Feminist Perspectives on Disability
Traditional philosophy paid almost no attention to the existence and experiences of people who are physically or cognitively impaired. That in the past philosophers only rarely took notice of disability is understandable, if not condonable. The general culture usually associates disability with defectiveness, insufficiency, and imperfection, in other words, with states that philosophy throughout its history has mainly aimed to transcend or overcome. Traditionally, philosophers rarely mentioned the kinds of impairments that are identified with disabling conditions. And when they did mention disability, their purpose almost always has been to invoke a limiting case (Silvers et al. 1998, 3), for example, babies so deformed as to vitiate the value of human life (Kuhse and Singer 1986), or adults too dependent and noncontributing to be parties to the social contract (Rawls 1985).
Over the last half century, however, scholarship in many disciplines has come to appreciate the broader significance of difference. In this spirit, philosophers began to question the preeminence assigned to normalcy, and the concomitant devaluation of the physical and cognitive conditions considered to be disabilities (Canguilhem 1989). Recently, feminist thinkers moved into the forefront of this turn of interest in disability, sometimes prompted by their philosophical commitment to inclusiveness, and sometimes by personal encounters with disability. Disability perspectives have become familiar in feminist approaches to some philosophical topics, for instance, ethics and justice theory, and the metaphysics of embodiment. Feminist approaches to other topics, such as models and standards of knowing, might also benefit by being enlarged to include disability perspectives.
- 1. Disability Studies and the Philosophy of Disability
- 2. The Importance and Relevance of Feminist Philosophy
- 3. Feminist Epistemology and Disability Standpoints
- 4. Identity
- 5. Embodiment
- 6. Ethics and Inclusion
- 7. Applications
- 8. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Disability studies has steadily gained prominence over the past half century, moving expeditiously (at least in the United States) into the mainstream in historical and literary scholarship, but not so quickly in philosophy. In the former fields, the components of disability studies are (mainly) two. There are analyses of the real histories of individuals or groups of individuals with disabilities, and there also are readings of representations of disabled people as they appear in literature, cinema, and similar creative work. Integrated with the accounts of real or invented disabled people are interpretations of the social or cultural forces that shaped their lives (in the case of actual individuals with disabilities), or else that shaped their representations in texts, film, and similar symbolic media.
Conducting disability studies in these disciplines has to a large degree been a matter of applying well-known interpretive techniques to subjects whom historical and literary scholarship previously ignored. Thus, for example, most historical scholarship about disability has aimed at reporting about the marginalized lives of individuals with physical, cognitive, or psychological impairments. Historical accounts of how such individuals fared in a particular society and a particular era are informed by familiar theories about the political function of social roles, applied to the status to which disabled people in that historical period were assigned. (To sample a disability studies approach to intellectual history, see Kudlick and Longmore 2006, on how disability shaped Habermas's philosophy.) Similarly, studies of symbolic presentations of disability mostly interpret representations (either fictional or biographical) of individuals whose characterization is inflected by attribution of one or another impairment. Scholarship about what such representations mean in a particular creative work usually is propelled by one or another familiar theory about the aesthetic, psychological, political or other function of symbolic roles, applied to disabled characters and characterizations of their disabilities. (See Silvers 2000 for a discussion of literary theory in disability studies.)
In these disciplines and related ones, consequently, engaging with disability has involved invoking mainstream theoretical presuppositions and principles to explore phenomena associated with certain previously under-theorized or otherwise ignored groups. Not so in philosophy, however, where disability, deformity and illness have appeared to defy application of familiar theoretical presumptions and practices. Examples of the resistance of disability to being subsumed under philosophical theories turn up throughout the discipline's history, from Plato's uncharacteristic emphasis on fleshly ideals in settling the fate of infants with deformities (Garland 1995, 15) to Hume's setting aside the testimony of individuals with illnesses as pertinent to theories of perception (Hume 1757) to Rawls's declaration that justice for disability is a detour that cannot be addressed when basic principles of justice are formulated and therefore must wait for the later, legislative stage. (See Sen's World Bank Speech [in Other Internet Resources] for an analysis of how Rawls's theory fails to respond to the facts of disability, but see also Becker 2005.)
Feminist philosophy, with its methodological reluctance to adopt philosophy's traditional presuppositions without scrutinizing them, initially was the most prominent area within the discipline where disability is taken to be a serious subject for philosophical investigation. According philosophical significance to the state of being disabled is one of the innovations feminist theory has introduced into philosophy. This article therefore explores affinities between feminist philosophy, which is aimed at expanding philosophical inquiry so that it adequately addresses women and their perspectives, and philosophical work with similar aspirations in regard to people with disabilities.
In some respects, disability presents the instances or issues that most intensely and interestingly challenge those traditional philosophical presuppositions and principles against which feminist thought has been inclined to protest. Nevertheless, feminist interests do not always coincide with disability perspectives, and unresolved tensions between feminist philosophy and the philosophy of disability remain. Consequently, this article also explores disability perspectives on feminist philosophy as much as it reports feminist perspectives on disability.
The attitudes and aims that have informed and propelled feminist philosophy have been consequential for the study of disability in philosophy. Asking why women have been excluded from the philosophical tradition, feminist thinkers explicitly have intended to remedy philosophy's prevailing indifference to the way the world is experienced by women, including women with disabilities. (But see Wendell 1989 and 1996 for concerns about feminist theory's disregard of women with disabilities. Despite this criticism, Wendell's remedy for such neglect is propelled by feminist precepts.) In doing so, they have made interventions that have altered the course of philosophy.
Some have argued, for example, that the universality to which philosophical theories traditionally have aspired cannot embrace women without erasing them. Some have questioned whether such a standard discerns, or instead disregards, important dimensions and textures of women's lives. Some also have affirmed differences among different kinds of women that they take to be, if not essential, at least as philosophically significant as the differences between women and men. (See, for example, Spelman 1988, Fuss 1989 and Crenshaw 1991, among many others, for discussions of these matters.)
Such divergence from standard philosophical views invites expanding philosophical theorizing on various topics, including ways of knowing, kinds of being (especially the ontological implications of embodiment and the relationship between body and mind), principles of conduct, intrinsically valuable human properties and ways of life, conceptualization of personal and social identity, and other traditional philosophical topics, by attending to differences occasioned by or associated with disability. Further, biased pretextual and other unjust treatment of women has been traced by some feminist philosophers to their being viewed as impaired and thereby subjected to the usual social practice of devaluing disability and people who are disabled. Some of the initial philosophically influential discussions of disability have to do with how women's physical realities are judged to be inferior because they do not match performances paradigmatic of healthy males. One example is Iris Marion Young's 1980 essay “Throwing Like a Girl,” about the prevailing masculinized rendering of women's embodiment that stigmatizes feminine physicality, wrongly construing the female body as fragile and burdensome. As a result, women are inhibited from confidently embracing their own experienced spatial orientation and are induced instead to underestimate their physical capabilities and to deform their gestures and their movements through space. Another is Susan Wendell's 1989 Hypatia article “Toward a feminist theory of disability,” wherein feminist philosophy's uncritical, unreflective conflation of healthiness with happiness and productivity is criticized.
In a conceptual climate that affords men's modes of bodily performance ascendancy, women are at heightened risk of being segregated and disrespected in virtue of being deemed deficient in physical or mental strength or health. Also consequential in the development of feminist philosophical treatments of disability has been the high frequency of assignment of women (rather than men) to the caretaking of individuals with disabilities, a social arrangement that usually burdens and frequently fails to recognize or materially reward those who must occupy this role and therefore one that unfairly disadvantages women. Considerations like these helped tie liberatory feminist philosophical work to the development of an insightful philosophy of disability.
Pervading the practice of philosophy, feminists found, are traces of bias that disregards women's interests and oppressively occludes their opportunities. Illuminating the significance of women's experiences of limitation is one of feminism's prominent contributions to philosophy. Early philosophical study of women by feminist scholars examined the limitations that hampered their own lives, and the lives of women generally, asking whether these resulted from alterable social arrangement or immutable biological destiny. (See Section 2.2, “Normative and Descriptive Components,” of SEP entry on “Topics in Feminism” for references to scholars who advance variations of these positions on the source(s) of women's subordination.) On the whole (although not for everybody), feminist theory has moved past this issue and now seems to regard the debate about biology versus society as the source of women's limitation as either irresolvable or unimportant.
Nevertheless, the nature of the (in)justice of limitations associated with physical or cognitive impairment remains a concern in the philosophy of disability, including feminist disability theory. Biological difference is a central and undeniable fact of disability, but the impact of biology on the kinds of experiences characteristic of being disabled is much more controversial. There is debate as to whether the functional limitations associated with disability result mainly from biology's going awry and whether, if disability is disadvantageous, it is naturally and immutably so. Or instead whether disabled people's functional limitation should be laid at the door of flawed social practice which rewards the species-typical functioning of so-called normal people and punishes the anomalous functioning of disabled people (Wendell 1996).
Feminist philosophical work has aimed at repairing the imbalance between men's and women's concerns and rectifying the negative depictions of traits viewed as female that are found in traditional philosophical positions, paradigms and methodologies. Feminists have tried to remedy a pervasive narrowness in the usual ways of framing those issues philosophers have considered important enough to command philosophical attention and work—that is, in the benchmarks that signal philosophical considerability. To induce change, feminist philosophers have crafted approaches that draw upon the very limitations they encounter when attempting to pursue women's interests within philosophy. This effort has supplied stimulating ideas to philosophers seeking to import the singular insights and different perspectives of other subordinated groups, such as the disabled, into contemporary philosophy to improve its inclusiveness and extend its scope. Specifically, disabled people's philosophical interests find ready-made conveyances in several of feminist thinking's signature reforms.
For example, feminist epistemology is a philosophically innovative reform movement that can serve as a beacon for the philosophical investigation of disability, although as of this writing the significance of disability for an adequate epistemology has not been much explored in disability scholarship, neither in the philosophical study of disability or in disability studies generally. Some feminist philosophers (and some feminist psychologists as well) have argued that women have ways of knowing that differ from men's. (For psychologists, see Belenky et al. 1986 and Tannen 1990; for philosophers, see Code 1991 and Ruddick 1989) Tannen, for example, adduces evidence from sociolinguistic research to argue that environments conducive to women's learning differ from those appropriate for men. More generally, some theorists influenced by such accounts have characterized women as being alienated, unsatisfied, and unconvinced when held to traditional epistemology's paradigm of the isolated knower, with its detached, universalizing, and controlling approach to knowledge. Dissatisfaction with this kind of view has prompted feminist epistemological insights about the possibilities for achieving objectivity without insisting that cognition works or should work the same way for everyone, as well as about the importance of situating, contextualizing, and nuancing truths, and about the benefits of collaborative practices of achieving knowledge. (See section 2. “Social Models of Knowers” in SEP entry on Feminist Social Epistemology for references.)
In developing their insights, feminist epistemologists have addressed the influence on knowledge of the social situations of knowers. Situatedness cannot be just a matter of the social positioning of knowers, however, or of their histories or cultures. What we know is modulated by how we acquire the elements of knowledge, and these processes are shaped by the condition of the body as well as by social conditions. Cognitive skills are expressions of development in various areas of the brain, which in turn is responsive to the rest of the body. We therefore may expect that people with disabilities, whose bodies diverge from the species-typical kind, also sometimes will develop cognitive approaches and abilities that differ from most other people's. Parenthetically, in one of the exceedingly rare instances of a philosopher treating an impairment as something other than a deficit, the 18th century experimentalist philosopher Denis Diderot investigated blind people's ways of knowing (Diderot 1999 , Curran 2013). Taking a stance that resembles, if not prefigures, recent feminist criticisms of Descartes, Diderot, in his “Letter on the Blind for the Use of Those Who See,” describes how blind people know about the world to show the short-comings of Cartesian over-reliance on metaphors that associate reason with light or sight and Cartesian reliance on visual rather than tactile ways of knowing.
Traditionally, of course, philosophers have dismissed disabled people's claims to knowledge about subjects touched by the limitations of their particular impairments. A telling illustration is given in the correspondence between philosophers Bryan Magee and Martin Milligan, in which Magee simply dismisses, absent argument, Milligan's report and arguments that, although blind almost from birth and without visual memories of experiencing specific colors, he fully understands the meaning of “red” (Magee and Milligan 1996). Here Magee portrays Milligan as a defective knower because of his blindness, a conclusion Magee advances with assertions that Milligan's experiences with redness are not exactly like Magee's own. Yet it is tendentious to point out that blind-from-birth individuals do not develop visual processing skills, and then to intimate that they must be epistemologically inferior to, or that their modes of knowing cannot rise to the epistemological significance of, sighted people. To the contrary, in some born-blind people, for instance, the area of the brain associated in most other people with visual processing appears instead to be a site for aural processing, meaning that a much larger part of the brain is available for dealing with information obtained through hearing than is the case for sighted people. This biological difference is thought to explain why in many cultures blind individuals are taken to be endowed with legendary skills for remembering and transmitting the spoken word accurately and with heightened understanding of orally transmitted texts, Thus blind bards who preserve and perform lengthy gospels or narratives from an authoritative standpoint are familiar figures in the history of many cultures (O'Neil 2003).
There are other blind people who know objects in their physical environment by echolocation, having cultivated the skill of making clicking noises with their tongues and identifying the different qualities of sounds bounced back toward them (Tresniowski and Arias 2006 [in Other Internet Resources]; see also “Shattering Barriers” at the World Access for the Blind website, in Other Internet Resources). Belgium's police force includes blind detectives who can listen to criminals' recorded conversations and by the reverberations of sound identify what kind of room they occupy, whether they are using a landline or cell phone, and even what kind of car they are traveling in or whether the suspect's Flemish carries an Albanian rather than a Moroccan accent (Soares 2007). Sighted people's typical lack of functional ability to navigate by reverberated sound, and thus their inferior way of knowing the absorption/reflection properties of the physical objects that surround them, and their deafness to nuances of spoken sound, surely should be recognized as a disadvantage. Yet this is almost never so, even where sighted people must find their way in the dark or distinguish among interlocutors beyond their vision.
The experiences of people diagnosed with cognitive impairments also usually are dismissed as epistemologically defective, judged against the philosophical ideal of the rational thinker. Some people described as cognitively impaired have anomalous patterns of cognitive skills, in some ways failing to attain, but in other ways exceeding, levels typical for the species. For example, individuals with Down Syndrome, who think abstractly only with difficulty or not at all, sometimes have greater than usual skills in perceiving, and remembering, the concrete details of what they see or hear. And people with Williams Syndrome quite often have greater social and emotional intelligence than is species-typical for humans, as well as unusual musical facility. This is not even to mention the innovative insightfulness and creativity achieved by individuals with diagnoses of various kinds of psychoses and similar so-called mental disabilities, conditions experienced by many famed artists, writers and musicians.
Such individuals usually are exempted from philosophy's scope as, for example, when epistemological theory discounts the judgments of blind people as irrelevant or unimportant to philosophical accounts of empirical knowledge, as philosopher Magee dismisses philosopher Milligan.. And people who lack abstract thinking skills, thereby diverging from the kind of human capability philosophers themselves exercise so well and enjoy so greatly, usually are dismissed as unimportant, that is, as not rising to philosophical considerability. People whose cognitive anomalies impede them from arriving at and articulating complex and rationalized accounts of their own good very often are not accorded full status, and sometimes even are denied considerability, by moral and political theories, including pluralistic liberal theories committed to respecting citizens' diverse values. (See McMahan 2005 and Kittay 2005) Yet, as Francis and Silvers (Francis and Silvers 2007, Silvers and Francis 2009) have pointed out, normally autonomous individuals do not arrive at, nor do they express, notions of their own good in isolation from, or independent of, their interactions with other people. Conceptualizations of the good of cognitively impaired people, developed through structurally similar collaborative interactions between them and others, deserve equal consideration in moral and political philosophy.
To account for the misfit between philosophical paradigms and their realities, the testimony or example of outliers such as blind people, and people with Down Syndrome or Williams Syndrome, typically is disallowed on the ground that it must be inherently flawed where it challenges or deviates from philosophical theory. Yet to disregard the standpoints, and thereby the performances and reports of the experienced world, of unusual people impoverishes philosophizing by diminishing the epistemological adequacy of philosophical accounts. Further, as an application of Miranda Fricker's analysis of epistemic injustice shows, the practice of systematically discounting belief claims made by people with disabilities should be condemned as testimonial injustice: individuals are wronged based on their disability status when they when they aspire to roles as knowers (see Fricker 2009). Nor, to apply a lesson from feminist philosophy of science, can objective knowledge about disability be produced unless disabled people, including people with cognitive disabilities, are fully respected members of the community of inquirers (see Longino 2001). Francis and Silvers have proposed an approach to constructing ideas of the good with full respect for and inclusion of the viewpoints of severely disabled persons (Francis and Silvers 2006, Silvers and Francis 2009).
Like disabled people as a group, women as a group have been dismissed and displaced, condemned for not complying with biological or social paradigms and therefore denied authorization for the ways of knowing that inform their experiences. What they believe they know often has been rejected as merely epistemologically anomalous. Oppressive policies traditionally were defended with the rationale that “nature” has made women physically, intellectually, and emotionally frail (Miles 1988). In response, feminist epistemology has welcomed recognition of the legitimate influences of social location in arriving at knowledge claims, as well as the centrality of collaborative practices in the pursuit of knowledge.
What is not so clear is whether feminist epistemology is as comfortable with the impact on knowing of other bodily differences. This is a question of whether different biological properties legitimately define different epistemological standpoints. Especially in the last part of the 19th and the first part of the 20th centuries, biological determinism was a potent tool used to oppress women through false testimony that science found them to be less capable of survival than men.
Wary of promoting such determinism, feminist philosophy has been more engaged with the social rather than the biological phenomena identified with women. Feminist standpoint theory has been inclined to treat differences in cognitive styles as arising from socially induced gendered identities or roles rather than from biological traits or conditions that differentiate men from women. Some of its proponents argue for the superiority of the styles associated with women. In the main, however, the operative notion for feminist theory is that epistemic authority is the product of a social award; there is no natural order in which the cognition of biologically fit individuals is most attuned to the actualities of the external world and therefore is superior.
To a significant extent, however, standpoints defined in terms of disability are associated with characteristic biological differences. This raises several questions for an epistemology of disability, especially one modeled on feminist theory, to explore. First, is characterizing standpoints with reference to biological differences inherently and onerously deterministic, so that one's body inescapably delineates one's cognitive destiny? Second, does granting equal legitimacy to standpoints defined with reference to biological differences lead to irresolvable and debilitating epistemological relativism? And, third, will acknowledging the range of atypical (for humans) ways of knowing reveal a heretofore unimagined richness in what humans can know the world is like?
The interplay of biological and social identities—whether these be innate, imposed, or embraced—has become a subject of first-order importance in disability studies as well as in feminist theory, and especially in philosophical ventures into disability scholarship. Feminists have been, by far, the most numerous of philosophical writers on the topic of disability identity. They have offered a rich variety of sophisticated approaches to the question of how the sensibilities and histories of people with very different kinds of limitations can be collected into a cohesive philosophical account. Some write from the perspective of a lifelong disability identity, others describe their transition into the world of disability, and still others write about disability without having experienced being disabled themselves.
In view of the relevance of so many different standpoints, feminist philosophy of disability must meet the challenge of constructing an account of disability identity that does not invoke or appeal to “normal” examples of disabled people. Further, no one should claim to be, or speak as or about, the typical disabled person. The enormous diversity among disabled people, and the importance of reflecting all their differences in formulating disability theory, calls for sensitivity to nuance and context. (Re)formulations of feminist identity theory that can accommodate the many ways in which disabled people differ from each other as well as from nondisabled people are of special importance because they may be extrapolated beyond disability theory to illuminate issues about identities shaped by other kinds of differences.
Unlike traditional ideas of race and sex, disability has always been understood to be a permeable classification. Some people have lived at length or lifelong with disability, some are newly so, and others have lived through periods in which they were disabled but now are not so. A large number of us should expect to become disabled later in our lives. And many of us find ourselves intimately involved in the lives of family members or friends who now are disabled or who face a future of disability. Further, as Eva Kittay reminds us, social policies that pertain to disabled people also affect their family members, friends and professional caregivers (Kittay 1998; Kittay 2001). So feminist disability theory should recognize that disability affects the identities of many people beyond the 600 million worldwide who are themselves disabled (Herr, Gostin, and Kuh 2003).
Disability identity may be claimed for a variety of very different reasons. Sometimes the objective is to acquire eligibility for assuming the “sick” role and thereby being relieved of various productivity-related expectations and responsibilities . Sometimes being identified as disabled offers access to government benefits of various kinds. Sometimes being understood to be disabled triggers acceptance of or accommodation to atypical modes of functioning. And sometimes disability identity is claimed as an empowering element of a political process intended to consolidate a group of people sufficiently numerous and vigorous to challenge stigmatization, exploitation, and exclusion based on disability. As the reasons for these disparate purposes for identifying as disabled diverge, so do the criteria or conditions for judging individuals to be disabled, as well as the inducements to individuals to understand themselves primarily in terms relating to disability.
The inclusiveness of the various identity theories promoted in feminist philosophy is of preeminent and persistent concern to women with disabilities. Discussing whether women with disabilities can comfortably be feminists, Anita Silvers has asked whether feminism privileges the functional capabilities and social roles characteristic of “normal” women. She has found some feminist theories guilty of “magnifying these (functional capabilities of typical women) until they become standards of womanhood against which disabled women shrink into invisibility” (1998a).
Feminist philosophy validates and valorizes activities women typically execute and in which they excel, such as theories of maternal ethics that center on mothering as preeminent moral conduct. But not all women are admitted to women's roles. Even in the most progressive contemporary societies, women with disabilities encounter opposition to their maintaining fertility, or accessing reproductive medical technology in achieving fertility, or even retaining custody of the children to which they have given birth. Karin Barron, who has conducted extensive research on the lives of young women with disabilities, observes that we place great value on the womanly art of caring for dependents, but the traditional dependent position of young women with disabilities prevents them from occupying, and therefore from demonstrating any aptitude for, this role (1997). We should be clear that what precluded the young women Barron studied from being homemakers and mothers was not their lack of potential for serving in these roles but, instead, their having been assigned to an alternative social position, one defined in terms of such dependence that their capacity to nurture others became virtually inconceivable.
Licia Carlson has shown that a gendered process of conceptualizing social roles even affected the diagnostic classification of mental retardation. She has explored the complex interconnections that characterize the linked history of cognitive disability and gender oppression. Carlson points out that while superintendents of institutions that warehoused intellectually disabled people were mostly male, women were employed to go out and identify cases of feeblemindedness on the theory that they were more intuitive by nature and therefore better qualified for the job. This was an era when normal women were presumed to have a leading role in defending society against moral weakness of the sorts for which the feebleminded were feared, based on a notion about women's commitment to maintain community virtue for protection of the young. While there is value in acknowledging human vulnerability and dependence, Carlson observes, feminists should be as concerned about placing persons with intellectual disabilities in such mirror roles as about making third world feminism a mirror for Western feminism (Carlson 2009; also see Narayan 1997).
Carlson's analysis should compel feminist philosophers to reconsider their understanding of cognitive disability. Feminist philosophers are not immunized by their philosophical persuasion against their having limitations such as ignorance of the lived realities of people with intellectual disabilities, the nature of intellectual disability, and the historical basis of this category (Carlson 2009,2010). As feminists have questioned the privileged status of masculine ways of thinking, Carlson questions whether some feminists privilege their own modes and levels of cognition (Carlson 2001). They should, further, ask whether they have constructed feminist philosophizing in terms that make intellectual endeavor too central an undertaking. Eva Kittay makes this point penetrating, poignant, and personal when she describes the transformative insight occasioned by being told that her child is congenitally mentally retarded:
the worst anticipation was that her handicap involved her intellectual faculties. …. I was committed to a life of the mind. … How was I to raise a daughter that would have no part of this? If my life took its meaning from thought, what kind of meaning would her life have? …. [W]e already knew that we had learned something. That which we believed we valued, what we—I—thought was at the center of humanity—the capacity for thought for reason, was not it, not it at all. (Kittay 1998, 150)
A somewhat similar dilemma about the preeminent value of intellectual skills may confront people who acquire a cognitive disability later in their lives. Kate Lindemann (2001) and Ann Davis (2005) both write about the effects that experiencing the sequelae of head injuries had on their beliefs about cognition. Lindemann's critique points to radical and profound ways in which feminist appreciation of the diverse workings of mind can enlarge philosophical inquiry. Feminist theory stands to gain by paying new attention to philosophical issues that should be rethought to reflect the situation of adults with brain injuries: personal identity, mind-body dualism, conceptions of the self, and philosophical psychology.
Recognizing that some individuals have invisible disabilities should remind us, Davis observes, of the extent to which we always are epistemologically dependent on people's disclosures of their own identities. Davis rejects the presumption that we can clearly separate voluntary from inadvertent limitations. Many cognitive and psychological limitations cannot be documented by reference to physical anomalies. Yet, Davis rightly says, experiences of them are no less real. She rejects the conviction that we can find physical correlates of anomalous cognitive or psychological functioning. Policies demanding that these kinds of cognitive and psychological limitations be documented by public demonstration or third-party confirmation should be abandoned, for they rely on mere faith in their having physical causes rather than on factual evidence that they do.
These personalized experiences of limitation should not be discounted. The philosophy of disability suggests that we need to recalibrate our sensibilities to honor the evidence of other people's senses, especially of their own embodiment. People's testimony about their own limitations and incapacities deserves respect even if uncorroborated by biological confirmation. Such experienced limitations may place the individual at activity-impeding, pain-inducing or life-threatening risk. As Davis argues eloquently, we improperly burden people whose limitations we cannot directly see, and aren't sufficiently knowledgeable to appreciate, by constantly challenging them to prove their disabilities.
Feminist scholars have explored how corporeal or biological distinctiveness mediates daily activities so that self-identification and social experience act on, and become attuned to, each other. Feminist research such as that of Susan Sherwin (1992) shows that medicine has treated women as if they were disabled people, intervening in their bodies to eliminate or discipline (to use Foucault's term) those parts that mark their identification with a purportedly inferior group. Medicine has, in particular, been dismissive of women's emotional lives. The history of how medicine has addressed disabled people is similar. It is a history of the repression and rejection of bodies and minds that diverge from the supposed paradigm or norm provided by healthy young males.
Enlightened by these parallels with their own history, some early disability studies scholars rejected medical practices directed at altering themselves. They characterized the medical model of disability, which takes disability to be a problem requiring medical rather than social intervention and as both the prerogative and the responsibility of medical professionals to fix, as oppressive. They saw medicine itself as a coercive instrument that subordinates disabled people, not the least by inducing feelings of inadequacy and self-hate in them. (See UPIAS 1978; Finkelstein 1980; Oliver 1983.)
Just as biological sex, and the division of humans into two sexes, initially were taken as givens in feminist theory, so early disability studies scholars proposed to treat impairments such as being unable to hear, see, walk, talk, or execute cognitive activities as biological givens, and disabilities as social interpretations of impairments. On such accounts, the properties of bodies (including brains) are supposed to be pre-social. According to these accounts, it is socially constructed interpretations and valuations of the powers of neutral corporeal properties that consign people with various kinds of bodies to advantageous or detrimental social roles.
Jenny Morris, a leader of the disabled women's movement, proposes that the social model of disability enables disabled people to define their own bodies and their differences in terms of personal experience and self-authorization, free of detached diagnoses imposed by medical authorities. The social model construes the limitations of people with disabilities as a social problem rooted in the imposition of practices that are biased against the disabled. Once understood as products of bias rather than biology, disabled people's disadvantages can be remedied through the pursuit of justice to reform the practices that oppress them. According to Morris, adopting the social model of disability makes it possible to talk about addressing the limitations of disabled people's functioning without condemning, or requiring improvements in, the state of their bodies (or, for that matter, their minds) (Morris 2001).
Better informed, more sophisticated recognition of and reflection on the facts about sex and gender have complicated the picture for both feminist and disability scholarship. There are, for example, intersexed people, born with the biological markers of both female and male. A socially imposed allegiance to sexual dualism demands they be submitted to medical intervention that (usually through amputation) presses their bodies into one or the other sexual mold. Yet having a woman's body does not necessarily suit a person for feminine roles, nor do all those with men's bodies find themselves fitting comfortably into masculine roles. The materiality of sexual characteristics does not make them unbreachable constants. There are individuals who adapt with facility to gendered roles that are not traditional for their particular bodily configurations.
Others, however, find their sexual characteristics too restricting for the roles they adopt and consequently seek to change these elements of their bodies through surgical and chemical intervention. The way transgendered people see themselves in the world indicates that the body's limitations cannot always be discounted. While some people do not think their corporeal alteration is required to comfortably fit into opposite gendered roles, others seek medical intervention to facilitate their transgendering. Thus, the experiences of transgendered people suggest that there are circumstances in which altering one's body to better execute preferred social roles can be an affirming, rather than a degrading, choice.
These considerations show not only the error in supposing that the natural and social dimensions of embodiment can be cleanly dichotomized, but also the superficiality of thinking that we always should take bodies as they come. Extrapolating this insight to disability helps us to see the over-simplification in condemning medical transformations of the body as being expressions of self-hatred. There is no phenomenological firewall separating our awareness of our biological properties from our social experiences. How our own bodies feel to us is shaped by social discourse.
In a documentary film presenting conversations with leading philosophers, feminist theorist Judith Butler learns about the social model of disability from artist and disability activist Sunaura Taylor (Taylor, 2009). The social model is compatible with Butler's own theory of embodiment. Butler observes that everyone, whether or not disabled, requires support for bodily activities from various kinds of things that are external to their bodies. Every body is permeable in the sense of being vulnerable to being impinged upon by others. People who violently target and victimize the disabled are managing their own permeability by abusing individuals who appear to be more dependent than most and thus more vulnerable. Violent acts against the disabled foreground their permeability and thereby, according to Butler, give the perpetrators the illusion of being themselves exempt from permeability.
Applying Butler's ideas about embodiment, which emphasize the inconstancy of conceptualizations of bodily kinds, feminist legal scholar Kathryn Abrams contends that one reason the Americans with Disabilities Act (ADA) has had trouble in the courts, with most plaintiffs losing their cases (at least under Title I - Employment), is because the social model disrupts a premise of mainstream jurisprudence. The legal norm presumes that human bodies are biological objects of fixed kinds, whereas on Butler's theory bodies are contingently constituted by transient social interactions (Abrams 2011:76). However, not all judicial thinking has been so narrow. For example, in 2006 a pre-surgery transexual individual's denial of employment suit was allowed to proceed, despite the defendant's claim that Title VII did not apply because the plaintiff was not a woman; in supporting the plaintiff, the court invoked the factual complexities that underlie human sexual identity and explained that these complexities are occasioned by how biological sexuality interacts with social, physiological, and legal conceptions of gender (see Schroer v. Billington 2006, 2009).
Our bodies' responses and responsiveness inflect in turn the social as well as the solitary aspects of our experiences. Nor is social practice isolated from, or prior to, materiality. An individual's impairments are no more neutral than her sexual characteristics are, for they mediate much of the content of her consciousness of the world with which she interacts. Performing major life functions such as mobilizing, hearing, seeing, communicating and understanding are such intimate elements of the fabric of our experience that what we view as within our reach in the world around us—and thereby what we take as the objects of our ambition—arises out of the scope and facility of our biological functioning.
Considering whether the experiences of women are sufficiently acknowledged in disability studies, Susan Wendell points to masculinist influences on the field's standard model of disability (1996). Wendell offers a refreshing look at the disability politics of promoting an image of the healthy disabled, which is similar to the feminist politics of excluding disabled women altogether in an effort to advance more appealing and powerful icons. She argues that the social model of disability, which until recently has been the preeminent theoretical inspiration for disability studies, tends to obscure the frequency with which disability is tied to illness (Wendell 2001).
Opponents of the medical model of disability urged the disentanglement of disability from illness, pointing out that many individuals with disabilities are as strong and capable of productivity as nondisabled people, and therefore should not be consigned to the limitations of the “sick” role (Amundson 1992). This strategy also promotes self-reliance over dependence and replaces trust in the expertise of medical and social service professionals with strategies to let disabled people take control of their own lives. The useful point of such emphasis for disabled individuals, Wendell acknowledges, is that by getting their political position about subordination to medicalization right, they affirm rather than devalue their own bodies.
Yet, Wendell adds, political correctness will not always make people feel right about our bodies or make their bodies feel right. Illness is itself disabling, and chronically ill individuals constitute a prominent part of the population considered to be disabled. Making healthy rather than ill disabled people paradigmatic of the disability category may obscure some disabled people's important differences. Worse, doing so may perpetuate our culture's devaluing of dependency and inflating of the value of self-sufficiency. Wendell argues for reforming disability studies through a more inclusive feminist approach to disablement, namely, one that does not exaggerate the value of strength and independence as she believes masculinist influenced theorizing tends to do (Wendell 1996).
Wendell also proposes that feminist disability politics consider the implications of chronic illnesses that mark the unhealthy disabled's experience of embodiment (Wendell 2001). One such implication concerns the appropriate reaction to suffering. Many chronically ill people feel pain, fatigue, feebleness, and disorientation to a degree that forestalls productivity, saps self-sufficiency, and even may alienate them from their own bodies or minds. The social response in both mainstream society and disability circles is to support cures for chronic illnesses, as though the suffering caused by illnesses renders these conditions irrelevant to how disabled individuals form their identities. Yet some disabled individuals, at least, reject medical interventions aimed at a cure on the ground that they do not wish to become different from whom they are. To the contrary, Wendell thinks, an adequate philosophical account of embodiment will appreciate identities inflected by suffering without glorifying or sugar-coating the debilitating dimensions of perpetual exhaustion and discomfort.
A related implication concerns the reaction to emotional or psychiatric suffering. Unlike feminist literary scholarship, where studies of madness are well represented, feminist philosophers have shown comparatively little interest in addressing the phenomena of neurodiversity. Feminist and disability studies theorists who are undermining the domination of paradigms of youth and health should extend their efforts so as to liberate psychiatrically disabled people from the idealization of the neurotypical mind. Andrea Nicki argues that feminists ordinarily do not think of anger and aggression as being valuable because they are emotions of competition rather than cooperation. But, Nicki thinks, these feelings may serve as morally valuable—because liberating—expressions for some neurodiverse people, especially for emotionally abused individuals (2001).
The powerfully negative meanings evoked by the prevailing conceptualization of disability may overwhelm both the equality of opportunity and the moral respect that disabled people's exercise of autonomy or independence should command. Thus, even healthy people with disabilities often are stigmatized because their embodied modes of functioning strike others as disruptive, however adeptly adaptive and independent these may be. And individuals with genetic vulnerabilities that put them at more than species-typical risk for illness are also at risk of such stigmatization. People who test positive for alleles associated with disease may encounter discrimination in employment and other areas of civic and commercial life, even though they never become symptomatic (Silvers and Stein 2003). Feminist and gender studies already have shown that atypical, and thereby transgressive, modes of corporeal functioning offer a rich resource for developing more adequate concepts of the materiality of human experience and of our personhood (Clare 1999). Yet, whether in illness or in health, the lives of disabled people largely have been ignored when these concepts are explored, to the detriment of moral and political philosophy generally.
People who talk or read with their fingers, walk using their arms and hands, categorically recoil from other people's touches, or float through the day on analgesics that suppress waves of pain, often develop resilient and innovative approaches to fleshly function. Further, disabled people often are the first to incorporate adaptive technology into their lives. From machines that write (typewriters were invented to permit blind people to write) to machines that speak (computerized speech output was invented to permit blind people to read), disabled people have piloted the use of mechanical devices that now are integral to so many lives. Adaptive technology combines with fleshly effort to secure their basic capabilities: they hear with amplifiers, breath with respirators, mobilize in wheelchairs that they guard with more concern than the care they give their bodies.
A supportive intimacy of machine with flesh thus is a feature of many disabled people's lives, but one that can distance them from the nondisabled. Alison Kafer criticizes ecofeminism for assuming that authentic engagements with nature are possible only through purely natural immersion experiences from which use of manufactured products, including the assistive and prosthetic devices that distinguish some disabled people's embodiment, are banned. Ecofeminism remains bound by the traditional dualism of human artifice versus nature, Kafer argues, in part because of mistakenly equating species-typical bodies with naturalness. Species-typicality remains a presumption of feminism, she says (Kafer 2005). Such a standard disregards or devalues people with disabilities whose functioning integrates their fleshly parts with mechanical components or other technologies. (See Kafer 2013 for a more general theory that intersects feminist, disability, and queer theory approached to embodiment.)
Although ordinarily considered unfit to participate in competitive schemes, when disabled people with prostheses function well, their supposed cyborgian advantages create another reason for their being shunned. In a case that went to the United States Supreme Court, the Professional Golf Association unsuccessfully attempted to ban an otherwise qualified individual because a physical anomaly prevented him from walking for a full eighteen holes. The PGA invoked the specter of a Frankensteinian slippery slope: if an anomalous golfer could mobilize with a golf cart while normal golfers walked, what would prevent a future contender, an upper limb amputee, from strapping on a bionic arm that can drive a golf ball more than two miles (PGA Tour, Inc. v. Martin (00-24) 532 U.S. 661 (2001) 204 F. 3d 994)?
Lower leg amputees used to be excluded from competitive running because their prostheses made them run too slowly. Now new materials and designs have created specially springy sports feet that permit their wearers, when very skilled and talented, to run as fast as can be done with fleshly feet. A hit-and-run driver's victim, Dory Selinger now bicycles with a cleated peg replacing an amputated foot. Because it does not flex, the peg is more efficient at pedaling than a fleshly foot. Selinger's best time is only four seconds off the longstanding world record for “normal” racers (Squatrighlia 2001).
The South African track star Oscar Pistorius, whose congenitally anomalous feet were amputated in childhood, uses modern alloy artificial feet that return almost as much energy as the runner's weight loads. Racing officials opposed Pistorius's competing against nondisabled athletes, invoking objections running from fears of his falling on other athletes, through his violating the rules because he has no fleshly foot to touch the starting block, to his very presence corrupting the purity of the sport, and the extravagantly dire prediction that able-bodied athletes would amputate their own fleshly feet to gain advantages derived from prosthetics. Pistorius appears to use about one-fourth less lower leg energy when matched with runners with fleshly feet because his prosthetic ankles are more efficient than fleshly ankles, and initially he was banned from the Olympics due to the claim (subsequently overturned by the International Court of Arbitration for Sport) that his artificial feet gave him an unfair advantage. (See Silvers and Wasserman 2000 for a general discussion of fairness in regard to accommodating people with disabilities in competitive sport and Silvers 2008 in regard to enhanced embodiment.)
Arguably, it is unfair to exclude racers with disabilities on the ground that crude prosthetics render unable to be competitive, and then also to exclude them when better prosthetics make them highly competitive. Such a practice of limiting eligibility to typically embodied competitors narrows social opportunity for whoever does not conform to the conventional rules of embodiment. And it is precisely because of the ease with which such rules of competition can be rigged to favor some so-called normal modes of functioning over other seemingly anomalous ones that feminists rightly have been suspicious of invoking rules derived from models of competitive recreation as relevant to and regulative of social justice.
Traditional approaches to justice often take competition for resources or position to be fundamental to social and political relationships, which consequently puts an emphasis on fairly managing socially bestowed or artificially achieved advantage, somewhat as the rules of games control the deployment of inside information, equipment, pharmaceuticals and other such performance enhancers. On the other hand, feminist theories of justice achieved through inclusiveness, such as Iris Young's (1990) and Martha Nussbaum's (2006), cast interdependence rather than rivalry as the social and political relationship with which justice should be more concerned. In contrast to traditional justice theory's worries about disruptive embodiment's impact on practice, policy and principle (for example, see Rawls's well-known exclusion of disabled people on this ground, 1985 p. 234), such feminist theories condemn, and try to overcome, the omission or interdiction from practice, policy and principles of justice of people with anomalous bodies or minds.
In general, people with physical and mental disabilities have at least their experiences of social exclusion in common. Exclusion looms large in many disabled people's lives and shapes their expectations and aspirations. This is a familiar story in the life histories of many individuals who are identified with non-dominant groups.
Presumptions about biological unfitness and burdensomeness often have been invoked to engineer enforced segregation of parts of the population. Courts have endorsed the separation of people identified as being of different races by advancing the rationale that segregating social schemes merely acknowledge “natural” affinities among people of the same race and “natural” antipathies among people of different races. The supposed benefits of biological separatism also have been cited to deny women employment that would place them in the company of men. For example, when a state law denying women the opportunity to be employed as bartenders was appealed to the U.S. Supreme Court as a violation of the constitutional guarantee of equal protection, the Court declared the exclusion to be constitutional because of the “real” differences between men and women. The majority opinion explicitly affirmed that women's presence “naturally” incites males to lust and violence, and that women do not have the physical ability to impose orderly behavior on the rowdy patrons of a bar (Silvers and Stein 2002).
Similarly, people with disabilities have been characterized as being biologically unfit to execute the responsibilities and thereby to enjoy the privileges of citizenship, to work and play with nondisabled people, and to be permitted reproductive freedom. For example, people with mental retardation, cerebral palsy, blindness, and deafness all have suffered the state's sterilizing them, removing their children from their custody based only on their disability, denying them access to public education on the ground that their presence harmed other children, and institutionalizing them to protect citizens who function in species-typical ways from having to have contact with them (Lombardo, 2008). Similar legally endorsed harm is a familiar theme in the history of women, racial minorities, native people, and gays and lesbians.
Searching for ethical grounds to condemn the kinds of exclusions to which women have been subjected, feminist thinkers have been disappointed by traditional metaethical, moral and political analyses. Feminists have found traditional moral philosophy suspect for inflating typical male behaviors into paradigmatic moral actions and traditional political philosophy equally suspect for being bereft of remedies for the moral and political challenges posed by such biased and pretextual exclusion. Although standard ethical and political theorizing claims as a matter of principle to embrace everyone alike, feminist critiques have shown that their presumptions often exclude devalued kinds of people from significant moral, political and social roles (for example, Putnam 1993 draws attention to Rawls' exclusion of people with serious disabilities from the basic level of formulation of principles of justice). Consequently, feminist philosophers such as Annette Baier (1986, 1987), Eva Kittay (1998), Martha Nussbaum (2001, 2006), and Iris Marion Young (1990a; 1990b) have pioneered the exploration of more inclusive alternative theories (to mention just a few leading feminists whose theories have been influenced by a concern to address the phenomena of disability adequately). They have relocated the search for an adequate center for moral and political philosophy to, for example, the ethics and politics of trust and care, the virtues of dependency, the sustenance of capabilities fundamental to human life, and the establishment of moralized interconnectedness among people who do not occupy similar positions in life. Albeit differing from one another in their approaches to feminist ethical and political theory, all build in concern for achieving adequate philosophical treatment to address problematic kinds of interactions between people with disabilities and the nondisabled, or to illuminate ways of framing distributive policies that are equal to the situations of both nondisabled and disabled individuals. (For another explicitly feminist example of the former, see Mahowald in Silvers, Wasserman and Mahowald 1998 and for a feminism compatible example of the latter, see Becker, 2008 [in Other Internet Resources].)
Two main approaches to addressing the social exclusion of disabled people have surfaced in the philosophical literature that refers to them. Some writers focus foremost on procedural justice to open up disabled people's opportunities for social participation (Young 1992; Silvers 1998b; Anderson 1999; Silvers and Francis 2005). Anderson urges that everyone be guaranteed effective access to the social conditions of their freedom in virtue of their equality, not their inferiority. To illustrate, she notes that what Deaf people object to is not their lack of hearing but that “everyone else has rigged the means of communication in ways that leave them out of the conversation. One can detect this injustice without investigating anyone's preferences or subjective states” (Anderson 1999, 334). Silvers proposes a procedure called historical counterfactualizing to identify practices catering to the nondisabled majority that unjustly exclude people with disabilities (Silvers 1998b; Hoffman 2003).
Others take the answer to lie first of all in distributive justice to increase provision of resources to the disabled and to families caring for the disabled (Kittay 1998; Kittay 2001; Nussbaum 2006). Nussbaum, for example, begins with a comprehensive idea of the good to guide justice. She develops a list of capabilities necessary to live with dignity and holds that people with disabilities deserve support to achieve threshold levels of these capabilities, if they can do so, even if more resources must be deployed to assist them than other people need to reach the same level. Kittay, another example, seeks supportive conditions for those who interact in dependency relations, both dependents and their caregivers, arguing that both must be assisted in order to achieve good care, and therefore justice, for the dependent. To effect such an outcome through justice, Kittay believes, requires maintaining a social order that secures care for dependents as a main purpose of formulating fundamental principles of justice and a theoretical basis that downgrades the value of independence, at least for disabled people (Kittay 2011). Although many commentators endorse the prominence Kittay assigns to (re)organizing society to provide various kinds of care and to protect care workers, Kittay's understanding of how her view relates to liberal political has been questioned. One problem has to do with Kittay's assumptions about how reciprocity functions in liberal theory, and another is about the role of reciprocating relationships on her view (Whitney 2011). Another is abut whether the vulnerability of utter dependents is sufficiently similar to other kinds of vulnerability, such as that of care workers, to warrant taking the support relationship needed by utter dependents as the basic model for social affiliation and obligation (Bhandary 2010).
Neither of these approaches to justice—one foregrounding procedural reform and the other revising resource distribution – denies the importance of the other's objectives. In great part, they diverge on matters of practical priorities, but also on matters of whether moral priority should be given to agreement about what is right, or instead about what is good. However, some feminist thinkers who have questioned the ability of traditional moral theories to take account of the needs and experiences of both care-receivers and care-givers are inclined to portray caring conduct as inspired not by duty but by the compelling recognition of another's need and of one's own capacity to relieve that person's need. Consequently, they have criticized rights-based and obligation-catering procedural theories for abstracting excessively from experienced encounters with dependents who need protection and support (Kittay, 1998, for example). Other feminist philosophers, such as Baier and Nussbaum, have raised a different question about the adequacy of traditional moral theories to address the phenomena of interdependency. Their issue is about validation rather than motivation. They have queried whether approaches centered on independent individuals contracting freely and reciprocally with one another for mutual benefit can give plausible accounts of obligations to people who are, temporarily or permanently, greatly dependent on others for physical, cognitive or emotional support.
Nussbaum (2006) suggests that the source of political philosophy's ignoring the disabled lies in a foundational assumption of social contract theory. She criticizes Rawls for casting citizens in the role of rough equals who relate because they can benefit each other, saying “Instead of picturing one another as rough equals making a bargain, we may be better off thinking of one another as people with varying degrees of capacity and disability, in a variety of different relationships of interdependency with one another” (2001, B9). Construing reciprocal bargaining as the foundational and therefore paradigmatic social connection among citizens “effaces the more asymmetrical forms of dependency that human life contains: the need for care in infancy, extreme age, and periods of severe illness or a lifetime of severe disability,” she objects (2001, B9).
Nussbaum thinks traditional social contract theory is misguided in testing basic conceptions of justice against self-regarding reasons, thereby assigning self-regarding reasons preeminence over other-regarding ones. And surely it is hard to see how a conception that derives justice from decisions featuring self-regard (such as whether particular formulations of principle would benefit one's self regardless of one's circumstances) can provide adequately protective principles for each individual in relation to others, especially in view of the vulnerabilities individuals accept as the price of being part of cooperative schemes.
Stimulated by Nussbaum's critique, Silvers and Francis (2005) return to Baier's insights about the centrality of trust in moral interaction. They propose extrapolating principles of justice from practices that facilitate people's relying on, and thereby making themselves vulnerable to, each other. Practices that nourish such trust are crucial components of social cooperation. Moreover, unlike bargaining, which requires strategizing and therefore complex high-order cognitive skills, trusting is conduct that people without disabilities and people with almost every kind of disability equally can engage in. People who cannot articulate their decisions, and who may not even be able to arrive at decisions, nevertheless may express bestowal or withdrawal of their trust. As a mode of relating to one another, trust is par excellence suited to facilitating interactions between individuals who in various respects are asymmetrically positioned in regard to one another. Silvers and Francis argue that building trust is a more inclusive process than bargaining about principles of justice. Building trust therefore offers a more adequate practice for achieving justice for both disabled and nondisabled people than the reciprocating exchanges called for in strategic contracting.
By clearing away some biased approaches to moral and political theorizing, the work of feminist philosophers has greatly and beneficially influenced the philosophy of disability. Nevertheless, because feminist philosophy is woman-centered, and most women do not identify as being disabled themselves, the interests and emphases of feminist thinkers are not always congruent with those of activists aspiring to liberate the disabled from oppressive social arrangements or of scholars formulating liberatory theories that guide and justify doing so. Two conversations where the alliance between feminist philosophy and the philosophy of disability is strained relate to women's liberty to shape their own relationships, and their liberty to reproduce. Although disability activists and scholars never deny that women should be thoroughly free, some have concerns about women's exercising their freedom in ways that curtail or dismiss disabled people's freedom.
Women are more likely to remain in relationships with ill or disabled dependents—partners, children, or elders—than are men (Cohen 1996). Possibly, fewer men than women consider caregiving as a self-affirming role. Women therefore contribute a very large proportion of society's caregiving, but may be harmfully confined and disadvantaged by this role unless their contributions as carers are adequately acknowledged, appreciated and compensated. Emphasized in feminist literature and by the women's movement, this issue is a touchstone for many feminist philosophers in judging the adequacy of moral and political theories.
Analyses and assessments of the moral dimensions of how caregivers relate to dependent disabled individuals, as well as to disabled people who do not need extraordinary levels of care, would benefit from nuanced collaboration attention by feminist and disability scholars. Even where helping relationships are voluntary, they risk being asymmetrically so, with the dependent feeling coerced into receiving assistance in the proffered rather than in a preferred form, or the dependency worker feeling imprisoned by the relationship. Help-givers choose how they will help, but help-takers cannot choose how they will be helped, for if one's connection to others is as the recipient of help, rejecting others' choice of proffered help leaves one solitary (Silvers 1995). Joan Tronto finds that the power imbalance between care givers and care receivers carries with it a potential for oppression (Tronto 1987; Tronto 1993).
Nussbaum rightly observes that we must preserve the self-respect of dependents without exploiting caregivers. Morris argues that the solution lies in eliminating the presumptions about normate embodiment and normal functioning that now pervade the way caregivers and care receivers usually are conceptualized by ethics of care. Proponents of the ethics of care could profit from recognizing that many disabled people, men as well as women, are caregivers for themselves and therefore are crucially positioned to understand how giving care best connects to receiving it (Morris 2001). Working out better understanding of the moral, political, and social dimensions of caregiving relationships is of crucial importance not only to disabled people themselves, but also to families who are as dependent on securing care for their dependent members as their dependents are on them.
Bioethics is another area of applied philosophy where feminist thinking, while making its mark, at least initially occluded disability perspectives. Feminist bioethicists most often have aligned with the principle that women are owed control of their own bodies. While this idea may appear compatible with the value of self-determination promoted by much disability philosophy, some bioethicists, including some who are feminists, have adopted medicalized views of disability and, in doing so, have argued that the prospect of bearing a disabled child justifies, or even obligates, termination of the pregnancy (Purdy 1995; see also McMahan 1998 and McMahan 2005). A related but not identical position challenges “Baby Doe” laws that prohibit hospitals from denying neonates with disabilities effective life-saving treatment, arguing that parents should be free to decide whether their child's life will be worth living (Paris et al. 2005).
Feminist bioethicist Adrienne Asch has carefully distinguished between a woman's right to terminate her pregnancy and the moral constraints on her terminating the life of her new-born child. Disability does not diminish the claims of neonates, nor of other individuals with disabilities, to the necessities of life (Asch 1990 2002; Asch and Geller 1996; Asch, Gostin and Johnson 2003; Kittay 2005). Disability scholars generally have objected to the unfounded presumption that being disabled makes life not worth living, or at least makes the lives of people with disabilities less gratifying and valuable than those of nondisabled people. The social isolation to which disabled individuals often are condemned results in nondisabled people being misinformed about their potential for satisfying lives. Terminating a pregnancy because the resulting child may have an impairment reduces the individual to the disability, but people with disabilities are as much a sum of many different strengths and flaws as nondisabled people are (Parens and Asch 1999). Like Asch, Carlson urges feminists to be wary of women's being induced to accept social roles in which they devalue individuals who are disabled. She notes that feminist programs for the availability of birth control often invoked fears of perpetuating feeblemindedness to support their case. Carlson warns that genetic counseling, which also is work done primarily by women, may function in a similar gatekeeping role (Carlson 2010).
The objectionable presumptive devaluing of life with a disability is not compatible with a full and equitable commitment to reproductive liberty. Philosophers as well as policy makers have invoked the supposed inescapable suffering of disabled people as a reason for barring deaf women and women with dwarfism from using reproductive technology (for example, pre-implantation genetic diagnosis) to bear children like themselves, narrowing these women's reproductive choices. An additional consistency challenge emerges in regard to the influence that the prospect of a sad or bad life should have on the reproductive liberty to bear children who may or will have disabilities. Feminists condemn the practice of aborting female fetuses and of female infanticide, even where women lead inescapably miserable lives. It is difficult to see what, other than the influence of the prevailing social biases against disability, would lead those who regard the termination of females this way from extending their objection to the termination of other devalued kinds of people (Asch 1999; Asch and Geller 1996).
For more than two decades, feminist philosophy has had a productive but sometimes uneasy engagement with the facts and theory of disability. Some feminists who view feminist theorizing from a disability perspective, such as Morris and Wendell, are disturbed by evidence that feminism has not overcome a residual allegiance to normalcy. And indeed some discussions of disability by feminists seem to proceed by laying aside feminism's own affiliations with liberation, self-affirmation, and inclusiveness. In general, however, philosophy has benefited from applying feminism's theoretical lenses to better understand disability. Polishing those lenses with the cloth of which disabled people's lives are made promises to achieve more finely nuanced and perspicacious philosophical accounts, and theories broader in scope and farther seeing, than during the centuries when philosophy overlooked disability.
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