Supplement to Facts

The Slingshot Argument

There is a famous argument of Davidson's to the effect that if true statements correspond to facts, then they all correspond to the same Great Fact. This has been called ‘the slingshot argument’. (Davidson 1969; Neale 2001 contains a detailed discussion on the various versions of the slingshot by Davidson and others). We shall here present it and point to possible ways out.

The argument is in substance the following (we talk of sentences where Davidson talks of statements). Let ‘s’ and ‘t’ be two true sentences, consider the sentences of following list, and assume they all correspond to facts:

  1. s
  2. ιx[x = Socrates and s] = ιx[x = Socrates]
  3. ιx[x = Socrates and t] = ιx[x = Socrates]
  4. t

Then under certain assumptions about definite descriptions, we can prove that these four sentences correspond to the same fact. So under these assumptions, we can draw the following general conclusion: any two true sentences ‘u’ and ‘v’ correspond to the same fact if they correspond to facts at all. The assumptions are the following:

  1. Sentences ‘u’ and ‘v’ correspond to the same fact (if they correspond to facts at all) if ‘u’ and ‘v’ are logically equivalent;
  2. Sentences ‘u’ and ‘v’ correspond to the same fact (if they correspond to facts at all) if ‘u’ can be obtained from ‘v’ by replacing a definite description by another, co-referential definite description;
  3. ‘ιx[x = Socrates and u] = ιx[x = Socrates]’ is logically equivalent to ‘u’;
  4. If sentences ‘u’ and ‘v’ are both true, then ‘ιx[x = Socrates and u]’ and ‘ιx[x = Socrates and v]’ are co-referential.

(Here we understand ‘a’ and ‘b’ are co-referential’ as meaning that ‘a = b’ is true.)

There are several ways to block the argument, some more plausible than others.

One may think, for instance, that sentences (b) and (c) above fail to correspond to anything. One rationale for that view may be that only simple predicative sentences can correspond to facts (that is presumably what a Wittgensteinian would say).

Let us assume that there is no such restriction on fact-expressions. Assuming classical logic, that ‘logically equivalent’ means the same as ‘classically logically equivalent’, and a Russellian treatment of definite descriptions (which is favoured by many of us), (C) and (D) are true. And it may be argued that any theory of definite descriptions, whether Russellian or not, should validate (D), and (C) with logical equivalence understood as classical logical equivalence.

Taylor rejects (A) and (C) understood in accordance with a classical view about logical equivalence (Taylor 1985). On his view, two sentences are logically equivalent iff the corresponding biconditional is a logical truth, and what count as a logical truth depends on what one takes to be the logical vocabulary. Taylor excludes identity and any primitive description operator for that vocabulary, and the resulting notion of logical equivalence he calls tight logical equivalence. On that conception of logical equivalence, (C) is false, and Taylor buys (A).

Let us assume now that in premisses (A)-(D), ‘logically equivalent’ means the same as ‘classically logically equivalent’. If (A) is false, then facts are extremely fine-grained. In particular, rejecting (A) leads to rejecting Modal Criterion (see section 2.1.1). For take ‘u’ and ‘v’ logically equivalent. Then ‘u’ and ‘v’ are true in the very same worlds. Suppose that each of these two sentences corresponds to a fact, x and y, respectively, with x and y distinct. The existence-set of x is the set of worlds at which ‘u’ is true, and similarly for y. So x and y have the same existence-set, but they are distinct.

Searle (Searle 1995) rejects (A), as do Barwise and Perry (Barwise and Perry 1981).

(B) is implausible on a Russellian view about descriptions as devices of quantification. Take the sentences ‘ιx[x = Socrates] = Socrates’ and ‘ιx[x is John's favourite philosopher] = Socrates’. On Russell's view, the first is to be understood as ‘there is a unique object identical to Socrates, and whatever is identical to Socrates is identical to Socrates’ and the second as ‘there is a unique object identical to John's favourite philosopher, and whatever is identical to John's favourite philosopher is identical to Socrates’. Now even on the assumption that Socrates is John's favourite philosopher, there is little temptation to view the last two sentences as corresponding to the same fact. (B) is much more plausible if descriptions are treated referentially.

Enemies of (B) include Barwise and Perry (Barwise and Perry 1981), Bennett (Bennett 1988) and Hochberg (Hochberg 2003).

Copyright © 2013 by
Kevin Mulligan <>
Fabrice Correia <>

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