First published Fri Aug 11, 2006; substantive revision Mon Jul 28, 2014
For my own part, I think that if one were looking for a single phrase to capture the stage to which philosophy has progressed, ‘the study of evidence’ would be a better choice than ‘the study of language’.
   —A.J. Ayer, Philosophy in the Twentieth Century
And when we try to define ‘evidence’ … we find it very difficult.
   —R.G. Collingwood, The Idea of History

The concept of evidence is central to both epistemology and the philosophy of science. Of course, ‘evidence’ is hardly a philosopher's term of art: it is not only, or even primarily, philosophers who routinely speak of evidence, but also lawyers and judges, historians and scientists, investigative journalists and reporters, as well as the members of numerous other professions and ordinary folk in the course of everyday life. The concept of evidence would thus seem to be on firmer pre-theoretical ground than various other concepts which enjoy similarly central standing within philosophy. (Contrast, for example, the epistemologist's quasi-technical term ‘epistemic justification’.)

When one compares philosophical accounts of evidence with the way the concept is often employed in non-philosophical contexts, however, a tension soon emerges. Consider first the kinds of things which non-philosophers are apt to count as evidence. For the forensics expert, evidence might consist of fingerprints on a gun, a bloodied knife, or a semen-stained dress: evidence is, paradigmatically, the kind of thing which one might place in a plastic bag and label ‘Exhibit A’. Thus, a criminal defense attorney might float the hypothesis that the evidence which seems to incriminate his client was planted by a corrupt law enforcement official or hope for it to be misplaced by a careless clerk. For an archaeologist, evidence is the sort of thing which one might dig up from the ground and carefully send back to one's laboratory for further analysis. Similarly, for the historian, evidence might consist of hitherto overlooked documents recently discovered in an archive or in an individual's personal library.[1] Reflection on examples such as these naturally suggests that evidence consists paradigmatically of physical objects, or perhaps, physical objects arranged in certain ways. For presumably, physical objects are the sort of thing which one might place in a plastic bag, dig up from the ground, send to a laboratory, or discover among the belongings of an individual of historical interest.

However natural such a picture might be, it is at least somewhat difficult to reconcile with historically prominent philosophical accounts of the nature of evidence. Russell, the greatest empiricist of the first half of the twentieth century, tended to think of evidence as sense data, mental items of one's present consciousness with which one is immediately acquainted. In this, he stood squarely within the tradition of classical empiricism. Quine, the greatest empiricist of the second half of the century, maintained throughout his career that evidence consisted of the stimulation of one's sensory receptors.[2] The logical positivists held that whatever evidence there is for a given scientific theory is afforded by observation statements or ‘protocol sentence’, linguistic entities with suitably-restricted contents; the precise nature of the restrictions became a vigorously contested matter within the tradition itself.[3] According to one recent and influential study, one's evidence consists of the totality of propositions that one knows (Williamson 2000). According to another, one's evidence consists exclusively of one's current mental states (Conee and Feldman 2004). Within contemporary confirmation theory, a prominent version of Bayesianism is naturally understood as identifying one's evidence with those beliefs of which one is psychologically certain. Of course, the suggestion that one might place sense data, sensory receptor stimulations, known propositions, or one's current mental states in a plastic bag (or dig them up from the ground, or send them to a laboratory, or …) is of dubious intelligibility. From the perspective of much ordinary thought and talk about evidence, much philosophical theorizing about evidence would seem to embody a particularly grotesque category mistake.

Moreover, it is not simply that the accounts of evidence that have been advanced by philosophers stand in at least some prima facie tension with much that is said and thought about evidence outside of philosophy. As even the cursory survey offered above makes clear, philosophers themselves have offered quite divergent theories of what sorts of things are eligible to serve as evidence. What might account for such discrepancies?

One possibility is the following. Both in and outside of philosophy, the concept of evidence has often been called upon to fill a number of distinct roles. Although some of these roles are complementary, others stand in at least some measure of tension with one another. Indeed, as we will see below, it is far from obvious that any one thing could play all of the diverse roles that evidence has at various times been expected to play. Different theories about the nature of evidence might thus naturally emerge from different emphases on the competing demands that have been placed on the concept. In what follows, I survey some of the theoretical roles that the concept of evidence has been asked to play and explore some of the relations among them.

1. Evidence as That Which Justifies Belief

In any event, the concept of evidence is inseparable from that of justification. When we talk of ‘evidence’ in an epistemological sense we are talking about justification: one thing is ‘evidence’ for another just in case the first tends to enhance the reasonableness or justification of the second.… A strictly nonnormative concept of evidence is not our concept of evidence; it is something that we do not understand.
   —Jaegwon Kim, ‘What is “Naturalized Epistemology”?’

Evidence, whatever else it is, is the kind of thing which can make a difference to what one is justified in believing or (what is often, but not always, taken to be the same thing) what it is reasonable for one to believe. Some philosophers hold that what one is justified in believing is entirely determined by one's evidence. This view—which sometimes travels under the banner of ‘Evidentialism’—can be formulated as a supervenience thesis, according to which normative facts about what one is justified in believing supervene on facts about one's evidence (See especially Conee and Feldman 2004). Thus, according to the Evidentialist, any two individuals who possessed exactly the same evidence would be exactly alike with respect to what they are justified in believing about any given question.

Given Evidentialism, various traditional debates within the theory of knowledge are naturally cast as debates about the status of various underdetermination theses. Thus, the skeptic about our knowledge of the external world maintains that one's evidence (understood, perhaps, as the totality of one's present experiences) does not favor one's ordinary, commonsense views about one's surroundings over various skeptical alternatives (e.g., the hypothesis that one is hallucinating in an undetectable way). Similarly, one longstanding controversy that divides realists and antirealists in the philosophy of science can be understood as a debate about whether the kind of evidence which is available to scientists is ever sufficient to justify belief in theories that quantify over entities that are in principle unobservable, such as electrons or quarks.

Inasmuch as evidence is the sort of thing which confers justification, the concept of evidence is closely related to other fundamental normative concepts such as the concept of a reason. Indeed, it is natural to think that ‘reason to believe’ and ‘evidence’ are more or less synonymous, being distinguished chiefly by the fact that the former functions grammatically as a count noun while the latter functions as a mass term.[4]

To the extent that what one is justified in believing depends upon one's evidence, what is relevant is the bearing of one's total evidence. Even if evidence E is sufficient to justify believing hypothesis H when considered in isolation, it does not follow that one who possesses evidence E is justified in believing H on its basis. For one might possess some additional evidence E′, such that one is not justified in believing H given E and E′. In these circumstances, evidence Edefeats the justification for believing H that would be afforded by E in its absence. Thus, even if I am initially justified in believing that your name is Fritz on the basis of your testimony to that effect, the subsequent acquisition of evidence which suggests that you are a pathological liar tends to render this same belief unjustified. A given piece of evidence is defeasible evidence just in case it is in principle susceptible to being undermined by further evidence in this way; evidence which is not susceptible to such undermining would be indefeasible evidence. It is controversial whether any evidence is indefeasible in this sense.[5]

Following Pollock (1986), we can distinguish between undercutting and rebutting defeaters. Intuitively, where E is evidence for H, an undercutting defeater is evidence which undermines the evidential connection between E and H. Thus, evidence which suggests that you are a pathological liar constitutes an undercutting defeater for your testimony: although your testimony would ordinarily afford excellent reason for me to believe that your name is Fritz, evidence that you are a pathological liar tends to sever the evidential connection between your testimony and that to which you testify. In contrast, a rebutting defeater is evidence which prevents E from justifying belief in H by supporting not-H in a more direct way. Thus, credible testimony from another source that your name is not Fritz but rather Leopold constitutes a rebutting defeater for your original testimony. It is something of an open question how deeply the distinction between ‘undermining’ and ‘rebutting’ defeaters cuts.

Significantly, defeating evidence can itself be defeated by yet further evidence: at a still later point in time, I might acquire evidence E″ which suggests that you are not a pathological liar after all, the evidence to that effect having been an artifice of your sworn enemy. In these circumstances, my initial justification for believing that your name is Fritz afforded by the original evidence E is restored. In principle, there is no limit to the complexity of the relations of defeat that might obtain between the members of a given body of evidence. Such complexity is one source of our fallibility in responding to evidence in the appropriate way.

In order to be justified in believing some proposition then, it is not enough that that proposition be well-supported by some proper subset of one's total evidence; rather, what is relevant is how well-supported the proposition is by one's total evidence. In insisting that facts about what one is justified in believing supervene on facts about one's evidence, the Evidentialist should be understood as holding that it is one's total evidence that is relevant. Of course, this leaves open questions about what relation one must bear to a piece of evidence E in order for E to count as part of one's total evidence, as well as the related question of what sorts of things are eligible for inclusion among one's total evidence.[6]

Given the thesis that evidence is that which justifies belief, one's intuitions about the evidence that is available to an individual in a hypothetical scenario will shape one's views about what the individual would be justified in believing in that scenario. Of course, one can also theorize in the opposite direction as well: to the extent that one has independent intuitions about what an individual would be justified in believing in a given scenario, such intuitions will shape one's views about what evidence must be available to an individual so situated—and therefore, one's views about the more general theoretical issue about what evidence is, or what sorts of things can and cannot qualify as evidence. Thus, if one is firmly convinced that an individual in circumstances C might be justified in believing that p is the case, it follows immediately that being in circumstances of kind C is consistent with having evidence sufficient to justify the belief that p. As we will see below (Section 2), reasoning of this general form has often encouraged a picture according to which one's total evidence is exhausted by one's present experiences.

Here is an example of the way in which intuitions about justification can drive one's account of evidence, given a commitment to the Evidentialist thesis that changes in what an individual is justified in believing always reflect changes in her total evidence. It is sometimes suggested that how confident a scientist is justified in being that a given hypothesis is true depends, not only on the character of relevant data to which she has been exposed, but also on the space of alternative hypotheses of which she is aware. According to this line of thought, how strongly a given collection of data supports a hypothesis is not wholly determined by the content of the data and the hypothesis. (Nor is it wholly determined by their content together with the scientist's background theory of how the world works.) Rather, it also depends upon whether there are other plausible competing hypotheses in the field. It is because of this that the mere articulation of a plausible alternative hypothesis can dramatically reduce how likely the original hypothesis is on the available data.[7]

Consider an historical example that is often thought to illustrate this phenomenon. Many organisms manifest special characteristics that enable them to flourish in their typical environments. According to the Design Hypothesis, this is due to the fact that such organisms were designed by an Intelligent Creator (i.e., God). The Design Hypothesis is a potential explanation of the relevant facts: if true, it would account for the facts in question. How much support do the relevant facts lend to the Design Hypothesis? Plausibly, the introduction of the Darwinian Hypothesis as a competitor in the nineteenth century significantly diminished the support enjoyed by the Design Hypothesis. That is, even if there were no reason to prefer the Darwinian Hypothesis to the Design Hypothesis, the mere fact that the Design Hypothesis was no longer the only potential explanation in the field tends to erode (to some extent at least) how much credence the Design Hypothesis merits on the basis of the relevant considerations.

Assume for the sake of illustration that what one is justified in believing does in fact depend upon the space of alternative hypotheses of which one is aware: as new hypotheses are introduced, one's justification for believing already proposed hypotheses changes. Given the Evidentialist thesis that differences in justification are always underwritten by differences in evidence, it follows that a complete specification of one's evidence at any given time will make reference to the set of hypotheses which one is aware of at that time. This is an example of the way in which intuitive judgments about what individuals are justified in believing in certain circumstances, when coupled with a commitment to Evidentialism, can drive one's theory of evidence (i.e., make a difference to which items one classifies as ‘evidence’ in one's theorizing).

The justifying or rationalizing role of evidence is also central to other prominent epistemological views, including views which are strictly speaking incompatible with Evidentialism as formulated above. Consider, for example, Bayesianism. (See the entry on Bayesian epistemology.) The Bayesian holds that what it is reasonable for one to believe depends both on the evidence to which one is exposed as well as on one's prior probability distribution. According to the Bayesian then, two individuals who share exactly the same total evidence might differ in what it is reasonable for them to believe about some question in virtue of having started with different prior probability distributions. Still, inasmuch as Bayesians often focus upon rational belief change, or on what is involved in rationally revising one's beliefs over time, the justificatory role of evidence retains a certain pride of place within the Bayesian scheme. For Bayesians typically maintain that that which distinguishes those changes in one's beliefs that are reasonable from those that are not is that the former, unlike the latter, involve responding to newly-acquired evidence in an appropriate way.[8] Thus, for the Bayesian no less than for the Evidentialist, it is evidence which justifies that which stands in need of justification.

Notably, even views which tend to marginalize the role of a subject's evidence in determining facts about what he or she is justified in believing typically do not take facts about the subject's evidence to be wholly irrelevant. Consider, for example, reliabilist theories of epistemic justification (Goldman 1979, 1986). In its purest and most straightforward form, reliabilism holds that the status of a token belief as justified or unjustified depends upon whether or not the psychological process which gives rise to the belief is a reliable one, i.e., one that is truth-conducive. When formulated in this way, the concept of evidence plays no role in the reliabilist account of justification: in particular, the status of a given belief as justified or unjustified depends upon whether the relevant belief-forming process is in fact reliable, and not on any evidence which the believer might possess which bears on the question of its reliability (or even, for that matter, on any evidence which the believer might possess which bears more directly on the truth of the belief itself). Thus, someone who was in fact a reliable clairvoyant would be justified in holding beliefs that she forms on the basis of clairvoyance, even if her total evidence strongly suggested both that (i) she does not possess the faculty of clairvoyance, and that (ii) the relevant beliefs are false (BonJour 1985, Chapter 3). However, in response to such examples, reliabilists typically seek to accommodate the intuition that such a subject is not justified in maintaining her reliably-arrived-at beliefs in the face of her evidence, and they seek to modify the simple reliabilist account to allow for this (See, e.g., Goldman 1986: 109–112). The felt need to modify the original, more straightforward account is, perhaps, a testament to the resilience of the idea that one's evidence can make a difference to what one is justified in believing—even if other factors are also taken to be relevant.

2. Rational Thinkers Respect Their Evidence

A rational man is one who makes a proper use of reason: and this implies, among other things, that he correctly estimates the strength of evidence.
   —Ayer, Probability and Evidence
Insofar as we are rational in our beliefs, the intensity of belief will tend to correspond to the firmness of the available evidence. Insofar as we are rational, we will drop a belief when we have tried in vain to find evidence for it.
   —Quine and Ullian, The Web of Belief
A wise man proportions his belief to the evidence.
   —David Hume, An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding

It is characteristic of rational thinkers to respect their evidence. Insofar as one is rational, one is disposed to respond appropriately to one's evidence: at any given time, one's views accurately reflect the character of one's evidence at that time, and one's views manifest a characteristic sensitivity or responsiveness to changes in one's evidence through time. Of course, rationality is no guarantee of correctness. Indeed, in a given case one might be led astray by following one's evidence, as when one's evidence is misleading. But being mistaken is not the same as being unreasonable. To the extent that one respects one's evidence, one is not unreasonable even when one is wrong.[9]

The foregoing remarks, although bordering on the platitudinous, naturally suggest a substantive model of the norms which govern our practice of belief attribution. According to the model in question, in attributing beliefs to you, I should, all else being equal, attribute to you the belief that p just in case it would be reasonable for you to believe that p given your total evidence. This is the core idea behind one popular version of the Principle of Charity. According to this line of thought, I am justified in drawing inferences about what you believe on the basis of my knowledge of your epistemic situation. Thus, if I know that your evidence strongly suggests that it will rain today, then (all else being equal) I should attribute to you the belief that it will rain today. On the other hand, if I know that your evidence strongly suggests that it will not rain today, then I should likewise attribute to you a belief to that effect. Although on a given occasion a thinker who is generally reasonable might fail to believe in accordance with her evidence, such cases are exceptional. In the absence of any reason to think that a given case is exceptional in this way, one is licensed to draw inferences about the contents of another's beliefs on the basis of information about the character of her evidence. The default assumption is that a person's beliefs are those that it is appropriate for her to hold given the evidence to which she has been exposed.

Above, we noted that in a given case one might be led astray by following one's evidence: even if p is true, one's evidence might misleadingly suggest that p is not true. When one's evidence is misleading, one typically arrives at a false belief by believing in accordance with it. We ordinarily assume that such cases are exceptional. Are there possible worlds in which such cases are the norm? Consider a careful and judicious thinker who consistently and scrupulously attends to his evidence in arriving at his beliefs. In our world, these habits lead to cognitive prosperity—the individual holds a relatively large number of true beliefs and relatively few false beliefs. (Or at least, he fares significantly better with respect to truth and falsity than those who fail to attend to their evidence and instead form their beliefs in a hasty or haphazard manner.) Consider next how the same individual fares in a world that is subject to the machinations of a Cartesian evil demon, a being bent on deceiving the world's inhabitants as to its true character. Although the true character of the world in question differs radically from our own, it is, from the point of view of its inhabitants, utterly indistinguishable, for the Demon takes care to ensure that the courses of experiences that the inhabitants undergo are qualitatively identical to the courses of experiences that they undergo in our non-delusory world. In the world run by the Cartesian Demon, our thinker is no less judicious and no less scrupulous in attending to (what he blamelessly takes to be) relevant considerations than he is in our world. Because of his unfortunate circumstances, however, his beliefs embody a radically false picture of his environment. Granted that the thinker's beliefs about his environment are false, are they any less justified than in our world? Is the thinker himself any less rational? Many philosophers maintain that the thinker's beliefs are equally well-justified and that the thinker himself is equally rational in the two worlds (See e.g., Cohen 1984 and Pryor 2001). Apparently, there is strong intuitive resistance to the idea that a thinker whose underlying dispositions and habits of thought remain unchanged might become less rational simply in virtue of being located in less fortuitous circumstances. As Williamson (2000) has forcefully emphasized, however, embracing the judgement that the thinker is equally rational in ‘the good case’ and ‘the bad case’ tends to push one inexorably towards a conception of evidence according to which one's evidence is exhausted by one's subjective, non-factive mental states. For if rationality is a matter of responding correctly to one's evidence, then the judgement that the thinker is equally rational in the good case and the bad case would seem to require that the thinker has the same evidence for his beliefs in both cases. But ex hypothesi, the only thing common to the good case and the bad case that is a plausible candidate for being the thinker's evidence are his non-factive mental states. Thus, the judgement that the thinker is equally rational in both cases, when conjoined with the view that rationality is a matter of responding to one's evidence in the appropriate way, seems to force the conclusion that the thinker's evidence is limited to his non-factive mental states even in the good case. In this way, the requirement that the thinker has the same evidence in the good case and the bad case seems to encourage what Williamson calls ‘the Phenomenal Conception of Evidence’.[10]

Consider also how the aforementioned Principle of Charity encourages such a picture of evidence when it is applied to the world run by the Demon. In attributing beliefs to an individual in the bad case, one attributes exactly those beliefs that one would attribute if the same individual were in the good case. For if the Demon's illusions are truly undetectable, failure to detect them hardly seems to constitute a failure of rationality. In attributing commonsense beliefs to the individual in the bad case, one proceeds according to the Principle of Charity: after all, it seems that these are exactly the beliefs that even a perfectly rational (though not infallible) being would have in the circumstances. But if the commonsense beliefs are no less reasonable when held in the bad case, then the individual's evidence for those beliefs must be just as strong in the bad case as in the good case. Indeed, it is natural to describe the bad case as a world in which the thinker's evidence is systematically misleading. The trick to being a good Evil Demon (one might think) is to be effective at planting misleading evidence. Intuitively, the Demon misleads his victims by exploiting their rationality, inasmuch as he trades on the sensitivity of their beliefs to misleading evidence. (Indeed, those who dogmatically cling to favored theories in the face of apparently disconfirming evidence would seem to be relatively less vulnerable to being manipulated by the Demon.) But the Demon misleads by providing his victims with misleading experiences. Hence the temptation to simply identify one's evidence with one's experiences: once again, the phenomenal conception of evidence looms.

As Williamson emphasizes, the insistence that one's evidence is identical in the good case and the bad case effectively rules out many otherwise-attractive accounts of evidence:

That one has the same evidence in the good and bad cases is a severe constraint on the nature of evidence. It is inconsistent with the view that evidence consists of true propositions like those standardly offered as evidence for scientific theories.… For similar reasons [it] does not permit my evidence to include perceptual states individuated in part by relations to the environment. No matter how favorable my epistemic circumstances, I am counted as having only as much evidence as I have in the corresponding skeptical scenarios, no matter how distant and bizarre. Retinal stimulations and brain states fare no better as evidence, for in some skeptical scenarios they are unknowably different too (2000:173).

In view of its apparent consequences for the theory of evidence, the idea that one's evidence is the same in the good case and the bad case warrants further scrutiny. Again, it is uncontroversial that there is a robust distinction between nonculpable error on the one hand and irrationality or unreasonableness on the other. Nonculpable error does not in general make for irrationality, even when such error is relatively widespread and pervasive. Still, it's worth asking just how much weight the distinction in question can bear. Is any amount of nonculpable error about the environment in which one is embedded compatible with perfect rationality? Or rather, at some point, does a sufficient amount of error about one's environment tend to compromise one's ability to form rational beliefs about that environment?

Here is one line of thought for the conclusion that a sufficient level of nonculpable error about one's environment does tend to compromise one's ability to arrive at rational beliefs about that environment. It's plausible to suppose that much if not all of the value that we place on believing rationally depends on a connection between believing rationally and believing what is true (although the precise nature of this connection is no doubt a particularly vexing topic). One might worry that a view according to which even ideal, perfect rationality can coexist harmoniously with a more or less completely mistaken view of one's situation threatens to attenuate the connection between believing rationally and believing truly too far, and to render obscure why the former would be valuable relative to the latter. To put the same point in terms of evidence: plausibly, much if not all of the value of respecting one's evidence consists in the putative link between doing so and believing the truth. Given this, one might worry that a view according to which perfectly following one's evidence is compatible with a more or less completely mistaken view of one's situation threatens to render obscure why following one's evidence would be a good thing to do relative to the goal of having true rather than false beliefs.

This line of thought is not decisive, however. In general, the value of x might consist in its serving as a means to y, even if there are conditions in which relying on x utterly fails to bring about (or even frustrates the achievement of) y. Thus, it might be that the value of a given drug consists in its being the miracle cure for some disease, even though in certain conditions the drug would have the effect of aggravating the disease. Similarly, it might be that we value following our evidence as a means to believing what is true, even though we recognize that there are circumstances such that, were we unfortunate enough to be in them, doing so would hinder or frustrate that goal.

A different tack is pursued by Williamson, who argues at length that we should not accept the idea that one has the same evidence in the good case and the bad case. Central to his argument is the contention that, even if one were to adopt the phenomenal conception of evidence, this would not allow one to vindicate the underlying intuitions that seemed to make its adoption attractive in the first place; hence, the phenomenal conception of evidence is ultimately not well-motivated. As we have seen, it is the desire to preserve the intuition that a sufficiently scrupulous thinker in the bad case can be reasonable in his beliefs (indeed, no less reasonable than a similarly scrupulous thinker in the good case) which seems to rule out any conception of evidence according to which one's evidence might consist of (say) true propositions or facts about the external world. For a thinker in the bad case is not in a position to recognize facts about the external world; he is, however, in a position to recognize facts about his own experiences. The view that one's evidence is limited to one's experiences thus seems to be motivated by the idea that one's evidence, no matter what else is true of it, must be the sort of thing that one is always in a position to correctly take into account, at least in principle. But (it is claimed) one's experiences are the things that one is always in a position to correctly take into account. Williamson argues that this last thought is a mistake: in fact, one is not always in a position to correctly take into account one's experiences, even in principle. Indeed, Williamson argues that there is no non-trivial condition which is such that one is always in a position to know that it obtains. Thus, the thought that evidence might be such that one is always in a position to know what one's evidence is is a chimerical one. To insist that in order for x to be among one's evidence, x must be such that one is always in a position to know whether one's evidence includes x is thus to impose a misguided and unrealizable desideratum on the theory of evidence. In short: ‘Whatever evidence is, one is not always in a position to know what one has of it’ (2000: 178, emphasis added).

Having rejected the phenomenal conception, Williamson proposes that we take a subject's evidence to consist of all and only those propositions that the subject knows.[11] Williamson elaborates this simple and straightforward idea with great sophistication; here we focus exclusively on the way in which the resulting theory interacts with the theme that rational thinkers respect their evidence. Of course, one immediate consequence of the view that a subject's evidence consists of his knowledge is that a thinker in the good case and a thinker in the bad case will differ—indeed, differ significantly—in the evidence which they possess. When a thinker in the good case comes to know that there is blood on the knife in virtue of having a visual experience as of blood on the knife, the relevant proposition becomes part of his total evidence. In contrast, when a thinker in the bad case is caused by the Demon to undergo the same experience (or at least, an experience that is qualitatively indistinguishable) and arrives at the same belief, the relevant proposition is not part of his total evidence, for the relevant proposition is not true and hence not known. Inasmuch as the scrupulous thinker in the good case will know far more than the scrupulous thinker in the bad case, the former will have far more evidence for his beliefs than the latter. Given that the two thinkers have the same beliefs, it seems that the thinker in the good case will be significantly more reasonable in holding those beliefs.[12]

How much of a cost is this? We should distinguish between two different intuitions one might have about a thinker in the bad case. The first intuition is that a thinker in the bad case has exactly the same evidence as a thinker in the good case. Perhaps abandoning this intuition is not much of a cost (if it is any cost at all). A different intuition is the following: when a thinker in the bad case takes his experiences at face value and forms beliefs about the external world in the usual manner, those beliefs are not simply unreasonable, in the way that they would be if, for example, the thinker adopted those same beliefs on a whim, or in the absence of any reason to do so at all. Abandoning this intuition would seem to be a much heavier price to pay. However, it is contentious whether this intuition can be preserved on a view according to which one's evidence consists of one's knowledge. Consider, once again, a thinker in the bad case who is caused by the Demon to have a visual experience as of being in the presence of a bloodied knife. Possessing no reason to doubt that the experience is veridical, the thinker forms the belief that there is blood on the knife in the usual manner. Intuitively, this belief is at the very least better justified than it would be in the absence of the relevant visual experience. On the supposition that one's evidence consists of those propositions that one knows, we can ask: what known proposition or propositions justify this belief, to the extent that it is justified? The proposition that there is blood on the knife is false and therefore not known. Perhaps the thinker's evidence for his belief that there is blood on the knife is the true proposition that (i) it appears that there is blood on the knife or the true proposition that (ii) my experience is as of there being blood on the knife.[13] However, some philosophers maintain that in typical cases of perception, one does not form beliefs about how things appear to one, or about how one's perceptual experience presents things as being: rather, in response to one's experiences, one simply forms beliefs about the external world itself.[14] If this is correct, then, given that knowledge requires belief, propositions like (i) and (ii) are not known because they are not believed. Hence, if this model is correct, then, on the view that one's evidence consists only of known propositions, the thinker's belief that there is blood on the knife seems to lack any justification.[15]

According to the phenomenal conception of evidence, only one's experiences can serve as evidence. According to Williamson's conception of evidence as knowledge, one's experiences are excluded from counting as evidence—at best, one's evidence includes whatever propositions about one's experiences that one knows. Even if one abandons the phenomenal conception of evidence, however, one might hold on to the idea that one's evidence includes one's experiences, inasmuch as one's experiences can and often do make some difference to what one is justified in believing, regardless of whether one forms beliefs about those experiences themselves. A view of evidence that is more liberal than either Williamson's or the phenomenal conception might thus take one's evidence to include both one's experiences and one's knowledge, on the grounds that the beliefs of a rational thinker will exhibit direct sensitivity both to what he knows and to the experiences that he undergoes. The question of whether one's experiences—as opposed to one's beliefs about one's experiences, or one's knowledge of one's experiences—can play a direct role in justifying beliefs about the external world is a much contested one in the philosophy of perception; it will not be pursued further here.

An issue that has recently come to the fore concerns the distinction between first-order evidence and higher-order evidence (Christensen 2010, Feldman 2005, Kelly 2005, 2010, Lasonen-Aarnio 2014). Intuitively, first-order evidence E is evidence that bears directly on some target proposition or hypothesis H. Higher-order evidence is evidence about the character of E itself, or about subjects' capacities and dispositions for responding rationally to E. Suppose that a trained meteorologist carefully surveys the available meteorological data and concludes that it will rain tomorrow. Here, the meteorological data (E) is first-order evidence that bears on the hypothesis (H), that it will rain tomorrow. Now consider the fact that the meteorologist arrived at the view that it will rain tomorrow on the basis of E. This fact is higher-order evidence, inasmuch as it is evidence about the content and import of the original meteorological data E. In particular, given that the meteorologist is generally competent when it comes to assessing the relevant kind of evidence, the fact that she arrived at the view that H on the basis of E is evidence for the epistemic propositions that E supports H. Moreover, at least in many contexts, the fact that the meteorologist arrived at the view that H on the basis of E will count as evidence, not only for the epistemic proposition that E supports H, but also for the hypothesis itself, i.e., it will rain tomorrow. This seems especially clear in cases in which a third party lacks access to the original meteorological evidence E (or is incompetent to assess that evidence) but does know that the meteorologist arrived at the verdict that it will rain tomorrow on its basis. In these circumstances, it makes sense for the third party to increase his credence in rain tomorrow, once he learns what the meteorologist has concluded. In effect, in these circumstances, one treats the fact that the meteorologist arrived at the belief that it will rain tomorrow as a kind of proxy for the meteorological evidence to which one lacks access, or which one is incompetent to assess (Kelly 2005). Here evidence of evidence (for H) is itself evidence for H (Feldman 2005). The general lesson is that higher-order evidence sometimes serves as evidence that should make a difference not only to what one believes about the first-order evidence, but also to one's beliefs about the world itself.

Other cases, however, are less clear-cut. For example, suppose that a second trained meteorologist evaluates the available meteorological data E and arrives at her own view about the possibility that it will rain tomorrow. She then learns that the first meteorologist arrived at the view that it will rain tomorrow on the basis of evidence E. Should the second meteorologist count her colleague's opinion as additional evidence for the hypothesis that it will rain tomorrow? Or would doing so be in effect to engage in a kind of illegitimate double counting of the original evidence (Kelly 2005, Matheson 2009)? More generally, in what circumstances, exactly, is evidence of evidence (for some proposition) evidence for that proposition (Fitelson 2012, Feldman 2014)? Questions about the nature and bearing of higher-order evidence are topics of active research.

3. Evidence as a Guide to Truth: Evidence as Sign, Symptom, or Mark

The situation in which I would properly be said to have evidence for the statement that some animal is a pig is that, for example, in which the beast itself is not actually on view, but I can see plenty of pig-like marks on the ground outside its retreat. If I find a few buckets of pig-food, that's a bit more evidence, and the noises and the smell may provide better evidence still. But if the animal then emerges and stands there plainly in view, there is no longer any question of collecting evidence; its coming into view doesn't provide me with more evidence that it's a pig, I can now just see that it is.
   —J.L. Austin, Sense and Sensibilia
‘Not enough evidence God! Not enough evidence!’
   —Bertrand Russell, upon being asked what he would reply if, after dying, he were brought into the presence of God and asked why he had not been a believer

If E is evidence for some hypothesis H, then E makes it more likely that H is true: in such circumstances, E confirms H. On the other hand, if E is evidence against H, then E makes it less likely that H is true: E disconfirms H. Verification is the limiting case of confirmation: a piece of evidence verifies a hypothesis in this sense just in case it conclusively establishes that hypothesis as true. At the other end of the spectrum, falsification is the limiting case of disconfirmation: a piece of evidence falsifies a hypothesis just in case it conclusively establishes that the hypothesis is false. It is at least somewhat controversial whether full-fledged verification or falsification in this sense ever occurs.[16]

Plausibly, there are some propositions whose truth or falsity we grasp in an utterly direct, unmediated way. Consider, for example, simple arithmetical truths such as the proposition that 2+2=4. Traditionally, such truths have been held to be ‘self-evident’; allegedly, they need only to be understood in order to be known. If the truth value of every proposition were transparent in this way, perhaps we would have little or no need for evidence. In contrast, a central function of evidence is to make evident that which would not be so in its absence.

In general, we rely on evidence in cases in which our access to truth would otherwise be problematic. One's recognition that the earth is roughly spherical in shape seems to depend on one's evidence in a way that one's recognition that 2+2=4 does not. Of course, it can be a contested matter whether one's access to truth in some domain is problematic—and thus, whether one is dependent upon evidence for grasping truths about that domain. Common sense holds that we often have unproblematic access to facts about our immediate physical environment via sense perception; perhaps in part for this reason, common sense regards it as at the very least odd, if not simply wrong, to say that one who finds himself face-to-face with what is clearly a pig thereby has strong evidence that the animal is a pig. (Although it would no doubt also be odd to assert that one lacks evidence that the animal is a pig in such circumstances.) In contrast, much traditional epistemology holds that one's access to such truths is always deeply problematic; what is unproblematic, rather, is one's recognition that one's experiences represent the world as being a certain way. Hence, much traditional epistemology construes the relationship between one's experiences and one's beliefs about the physical world on the model of the relationship between evidence and hypothesis. On this model, the fallibility of sense perception is assimilated to the fallibility of non-deductive inference. (The above quotation from Austin is, of course, a protest against the model in question.)

As a general matter, evidence seems to play a mediating role vis-a-vis our efforts to arrive at an accurate picture of the world: we seek to believe what is true by means of holding beliefs that are well-supported by the evidence, and we seek to avoid believing what is false by means of not holding beliefs that are not well-supported by the evidence. The picture is well summarized by Blanshard:

‘Surely the only possible rule’, one may say, ‘is to believe what is true and disbelieve what is false.’ And of course that would be the rule if we were in a position to know what was true and what false. But the whole difficulty arises from the fact that we do not and often cannot. What is to guide us then?… The ideal is believe no more, but also no less, than what the evidence warrants (1974: 410–411).

Indeed, it is plausible to suppose that both the capacity of evidence to justify belief (Section 1) and the fact that rational thinkers respect their evidence (Section 2) depends upon the connection between evidence and truth.

Why should attending to evidence constitute a promising way of pursuing an accurate view of the world? This question is more readily answered on some conceptions of evidence than on others. Thus, consider a theory according to which evidence consists of facts. Given that no true proposition is inconsistent with any fact, one has an immediate rationale for not believing any proposition that is inconsistent with one's evidence, for only propositions that are consistent with one's evidence are even candidates for being true. The same holds for Williamson's conception of evidence as knowledge: inasmuch as any known proposition is true, inconsistency with one's evidence entails inconsistency with some truth. Put the other way around: if evidence consists of facts or known propositions, then no body of evidence rules out any truth. Notice that the same is not true for conceptions of evidence according to which one's evidence consists of one's beliefs, or one's experiences, or propositions of which one is psychologically certain: that a proposition is inconsistent with one of my beliefs, or with the content of one of my experiences, or with a proposition of which I am psychologically certain, does not guarantee that it is false.

Perhaps the root notion of evidence is that of something which serves as a reliable sign, symptom, or mark of that which it is evidence of. In Ian Hacking's phrase, this is ‘the evidence of one thing that points beyond itself’ (1975: 37). Thus, smoke is evidence of fire, Koplik spots evidence of measles, a certain distinctive and off-putting smell evidence of rotten egg. Here, the paradigm would seem to be that of straightforward correlation: the reason why smoke counts as evidence of fire, but not of impending rain, is that smoke is a reliable indicator or symptom of the former but not of the latter. Taken at face value, the idea of evidence as reliable indicator tends to encourage an inclusive picture of what sorts of things are eligible to count as evidence, according to which either mental or non-mental objects, events and states of affairs can qualify as such. For such entities would seem to be perfectly capable of standing in the relevant relation to other objects, events and states of affairs.

Consider the claim that

(1) Koplik spots are evidence of measles.

On what is perhaps its most natural reading, the truth of this claim was an empirical discovery of medical science. At a certain point in time, it was discovered that Koplik spots are a reliable indication of measles—something which was true, presumably, long before the discovery in question. Here, the evidence relation is understood as a relation that either obtains or fails to obtain independently of what anyone knows or believes about its obtaining.[17] To the extent that one is concerned to arrive at an accurate picture of the world, knowledge of instances of this relation—roughly, knowledge of what bits of the world tend to accompany what other bits of the world—would seem to be exactly the sort of thing which one is seeking. When the evidence relation is construed in this way, investigating it is of a piece with investigating the world itself.


(2) Smoke is evidence of fire

would seem to have the same empirical status as (1), differing chiefly in that it is much more widely known.

When evidence is understood in this way, it is no mystery why attending to evidence is a good strategy for one who is concerned to arrive at an accurate picture of the world: given that Koplik spots are in fact a reliable indicator of measles, it obviously behooves those who are concerned to have true beliefs about which individuals are suffering from measles to pay attention to facts about which individuals have Koplik spots. Similarly, given that smoke is in fact a reliable indicator of fire, those who are concerned to have true beliefs about the presence or absence of fire do well to pay attention to the presence or absence of smoke. Thus, when we understand ‘E is evidence for H’ as more or less synonymous with ‘E is a reliable indicator of H’, the connection between evidence and truth seems easily secured and relatively straightforward.

Of course, although the presence of Koplik spots is in fact a reliable guide to the presence of measles, one who is ignorant of this fact is not in a position to conclude that a given patient has measles, even if he or she is aware that the patient has Koplik spots. Someone who knows that Koplik spots are evidence of measles is in a position to diagnose patients in a way that someone who is ignorant of that fact is not. In general, the extent to which one is in a position to gain new information on the basis of particular pieces of evidence typically depends upon one's background knowledge. This fact is a commonplace among philosophers of science and has also been emphasized by philosophically-sophisticated historians.[18]

Suppose that one knows that a particular patient has Koplik spots but is ignorant of the connection between Koplik spots and measles. Moreover, suppose that one's ignorance is not itself the result of any prior irrationality or unreasonableness on one's part: rather, one has simply never had the opportunity to learn about the connection between Koplik spots and measles. In these circumstances, does one have evidence that the patient has measles? Taken in one sense, this question should be answered affirmatively: one does have evidence that the patient has measles, although one is not in a position to recognize that one does. However, the idea that one has evidence in such circumstances seems to sit somewhat awkwardly with the themes that evidence tends to justify belief, and that rational thinkers are sensitive to their evidence. For consider the moment when one first learns that the patient has Koplik spots. Given one's ignorance of the connection between Koplik spots and measles, one is not in any way unreasonable if one fails to become more confident that the patient has measles. Indeed, given one's ignorance, it seems that one would be unreasonable if one did become more confident that the patient has measles upon learning that she has Koplik spots, and that a belief that the patient has measles held on this basis would be unjustified.

This suggests that the notion of evidence in play in statements such as ‘evidence tends to justify belief’ and ‘rational thinkers respect their evidence’ cannot simply be identified with evidence in the sense of reliable indicator. Let's call evidence in the former sense normative evidence, and evidence in the latter sense indicator evidence. Although the normative notion of evidence cannot simply be identified with the indicator notion, we would expect the two to be closely linked, inasmuch as one's possession of normative evidence frequently depends upon one's awareness that one thing is indicator evidence of something else.

Reflection on the role that considerations of background theory play in determining how it is reasonable for one to respond to new information have convinced some that the normative notion of evidence is better understood in terms of a three place-relation rather than a two-place relation. According to this view, judgements of the form ‘E is evidence for H’—when this is understood as more or less synonymous with ‘E tends to make it more reasonable to believe H’— are typically elliptical for judgements of the form ‘E is evidence for H relative to background theory T’. Thus, given that your background theory includes the claim that Koplik spots are a reliable indication of measles, the fact that a particular patient has Koplik spots constitutes normative evidence for you (gives you a reason to believe that) the patient has measles. On the other hand, given that my background theory does not include the claim that Koplik spots are a reliable indication of measles, the fact that the same patient has Koplik spots does not constitute normative evidence for me (give me a reason to believe that) the patient has measles.

The view that the status of E as normative evidence for H can depend upon considerations of background theory immediately raises questions about the status of the background theory itself. Given that one's background theory consists of some set of propositions, which set is it? Is it the set of propositions that one knows? Or rather, the set of propositions that one believes? Or perhaps, the set of propositions that one justifiably believes? It seems that E might count as evidence for H relative to the set of propositions that one believes but not relative to the set of propositions that one knows (or vice versa)—which of these, if either, determines whether E is evidence for H, in the sense that one's possession of E tends to justify one in believing that H is true? The issues that arise here are subtle and delicate; Christensen (1997) is a careful and illuminating discussion.

A note about confirmation theory. Although philosophy had in some sense long been concerned with questions about when evidence makes a theory more likely to be true, the investigation of this relationship reached new levels of systematicity and rigor during the positivist era. The positivists thought of philosophy as ‘the logic of science’; they thus took it to be a central task of philosophy to furnish detailed analyses and explications of fundamental scientific concepts such as explanation and confirmation.

Hempel (1945) and Carnap (1950) each distinguished two different ‘concepts’ of confirmation: the ‘classificatory’ or ‘qualitative’ concept on the one hand and the ‘quantitative’ concept on the other. Roughly, the classificatory concept is employed in the making of yes-or-no judgements about whether a given piece of evidence does or does not support a given hypothesis. Thus, it is the classificatory concept which is in play when one is concerned with judgements of the following form: ‘Hypothesis H is confirmed by evidence E’. On the other hand, the quantitative concept is employed in making numerical judgements about how much support a hypothesis derives from a given piece of evidence (e.g,. ‘Hypothesis H is confirmed by evidence E to degree R’).[19] Formal theories attempting to explicate each of these notions were developed. Hempel (1945) took the lead in attempting to explicate the qualitative concept while Carnap (1950, 1952) concentrated on the quantitative concept. During this period, the philosophical study of the relationship between evidence and theory took on, perhaps for the first time, the characteristics of something like normal science, and became a discipline replete with technical problems, puzzles, and paradoxes, the anticipated solutions to which were viewed as items on the agenda for future research.[20] Here lie the origins of present-day confirmation theory, as represented by Bayesianism in its protean forms (See, e.g., Jeffrey 1965, 1992, 2004, Horwich 1983, Howson and Urbach 1993) and its rivals (e.g., Glymour's (1980) ‘bootstrapping’ model of confirmation).

Although Carnap's own vision for confirmation theory was ultimately abandoned,[21] the quantitative approach that he championed proved influential to the subsequent development of the subject. In particular, the emphasis on attempting to understand confirmation in quantitative terms paved the way for the increased use of mathematics—and specifically, the probability calculus—in the philosophical study of evidence. The idea that the probability calculus provides the key to understanding the relation of confirmation is central to Bayesianism, the dominant view within contemporary confirmation theory. An examination of Bayesianism will not be undertaken here.[22] Instead, we will simply take note of the explication of the concept of evidence which the Bayesian offers. At the outset of the present section, we noted that evidence confirms a theory just in case that evidence makes the theory more likely to be true; evidence disconfirms a theory just in case the evidence renders the theory less likely to be true. The Bayesian takes these platitudes at face value and offers the following probabilistic explication of what it is for E to be evidence for H:

E is evidence for H if and only if Prob(H/E) > Prob(H).[23 ]

That is, E is evidence for H just in case the conditional probability of H on E is greater than the unconditional probability of H. Thus, the fact that the suspect's blood is on the knife is evidence for the hypothesis that the suspect committed the murder if and only if the probability that the suspect committed the murder is greater given that his blood is on the knife than it would be otherwise.


E is evidence against H if and only if Prob(H/E) < Prob(H).

That is, E is evidence against H just in case the conditional probability of H on E is less than the unconditional probability of H. Thus, the fact that the suspect's fingerprints are not on the knife is evidence against the hypothesis that the suspect committed the murder if and only if the probability that the suspect committed the murder is lower given the absence of his fingerprints on the knife than it would be otherwise. Within this probabilistic model, verification (in the sense of conclusive confirmation) would involve bestowing probability 1 on an hypothesis while falsification would involve bestowing probability 0 on it.

This straightforward probabilistic model of evidence and confirmation is an attractive and natural one. Indeed, hints of it are found in Anglo-American law.[24] The model is not without its critics, however. Achinstein (1983) contends that something can increase the probability of a claim without providing evidence for that claim. For example, the information that seven-time Olympic swimming champion Mark Spitz went swimming increases the probability that Mark Spitz has just drowned; nevertheless, according to Achinstein, the former hardly constitutes evidence that the latter is true.[25] According to a line of thought in Goodman (1955), the notion of confirmation that is crucial for science is not to be understood in terms of straightforward increase-in-probability. Thus, consider the generalization that All of the change in my pocket consists of nickels. Examining one of the coins in my pocket and finding that it is a nickel undoubtedly increases the probability that the generalization is true, inasmuch as it now has one less potential falsifier. But Goodman contends the relevant observation does not confirm the generalization, inasmuch as the observation should not make one more confident that any of the other, as-yet-unexamined coins in my pocket is itself a nickel. (According to Goodman, although ‘accidental generalizations’ such as ‘All the coins in my pockets are nickels’ can have their probabilities raised by observations, they cannot be confirmed by them, in the way that ‘law-like generalizations’ can be.)

In general, the idea that the probability calculus provides the key to understanding the concept of evidence has found greater favor among philosophers of science than among traditional epistemologists. In the next and final section, we turn to a cluster of themes that have also been much emphasized by philosophers of science, themes which came to the fore as a result of philosophical reflection upon the role that evidence plays within scientific practice itself.

4. Objectivity, Publicity, and Intersubjectivity: Evidence as Neutral Arbiter

What is creditable … is not the mere belief in this or that, but the having arrived at it by a process which, had the evidence been different, would have carried one with equal readiness to a contrary belief.
   —Blanshard, Reason and Belief

It is natural to suppose that the concept of evidence is intimately related to the cognitive desideratum of objectivity. According to this line of thought, individuals and institutions are objective to the extent that they allow their views about what is the case or what ought to be done to be guided by the evidence, as opposed to (say) the typically distorting influences of ideological dogma, prejudice in favor of one's kin, or texts whose claim to authority is exhausted by their being venerated by tradition. To the extent that individuals and institutions are objective in this sense, we should expect their views to increasingly converge over time: as shared evidence accumulates, consensus tends to emerge with respect to formerly disputed questions. Objective inquiry is evidence-driven inquiry, which makes for intersubjective agreement among inquirers.[26] Thus, it is widely thought that the reason why the natural sciences exhibit a degree of consensus that is conspicuously absent from many others fields is that the former are evidence-driven—and therefore, objective—in ways that the latter are not.

According to this picture, a central function of evidence is to serve as a neutral arbiter among rival theories and their adherents. Whatever disagreements might exist at the level of theory, if those who disagree are objective, then the persistence of their disagreement is an inherently fragile matter, for it is always hostage to the emergence of evidence which decisively resolves the dispute in one direction or the other. Our ability to arrive at consensus in such circumstances is thus constrained only by our resourcefulness and ingenuity in generating such evidence (e.g., by designing and executing crucial experiments) and by the generosity of the world in offering it up.

The slogan ‘the priority of evidence to theory’ has sometimes been employed in an attempt to capture this general theme. However, this slogan has itself been used in a number of importantly different ways that it is worth pausing to distinguish.

First, the claim that ‘evidence is prior to theory’ might suggest a simple model of scientific method that is often associated (whether fairly or unfairly) with Francis Bacon. According to the model in question, the collection of evidence is temporally prior to the formulation of any theory or theories of the relevant domain. That is, the first stage in any properly-conducted scientific inquiry consists in gathering and classifying a large amount of data; crucially, this process is in no way guided or aided by considerations of theory. Only after a large amount of data has been gathered and classified does the scientist first attempt to formulate some theory or theories of the domain in question. On this model, then, evidence is prior to theory within the context of discovery. This model—which Hempel (1966) dubbed ‘the narrow inductivist account of scientific inquiry’—is now universally rejected by philosophers. For it is now appreciated that, at any given time, which theories are accepted—or more weakly, which theories are taken to be plausible hypotheses—typically plays a crucial role in guiding the subsequent search for evidence which bears on those theories. Thus, a crucial experiment might be performed to decide between two rival theories T1 and T2; once performed, the outcome of that experiment constitutes an expansion in the total evidence which is subsequently available to the relevant scientific community. If, however, the two leading contenders had been theories T1 and T3, a different crucial experiment would have been performed, which would have (typically) resulted in a different expansion in the total evidence. The point that the formulation of hypotheses is often temporally prior to the collection of evidence which bears on their truth (and that this priority is no accident) is perhaps most immediately apparent on Popper's falsificationist model of science (1959), according to which exemplary scientific practice consists in repeatedly attempting to falsify whichever theory is presently most favored by the relevant scientific community. But it is no less true on other, less radical models of science, which (unlike Popper's) allow a role for confirming evidence as well as disconfirming evidence. As Hempel puts the point,

In sum, the maxim that data should be gathered without guidance by antecedent hypotheses about the connections among the facts under study is self-defeating, and it is certainly not followed in scientific inquiry. On the contrary, tentative hypotheses are needed to give direction to a scientific investigation. Such hypotheses determine, among other things, what data should be collected at a given point in a scientific investigation (1966, p. 13).[27]

A second, quite different, sense of ‘priority’ in which evidence has sometimes been held to be prior to theory is that of semantic priority. According to this view, the meanings of hypotheses that involve ‘theoretical terms’ (e.g., ‘electron’) depend upon the connections between such hypotheses and that which would count as evidence for their truth—typically on such accounts, the observations that would confirm them. The view that (observational) evidence is semantically prior to theories was central to the logical positivist conception of science. On this picture, meaning flows upward from the level of observation; a given theory is imbued with whatever meaning it has in virtue of standing in certain relations to the observational level, which constitutes the original locus of meaning. The picture was gradually abandoned, however, in the face of repeated failures to carry through the kind of theoretical reductions that the picture seemed to demand, as well as appreciation of the point, forcefully emphasized by Putnam[28] and others, that the meanings of theoretical terms do not seem to change as our views about what counts as confirming evidence for hypotheses in which they occur evolve.

A third and final sense of ‘priority’ in which evidence has often been thought to be prior to theory is that of epistemic priority. On this view, it is not that the task of evidence gathering either is or ought to be performed earlier in time than the task of formulating theories; nor is semantic priority at issue. Rather, the thought is that theories depend for their justification on standing in certain relations to evidence (understood here, once again, as that which is observed), but that observations do not themselves depend upon theories for their own justification. That is: (observational) evidence is prior to theory within the context of justification. This, perhaps, is the interpretation of ‘evidence is prior to theory’ on which the slogan enjoys its greatest plausibility. For it seems that our justification for believing any presently-accepted theory of natural or social science typically does depend upon suitable observations having been made, but that, on the other hand, one can be justified in taking oneself to have observed that such-and-such is the case even if there is at present no available theory as to why such-and-such is the case (and indeed, even if such-and-such's being the case is unexpected or unlikely given the theories that one presently accepts). To the extent that such a justificational asymmetry exists, there would seem to be some truth to the idea that evidence is epistemically prior to theory.[29] And this sort of priority might seem to be exactly what is required if evidence is to play the role of neutral arbiter among those who come to the table with different theoretical commitments.

The idea of evidence as a kind of ultimate court of appeal, uniquely qualified to generate agreement among those who hold rival theories, is a highly plausible one. Nevertheless, complications with this simple picture—some more serious than others—abound. Above, we took note of the widely-held view according to which the bearing of a given piece of evidence on a given hypothesis depends on considerations of background theory. Thus, two individuals who hold different background theories might disagree about how strongly a particular piece of evidence confirms a given theory, or indeed, about whether the evidence confirms the theory at all. Of course, if the question of who has the superior background theory is itself susceptible to rational adjudication, then this possibility need pose no deep threat to objectivity. Often enough, this will be the case. Suppose, for example, that you treat the fact that

(i) the patient has Koplik spots on her skin

as evidence that

(ii) the patient has measles

while I do not, simply because you know that Koplik spots are typically an effect of measles while I am ignorant of this fact. Here, that you treat (i) as evidence for (ii) while I do not is attributable to the straightforward superiority of your background theory to mine: you possess a crucial piece of medical knowledge that I lack. Presumably, if I were to acquire the relevant bit of medical knowledge, then I too would treat (i) as confirming evidence for (ii). The possibility that those who are relatively ill-informed might differ from those who are better informed in the way that they respond to evidence does not itself cast doubt on the capacity of evidence to play the role of neutral arbiter among theories; clearly, what is needed in such cases is for the worse informed party to become privy to those facts of which they are presently ignorant.

However, a recurrent motif in twentieth century philosophy of science is that the bearing of evidence on theory is mediated by factors that might vary between individuals in ways that do not admit of such rational adjudication. Imagine two eminent scientists, both of whom are thoroughly acquainted with all of the available evidence which bears on some theory. One believes the theory, the other believes some different, incompatible theory instead. Must one of the two scientists be making a mistake about what their shared evidence supports? Perhaps the most natural answer to this question, at least at first blush, is ‘Yes’. A fair amount of twentieth century philosophy of science shied away from this natural answer, however, at least in part because of a growing awareness of just how often eminent, fully-informed and seemingly rational scientists have disagreed in the history of science.[30] Thus, Thomas Kuhn (1962) would maintain that both scientists might be perfectly rational in holding incompatible theories, inasmuch as rationality is relative to a paradigm, and the two scientists might be operating within different paradigms. Similarly, Carnap (1952) would maintain that both scientists might be rational because rationality is relative to an inductive method or confirmation function, and the two scientists might be employing different inductive methods or confirmation functions. As we have noted, for the contemporary Bayesian, how it is reasonable to respond to a given body of evidence depends upon one's prior probability distribution: the two scientists might thus both be rational in virtue of possessing different prior probability distributions. There are, of course, important differences among these accounts of rationality. But notice that they each possess the same structure: what it is reasonable for one to believe depends not only on one's total evidence but also on some further feature F (one's prior probability distribution, paradigm, inductive method.). Because this further feature F can vary between different individuals, even quite different responses to a given body of evidence might be equally reasonable. On such views, the bearing of a given body of evidence on a given theory becomes a highly relativized matter. For this reason, the capacity of evidence to generate agreement among even impeccably rational individuals is in principle subject to significant limitations.

Why is relativity to a prior probability distribution (paradigm, inductive method) any more threatening to the idea of evidence as neutral arbiter than the previously mentioned relativity to background theory? The difference is this: when I fail to treat Koplik spots as evidence of measles, there is a clear and straightforward sense in which my background theory is inferior to yours. By contrast, proponents of the views presently under consideration typically insist that a relatively wide range of prior probability distributions (confirmation functions, inductive methods, paradigms) might be equally good. For this reason, such views are often criticized on the grounds that they turn the relationship between evidence and theory into an overly subjective affair.

Proponents of such views are not wholly without resources for attempting to alleviate this concern. In particular, many subjective Bayesians place great weight on a phenomenon known as the ‘swamping’ or ‘washing out’ of the priors. Here, the idea is that even individuals who begin with quite different prior probabilities will tend to converge in their views given subsequent exposure to a sufficiently extensive body of common evidence. However, the significance of the relevant convergence results is highly controversial.[31]

According to the accounts briefly canvassed here, two individuals of impeccable rationality might radically disagree about the bearing of a particular piece of evidence E on a given hypothesis H. Even in such cases, the disputants are not wholly without common ground. For they at least agree about the characterization of the evidence E: their disagreement concerns rather the probative force of E with respect to H. An even more radical challenge to the capacity of evidence to serve as neutral arbiter among rival theories concerns the alleged theory-ladenness of observation. According to proponents of the doctrine of theory-ladenness, in cases of fundamental theoretical dispute, there will typically be no theoretically-neutral characterization of the evidence available. Rather, adherents of rival theories will irremediably differ as to the appropriate description of the data itself.[32]

The doctrine of theory-ladenness is perhaps best appreciated when it is viewed against the background of the positivist tradition to which it was in large part a reaction. For the positivists, evidence was both epistemically and semantically prior to theory. Moreover, central to the positivist conception of science as a paradigm of rationality and objectivity is the idea that its disputes admitted of rational adjudication by appeal to evidence that could be appreciated by both sides. For these reasons, the positivists often insisted that the fundamental units of evidential significance—observation statements or ‘protocol sentences’—should employ only vocabulary that is within the idiolect of any minimally competent speaker of the relevant language. Ideally then, observation statements should be comprehensible to and verifiable by individuals who possess no specialized knowledge or terminological sophistication. Thus, Carnap recommended ‘blue’ and ‘hard’ as exemplary predicates for observation sentences.[33] As against this, Hanson insisted that

… the layman simply cannot see what the physicist sees … when the physicist looks at an X-ray tube, he sees the instrument in terms of electrical circuit theory, thermodynamic theory, the theories of metal and glass structure, thermionic emission, optical transmission, refraction, diffraction, atomic theory, quantum theory and special relativity (1961:19).

But what holds for the physicist and the layman holds also for two physicists with sufficiently different theoretical commitments. Thus

To say that Tycho and Kepler, Simplicius and Galileo, Hooke and Newton, Priestly and Lavoisier, Soddy and Einstein, De Broglie and Born, Heisenberg and Bohm all make the same observations but use them differently is too easy. This parallels the too-easy epistemological doctrine that all normal observers see the same things in x, but interpret them differently. It does not explain controversy in research science (1961:13).

The extent to which observation is theory-laden remains a contested matter.[34] To the extent that evidence which bears on a theory does not admit of a neutral characterization among those with sufficiently different theoretical commitments, this threatens to limit the ability of such evidence to successfully discharge the role of neutral arbiter in such cases. Still, whatever concessions to the proponents of theory-ladenness might be in order, the significance of the doctrine that they defend should not be overstated. For in any case, it seems undeniable that theories sometimes are discredited by the emergence of evidence which is taken to undermine them—even in the eyes of their former proponents.[35] Let's assume then that evidence sometimes does successfully discharge the function of neutral arbiter among theories and is that which secures intersubjective agreement among inquirers. What must evidence be like, in order for it to play this role? That is, given that evidence sometimes underwrites intersubjective agreement, what constraints does this place on answers to the question: what sorts of things are eligible to count as evidence?

Above, we noted that the traditional epistemological demand that one's evidence consist of that to which one has immediate and unproblematic access—and indeed, that one's evidence must be such that one can appreciate it (at least it in principle) even when one is in the most dire of epistemic predicaments—has often encouraged a phenomenal conception of evidence, according to which one's evidence is limited to one's experiences or sense data. On this picture, evidence consists of essentially private mental states, accessible only to the relevant subject. This picture of evidence stands in no small measure of tension with the idea that a central function of evidence is to serve as a neutral arbiter among competing views. For it is natural to think that the ability of evidence to play this latter role depends crucially on its having an essentially public character, i.e., that it is the sort of thing which can be grasped and appreciated by multiple individuals. Here, the most natural contenders would seem to be physical objects and the states of affairs and events in which they participate, since it is such entities that are characteristically accessible to multiple observers. (I ask what evidence there is for your diagnosis that the patient suffers from measles; in response, you might simply point to or demonstrate the lesions on her skin.) On the other hand, to the extent that one's evidence consists of essentially private states there would seem to be no possibility of sharing one's evidence with others. But it is precisely the possibility of sharing relevant evidence which is naturally thought to secure the objectivity of science. Indeed, it has often been held that inasmuch as the objectivity of science is underwritten by the fact that science is evidence driven, it is the public character of scientific evidence which is crucial. On this view, it is a central methodological norm of science to eschew as inadmissible (e.g.) any alleged episodes of incommunicable insight in considering whether to accept or reject a claim. The theme of the essentially public character of scientific evidence has been prominent from the earliest days of modern science—it was championed, for example, by Robert Boyle, founder of the Royal Society, who insisted that the ‘witnessing’ of experiments was to be a collective act[36]—and has remained so up until the present day. Unsurprisingly, the theme was taken up by philosophers of science with gusto. Thus, Hempel required that ‘all statements of empirical science be capable of test by reference to evidence which is public, i.e., evidence which can be secured by different observers and does not depend essentially on the observer’ (1952: 22). The idea was echoed by other leading positivists (see, e.g., Feigl 1953) as well as by Popper (1959). More recently, in the course of reviewing ‘some of the things objectivity, and specifically scientific objectivity, has been thought to involve’, Peter Railton singles out the idea that

… objective inquiry uses procedures that are intersubjective and independent of particular individuals and circumstances—for example … it makes no essential use of introspective or subjectively privileged evidence in theory assessment (1985: 764).

In short, it is not simply that the conception of evidence gleaned from exemplary scientific practice differs from the conception of evidence that traditional epistemology seemed to demand (as would be the case if, for example, one was somewhat more inclusive than the other). Rather, what seemed to be one of the characteristic features of scientific evidence, viz. its potential publicity, is the exact contrary of one of the characteristic features of evidence as construed by much traditional epistemology, viz. its privacy. Such a tension was bound to generate a certain amount of dissonance. One historically noteworthy manifestation of this dissonance was the protracted debate within the positivist tradition over the nature of ‘protocol sentences’. Here, Carnap's odyssey is perhaps the most illuminating. Early in his philosophical career, Carnap, under the influence of Russell and Ernst Mach (and through them, the tradition of classical empiricism) took sense data as the ultimate evidence for all of our empirical knowledge. (Indeed, his early work Der Logischer Aufbau der Welt (1928) is largely devoted to the Russellian project of ‘constructing’ the external world out of sense data.) During this period, Carnap maintained that the protocol sentences that serve as the ‘confirmation basis’ for scientific theories refer to sense data or (to be more precise) ‘the sensing of sense data’. However, under the influence of both Popper and Otto Neurath, Carnap ultimately abandoned this view of protocol sentences in favor of one on which such sentences refer not to private mental events but rather to public objects and states of affairs. As recounted in his philosophical autobiography, the primary motivation for this change of heart was the growing conviction that the conception of evidence as private mental states rendered it inadequate to ground the intersubjectivity and objectivity of science.[37] In this area as in others, the evolution of Carnap's own views was crucial to the evolution of the views of the Vienna Circle as a whole. The episode was well-recounted years later by Ayer:

At the outset … the prevailing view was that these [observation] statements referred to the subject's introspectible or sensory experiences … [I]t was held, following Russell and ultimately Berkeley, that perceiving physical objects was to be analyzed in terms of having sensations, or as Russell put it, of sensing sense data. Though physical objects might be publicly accessible, sense data were taken to be private. There could be no question of our literally sharing one another's sense data, any more than we can literally share one another's thoughts or images or feelings … [T]his conception of elementary statements was exposed to attack on various grounds.… [T]he most serious difficulty lay in the privacy of the objects to which the elementary statements were supposed to refer.… Because of such difficulties, Neurath, and subsequently Carnap, rejected the whole conception of elementary statements. They argued that if elementary statements were to serve as the basis for the intersubjective statements of science, they must themselves be intersubjective. They must refer, not to private incommunicable experiences, but to public physical events (1959: 17–20).

Inasmuch as it is the distinctive function of protocol sentences to report one's evidence, a view about what sorts of contents a protocol sentence might have is in effect a view about what sorts of things can count as evidence. To abandon a view according to which the subject matter of any protocol sentence concerns the ‘private incommunicable experiences’ of some particular individual is in effect to abandon a version of the phenomenal conception of evidence. To adopt in its place a view according to which the subject matter of any protocol sentence concerns ‘public physical events’ is thus a particularly radical shift, inasmuch as this latter view seems to entail that only public physical events can count as evidence—and in particular, that experiences, formerly taken to exhaust the category of evidence, are ineligible to count as such.[38]

Underneath the positivists' changing views about the nature of protocol sentences, however, lay a fundamental assumption that they never questioned. The assumption in question is the following: that there is some general restriction on the subject matter of a sentence if that sentence is a potential statement of one's evidence. This assumption was explicitly rejected by Austin:

It is not the case that the formulation of evidence is the function of any special sort of sentence.… In general, any kind of statement could state evidence for any other kind, if the circumstances were appropriate.… (1962: 116; emphases his).

According to the alternative picture sketched by Austin, there are, indeed, circumstances in which one's having knowledge that things are a certain way depends upon one's having ‘phenomenal’ evidence provided by the fact that is how things look, seem, or appear. Traditional epistemology errs, however, in thinking that this is the general case. Indeed, there are circumstances in which the fact that things are a certain way constitutes one's evidence for judgements about how they look, seem or appear.[39]

Inasmuch as he denies that there are any general restrictions on the subject matter of an evidence statement, Austin's way of thinking about evidence is considerably more liberal or inclusive than that of much of the tradition. In this respect, his account of evidence resembles Williamson's (2000) later theory. As we have seen, Williamson holds that one's evidence consists of everything that one knows. In particular, one's evidence is not limited to one's knowledge of one's experiences, nor is it limited to one's observational knowledge—one's evidence also includes any theoretical knowledge that one might possess (p. 190).

On such liberalized views, although one's evidence is not limited to one's introspectively arrived at knowledge of one's experiences, it includes everything that one knows about one's experiences on the basis of introspection. In this respect, such views are incompatible not only with the phenomenal conception of evidence but also with views that would rule out the objects of introspection as evidence on the grounds that the objects of introspection lack the objectivity and publicity that is characteristic of genuine evidence. However, it is dubious that any view on which evidence plays a role in justifying belief can consistently observe a constraint which would preclude the objects of introspection from counting as genuine evidence. Goldman (1997) argues that any such constraint is inconsistent with the introspectionist methodology employed in various areas of contemporary cognitive science and that this undercuts ‘the traditional view … that scientific evidence can be produced only by intersubjective methods that can be used by different investigators and will produce agreement’ (p. 95).

Reflection on examples drawn from more homely contexts also casts doubt on the idea that all genuine evidence is in principle accessible to multiple individuals. When one has a headache, one is typically justified in believing that one has a headache. While others might have evidence that one has a headache—evidence afforded, perhaps, by one's testimony, or by one's non-linguistic behavior—it is implausible that whatever evidence others possess is identical with that which justifies one's own belief that one has a headache. Indeed, it seems dubious that others could have one's evidence, given that others cannot literally share one's headache.

Here then we see another context in which theoretical demands are placed on the concept of evidence that seem to pull in different directions. On the one hand, it is thought central to the concept of evidence that evidence is by its very nature the kind of thing that can generate rational convergence of opinion in virtue of being shared by multiple individuals. This encourages the idea that any genuine piece of evidence can in principle be grasped by multiple individuals; anything which cannot be so grasped is either not genuine evidence or is at best a degenerate species thereof. On the other hand, evidence is taken to be that which justifies belief. And it seems that many of the beliefs which individuals hold about their own mental lives on the basis of introspection are justified by factors with respect to which they enjoy privileged access. Notably, the positivists' embrace of the idea that protocol sentences refer exclusively to publicly-observable physical objects and events was accompanied by an embrace of behaviorism in psychology.[40] It is characteristic of behaviorism to denigrate the idea that the deliverances of introspection can constitute genuine evidence; on this combination of views then, the thesis that all evidence consists of that which can be shared by multiple observers is upheld. For those who reject behaviorism, however, the idea that at least some evidence does not meet this condition is a more difficult one to resist.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


For help in the preparation of this entry, I am grateful to Richard Feldman, Gilbert Harman, Nico Silins, Timothy Williamson, and especially, Sarah McGrath.

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Thomas Kelly <tkelly@princeton.edu>

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