#### Supplement to Facts

## Some Formal Theories in the Literature

Here we briefly present some existing formal theories of facts. (Vocabulary and results presented in section 2 are presupposed here.)

### Suszko 1968

Suszko 1968 presents an axiomatic modal theory of situations which
aims at partly systematizing the ontological views of the
*Tractatus*, formulated in a language containing propositional
quantifiers (which he sharply distinguishes from objectual
quantifiers) and a binary identity operator
‘=’. Situations are not treated as objects. The
appropriate mode of expression for talking “about”
situations is to use locutions of type ‘it is a situation
that *p*’, which Suszko defines as follows ‘it is a
situation that *p* = (*p* = *p*)’. In
order to discuss the theory in the light of what precedes, we shall
nevertheless assume that situations are objects, designated by
sentences.

In Suszko's theory, every sentence designates a situation. Thus situations have negations, and any finitely many situations can be combined conjunctively and disjunctively. We shall take the facts to be the possible situations (Suszko defines a non-rigid notion of fact, but we will use the one just defined).

Suszko defines a world as a fact such that for every situation *p*, it
necessitates *p* or it necessitates the negation of *p*. All the situations
which are necessitated by a world are possible, i.e. facts, and every
fact is necessitated by some world. We take the domain of a world to be
just the set of all situations it necessitates.

In the theory, *Modal Criterion* holds, as well as *No
Twins* and *Plenitude*. As we saw, situations have
negations, and any finitely many situations can be combined
conjunctively and disjunctively. Thus there is an operation of negation
on facts, and an operation of conjunction and one of disjunction as
well, but restricted to finite collections of facts. This is certainly
an accident due to the lack of expressive power of the language, and
presumably unrestricted operations should be admitted in suitable
extensions of that language.

The notion of a state of affairs is taken as a primitive. States of affairs are facts, they are neither necessary nor impossible, and the negation of a state of affairs is not a state of affairs. Suszko endorses the view that in every possible world, there is at least one obtaining state of affairs, and that every possible world is identical to a conjunction of state of affairs and of negations of state of affairs.

Suszko has an axiom which says that the set of all states of affairs
is *quasi-independent* (our terminology): any finite set of
states of affairs is independent in the sense of section 2.3. But the
set of all states of affairs itself is not independent, since in every
world there is an obtaining state of affairs. (It then follows that the
states of affairs are infinitely many.) A theorem states that every
situation is a disjunction of worlds, namely the disjunction of all
worlds in which it exists. So the set *F* of all facts is generated by
the set of all states of affairs via booleanization. Suszko's theory is
thus a variant of t_{4}, and is pretty close to T_{4}:
Suszko has quasi-independence where T_{4} has independence
*tout-court*.

(Suszko discusses the inner structure of facts. He holds that states
of affairs are complexes containing properties and objects, raises
various questions but does not propose any definitive
principles. Notice that Suszko's attempt at systematizing
Wittgenstein's ideas on facts departs from Wittgenstein's thought on
the matter. As we saw, the latter denies that facts combine by means
of boolean operations, and holds that the set of all facts is
independent *tout court*, not just quasi-independent. Finally,
see Wolniewicz 1982 for a study partly stemming from Suszko's paper
and Wolniewicz 1983 for a more general study, each of which employs an
algebraic framework.)

### Van Fraassen 1969

Van Fraassen 1977 contains a non-modal theory of facts which he uses to provide a semantic analysis of tautological entailments (Cf. Anderson and Belnap 1975). Here we shall present a modal theory based on it, focusing on facts themselves and their relations to propositions, which departs from the original theory but which retains the core of Van Fraassen's ideas and is of interest in itself.

With each world *w* we associate a
domain *D*_{w} of individuals, and we assume
that there is a collection of relations. We also assume that there is
an operation, the *complex-builder*, which takes
any *n*-ary relation *R* and any *n*
members *a*_{1},
…, *a*_{n} from any domain of
individuals to yield a fact [*R*; *a*_{1},
…, *a*_{n}]. The facts obtained that
way are called *complexes*. We take for granted that
each *n*-ary relation has a *dual*, namely that for
each *n*-ary relation *R*, there is
another *n*-ary relation *S* such that given any
individuals
*a*_{1}, …, *a*_{n}
existing in some world, the existence-set of
[*R*; *a*_{1},
…, *a*_{n}] is the complement of the
existence-set of [*S*; *a*_{1}, …,
*a*_{n}]. We assume that each relation has a
unique dual. Notice that the dual of the dual of a relation is the
relation itself. Thus there is an operation of negation defined *on
the set of complexes*. We finally take it that there is an
operation
** ^{c}** of conjunction defined on the set of all
facts, and that the set of all complexes generates the set of all facts
via conjunction.

Given all these assumptions, it is possible to use facts to formulate a theory of truth for certain kinds of propositions. Instead of working directly with propositions, we shall work with an artificial interpreted formal language whose sentences express all the propositions in question, and only them. The language is a first-order language with individual constants, whose basic predicates express relations and whose variables range over individuals, which verifies the following two conditions: (i) every relation is expressed by some basic predicate of the language, and (ii) every individual (taken from any world) is designated by some constant of the language.

We let the *product* of some given sets of
facts *G*, *H*, … be the set of all conjunctions
{*x*, *y*, …}** ^{c}**
for

*x*∈

*G*,

*y*∈

*H*, … The set

*V*

_{w}(

*A*) of

*verifiers*of sentence A at world

*w*, and the set

*F*

_{w}(

*A*) of

*falsifiers*of

*A*at world

*w*are sets of facts are defined as follows:

- For
*F*a*n*-place predicate and*n*_{1}, …,*n*_{n}constants,*V*_{w}(*F*(*n*_{1}, …,*n*_{n})) = {[*R*;*a*_{1}, …,*a*_{n}]} and*F*_{w}(*F*(*n*_{1}, …,*n*_{n})) = {[*S*;*a*_{1}, …,*a*_{n}]},where

*R*is the relation expressed by*F*,*S*is the dual of*R*, and each*n*_{i}designates the corresponding*a*_{i}; *V*_{w}(¬*A*) =*F*_{w}(*A*), and*F*_{w}(¬*A*) =*T*_{w}(*A*);*V*_{w}(*A*&*B*) = the product of*V*_{w}(*A*) and*V*_{w}(*B*), and*F*_{w}(*A*&*B*) = the union of*F*_{w}(*A*) and*F*_{w}(*B*);-
*V*_{w}(∀*x*φ(*x*)) = the product of all the sets*V*_{w}(φ(*n*)) for*n*a name of some member of*D*_{w}, and*F*_{w}(∀*x*φ(*x*)) = the union of all the sets*F*_{w}(φ(*n*)) for*n*a name of some member of*D*_{w}.

It is then easy to verify that for every sentence *A* of our
language,
*A* is true in world *w* iff some verifier of *A*
relative to *w* exists in *w*, and *A* is false
in world *w* iff some falsifier of *A* relative
to *w* exists in *w*.

### Fine 1982

Fine (Fine 1982) distinguishes between two conceptions of facts, the
*propositional* and the *worldly*. On the propositional
view, facts are derivative upon propositions, the identity of a fact
depends on the identity of a given proposition. On that view, every
fact is obtained by applying a fact-forming operation to a given
proposition. On the worldly conception, facts are not derivative upon
propositions. Fine takes it that these two conceptions correspond to
two genuine categories of objects, and calls the first *truths*
and the second *circumstances*. He also distinguishes between
two other, orthogonal conceptions of facts, *objectualism* and
*anti-objectualism*. Objectualism is the view that facts have an
internal structure, that they are composed by objects in a certain way,
and anti-objectualism the opposite view.

Fine presents three theories of facts framed in the language we have
been using here: two anti-objectualist theories, one for truths
(F(A)-Cond) and one for circumstances (C-Cond), and a theory of truths
under the objectualist view (F-Cond). F-Cond has niceties which make it
difficult to present here. F(A)-Cond is just W4 + *Modal
Criterion*, and C-Cond is B2 + B4 + W1 + *Modal Criterion*.
The first theory thus admits of all boolean operations on facts, and
the second admits conjunction.

Theory F(A)-Cond is supplemented by the principle according to which
there is a 1-1 correspondence C between the facts and the propositions
which can be true, such that for any such proposition *p* and any world,
*p* is true at that world iff the corresponding fact exists in that
world, which entails P1. No such principle is introduced to extend
C-Cond, but in the informal part of the paper Fine suggests that P2 is
the right candidate.

### Zalta 1991

Zalta 1991 contains an axiomatic theory of situations, worlds and
states of affairs, in the framework of Zalta's theory of abstract
objects. Zalta defines *situations* as abstract objects which
encode certain properties, namely properties expressed by predicates
of type ‘being such that *p*’, for
‘*p*’ a sentence, and only such properties. A
situation is *part* of another one iff every property the first
encodes is encoded by the second. *States of affairs* are what
is expressed by sentences. Zalta define *worlds* as situations
of a certain kind: a world is a situation *w* which is possibly
such that it encodes being such that *p* iff it is the case
that *p*, for any *p*. We may define the
domain *F*_{w} of a world *w* as the
set of all situations which are part of that world. On the theory,
every possible situation belongs to the domain of some world.

There are two interpretations of the theory. We may take facts to be possible states of affairs, or alternatively, we may take facts to be possible situations and understand ‘state of affairs' as ‘proposition’.

Let us assume the first view. The theory then licences
fact-negation, and fact-conjunction and fact-disjunction restricted to
finite sets of facts. These restrictions arise from the limited
expressive power of the language in which the theory is formulated, it
seems that on a natural extension of the theory, the restriction should
vanish, in which case the theory would be a variant of t_{4}.
*No Twins* holds, but not *Modal Criterion*.

Let assume now the second reading of the theory. There is then a
theorem which says that each world belongs to its own domain and to it
only, so W2 holds. B4 holds, *Modal Criterion* fails, and there
is no negation or disjunction operation on facts. There is an operation
of conjunction on facts, restricted to finite collections of facts, due
to limitations in expressive power. Again, a natural extension of the
theory should drop the restriction, in which case the theory would be a
variant of t_{3}. Principle P1 of truthmaking trivially holds:
given any proposition *p* which can be true, the (possible) situation
which encodes just the property of being such that *p* is part of a world
(in Zalta's system, this means that the world encodes the property of
being such that *p*) iff the situation is part of that world.