Notes to Fictionalism

1. The distinction hermeneutic/revolutionary comes from Burgess 1983, who distinguishes between hermeutic and revolutionary nominalism. This distinction is also put to important use in Burgess and Rosen 1997. Stanley (2001, p. 36) introduced the terminology of hermeneutic versus revolutionary fictionalism.

2. What Yablo actually says is, “Objects with a tendency to turn up unexpected in truth-conditions like this can be called platonic”. Strictly, objects are platonic relative to areas of discourse. An example: many hold that the truth-condition for “argument A is invalid” is: A has a countermodel. Given this, countermodels are platonic, relative to discourse about validity.

3. For criticisms of specific fictionalisms see e.g. MacBride 1999 on Field's mathematical fictionalism; Rosen 1994 on how exactly to understand the fictionalist element in van Fraassen's scientific fictionalism (see too van Fraassen's (1994) reply); Blackburn 2005, Hussain 2004, and Lillehammer 2004 on moral fictionalism; and Sider 1993, Eklund 2002 and Uzquiano 2004 on van Inwagen's fictionalism about ordinary objects. Consult Daniel Nolan's entry on modal fictionalism for what criticisms have been leveled specifically against modal fictionalism. (With respect to each of the fictionalist theories here mentioned, there are other important critical discussions. The critical discussions mentioned here are ones specifically directed at the fictionalist element in the theories concerned.)

4. One nice question here is how fictionalism fares, as an option for the antirealist, as compared to other alternatives to an outright error theory, such as Blackburn's quasi-realism. See the exchange between David Lewis and Simon Blackburn in Kalderon 2005.

Copyright © 2011 by
Matti Eklund <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to