concrete evidence of fetal harm from such drinking (Armstrong 2003, Lee 2009).
It is tempting to think that even if light drinking or drug use poses only a small teratogenic risk, women are morally obligated to refrain from it. For instance, Elizabeth Harman (1999) claims that any smoking during a pregnancy one plans to carry to term is “morally impermissible”, and Gilmore (2008) argues that women who are or might become pregnant ought to abstain from drinking any alcohol. But we cannot, of course, ask pregnant women to abstain completely from all voluntary activities carrying some fetal risk, for they would be paralyzed into inactivity (which would itself come with some risk). Indeed, we are not nearly so draconian in our attitudes towards other, more clearly risky behaviors during pregnancy, such as driving a car. Elizabeth Armstrong (2003) and Janet Golden (2006) have argued that widespread social anxiety over Fetal Alcohol Syndrome constitutes a ‘moral panic’ over mothers engaging in what we imagine as self-indulgent or decadent behavior, rather than an evidence-based response to risk. Focusing on the consumption of alcohol or drugs as a particularly pernicious form of risk-taking seems to have more to do with images and ideologies of maternal self-sacrifice, purity, and decadence than with rational concern for fetal well-being.
The ethical issues are quite different when we turn to pregnant women who seriously abuse alcohol and other drugs known to cause major damage to fetuses. Clearly this is undesirable behavior that we would like to prevent if possible, and if a woman can stop this behavior, then she is ethically required to do so. Many states have tried to prosecute pregnant drug users for separate crimes beyond illicit drug use, such as child abuse, but such charges have rarely stood up in court (but see Whitner v. South Carolina, 1997). Not infrequently, pregnant drug users have had their children removed from their care at birth, or have been coerced into treatment.
George Schedler (1991, 1993) has argued that as a society we ought to force pregnant women who persistently abuse drugs to have abortions. He argues that harm is minimized by simply eliminating fetuses at high risk for damage through maternal drug abuse. The harm of unwanted abortion, he claims, ‘pales in comparison’ to the suffering imposed on other family members, teachers, etc. who must help care for a damaged child. He also argues that fetuses have a right not to be subjected to a life damaged by in utero drug exposure, and that reproductive autonomy does not extend to the right to bear a child damaged by one's own drug use. It is integral to his argument that doing drugs is a ‘leisure activity’, and hence that women morally forfeit their protection from unwanted abortion and their right to bear a child through participating in this activity. One might find implausible the idea that non-existence is preferable to a life involving even quite severe impairments caused by in utero drug exposure, and hence Schedler's argument from fetal rights is questionable. Furthermore, the idea that caring for such an impaired child obviously involves far more suffering than joy is disturbing. Moreover, Schedler does not discuss the emotional damage and the assault on bodily integrity and privacy involved in a forced abortion; he considers only the immediate discomfort of the surgical procedure in factoring in the harm done to pregnant women under his proposal.
Most commentators on the ethics of managing pregnant drug abusers have rejected a punitive or coercive approach (Capron 1998, Steinbock 1992, deVille et al 1998, Center for Reproductive Rights 2000). The Center for Reproductive Rights published a brief in 2000 summarizing common arguments against punishing pregnant drug abusers. They point out that punishing the mother does not particularly protect the well-being of children. It is also unlikely to have a deterrent effect, since drug use among addicts is rarely a voluntary choice based on a rational assessment of the risks and potential benefits of drug use. Indeed, most pregnant addicts are not ‘choosing’ their own pleasure over their children's well-being, as they would generally prefer not to be drug abusers, for their own sake as well as their child's. Threatening pregnant drug users with punishment may well only deter them from getting prenatal care and especially drug treatment, which thereby further harms their children. Furthermore, a punitive approach individualizes the problem of drug use during pregnancy and ignores social determinants of drug addiction. Finally, poor and minority pregnant women are disproportionately tested for drugs and threatened with punishment, even though they use drugs at rates no higher than their white, middle-class counterparts, and hence a punitive approach is likely to be unjustly applied (see also Hans 1999). Iris Young argues, “[b]ecause punishing the pregnant addict does next to nothing to prevent the birth of babies harmed by the chronic drug use of their mothers, punishment seems only to have the function of marking the women as deviant, publicly reaffirming their exclusion from the class of upstanding citizens” (Young 1994, 39).
Capron (1998) and Steinbock (1992) point out that pregnant women who use illegal drugs are already subject to prosecution like anyone else, and hence extra criminal charges seem merely punitive. Meanwhile, punishing them for otherwise legal behaviors such as consuming alcohol sets up a double standard that risks violating their constitutional rights. Furthermore, it seems difficult to draw a relevant distinction between the risks to the fetus imposed by ingesting (legal) drugs and those posed by a variety of other legal and voluntary behaviors (driving a car, sexual intercourse, eating junk food, etc.). If we allow pregnant women who put their fetuses at risk through otherwise legal activities to be charged with ‘child abuse’ or other pregnancy-specific crimes, we risk imposing restrictions and surveillance upon nearly all dimensions of pregnant women's activities.
Iris Young (1994) distinguishes between three approaches to drug abuse during pregnancy: punishment, treatment, and empowerment. She rejects the punishment approach as immoral and impractical. Most critics of the punitive approach advocate a treatment approach (i.e., Steinbock 1992, DeVille et al 1998). Young, however, has reservations about the treatment approach as currently practiced; she argues that it still treats addiction as an individual, medicalized health problem, rather than as a social problem. An empowerment approach of the sort that Young favors offers treatment, but in the context of a project of social empowerment and consciousness-raising designed to foster a critically reflective “sense of collective influence over the social conditions of one's life” (Young 1994, 48). She advocates programs that help women develop a perspective from which overcoming addiction can be understood not just as an individual health or will-power problem, but as part of a shared project of personal and community transformation.
Up until the early 1990s, women were dramatically underrepresented in clinical research trials. The two most common reasons given for their default exclusion were their purportedly more complicated and variable hormonal patterns and the possibility that they might be or become pregnant during the study and their fetus might be harmed by study interventions (DeBruin 1994, Little 1996, Giacomini and Baylis 2003). The National Institutes of Health solicited a report from the Institute of Medicine in 1992 on the effects upon women's health of these routine exclusions, and the report concluded that serious harms were being done to women. Women were disproportionately denied the direct benefits that might come from study participation. More importantly, their systematic exclusion from clinical trials meant that we did not know how to design appropriate treatment plans for women, whose different hormones and reproductive system, longer life span, and other medically relevant differences meant that treating them as smallish men for the purposes of dosing drugs and other treatment decisions was not a medically sound strategy. In 1993, the NIH changed its policies to make inclusion of women the default in all research, variation from which requires explicit justification. As of 2006, women comprised 68.9% of participants in clinical trials (Holden 2008).
Still, pregnant women remain an official ‘vulnerable group’ under the federal policies governing human subjects research, and are exempt from the inclusion mandate. Indeed, virtually all clinical research excludes pregnant women, out of concern for teratogenic effects on fetuses. Our unwillingness to conduct research on pregnant women leaves us without knowledge of how to effectively treat these women (whose metabolism, blood volume, hormones, immune system, and other bodily systems are affected by pregnancy in ways that impact their response to medication) without putting their fetuses at undue risk. Out of the 468 medications approved in the United States in 2002, 91% posed an unknown risk to fetuses (Lyerly, Little, and Faden 2008). While this lack of knowledge is widely acknowledged as a problem, it has not, in general, shaken the consensus that it is unethical to put fetuses at unknown risk for the purposes of research. Often the thalidomide crisis of the 1970s is cited as an example of the potential dangers of exposing fetuses to drugs, and hence as an object lesson in the need for precautionary principle to govern our practices of including pregnant women in research. But if the welfare of fetuses is our primary concern, we ought to take the opposite lesson from the thalidomide disaster: it is precisely because thalidomide was not systematically tested before being prescribed that so many babies were affected (Ibid.).
In light of our lack of knowledge of the teratogenic effects of most drugs, advice for pregnant women is generally conservative; women are advised to avoid medical interventions and medications during pregnancy if at all possible. For example, women with mental illnesses such as bipolar disorder and depression are often counseled to avoid medication during pregnancy, both because psychotropic drugs tend to diffuse readily across the placenta, and because typically, the mental state of the mother does not directly impact the health of the fetus (in contrast with, for instance, diabetes or life-threatening cancer). However, mental illness in pregnant women matters to fetal development: untreated depression, for example, is associated with premature birth, low birthweight, and other complications. Without improved evidence, it is difficult to give any rules of thumb for the ethics of treating mental illness during pregnancy.
More generally, the conservative approach to doing research with and treating women during pregnancy emphasizes the risks to fetuses from intervening, but not the risks from not intervening (Ibid; Lyerly et al 2007). When we exclude pregnant women from research or discourage treatment because of a lack of knowledge about the effects of a medication, we are not typically erring on the side of fetal safety; rather, we generally have no idea whether it is riskier for the fetus to be exposed to a medication or to the effects of untreated maternal morbidity. As Lyerly, Little and Faden point out, “If research is important to tell us when medications are unsafe, it is also important to reassure us when drugs are safe … In the absence of information about the safety and efficacy of medications, pregnant women and their providers are left with two unsavory options—take a drug, with unknown safety and efficacy; or fail to treat the conditions, thus leaving the woman and fetus vulnerable to the consequences of the underlying medical problems” (Lyerly, Little and Faden 2008, 12, 19). Pregnant women who have medical needs during pregnancy are typically told to weigh the risks and benefits when deciding whether to proceed with a treatment whose impact on fetuses is unknown. But this is an impossible demand; no one can weigh unknown risks and benefits. Excluding pregnant women from research sustains the impossibility of this calculation, and erring on the side of nontreatment may or may not best protect fetal well-being.
To the extent that the issue has received bioethical attention, no one has defended the current policy of near-universal exclusion of pregnant women from research. It is unclear, however, how best to craft appropriate standards for inclusion. Not only is the random exposure of fetuses to unknown teratogenic risks ethically problematic, but few pregnant women are likely to enroll in such trials. We are in need of new practices and policies that are sensitive to the difficulties and dangers of research on pregnant women, but are undistorted by assumptions that it is always more responsible and safer to protect fetuses from unknown interventions.
In rare cases, such as some advanced cancers, treatment decisions for a pregnant woman necessitate a choice between saving her life and that of the fetus, or other dramatic trade-offs. In such cases, there is general consensus (especially in the wake of the Angela Carder case discussed above) that the primary consideration should be saving the life of the mother (i.e. see Puls, Terry, and Hunter 1997). Charles Weijer (1998) points out, however, that in some cases a pregnant woman's decision to refuse treatment and sacrifice herself for her child should be counted as an autonomous decision worth respecting, and that we should not assume that only self-interested decisions can be autonomous.
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- Society for Women in Philosophy
- International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics
feminist (interventions): bioethics | feminist (interventions): ethics | feminist (topics): perspectives on disability | feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family | nonidentity problem | parenthood and procreation