Notes to Evidence

1. On historical evidence, cf. Collingwood: ‘Everything is evidence which the historian can use as evidence. But what can he so use? It must be something here and now perceptible to him: this written page, this spoken utterance, this building, this finger-print …’ (1956: 247).

2. See, among many similar declarations, Quine (1968: 75): ‘The stimulation of his sensory receptors is all the evidence anybody has to go on, ultimately, in arriving at his picture of the world’.

3. On this, see Section 4 below.

4. Perhaps ‘evidence’ also has something of an empirical connotation that ‘reason to believe’ lacks: it sounds more natural, at least to some ears, to describe a priori philosophical considerations as reasons to believe some philosophical thesis than as evidence for that thesis.

5. Consider what might seem to be among the best candidates for indefeasible evidence: a genuine mathematical proof for the conclusion that p that one correctly recognizes as such. Even in these circumstances, it is arguable that one might acquire further evidence which would render one unjustified in believing p: say, the testimony of expert mathematicians to the effect that one's proof for p harbors some subtle flaw which one lacks the sophistication to detect.

6. A classic discussion of the requirement of total evidence is Hempel (1960).

7. The point was forcefully pressed by Hilary Putnam in the 1960s as a reason for doubting that Carnap's vision for inductive logic was a well-conceived research program. The relevant papers are collected in Putnam (1975). Horwich (1982) concedes the general epistemological point but argues that a broadly Carnapian confirmation theory can successfully accommodate it. Chihara (1987) argues that orthodox Bayesianism founders on the same point. A good discussion of the general issue is Earman (1992).

8. More particularly, the Bayesian will hold that responding to newly-acquired evidence in the appropriate way involves conditionalizing on that evidence. See Talbott (2001) for further discussion.

9. To a first approximation, E is misleading evidence for p just in case (i) E is evidence for p and (ii) p is false. Thus, misleading evidence is genuine evidence in that it satisfies the conditions for being evidence (whatever those conditions turn out to be). In this respect, it contrasts with apparent evidence or fake evidence, which seem to satisfy the conditions for being evidence but do not. The fact that misleading evidence is genuine evidence is why beliefs based on misleading evidence can be reasonable, given that what it is reasonable to believe depends on one's evidence.

10. As is suggested by his use of this name, Williamson himself seems to think that the sameness of evidence requirement entails that the thinker's evidence is exhausted by the thinker's experiences. That seems too strong, however. For one might hold that the thinker has the same evidence in both cases, but that that evidence is not limited to his experiences but also includes (e.g.) his non-object dependent thoughts. Hence, my use of ‘subjective, non-factive mental states’ instead of ‘experiences’ in the text above. Williamson clearly is correct, however, in thinking that the sameness of evidence requirement is incompatible with his own preferred account of evidence, according to which one's evidence consists of all and only those propositions that one knows.

11. Thus, Williamson's theory is an ‘externalized’ theory of evidence, in the sense of Silins (2005).

12. Silins (2005) contends that there are also circumstances in which the thinker in the good case ends up being less reasonable than the thinker in the bad case. He suggests, plausibly, that this is a potentially more embarrassing consequence for such a theory: ‘Even if one is willing to accept the result that one is sometimes more rational in the good case than in the bad case, it is harder to live with the claim that one is sometimes more rational in the bad case than the good case’ (p. 390).

13. Williamson himself would opt for (i): ‘If perceptual evidence in the case of illusions consists of true propositions, what are they? The obvious answer is that things appear to be that way’ (2000: 198).

14. See, for example, Pollock and Cruz: ‘We rarely have any beliefs at all about how things appear to us. In perception, the beliefs we form are almost invariably beliefs about the objective properties of physical objects—not about how things appear to us’ (1999: p. 61).

15. Anticipating such concerns, Williamson devotes some effort to defending the idea that in typical cases of perception one does come to know propositions about how things appear (2000:198-199).

16. A representative denial that either is possible is Ayer (1936), according to which ‘… no proposition is capable, even in principle, of being verified conclusively, but only at best of being rendered highly probable’ (p. 135). But see the preface to the second edition (Ayer 1946) for some second thoughts on this point.

17. Compare Achinstein's (2001) concept of ‘veridical evidence’: ‘in this respect the present concept functions like “sign” or “symptom”. A rash may be a sign or symptom of a certain disease, or a good reason to believe the disease is present, even if the medical experts are completely unaware of the connection and so are not justified in believing that this disease is present, given what they know’ (p. 25).

18. An example of the latter is Collingwood (1956): ‘The whole perceptible world, then, is potentially and in principle evidence to the historian. It becomes actual evidence in so far as he can use it. And he cannot use it until he comes to it with the right kind of historical knowledge. The more historical knowledge we have, the more we can learn from any given piece of evidence; if we had none, we could learn nothing. The enlargement of historical knowledge comes about largely through finding how to use as evidence this or that kind of perceived fact which historians have hitherto thought useless to them’ (p. 247).

19. They also distinguished a third, ‘comparative concept’ of confirmation, which is employed in making judgements of the following form: ‘H is confirmed by E at least as highly as H′ by E′’. The comparative concept will not concern us here.

20. Especially notable among the puzzles was Hempel's (1945) ‘paradox of the ravens’ and Goodman's (1955) ‘new riddle of induction’.

21. Carnap's original vision was breathtakingly ambitious; a fair bit of the subsequent history of the subject has involved scaling back those ambitions. Notably, Carnap's dream of an inductive logic that would parallel deductive logic in having a purely formal character was ultimately abandoned as unworkable; the conclusion that confirmation is not a purely formal matter is often taken to be one of the lessons of Goodman (1955).

22. In addition to the works by Bayesians noted above, Earman (1992) is a sophisticated, sympathetic yet critical survey by a self-described ‘lapsed Bayesian’.

23. For the reasons noted above, Bayesians will typically hold that, strictly speaking, the proper formulation is ‘E is evidence for H relative to background theory T’. For expository purposes, I will treat this relativization to background theory as understood in what follows.

24. Consider, for example, Federal Rule of Evidence 401, which defines ‘relevant evidence’ as that ‘having any tendency to make the existence of any fact that is of consequence to the determination of the action more probable or less probable than it would be without the evidence’.

25. Kronz (1992) and Maher (1996) are replies to Achinstein. Achinstein continues the debate in his (1992) and (2001, ch.4).

26. Indeed, the logical positivists tended to simply identify ‘objective’ questions with those that are susceptible to intersubjective resolution (see, e.g., Feigl 1953: 11).

27. Hempel suggests that the appeal of the ‘narrow inductivist account’ lies in the belief that if theories were formulated prior to the collection of data which bears on their truth, then this would introduce a potentially biasing factor which would jeopardize the scientific objectivity of the investigation (p. 11). He argues, however, that scientific objectivity is underwritten not by the priority of evidence to theory within the context of discovery but rather by the priority of evidence to theory within the context of justification (p. 16). On this point, see below.

28. See especially the essays collected in his (1975).

29. Even when understood in this way, however, the idea that evidence is prior to theory can easily be pushed too far. Thus, as Quine (1951) emphasized, one might be justified in rejecting an apparent observation that p (say, that what one just saw was a centaur) if it conflicts too sharply with one's background theories, even if one would be justified in taking the same apparent observation at face value in the absence of those theories.

30. I believe that historical case studies played a significant role in driving this tendency. In particular, Kuhn's (1962) historically-informed insistence that many of the greatest heroes of scientific inquiry had disagreed with one another in ways that did not seem to admit of rational adjudication, coupled with a certain reluctance to declare one or the other side (or both) unreasonable, led naturally to the embrace of increasingly liberal standards of rationality. Another factor, perhaps equally or more important in some quarters, was the failure to arrive at a consistent version of some (suitably-restricted) Principle of Indifference for assigning prior probabilities to hypotheses and the consequent waning of enthusiasm for this project. This contributed to the rise of subjectivism among those attempting to explicate the concept of confirmation in probabilistic terms, as reflected in the present status of subjective Bayesianism as ‘orthodox’ Bayesianism.

31. A good discussion is Earman (1992, see especially Chapter 6).

32. The loci classici for the doctrine of theory-ladenness are Hanson (1961) and Kuhn (1962). A contemporary defender is Paul Churchland, see his (1979) and (1988).

33. Interestingly, Carnap himself was prepared to admit that this represented something of a departure from actual scientific practice:

To a philosopher, ‘observable’ has a very narrow meaning. It applies to such properties as ‘blue’, ‘hard’, ‘hot’ … To the physicist, the word has a much broader meaning.… In general, the physicist speaks of observables in a very wide sense compared to the narrow sense of the philosopher (1966: 225-226).

34. See, for example, the exchange between Fodor (1984), (1988) and Churchland (1988).

35. Cf. Fodor: ‘Nevertheless, it is perfectly obviously true that scientific observations often turn up unexpected and unwelcome facts, that experiments often fail and are often seen to do so, in short that what scientists observe isn't determined solely, or even largely, by the theories that they endorse, still less by the hopes that they cherish’ (1984: 251).

36. On this aspect of Boyle's thought, see especially Shapin (1994).

37. ‘Under the influence of some philosophers, especially Mach and Russell, I regarded in the Logischer Aufba a phenomenalistic language as the best for a philosophical analysis of knowledge. I believed that the task of philosophy consists in reducing all knowledge to a basis of certainty. Since the most certain knowledge is that of the immediately given, whereas knowledge of material things is derivative and less certain, it seemed that the philosopher must employ a language which uses sense-data as a basis. In the Vienna discussions my attitude changed gradually toward a preference for the physicalistic language … In our discussions, Neurath in particular urged the development toward a physicalistic attitude … In my view, one of the most important advantages of the physicalistic language is its intersubjectivity, i.e., the fact that the events described in this language are in principle observable by all users of the language’ (1963: 50-52). For the influence of Popper on the same point, see p. 32.

38. On the interpretation sketched here, the view of evidence that was ultimately embraced by the logical positivists is the exact contrary of the view that had been embraced by (many) traditional epistemologists: according to the former, evidence is essentially public while according to the latter evidence is essentially private. On an alternative interpretation of the later positivist view, it is not evidence itself which is essentially public, but rather ‘scientific’ evidence, i.e., evidence that it would be appropriate to use in the justification of scientific claims. This would seem to leave open the possibility that, in addition to scientific evidence, there is also non-scientific evidence, which need not have a public character. However, this second interpretation fails to give due weight to the logical positivist view about the relationship between the empirical sciences and possible objects of knowledge. A central tenet of positivism was the view that anything which is a possible object of human knowledge can be known via the methods of the empirical sciences (with the singular exceptions of the a priori and allegedly purely formal disciplines of logic and mathematics). Thus, there was no room within the positivist world view for a category of ‘non-scientific’ evidence: any constraints on the notion of scientific evidence are constraints on the notion of evidence itself. (In this respect, contrast the above passage from Railton, which seems to explicitly allow for the existence of ‘introspective or subjectively privileged’ evidence, in addition to the kind of evidence which is alleged to underwrite scientific objectivity.)

39. ‘It is not true in general that statements of how things are are “based on” statements of how things appear, look, or seem and not vice versa.… I may say, for instance, “The pillar is bulgy” on the ground that it looks bulgy; but equally I might say, in different circumstances, “That pillar looks bulgy”—on the ground that I've just built it, and I built it bulgy’ (1962: 116, emphasis his).

40. See especially Carnap's (1932/33) manifesto ‘Psychology in Physical Language’.

41. For help in the preparation of this entry, I am grateful to Richard Feldman, Gilbert Harman, Nico Silins, Timothy Williamson, and especially, Sarah McGrath.

Copyright © 2006 by
Thomas Kelly <>

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