Feminist Perspectives on Power
Although any general definition of feminism would no doubt be controversial, it seems undeniable that much work in feminist theory is devoted to the tasks of critiquing women's subordination, analyzing the intersections between sexism and other forms of subordination such as racism, heterosexism, and class oppression, and envisioning the possibilities for both individual and collective resistance to such subordination. Insofar as the concept of power is central to each of these theoretical tasks, power is clearly a central concept for feminist theory as well. And yet, curiously, it is one that is not often explicitly discussed in feminist work (exceptions include Allen 1998, 1999, Hartsock 1983 and 1996, Yeatmann 1997, and Young 1992). This poses a challenge for assessing feminist perspectives on power, as those perspectives must first be reconstructed from discussions of other topics. Nevertheless, it is possible to identify three main ways in which feminists have conceptualized power: as a resource to be (re)distributed, as domination, and as empowerment. After a brief discussion of theoretical debates amongst social and political theorists over how to define the concept of power, this entry will survey each of these feminist conceptions.
- 1. Defining power
- 2. Power as Resource: Liberal Feminist Approaches
- 3. Power as Domination
- 4. Power as Empowerment
- 5. Concluding thoughts
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In social and political theory, power is often regarded as an essentially contested concept (see Lukes 1974 and 2005, and Connolly 1983). Although this claim is itself contested (see Haugaard 2010; Morriss 2002, 199–206 and Wartenberg 1990, 12–17), there is no doubt that the literature on power is marked by deep, widespread, and seemingly intractable disagreements over how the term power should be understood.
One such disagreement pits those who define power as getting someone else to do what you want them to do, that is, as an exercise of power-over, against those who define it as an ability or a capacity to act, that is, as a power-to do something. The classic formulation of the former definition is offered by Max Weber, who defines power as “the probability that one actor within a social relationship will be in a position to carry out his own will despite resistance…” (1978, 53). Similarly, Robert Dahl offers what he calls an “intuitive idea of power” according to which “A has power over B to the extent that he can get B to do something that B would not otherwise do” (1957, 202–03). Dahl's definition sparked a vigorous debate that continued until the mid-1970s, but even Dahl's best-known critics seemed to agree with his basic definition of power as an exercise of power-over (see Bachrach and Baratz 1962 and Lukes 1974). As Steven Lukes notes, Dahl's one-dimensional view of power, Bachrach and Baratz's two-dimensional view, and his own three-dimensional view are all variations of “the same underlying conception of power, according to which A exercises power over B when A affects B in a manner contrary to B's interests” (1974, 30). Similarly, but from a very different theoretical background, Michel Foucault's highly influential analysis presupposes that power is a kind of power-over; and he puts it, “if we speak of the structures or the mechanisms of power, it is only insofar as we suppose that certain persons exercise power over others” (1983, 217). Notice that there are two salient features of this definition of power: power is understood in terms of power-over relations, and it is defined in terms of its actual exercise.
Classic articulations of the latter definition of power (as power-to) are offered by Thomas Hobbes — power is a person's “present means…to obtain some future apparent Good” (Hobbes 1985 (1641), 150) — and Hannah Arendt — power is “the human ability not just to act but to act in concert” (1970, 44). Arguing in favor of this way of conceptualizing power, Hanna Pitkin notes that power is related etymologically to the French word pouvoir and the Latin potere, both of which mean to be able. “That suggests,” she writes, “that power is a something — anything — which makes or renders somebody able to do, capable of doing something. Power is capacity, potential, ability, or wherewithal” (1972, 276). Similarly, Peter Morriss (2002) and Lukes (2005) define power as a dispositional concept, meaning, as Lukes puts it, that power “is a potentiality, not an actuality — indeed a potentiality that may never be actualized” (2005, 69). (This statement amounts to a significant revision of Lukes's earlier analysis of power, in which he argued against defining power as power-to on the grounds that such a definition obscures “the conflictual aspect of power — the fact that it is exercised over people” and thus fails to address what we care about most when we decide to study power (1974, 31). For helpful discussion of whether Lukes's recent embrace of the dispositional conception of power is compatible with his other theoretical commitments, see Haugaard (2010)). Some of the theorists who analyze power as power-to leave power-over entirely out of their analysis. For example, Arendt distinguishes power sharply from authority, strength, force, and violence, and offers a normative account in which power is understood as an end in itself (1970). As Jürgen Habermas has argued, this has the effect of screening any and all strategic understandings of power (where power is understood in the Weberian sense as imposing one's will on another) out of her analysis (Habermas 1994). (Although Arendt defines power as a capacity, she also maintains that “power springs up between men when they act together and vanishes the moment they disperse” (1958, 200); hence, it is not clear whether she fully accepts a dispositional view of power). Others suggest that both aspects of power are important, but then focus their attention on either power-over (e.g., Connolly 1993) or power-to (e.g., Morriss 2002). Still others define power-over as a particular type of capacity, namely, the capacity to impose one's will on others; on this view, power-over is a derivative form of power-to (Allen 1999, Lukes 2005). However, others have argued power-over and power-to refer to fundamentally different meanings of the word “power” and that it is a mistake to try to develop an account of power that integrates these two concepts (Pitkin 1972, Wartenberg 1990).
Another way of carving up the philosophical literature on power is to distinguish between action-theoretical conceptions of power — that is, those that define power in terms of either the actions or the dispositional abilities of particular actors — and broader systemic or constitutive conceptions of power — that is, those that view power as systematically structuring possibilities for action, or, more strongly, as constituting actors and the social world in which they act. On this way of distinguishing various conceptions of power, Hobbes and Weber are on the same side, since both of them understand power in primarily instrumentalist, individualist, and action-theoretical terms (Saar 2010, 10). The systemic conception, by contrast, views power as “the ways in which given social systems confer differentials of dispositional power on agents, thus structuring their possibilities for action” (Haugaard 2010, 425; see Clegg 1989). The systemic conception thus highlights the ways in which broad historical, political, economic, cultural, and social forces enable some individuals to exercise power over others, or inculcate certain abilities and dispositions in some actors but not in others. Saar argues, however, that the systemic conception of power should be understood not as an alternative to the action-theoretical conception of power, but rather as a more complex and sophisticated variant of that model. For, as he says, its “basic scenario remains individualistic at the methodological level: power operates on individuals as individuals, in the form of a 'bringing to action' or external determination” (Saar 2010, 14).
The constitutive conception of power, by contrast, focuses on the fundamentally transindividual and relational ways in which individuals and the social worlds they inhabit are themselves constituted by power relations. The roots of this constitutive conception can be traced back to Spinoza (2002a and 2002b), and also found in the work of more contemporary theorists such as Arendt and Foucault. (Here it is important to note that Foucault's work on power contains both action-theoretical and constitutive strands. The former strand is evident in his claim, cited above, that “if we speak of the structures or the mechanisms of power, it is only insofar as we suppose that certain persons exercise power over others” (Foucault 1983, 217), whereas the latter strand is evident in his definition of power as “the multiplicity of force relations immanent in the sphere in which they operate and which constitute their own organization; as the processes which, through ceaseless struggles and confrontations, transforms, strengthens, or reverses them;…thus forming a chain or system” (Foucault 1979, 92)).
What accounts for the highly contested nature of the concept of power? One explanation is that how we conceptualize power is shaped by the political and theoretical interests that we bring to the study of power (Lukes 1986, Said 1986). For example, democratic theorists are interested in different things when they study power than are social movement theorists or critical race theorists or postcolonial theorists, and so on. On this view, a specific conceptualization of power could be more or less useful depending on the specific disciplinary or theoretical context in which it is deployed, where usefulness is evaluated in terms of how well it “accomplishes the task the theorists set for themselves” (Haugaard 2010, 426). On this view, if we suppose that feminists who are interested in power are interested in understanding and critiquing gender-based relations of domination and subordination and thinking about how such relations can be transformed through individual and collective resistance, then we would conclude that specific conceptions of power should be evaluated in terms of how well they enable feminists to fulfill those aims.
Lukes suggests another, more radical, explanation for the essentially contested nature of the concept of power: our conceptions of power are, according to him, themselves shaped by power relations. As he puts it, “how we think about power may serve to reproduce and reinforce power structures and relations, or alternatively it may challenge and subvert them. It may contribute to their continued functioning, or it may unmask their principles of operation, whose effectiveness is increased by their being hidden from view. To the extent that this is so, conceptual and methodological questions are inescapably political and so what ‘power’ means is ‘essentially contested’…” (Lukes 2005, 63). The thought that conceptions of power are themselves shaped by power relations is behind the claim, made by many feminists, that the influential conception of power as power-over is itself a product of male domination (for further discussion, see section 4 below).
Those who conceptualize power as a resource understand it as a positive social good that is currently unequally distributed amongst women and men. For feminists who understand power in this way, the goal is to redistribute this resource so that women will have power equal to men. Implicit in this view is the assumption that power is “a kind of stuff that can be possessed by individuals in greater or lesser amounts” (Young 1990, 31).
The conception of power as a resource can be found in the work of some liberal feminists (Mill 1970, Okin 1989). For example, in Justice, Gender, and the Family, Susan Moller Okin argues that the contemporary gender-structured family unjustly distributes the benefits and burdens of familial life amongst husbands and wives. Okin includes power on her list of benefits, which she calls “critical social goods.” As she puts it, “when we look seriously at the distribution between husbands and wives of such critical social goods as work (paid and unpaid), power, prestige, self-esteem, opportunities for self-development, and both physical and economic security, we find socially constructed inequalities between them, right down the list” (Okin, 1989, 136). Here, Okin seems to presuppose that power is a resource that is unequally and unjustly distributed between men and women; hence, one of the goals of feminism would be to redistribute this resource in more equitable ways.
Although she doesn't discuss Okin's work explicitly, Iris Marion Young argues against this way of understanding power, which she refers to as a distributive model of power. First, Young maintains that it is wrong to think of power as a kind of stuff that can be possessed; on her view, power is a relation, not a thing that can be distributed or redistributed. Second, she claims that the distributive model tends to presuppose a dyadic, atomistic understanding of power; as a result, it fails to illuminate the broader social, institutional and structural contexts that shape individual relations of power. According to Young, this makes the distributive model unhelpful for understanding the structural features of domination. Third, the distributive model conceives of power statically, as a pattern of distribution, whereas Young, following Foucault (1980), claims that power exists only in action, and thus must be understood dynamically, as existing in ongoing processes or interactions. Finally, Young argues that the distributive model of power tends to view domination as the concentration of power in the hands of a few. According to Young, although this model might be appropriate for some forms of domination, it is not appropriate for the forms that domination takes in contemporary industrial societies such as the United States (Young 1990a, 31–33). On her view, in contemporary industrial societies, power is “widely dispersed and diffused” and yet it is nonetheless true that “social relations are tightly defined by domination and oppression” (Young 1990a, 32–33).
Young's critique of the distributive model points toward an alternative way of conceptualizing power, one that understands power not as a resource or critical social good, but instead views it as a relation of domination. Although feminists have often used a variety of terms to refer to this kind of relation — including ‘oppression’, ‘patriarchy’, ‘subjection’, and so forth —the common thread in these analyses is an understanding of power not only as power-over, but as a specific kind of power-over relation, namely, one that is unjust or illegitimate. In what follows, I use the term ‘domination’ simply to refer to such unjust or oppressive power-over relations. In the following section, I discuss the specific ways in which feminists with different political and philosophical commitments — influenced by phenomenology, radical feminism, socialist feminism, post-structuralism and analytic philosophy — have conceptualized domination.
The locus classicus of feminist phenomenological approaches to theorizing male domination is Simone de Beauvoir's The Second Sex. Beauvoir's text provides a brilliant analysis of the situation of women: the social, cultural, historical and economic conditions that define their existence. Beauvoir's basic diagnosis of women's situation relies on the distinction between being for-itself — self-conscious subjectivity that is capable of freedom and transcendence — and being in-itself — the un-self-conscious things that are incapable of freedom and mired in immanence. Beauvoir argues that whereas men have assumed the status of the transcendent subject, women have been relegated to the status of the immanent Other. As she puts it in a famous passage from the Introduction to The Second Sex: “She is defined and differentiated with reference to man and not he with reference to her; she is the incidental, the inessential as opposed to the essential. He is the Subject, he is the Absolute — she is the Other” (Beauvoir, xxii). This distinction — between man as Subject and woman as Other — is the key to Beauvoir's understanding of domination or oppression. She writes, “every time transcendence falls back into immanence, stagnation, there is a degradation of existence into the ‘en-soi’ — the brutish life of subjection to given conditions — and liberty into constraint and contingence. This downfall represents a moral fault if the subject consents to it; if it is inflicted upon him, it spells frustration and oppression. In both cases it is an absolute evil” (Beauvoir, xxxv). Although Beauvoir suggests that women are partly responsible for submitting to the status of the Other in order to avoid the anguish of authentic existence (hence, they are in bad faith) (see Beauvoir xxvii), she maintains that women are oppressed because they are compelled to assume the status of the Other, doomed to immanence (xxxv). Women's situation is thus marked by a basic tension between transcendence and immanence; as self-conscious human beings, they are capable of transcendence, but they are compelled into immanence by cultural and social conditions that deny them that transcendence (see Beauvoir, chapter 21).
More recently, feminist phenomenologists have engaged critically with Beauvoir's ground-breaking work, and, in so doing, have extended her insights into power. For example, Iris Young argues that Beauvoir pays relatively little attention to the role that female embodiment plays in women's oppression (Young 1990b,142–3). Although Beauvoir does discuss women's bodies in relation to their status as immanent Other, she tends to focus on women's physiology, and how physiological features such as menstruation and pregnancy tie women more closely to nature, thus, to immanence. In her essay, “Throwing Like a Girl,” Young concentrates instead on “the situatedness of the woman's actual bodily movement and orientation to its surroundings and its world” (Young 1990b, 143). She notes that girls and women often fail to use fully the spatial potential of their bodies (for example, they throw like girls), they try not to take up too much space, and they tend to approach physical activity tentatively and uncertainly (Young 1990b, 145–147). Young argues that feminine bodily comportment, movement and spatial orientation exhibit the same tension between transcendence and immanence that Beauvoir diagnoses in The Second Sex. “At the root of those modalities,” Young writes, “is the fact that the woman lives her body as object as well as subject. The source of this is that patriarchal society defines woman as object, as a mere body, and that in sexist society women are in fact frequently regarded by others as objects and mere bodies” (Young 1990b, 155). And yet women are also subjects, and, thus, cannot think of themselves as mere bodily objects. As a result, woman “cannot be in unity with herself” (Young 1990b, 155). Young explores the tension between transcendence and immanence and the lack of unity characteristic of feminine subjectivity in more detail in several other essays that explore pregnant embodiment, women's experience with their clothes, and breasted experience (See Young 1990b, chapters 9–11).
Many feminists have engaged in similar phenomenological analyses of the tension between transcendence and immanence that is, on this view, characteristic of women's subordination. For further feminist-phenomenological analyses of domination see Bartky 1990, 2002, Bordo 1993, and Kruks 2001. For recent overviews of the current state of the art in feminist phenomenology, see Fisher and Embree 2000, and Heinamaa and Rodemeyer 2010.
Unlike liberal feminists, who view power as a positive social resource that ought to be fairly distributed, and feminist phenomenologists, who understand domination in terms of a tension between transcendence and immanence, radical feminists tend to understand power in terms of dyadic relations of dominance/subordination, often understood on analogy with the relationship between master and slave.
For example, in the work of legal theorist Catharine MacKinnon, domination is closely bound up with her understanding of gender difference. According to MacKinnon, gender difference is simply the reified effect of domination. As she puts it, “difference is the velvet glove on the iron fist of domination. The problem is not that differences are not valued; the problem is that they are defined by power” (MacKinnon 1989, 219). If gender difference is itself a function of domination, then the implication is that men are powerful and women are powerless by definition. As MacKinnon puts it, “women/men is a distinction not just of difference, but of power and powerlessness….Power/powerlessness is the sex difference” (MacKinnon 1987, 123). (In this passage, MacKinnon glosses over the distinction, articulated by many second-wave feminists, between sex — the biologically rooted traits that make one male or female, traits that are often presumed to be natural and immutable — and gender — the socially and culturally rooted, hence contingent and mutable, traits, characteristics, dispositions, and practices that make one a woman or a man. This passage suggests that MacKinnon, like Judith Butler (1990) and other critics of the sex/gender distinction, thinks that sex difference, no less than gender difference, is socially constructed and shaped by relations of power.) If men are powerful and women powerless as such, then male domination is, on this view, pervasive. Indeed, MacKinnon claims that it is a basic “fact of male supremacy” that “no woman escapes the meaning of being a woman within a gendered social system, and sex inequality is not only pervasive but may be universal (in the sense of never having not been in some form” (MacKinnon 1989, 104–05). For MacKinnon, heterosexual intercourse is the paradigm of male domination; as she puts it, “the social relation between the sexes is organized so that men may dominate and women must submit and this relation is sexual — in fact, is sex” (MacKinnon 1987, 3). As a result, she tends to presuppose a dyadic conception of domination, according to which individual women are subject to the will of individual men. If male domination is pervasive and women are powerless by definition, then it follows that female power is “a contradiction in terms, socially speaking” (MacKinnon 1987, 53). The claim that female power is a contradiction in terms has led many feminists to criticize MacKinnon on the grounds that she denies women's agency and presents them as helpless victims (for an exemplary version of this criticism, see Butler 1997).
Marilyn Frye likewise offers a radical feminist analysis of power that seems to presuppose a dyadic model of domination. Frye identifies several faces of power, one of the most important of which is access. As Frye puts it, “total power is unconditional access; total powerlessness is being unconditionally accessible. The creation and manipulation of power is constituted of the manipulation and control of access” (Frye 1983, 103). If access is one of the most important faces of power, then feminist separatism, insofar as it is a way of denying access to women's bodies, emotional support, domestic labor, and so forth, represents a profound challenge to male power. For this reason, Frye maintains that all feminism that is worth the name entails some form of separatism. She also suggests that this is the real reason that men get so upset by acts of separatism: “if you are doing something that is so strictly forbidden by the patriarchs, you must be doing something right” (Frye 1983, 98). Frye frequently compares male domination to a master/slave relationship (see, for example, 1983, 103–105), and she defines oppression as “a system of interrelated barriers and forces which reduce, immobilize, and mold people who belong to a certain group, and effect their subordination to another group (individually to individuals of the other group, and as a group, to that group)” (Frye 1983, 33). In addition to access, Frye discusses definition as another, related, face of power. Frye claims that “the powerful normally determine what is said and sayable” (105). For example, “when the Secretary of Defense calls something a peace negotiation…then whatever it is that he called a peace negotiation is an instance of negotiating peace” (105). Under conditions of subordination, women typically do not have the power to define the terms of their situation, but by controlling access, Frye argues, they can begin to assert control over their own self-definition. Both of these — controlling access and definition — are ways of taking power. Although she does not go so far as MacKinnon does in claiming that female power is a contradiction in terms, Frye does claim that “if there is one thing women are queasy about it is actually taking power” (Frye 1983, 107).
A similar dyadic conception of male domination can arguably be found in Carole Pateman's The Sexual Contract (1988) (although in other respects Pateman's work might be more accurately described as socialist-feminist rather than radical-feminist). Like MacKinnon, Pateman claims that gender difference is constituted by domination; as she puts it, “the patriarchal construction of the difference between masculinity and femininity is the political difference between freedom and subjection” (Pateman 1988, 207). She also claims that male domination is pervasive, and she explicitly appeals to a master/subject model to understand it; as she puts it, “in modern civil society all men are deemed good enough to be women's masters” (Pateman 1988, 219). In Pateman's view, the social contract that initiates civil society and provides for the legitimate exercise of political rights is also a sexual contract that establishes what she calls “the law of male sex-right,” securing male sexual access to and dominance over women (1988, 182). As Nancy Fraser has argued, on Pateman's view, the sexual contract “institutes a series of male/female master/subject dyads” (Fraser 1993, 173). Fraser is highly critical of Pateman's analysis, which she terms the “master/subject model,” a model that presents women's subordination “first and foremost as the condition of being subject to the direct command of an individual man” (1993, 173). The problem with this dyadic account of women's subordination, according to Fraser, is that “gender inequality is today being transformed by a shift from dyadic relations of mastery and subjection to more impersonal structural mechanisms that are lived through more fluid cultural forms” (1993, 180). Fraser suggests that, in order to understand women's subordination in contemporary Western societies, feminists will have to move beyond the master/subject model to analyze how women's subordination is secured through cultural norms, social practices, and other impersonal structural mechanisms. (For Pateman's response to Fraser's criticism, see Pateman and Mills (2007, 205–06)).
According to the traditional Marxist account of power, domination is understood on the model of class exploitation; domination results from the capitalist appropriation of the surplus value that is produced by the workers. As many second wave feminist critics of Marx have pointed out, however, Marx's categories are gender-blind (see, for example, Firestone 1970, Hartmann 1980, Hartsock 1983, Rubin 1976). Marx ignores the ways in which class exploitation and gender subordination are intertwined; because he focuses solely on economic production, Marx overlooks women's reproductive labor in the home and the exploitation of this labor in capitalist modes of production. As a result of this gender-blindness, socialist feminists have argued that Marx's analysis of class domination must be supplemented with a radical feminist critique of patriarchy in order to yield a satisfactory account of women's oppression; the resulting theory is referred to as dual systems theory (see, for example, Eisenstein 1979, Hartmann 1980). As Iris Young puts it, “dual systems theory says that women's oppression arises from two distinct and relatively autonomous systems. The system of male domination, most often called ‘patriarchy’, produces the specific gender oppression of women; the system of the mode of production and class relations produces the class oppression and work alienation of most women” (Young 1990b, 21). Although Young agrees with the aim of theorizing class and gender domination in a single theory, she is critical of dual systems theory on the grounds that “it allows Marxism to retain in basically unchanged form its theory of economic and social relations, on to which it merely grafts a theory of gender relations” (Young 1990b, 24). Young calls instead for a more unified theory, a truly feminist historical materialism that would offer a critique of society and social relations of power as a whole.
In a later essay, Young offers a more systematic analysis of oppression, an analysis that is grounded in her earlier call for a comprehensive socialist feminism. Young identifies five faces of oppression: economic exploitation, socio-economic marginalization, lack of power or autonomy over one's work, cultural imperialism, and systematic violence (Young 1992, 183–193). The first three faces of oppression in this list expand on the Marxist account of economic exploitation, and the last two go beyond that account, bringing out other aspects of oppression that are not well explained in economic terms. According to Young, being subject to any one of these forms of power is sufficient to call a group oppressed, but most oppressed groups in the United States experience more than one of these forms of power, and some experience all five (Young 1992, 194). She also claims that this list is comprehensive, both in the sense that “covers all the groups said by new left social movements to be oppressed” and that it “covers all the ways they are oppressed” (Young 1992, 181; for critical discussion, see Allen 2008b).
Nancy Hartsock offers a different vision of feminist historical materialism in her book Money, Sex, and Power: Toward a Feminist Historical Materialism (1983). In this book, Hartsock is concerned with “(1) how relations of domination along lines of gender are constructed and maintained and (2) whether social understandings of domination itself have been distorted by men's domination of women” (Hartsock 1983, 1). Following Marx's conception of ideology, Hartsock maintains that the prevailing ideas and theories of a time period are rooted in the material, economic relations of that society. This applies, in her view, to theories of power as well. Thus, she criticizes theories of power in mainstream political science for presupposing a market model of economic relations — a model that understands the economy primarily in terms of exchange, which is how it appears from the perspective of the ruling class rather than in terms of production, which is how it appears from the perspective of the worker. She also argues that power and domination have consistently been associated with masculinity. Because power has been understood from the position of the socially dominant — the ruling class and men — the feminist task, according to Hartsock, is to reconceptualize power from a specifically feminist standpoint, one that is rooted in women's life experience, specifically, their role in reproduction. Conceptualizing power from this standpoint can, according to Hartsock, “point beyond understandings of power as power over others” (Hartsock 1983, 12). (I'll come back to this point in section 4).
Just as socialist feminists tried to broaden the theoretical framework for analyzing power so that it might encompass both class exploitation and women's subordination, intersectional theorists have aimed to broaden the framework even further. The goal of theories of intersectionality is to develop a single framework for analyzing power that encompasses gender, class, and race-based subordination, and their complex interconnections. The notion of intersectionality originally arose out of the criticisms of feminists of color of existing feminist conceptions of power (for classic statements, see Crenshaw 1991a and 1991b, and King 1988; for more recent work, see McCall 2005 and Pateman and Mills 2007). As legal theorist Kimberle Crenshaw argues, non-intersectional feminist approaches to power presuppose single-axis frameworks for understanding domination in the context of legal discrimination. A single-axis framework treats race and gender as mutually exclusive categories of experience. In so doing, such a framework implicitly privileges the perspective of the most privileged members of oppressed groups — sex or class-privileged blacks in race discrimination cases; race or class-privileged women in sex discrimination cases. Thus, a single-axis framework distorts the experiences of black women, who are simultaneously subject to multiple and intersecting forms of subordination. As Crenshaw explains, “the intersection of racism and sexism factors into Black women's lives in ways that cannot be captured wholly by looking at the race or gender dimensions of those experiences separately” (Crenshaw 1991b, 1244).
Some theorists of intersectionality have maintained that this term refers primarily to the action-theoretical level. A full analysis of the intertwining of racial, gender, and class-based subordination also requires, on this view, a systemic or macro-level concept that corresponds to the concept of intersectionality. Patricia Hill Collins proposes the term “interlocking systems of oppression” to fulfill this role. As she explains, “the notion of interlocking oppressions refers to the macro-level connections linking systems of oppression such as race, class, and gender. This is the model describing the social structures that create social positions. Second, the notion of intersectionality describes micro-level processes — namely, how each individual and group occupies a social position within interlocking structures of oppression described by the metaphor of intersectionality. Together they shape oppression” (Hill Collins et al 2002, 82).
Most of the work on power done by post-structuralist feminists has been inspired by Foucault. In his middle period works (Foucault 1977, 1978, and 1980), Foucault analyzes modern power as a mobile and constantly shifting set of force relations that emerge from every social interaction and thus pervade the social body. As he puts it, “power is everywhere, not because it embraces everything, but because it comes from everywhere” (1978, 93). Foucault endeavors to offer a “micro-physics” of modern power (1977, 26), an analysis that focuses not on the concentration of power in the hands of the sovereign or the state, but instead on how power flows through the capillaries of the social body. Foucault criticizes previous analyses of power (primarily Marxist and Freudian) for assuming that power is fundamentally repressive, a belief that he terms the “repressive hypothesis” (1978, 17–49). Although Foucault does not deny that power sometimes functions repressively (see 1978, 12), he maintains that it is primarily productive; as he puts it, “power produces; it produces reality; it produces domains of objects and rituals of truth” (1977, 194). It also, according to Foucault, produces subjects. As he puts it, “the individual is not the vis-à-vis of power; it is, I believe, one of its prime effects” (1980, 98). According to Foucault, modern power subjects individuals, in both senses of the term; it simultaneously creates them as subjects by subjecting them to power. As we will see in a moment, Foucault's account of subjection and his account of power more generally have been extremely fruitful, but also quite controversial, for feminists interested in analyzing domination.
It should come as no surprise that so many feminists have drawn on Foucault's analysis of power. Foucault's analysis of power has arguably been the most influential discussion of the topic over the last thirty years; even those theorists of power who are highly critical of Foucault's work acknowledge this influence (Lukes 2005 and, in a somewhat backhanded way, Morriss 2002). Moreover, Foucault's focus on the local and capillary nature of modern power clearly resonates with feminist efforts to redefine the scope and bounds of the political, efforts that are summed up by the slogan “the personal is political.” At this point, the feminist work that has been inspired by Foucault's analysis of power is so extensive and varied that it defies summarization (see, for example, Allen 1999 and 2008a, Bartky 1990, Bordo 2003, Butler 1990, 1993, 1997, Diamond and Quinby (eds) 1988, Fraser 1989, Hekman (ed) 1996, Heyes 2007, McLaren 2002, McNay 1992, McWhorter 1999, Sawicki 1990, and Young 1990). I will concentrate on highlighting a few central issues from this rich and diverse body of scholarship.
Several of the most prominent Foucaultian-feminist analyses of power draw on his account of disciplinary power in order to critically analyze normative femininity. In Discipline and Punish, Foucault analyzes the disciplinary practices that were developed in prisons, schools, and factories in the 18th century — including minute regulations of bodily movements, obsessively detailed time schedules, and surveillance techniques — and how these practices shape the bodies of prisoners, students and workers into docile bodies (1977, 135–169). In her highly influential essay, Sandra Bartky criticizes Foucault for failing to notice that disciplinary practices are gendered and that, through such gendered discipline, women's bodies are rendered more docile than the bodies of men (1990, 65). Drawing on and extending Foucault's account of disciplinary power, Bartky analyzes the disciplinary practices that engender specifically feminine docile bodies — including dieting practices, limitations on gestures and mobility, and bodily ornamentation. She also expands Foucault's analysis of the Panopticon, Jeremy Bentham's design for the ideal prison, a building whose spatial arrangement was designed to compel the inmate to surveil himself, thus becoming, as Foucault famously put it, “the principle of his own subjection” (1977, 203). With respect to gendered disciplinary practices such as dieting, restricting one's movement so as to avoid taking up too much space, and keeping one's body properly hairless, attired, ornamented and made up, Bartky observes “it is women themselves who practice this discipline on and against their own bodies….The woman who checks her make-up half a dozen times a day to see if her foundation has caked or her mascara run, who worries that the wind or rain may spoil her hairdo, who looks frequently to see if her stocking have bagged at the ankle, or who, feeling fat, monitors everything she eats, has become, just as surely as the inmate in the Panopticon, a self-policing subject, a self committed to relentless self-surveillance. This self-surveillance is a form of obedience to patriarchy” (1990, 80).
As Susan Bordo points out, this model of self-surveillance does not adequately illuminate all forms of female subordination — all too often women are actually compelled into submission by means of physical force, economic coercion, or emotional manipulation. Nevertheless, Bordo agrees with Bartky that “when it comes to the politics of appearance, such ideas are apt and illuminating” (1993, 27). Bordo explains that, in her own work, Foucault's analysis of disciplinary power has been “extremely helpful both to my analysis of the contemporary disciplines of diet and exercise and to my understanding of eating disorders as arising out of and reproducing normative feminine practices of our culture, practices which train the female body in docility and obedience to cultural demands while at the same time being experienced in terms of power and control” (ibid). Bordo also highlights and makes use of Foucault's understanding of power relations as inherently unstable, as always accompanied by, even generating, resistance (see Foucault 1983). “So, for example, the woman who goes into a rigorous weight-training program in order to achieve the currently stylish look may discover that her new muscles give her the self-confidence that enables her to assert herself more forcefully at work” (1993, 28).
Whereas Bartky and Bordo focus on Foucault's account of disciplinary power, Judith Butler draws primarily on his analysis of subjection. For example, in her early and massively influential book, Gender Trouble (1990), Butler notes that “Foucault points out that juridical systems of power produce the subjects they subsequently come to represent. Juridical notions of power appear to regulate political life in purely negative terms…..But the subjects regulated by such structures are, by virtue of being subjected to them, formed, defined, and reproduced in accordance with the requirements of those structures” (1990, 2). The implication of this for feminists is, according to Butler, that “feminist critique ought also to understand how the category of ‘women’, the subject of feminism, is produced and restrained by the very structures of power through which emancipation is sought” (1990, 2). This Foucaultian insight into the nature of subjection — into the ways in which becoming a subject means at the same time being subjected to power relations — thus forms the basis for Butler's trenchant critique of the category of women, and for her call for a subversive performance of the gender norms that govern the production of gender identity. In Bodies that Matter (1993), Butler extends this analysis to consider the impact of subjection on the bodily materiality of the subject. As she puts is, “power operates for Foucault in the constitution of the very materiality of the subject, in the principle which simultaneously forms and regulates the ‘subject’ of subjectivation” (1993, 34). Thus, for Butler, power understood as subjection is implicated in the process of determining which bodies come to matter, whose lives are livable and whose deaths grievable. In The Psychic Life of Power (1997), Butler expands further on the Foucaultian notion of subjection, bringing it into dialogue with a Freudian account of the psyche. In the introduction to that text, Butler notes that subjection is a paradoxical form of power. It has an element of domination and subordination, to be sure, but, she writes, “if, following Foucault, we understand power as forming the subject as well, as providing the very condition of its existence and the trajectory of its desire, then power is not simply what we oppose but also, in a strong sense, what we depend on for our existence and what we harbor and preserve in the beings that we are” (1997, 2). Although Butler credits Foucault with recognizing the fundamentally ambivalent character of subjection, she also argues that he does not offer an account of the specific mechanisms by which the subjected subject is formed. For this, Butler maintains, we need an analysis of the psychic form that power takes, for only such an analysis can illuminate the passionate attachment to power that is characteristic of subjection.
Although many feminists have found Foucault's analysis of power extremely fruitful and productive, Foucault has also had his share of feminist critics. In a very influential early assessment, Nancy Fraser argues that, although Foucault's work offers some interesting empirical insights into the functioning of modern power, it is “normatively confused” (Fraser 1989, 31). In his writings on power, Foucault seems to eschew normative categories, preferring instead to describe the way that power functions in local practices and to argue for the appropriate methodology for studying power. He even seems to suggest that such normative notions as autonomy, legitimacy, sovereignty, and so forth, are themselves effects of modern power (this point has been contested recently in the literature on Foucault; see Allen 2008a and Oksala 2005). Fraser claims that this attempt to remain normatively neutral or even critical of normativity is incompatible with the politically engaged character of Foucault's writings. Thus, for example, although Foucault claims that power is always accompanied by resistance, Fraser argues that he cannot explain why domination ought to be resisted. As she puts it, “only with the introduction of normative notions of some kind could Foucault begin to answer such questions. Only with the introduction of normative notions could he begin to tell us what is wrong with the modern power/knowledge regime and why we ought to oppose it” (1989, 29). Other feminists have criticized the Foucaultian claim that the subject is an effect of power. According to feminists such as Linda Martín Alcoff and Seyla Benhabib, such a claim implies a denial of agency that is incompatible with the demands of feminism as an emancipatory social movement (Alcoff 1990, Benhabib 1992, and Benhabib et al. 1995; for a reply to this line of criticism, see Allen 2008a chs. 2 and 3). Finally, Nancy Hartsock (1990 and 1996) calls into question the usefulness of Foucault's work as an analytical tool. Hartsock makes two related arguments against Foucault. First, she argues that his analysis of power is not a theory for women because it does not examine power from the epistemological point of view of the subordinated; in her view, Foucault analyzes power from the perspective of the colonizer, rather than the colonized (1990). Second, Foucault's analysis of power fails to adequately theorize structural relations of inequality and domination that undergird women's subordination; this is related to the first argument because “domination, viewed from above, is more likely to look like equality”(1996, 39; for a response to this critique, see Allen 1996 and 1999).
Despite these and other trenchant feminist critiques of Foucault (see, for example, Hekman, ed. 1996 and Ramazanoglu, ed. 1993), his analysis of power continues to be an extremely useful resource for feminist conceptions of domination.
An important recent contribution to the feminist literature on power has come from a very different methodological perspective than the post-structuralist/Foucaultian perspective discussed in the previous section. In her 2006 book, Analyzing Oppression, Ann Cudd draws on the framework of rational choice theory to analyze oppression (for related work on rational choice theory and power, see Dowding 2001 and 2009; for critical discussion, see Allen 2008c).
Cudd defines oppression in terms of four conditions: 1) the group condition, which states that individuals are subjected to unjust treatment because of their membership (or ascribed membership) in certain social groups (Cudd 2006, 21); 2) the harm condition, which stipulates that individuals are systematically and unfairly harmed as a result of such membership (Cudd 2006, 21); 3) the coercion condition, which specifies that the harms that those individuals suffer are brought about through unjustified coercion (Cudd 2006, 22); and 4) the privilege condition, which states that such coercive, group-based harms count as oppression only when there exist other social groups who derive a reciprocal privilege or benefit from that unjust harm (Cudd 2006, 22–23). Cudd then defines oppression as “an objective social phenomenon” characterized by these four conditions (Cudd 2006, 23).
As Cudd sees it, the most difficult and interesting question that an analysis of oppression must confront is the “endurance question: how does oppression endure over time in spite of humans' rough natural equality?” (Cudd 2006, 25). Any satisfactory answer to this question must draw on a combination of empirical, social-scientific research and normative philosophical theorizing, inasmuch as a theory of oppression is an explanatory theory of a normative concept (Cudd 2006, 26). (That oppression is a normative — rather than a purely descriptive — concept is evident from the fact that it is defined as an unjust or unfair set of power relations). Cudd argues that social-theoretical frameworks such as functionalism, psychoanalysis, and evolutionary psychology are inadequate for theorizing oppression (Cudd 2006, 39–45). Structural rational choice theory, in her view, best meets reasonable criteria of explanatory adequacy and therefore provides the best social-theoretical framework for analyzing oppression. By appealing to a structural theory of rational choice, Cudd's analysis of oppression avoids relying on assumptions about the psychology of individual agents. Rather, as Cudd puts it, “the structural theory of rational choice assesses the objective social rewards and penalties that are consequent on” the interactions and social status of specific group members and “uses these assessments to impute preferences and beliefs to individuals based purely on their social group memberships” (Cudd 2006, 45). But, as a structural theory of rational choice, the framework assumes “that agents behave rationally in the sense that they choose actions that maximize their (induced) expected utilities” (Cudd 2006, 46). In other words, structural rational choice theory models human actions as “(basically instrumentally rational) individual choice constrained within socially structured payoffs” (Cudd 2006, 37). When utilized to analyze oppression, structural rational choice theory suggests that the key to answering the endurance question lies in the fact that “the oppressed are co-opted through their own short-run rational choices to reinforce the long-run oppression of their social group” (Cudd 2006, 21–22).
Up to this point, much of this entry has focused, as does much of the feminist literature on this topic, on power understood in terms of an oppressive or unjust power-over relationship. I have used the term 'domination' to refer to such relationships, though some of the theorists discussed above prefer the terms 'oppression' or 'subjection', and others refer to this phenomenon simply as 'power'. However, a significant strand of feminist theorizing of power starts with the contention that the conception of power as power-over, domination, or control is implicitly masculinist. In order to avoid such masculinist connotations, many feminists from a variety of theoretical backgrounds have argued for a reconceptualization of power as a capacity or ability, specifically, the capacity to empower or transform oneself and others. Thus, these feminists have tended to understood power not as power-over but as power-to. (Wartenberg (1990) argues that this feminist understanding of power, which he calls transformative power, is actually a type of power-over, albeit one that is distinct from domination because it aims at empowering those over whom it is exercised. However, most of the feminists who embrace this transformative or empowerment-based conception of power explicitly define it as an ability or capacity and present it as an alternative to putatively masculine notions of power-over. Thus, in what follows, I will follow their usage rather than Wartenberg's.)
For example, Jean Baker Miller claims that “women's examination of power…can bring new understanding to the whole concept of power” (Miller 1992, 241). Miller rejects the definition of power as domination; instead, she defines it as “the capacity to produce a change — that is, to move anything from point A or state A to point B or state B” (Miller 1992, 241). Miller suggests that power understood as domination is particularly masculine; from women's perspective, power is understood differently: “there is enormous validity in women's not wanting to use power as it is presently conceived and used. Rather, women may want to be powerful in ways that simultaneously enhance, rather than diminish, the power of others” (Miller 1992, 247–248).
Similarly, Virginia Held argues against the masculinist conception of power as “the power to cause others to submit to one's will, the power that led men to seek hierarchical control and…contractual constraints” (Held 1993, 136). Held views women's unique experiences as mothers and caregivers as the basis for new insights into power; as she puts it, “the capacity to give birth and to nurture and empower could be the basis for new and more humanly promising conceptions than the ones that now prevail of power, empowerment, and growth” (Held 1993, 137). According to Held, “the power of a mothering person to empower others, to foster transformative growth, is a different sort of power from that of a stronger sword or a dominant will” (Held 1993, 209). On Held's view, a feminist analysis of society and politics leads to an understanding of power as the capacity to transform and empower oneself and others.
This conception of power as transformative and empowering is also a prominent theme in lesbian feminism and ecofeminism. For example, Sarah Lucia Hoagland is critical of the masculine conception of power with its focus on “state authority, police and armed forces, control of economic resources, control of technology, and hierarchy and chain of command” (Hoagland 1988, 114). Instead, Hoagland defines power as “power-from-within” which she understands as “the power of ability, of choice and engagement. It is creative; and hence it is an affecting and transforming power but not a controlling power” (Hoagland 1988, 118). Similarly, Starhawk claims that she is “on the side of the power that emerges from within, that is inherent in us as the power to grow is inherent in the seed” (Starhawk 1987, 8). For both Hoagland and Starhawk, power-from-within is a positive, life-affirming, and empowering force that stands in stark contrast to power understood as domination, control or imposing one's will on another.
A similar understanding of power can also be found in the work of the prominent French feminists Luce Irigaray and Hélène Cixous. Irigaray, for example, urges feminists to question the definition of power in phallocratic cultures, for if feminists “aim simply for a change in the distribution of power, leaving intact the power structure itself, then they are resubjecting themselves, deliberately or not, to a phallocratic order” (Irigaray 1985, 81), that is, to a discursive and cultural order that privileges the masculine, represented by the phallus. If we wish to subvert the phallocratic order, according to Irigaray, we will have to reject “a definition of power of the masculine type” (Irigaray 1985, 81). Some feminists interpret Irigaray's work on sexual difference as suggesting an alternative conception of power as transformative, a conception that is grounded in a specifically feminine economy (see Irigaray 1981 and Kuykendall 1983). Similarly, Cixous claims that “les pouvoirs de la femme” do not consist in mastering or exercising power over others, but instead are a form of “power over oneself” (Cixous 1977, 483–84).
Along similar lines, Nancy Hartsock refers to the understanding of power “as energy and competence rather than dominance” as “the feminist theory of power” (Hartsock 1983, 224). Hartsock argues that precursors of this theory can be found in the work of some women who did not consider themselves to be feminists — most notably, Hannah Arendt, whose rejection of the command-obedience model of power and definition of ‘power’ as “the human ability not just to act but to act in concert” overlaps significantly with the feminist conception of power as empowerment (1970, 44). Arendt's definition of ‘power’ brings out another aspect of the definition of ‘power’ as empowerment because of her focus on community or collective empowerment (on the relationship between power and community, see Hartsock 1983, 1996). This aspect of empowerment is evident in Mary Parker Follett's distinction between power-over and power-with; for Follett, power-with is a collective ability that is a function of relationships of reciprocity between members of a group (Follett 1942). Hartsock finds it significant that the theme of power as capacity or empowerment has been so prominent in the work of women who have written about power. In her view, this points in the direction of a feminist standpoint that “should allow us to understand why the masculine community constructed…power, as domination, repression, and death, and why women's accounts of power differ in specific and systematic ways from those put forward by men….such a standpoint might allow us to put forward an understanding of power that points in more liberatory directions” (Hartsock 1983, 226).
As this entry shows, there is a wide variety of feminist perspectives on power. If it is true, as I claimed at the outset, that power is a central concept for feminist theory, then the rich variety of feminist work on this topic should not be particularly surprising. And yet much work remains to be done. For example, feminist conceptions of domination must be continually refined in light of the ever-changing social, cultural, and historical circumstances that the concept aims to illuminate. At present, two of the most pressing needs in this respect are to develop existing intersectional analyses of power further and to rethink such analyses in light of recent discussions of globalization, cosmopolitanism, and transnational justice. With respect to empowerment, the challenge is for feminists to rethink this concept in ways that are not reliant on arguably essentialist conceptions of femininity, that is, conceptions that presuppose a universal essence of the feminine. More work also remains to be done to clarify the relationship between the action-theoretical, systemic, and constitutive dimensions of power. If we are to make these and other theoretical advances, however, feminists will have to spend more time explicitly discussing and defending the conceptions of power that up to now have been largely implicit in their work.
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Arendt, Hannah | Beauvoir, Simone de | critical theory | existentialism | feminism-analytic | feminism-body | feminism-continental | feminism-intersections | feminism-radical | feminism-sex | feminist (interventions): liberal feminism | feminist (topics): perspectives on class and work | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self | Foucault, Michel | identity politics | Marx, Karl | phenomenology | race