First published Fri Mar 30, 2007; substantive revision Mon Oct 19, 2015

Fictionalism about a region of discourse can provisionally be characterized as the view that claims made within that discourse are not best seen as aiming at literal truth but are better regarded as a sort of ‘fiction’. As we will see, this first characterization of fictionalism is in several ways rough. But it is a useful point of departure.

This entry is divided into five main sections. The first section contains a brief history and overview of fictionalist views. The second section describes more carefully what different fictionalist theses there are. In the third and fourth sections, important arguments for and against fictionalism are summarized. The fifth section is devoted to a more general discussion of the philosophical significance of fictionalism.

1. Brief History and Overview

Some historically especially important precursors to modern fictionalism are Jeremy Bentham (see Ogden 1932), Hans Vaihinger, and, specifically in the moral case, Friedrich Nietzsche. Voltaire's famous “If God did not exist, it would be necessary to invent him” can be seen as expressing a fictionalist stance toward theism. Moreover, George Berkeley's advice to think with the learned and speak with the vulgar well expresses a fictionalist stance (from §51 of A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge, defending his immaterialism from the charge that it does not fit the way we speak). Sometimes Hume is mentioned as an early fictionalist (see for example Varzi 2013). Among still earlier predecessors, we have Pyrrhonism (see Sextus Empiricus, “Outlines of Scepticism”); as well as the doctrine of the two truths in Buddhist philosophy (see Garfield 2006). Pierre Duhem (1913) argues that the dominant view on astronomy before the advent of modern physics was that a fictionalist attitude was appropriate. For some discussion of these historical precursors, see Gideon Rosen (2005) (for a discussion of Pyrrhonism, the early history of astronomy, and Bentham), Arthur Fine (1993) (for a discussion of Vaihinger), and Nadeem Hussain (2007) (for a discussion of Nietzsche and other 19th century German philosophers with fictionalist tendencies).

More recently, Hartry Field (1980 and 1989), Joseph Melia (e.g. 2000), Mark Balaguer (e.g. 1998) and Stephen Yablo (see especially 2000, 2000a, 2001 and 2002) have defended fictionalism about mathematical discourse (see here the entry on fictionalism in the philosophy of mathematics); Bas van Fraassen (1980) has defended a version of fictionalism about scientific theories; Richard Joyce (2001, 2005), Mark Kalderon (2005) and Daniel Nolan, Greg Restall and Caroline West (2005) have defended moral fictionalism; Kendall Walton (1985, 1990 , 2000), Mark Crimmins (1998), Stuart Brock (2002), Mark Balaguer (1998a), Anthony Everett (2005), and Frederick Kroon (2000, 2004) fictionalism about things like negative existentials, identity statements, propositional attitude reports, and fictional characters; Peter van Inwagen (1990) and Cian Dorr and Gideon Rosen (2002) fictionalism about ordinary object discourse; Bradley Armour-Garb and James Woodbridge (2015) and Alexis Burgess and John Burgess (2011) fictionalism about truth; and D.M. Armstrong (1989), Gideon Rosen (1990), John Nolt (1986), Seahwa Kim (2005) and John Divers (1999) modal fictionalism (see here the entry on modal fictionalism). Needless to say, this is a just a sample of recent defenses of fictionalist views. See the bibliography for some further references. For some recent overviews of fictionalism, see Caddick Bourne (2013), Divers and Liggins (2005), and Sainsbury (2010).

2. Some Qualifications and Distinctions

The earlier provisional characterization of fictionalism needs qualification and supplementation. In this section, more precision will be provided.

2.1 Language and ontology

A first crucial distinction is between a linguistic and an ontological thesis. The linguistic thesis is, roughly, that already expressed above, according to which utterances of sentences of the discourse are best seen not as efforts to say what is literally true, but as useful fictions of some sort. The ontological thesis, by contrast, is the thesis that the entities characteristic of the discourse do not exist, or have the ontological status of fictional entities. One can in principle embrace the linguistic thesis without embracing the ontological thesis, and vice versa.

Quite often the theses are run together. Nolan, Restall and West (2005) say, when introducing fictionalism, “The simplest fictionalist approach to a discourse takes certain claims in that discourse to be literally false, but nevertheless worth uttering in certain contexts, since the pretence that such claims are true is worthwhile for various theoretical purposes”. (The complication that they introduce is that some fictionalists may simply be agnostic about the relevant claims.) Zoltán Szabó (2001) says, “To be a fictionalist about Fs is to think that our naïve attitude toward F-discourse is only halfway correct: we are right in thinking that we use genuine singular terms that purport to refer to Fs, but wrong in thinking that they actually succeed in referring. In engaging in F-discourse we inadvertently slip into fictional talk”. One reason that the linguistic and ontological theses are often run together is that the linguistic thesis is often motivated by ontological concerns. For example, someone who is a nominalist might on that ground find herself attracted to fictionalism about mathematical discourse.

The focus in this entry will primarily be on the linguistic thesis. The ontological thesis might be held by someone who holds that we are better off simply abandoning or rejecting the target discourse, and that is not a distinctively fictionalist thesis.

2.2 Hermeneutic and revolutionary fictionalism

A second distinction is between hermeneutic and revolutionary fictionalism.[1] Hermeneutic fictionalism about a discourse D is a thesis about the actual nature of the discourse: according to hermeneutic fictionalism we actually do not aim at the literal truth but only appear or pretend to do so. Revolutionary fictionalism, by contrast, insists that when engaging in D we ought only to make such pretend-assertions; the point of engaging in D would be achieved by pretend-assertions. Obviously, hermeneutic and revolutionary fictionalism are different theses and must be evaluated separately. In the rest of the discussion in section 2, I will focus primarily on hermeneutic fictionalism. I trust that it will be straightforward to see how the points generalize to revolutionary fictionalism.

2.3 Meaning versus use

Most hermeneutic fictionalists about some particular discourse hold that although we normally utter sentences within the discourse in a fictional spirit, we could, and perhaps sometimes do, use these sentences literally. For example, a mathematical fictionalist might hold that when we utter “there are prime numbers” in ordinary contexts we mean this in a fictional spirit, but add that when we utter this sentence in the philosophy room we sometimes intend to speak literally. But one can at least imagine a different kind of hermeneutic fictionalism. Take the case of discourse about fictional characters. A name like ‘SpongeBob’ is first introduced for the purposes of story telling and for making claims internal to the story; for example, the claim that SpongeBob lives in a pineapple under the sea. But there is disagreement about the proper account of the use of names of fictional entities extrafictive, non-story-telling contexts, e.g. in “SpongeBob is a better role model than Superman”. Some philosophers hold that this ‘extrafictive’ use of fictional names shows that ‘SpongeBob’ has a reference outside the fiction (for example, that it refers to an abstract entity). Others hold that while ‘SpongeBob’ can be used meaningfully in such contexts, it is nonetheless, in such contexts, a mere non-referring empty name, alongside ‘Zeus’ and ‘Vulcan’. But we can imagine a third kind of view, according to which names of fictional characters are, as it were, only meaningful inside the fiction. Anyone attracted to such a view must tell some special story about seeming extrafictive truths (Brock 2002). Similarly, and returning to fictionalism, one can imagine a fictionalist about some discourse who denies that the relevant sentences even can be meaningfully used outside the pretense; who holds that the sentences only have pretense-uses.

The view may sound farfetched. But Yablo (1998) comes close to suggesting a view of this sort when he says, after having motivated fictionalism about the use of names of cities, that he does not know what it would be to use “Chicago exists” more literally than he already does. Let us call the fictionalism according to which there is a literal use of the sentences in question with which the ordinary use contrasts use fictionalism; call the other meaning fictionalism. The distinction may correspond to Armour-Garb and Woodbridge's (2015) distinction between extrinsic and intrinsic pretense. Armour-Garb and Woodbridge say that what characterizes extrinsic pretense is that we could take the utterance made literally, whereas in cases of intrinsic pretense, “the pretense is integral to the utterance saying anything at all”. Use fictionalism is arguably by far the more common doctrine. But it is worth mentioning meaning fictionalism as well, both because some fictionalists appear to endorse it, and because the distinction will be relevant to some of the arguments against fictionalism. Armour-Garb and Woodbridge call their own brand of fictionalism semantic and oppose what they call pragmatic accounts.

Following Yablo (2001), one can distinguish between the following fictionalist views (about discourse about Xs):

Instrumentalism: the speaker is not “really” asserting anything, only pretending to do so.

Meta-fictionalism: the speaker is “really” asserting that according to a certain fiction, the Xs are so and so.

Object-fictionalism: the speaker is “really” asserting that the world is in a certain condition, namely, the condition it needs to be in to make it true in the relevant fiction that the Xs are so and so.

Figuralism: the speaker is “really” asserting that something is in a certain condition, but perhaps not the world; the Xs are functioning as representational aids in a figurative description of the Ys, where the Ys may themselves be representational aids invoked to help us describe still further objects.

Let us take number discourse as our example, and consider these fictionalist views as applied to number discourse. The instrumentalist says that in an utterance of “the number of apples is two”, the speaker is merely pretending to assert something; nothing is really asserted. The instrumentalist does not present an alternative account of what the speaker is doing. The metafictionalist says that something is asserted along the lines of: according to the number fiction, the number of apples is two. The object fictionalist says that what is asserted is something non-number-involving about the real world — something which would make it true in the fiction that the number of apples is two: that there is an apple x and an apple y such that x and y are distinct and nothing distinct from both x and y is an apple. The characteristic objects of the discourse, the numbers, are mere aids we use to make utterances about how things stand in the real world. Yablo's own preferred view, figuralism, is supposed to be a close cousin of object fictionalism, but with an added twist. Figuralism does not differ from object fictionalism in what it says about the example used so far. The differences only show up when we are considering utterances intuitively about these props themselves, the numbers, such as “7 is less than 11”. Sometimes, Yablo says, numbers — and other entities used as mere representational aids, but sometimes they also function as things represented. (He provides as a comparison “pinpricks of conscience register less than pangs of conscience.”) In a typical utterance of “the number of apples is two”, the number functions as a representational aid. But in “there are numbers” as used by the platonist, numbers function as things represented. And in “the number of even primes is zero”, as a nominalist can be envisaged to use it when doing philosophy, saying something that given her philosophical views is true, they function both as representational aids (“number”) and as things represented (“even prime”). (Compare also the catalogue of fictionalist views in Kalderon 2005, ch. 3.)

A broader distinction is that between what can be called content fictionalism and force fictionalism. The content fictionalist holds that in (ordinary) utterances of sentences of D some content is asserted, but what is asserted is something other than their literal content. The force fictionalist holds that the content expressed in an (ordinary) utterance of a sentence of D is not asserted: instead some other speech act is performed. Instrumentalism is a form of force fictionalism. The other forms of fictionalism are in the first instance forms of content fictionalism. Notice that content and force fictionalism can be combined. A fictionalist can hold both that in an (ordinary) utterance of sentence of D, the literal content of the sentence is conveyed but not asserted, and that some content other than the literal content is asserted. This is even a rather natural view: in an ordinary utterance of a sentence of D, the speaker pretends-true the literal content of the sentence, and in so doing she asserts something other than the literal content.

Sometimes when fictionalism is discussed, it is presupposed that fictionalism would have to be of the meta-fictionalist variety. This is a mistake. There are objections to meta-fictionalism that do not generalize to other fictionalist theses. Joyce (2005) stresses that meta-fictionalism does not adequately distinguish between telling a story and describing a story. When we engage in fiction we do the former, but the meta-fictionalist has it that we do the latter. Yablo (2001) stresses, in the case of mathematical fictionalism, that in ordinary uses of mathematical sentences, we seem to assert something apriori and necessary, but it does not seem apriori and necessary that according to the fiction of standard mathematics, things stand thus-and-so. Generally, meta-fictionalism forces attention to the “according to the fiction…”-operator, but the problems that arise are beside the point on either of the other fictionalist views. (See Kim 2005 for a discussion of some of the problems that arise, having to do with, e.g., the contingent existence of fictions.)

2.4 Attitudes

There are also distinctions to be drawn concerning what mental attitude the hermeneutic fictionalist about a discourse D says we have toward utterances made within D. As the name “fictionalism” indicates, the attitude is often said to be the attitude we have toward paradigmatic cases of fiction. (Our motivation for adopting the attitude may be different in paradigmatic cases of fiction than in the case of one of the discourses under consideration here. But that is different.) The attitude is also often said to be that of pretense or make-believe. Those who compare D with make-believe normally rely on the account of make-believe of Walton (1990, 1993). Yablo's (e.g. 1998, 2001, 2002) brand of hermeneutic fictionalism is one example. The Yablo-Walton view is usefully divided into two parts. First, the statements made within D are likened to metaphorical statements. Second, a pretense account of metaphor is given. On this type of view on metaphor, a metaphorical utterance is one that represents the world as it needs to be in order to make the utterance pretense-worthy in a game of make-believe that it suggests. An example may help. Just as “Bert is carrying a gun” can be made true, in the pretense relevant to this utterance, by Bert's holding a twig, so, on this view on metaphor, can Romeo's “Juliet is the sun” be made true by features of Juliet and of the relation between Romeo and Juliet, given the pretense that Romeo's utterance makes relevant. For example, the utterance may be made true by Juliet's bearing the right type of real-world relation to Romeo's well-being. (Wearing 2012 has recently criticized this kind of view on metaphor.)

Clearly there are views between the extreme fictionalist view that D is best given a metaphor/pretense account and the extreme realist view that ordinary assertions within D aim at literal truth. (i) Van Fraassen (1980), discussing scientific discourse, emphasizes that our attitude toward our best theory of the world is, or should be, ‘acceptance’ rather than belief, where acceptance is an attitude that falls short of belief. (ii) Yablo (2006) has investigated the possibility that when engaging in mathematical discourse we presuppose that mathematical entities exist. (And while it is possible to assimilate presupposition to pretense such an assimilation is not part of Yablo's official story.) Compare here also Hinckfuss (1993). (iii) A suggestion developed in Eklund (2005) is that when it comes to a variety of sentences we use, we are often simply indifferent to some implications of what they express: the fictionalist can appeal to this and say that we are indifferent to the real-world existential implications of mathematical statements. (iv) Walton (1990) himself insists that even if he is giving a pretense account, the claim is not that speakers themselves actively engage in pretense. For a pretense account to be correct of the utterances of some given speaker, it is enough that the speaker participates in a pretense discourse. Compare here also Crimmins' (1998) remarks on “shallow pretense”. Crimmins emphasizes that, despite his talk of pretense, “we are instituting a manner of speaking, not painting a fantasy world”. The farther we depart from paradigmatically fictionalist theses, clearly relating discourse D to fiction or pretense, the more questionable it becomes whether the views discussed really deserve the label “fictionalism”. But arguably, all the theses on the list share the main attractions of paradigmatic versions of fictionalism.

3. Arguments for Fictionalism

Given the variety of fictionalisms it is hard to provide a succinct survey of the arguments for and against fictionalism simpliciter. This section is devoted to an overview of certain fictionalism-relevant arguments, together with remarks on what forms of fictionalism these arguments purport to justify. The overview focuses primarily on arguments that are of relevance for fictionalism as a general philosophical strategy, rather than arguments that only are relevant to fictionalism about a specific subject matter.

3.1 Via eliminativist antirealism

One historically important argument for fictionalism goes as follows. Suppose that have an independent argument for what one may call eliminativist antirealism about a particular discourse (whether it be mathematical discourse, or moral discourse, or … .): an argument to the effect that the atomic sentences of the discourse are all untrue, either because the characteristic objects of the discourse do not exist — there are no numbers — or because its characteristic predicates are uninstantiated — nothing is right, good, etc. This eliminativist antirealism threatens to convict ordinary speakers of massive, widespread error. This is often regarded as a serious problem. It is here that fictionalism comes to the rescue: if we suppose that the utterances in question are made in a fictional spirit, then eliminativist antirealism about (say) mathematics does not commit ordinary speakers of massive error.

As set out, this is an argument for hermeneutic fictionalism. Revolutionary fictionalism, aiming to secure a purpose that mathematical discourse can serve even if mathematical entities do not exist, would not avert the threat that the eliminativist antirealist would have to say of ordinary speakers that they are in massive error. But there is a nearby argument for revolutionary fictionalism. It goes like this: Eliminativist antirealism threatens to come at a serious cost. If by the lights of our philosophy of mathematics there are no mathematical entities, it seems mathematical discourse must be abandoned (because mathematical utterances are systematically untrue): such discourse cannot be worthwhile. It is here that revolutionary fictionalism comes to the rescue: so long as there is some worthwhile aim of mathematical discourse despite the nonexistence of mathematical entities, mathematical discourse need not be abandoned.

Consider too some specific motivations for revolutionary fictionalism. First, Joyce (2005) on moral fictionalism. Joyce starts out from the assumption that, when taken literally, moral sentences are systematically untrue, and seeks to show that it can still be practically useful to pretend that it is not so. Joyce asks first what the benefits are of believing that some acts are morally right and others morally wrong, and thinks that even when such a belief is false, it can be valuable: “The distinctive value of categorical imperatives is that they silence calculations. In this manner, moral beliefs function to bolster self-control against practical irrationality” (301). The basic idea is that for prudential reasons, essentially reasons such as those suggested by Hobbes and Hume, one ought generally to act in accordance with alleged moral requirements (“the fear of punishment, the desire for an ongoing beneficial relationship, the motivation to maintain a good reputation, the simple fact that one on the whole likes one's fellows,…”). But were it not for the moral beliefs one might still be tempted by the short term gains from acting immorally. Turning to moral fictionalism, Joyce thinks that the make-believe that moral properties are instantiated can have the same benefits as the genuine belief that they are. In general, fictions can produce real emotions, which have motivational effects. Joyce remarks, “Human motivation is often aroused more effectively by mental images than by mental calculation”. Second, consider Field's (1980, 1989) revolutionary fictionalism in the philosophy of mathematics. On Field's view the function of mathematics is to facilitate inferences from certain empirical, and nominalistically acceptable, statements to others. A mathematical theory can perform this function so long as it is conservative, where a mathematical theory T is conservative if, roughly, for every nominalistic theory N, T+N has no consequences for the ontology of N that are not consequences of N alone. The important point is that a mathematical theory need not be true in order to be useful in this way. In both these cases, the supposed lesson from the considerations adduced is that pretense would serve us as well as real belief or real assertion.

This first argument for fictionalism is only an indirect argument for the view. It says only that if we have reason to embrace eliminativist antirealism about some discourse, then fictionalism about D should also be attractive. The argument does not even purport to address the intrinsic merits of fictionalism.

3.2 The Oracle

Suppose a being you take to be an omniscient Oracle told you there are not in fact any abstract entities; you come to believe this claim. Would you not go on talking as before? Wouldn't you continue to say things like “You can't tile that rectangular floor with 17 tiles, for 17 is a prime number” and other seemingly committing sentences? And would anything really, so to speak, be or feel different about your use of these sentences?

If the verdict is that we really would continue using these sentences as before and nothing would seem different about our use of them, then we have here an argument for hermeneutic fictionalism. Surely after the Oracle's pronouncement we no longer commit ourselves to the existence of abstract entities. But if we are just going on as before, we were not thus committing ourselves earlier either.

The Oracle argument has primarily been used in discussions of abstract objects. But the strategy is clearly in principle generalizable. Take for instance the moral case. Suppose an Oracle were to tell you that really there are no moral facts. It can be argued that this would not cause you to change your practice of making moral assertions. The case can be argued to be analogous with the mathematics case.

Some brief remarks on the Oracle argument are in order. First, the Oracle argument presumes that the ontological commitments of a speaker's assertions are transparent to the speaker. It can legitimately be denied that speakers have the relevant sort of access to their commitments. Second, the Oracle argument implicitly highlights an important distinction. Fictionalism is often motivated by concerns about what we are and are not ontologically committed to. But what should we focus on when gauging our ontological commitments — the beliefs that we have, or what commitments we take on in our utterances? The Oracle argument in the first instance speaks to what commitments we take on in our utterances: it does not speak directly to the question of what the ontological commitments of our beliefs are. Third, as stated, the argument is obviously an argument for hermeneutic, not revolutionary, fictionalism. An Oracle argument for revolutionary fictionalism would rather emphasize that the Oracle's statement would give us no reason to abandon the discourse.

(The argument is from Yablo 2000. The thought experiment itself is originally from Burgess and Rosen 1997.)

3.3 The paradox of existence

Here is a kind of puzzle or paradox that several philosophers have stressed. On the one hand, existence questions seem hard. The philosophical question of whether there are abstract entities does not seem to admit of an easy or trivial answer. At the same time, there seem to be trivial arguments settling questions like this in the affirmative. Consider for instance the argument, “2+2=4. So there is a number which, when added to 2, yields 4. This something is a number. So there are numbers”, or “Fido is a dog. So Fido has the property of being a dog. So there are properties.” How should one resolve this paradox? One response is: adopt fictionalism. The idea would be that in the philosophy room we do not speak fictionally, but ordinarily we do. So in the philosophy room, the question of the existence of abstract entities is hard; outside it, the question is easy. When, ordinarily, a speaker utters a sentence that semantically expresses a proposition that entails that there are numbers, what she says is accurate so long as according to the relevant fiction, there are numbers. But when she utters the same sentence in the philosophy room, she speaks literally and then what she asserts is something highly non-trivial. The fictionalism that would seem to be motivated by this reasoning is use fictionalism.

(See e.g. Yablo 2000, Szabó 2001, Hofweber 2000, and Thomasson 2013 for discussion of this type of argument. However, of these authors, only Yablo uses the paradox of existence to motivate fictionalism. Szabó, Hofweber and Thomasson all offer other diagnoses.)

3.4 Analogies with uncontroversially non-literal discourse

One way to argue for fictionalism about a region of discourse is to show that our use of declarative sentences within the discourse resembles our use of non-literal language in other areas. There are three considerations that can be brought up under this heading.

(1) Unobtrusive metaphors — metaphors that easily go unnoticed — are quite common. So we should not be surprised if some philosophically interesting discourse should turn out to be permeated by such metaphors. Consider the following list from Yablo (2000):

They put a lot of hurdles in your path, there's a lot that could be said about that, there's no precedent for that, something tells me you're right, there are some things better left unsaid, there is something I forgot to tell you, viz. how to operate the lock, nothing gets my goat as much as chewing gum in class, a lot you can do for me, let's roll out the red carpet, the last thing I want is to…, their people have risen in my esteem, I took her into my confidence, my patience is nearly exhausted, I'll take my chances, there's a trace of sadness in your eyes, a growing number of these leaks can be traced to Starr's office, she's got a lot of smarts, let's pull out all the stops, let's proceed along the lines suggested above.

The idea is that there are many unobtrusive metaphors; and that if metaphors can often be this unobtrusive, then maybe the non-literalness of our actual utterances of sentences of D is also unobtrusive. Of course, what Yablo says here is controversial. One can insist that some of Yablo's examples are not metaphors but idioms. And one can insist that for some of the examples, the only reason to regard them as non-literal would stem from a prior conviction that their literal truth would require metaphysical absurdities. But so long as there are a fair number of unobtrusive metaphors, Yablo has a point.

(2) Relatedly, one way that fictionalists try to argue for their doctrines is by appeal to cases where, supposedly, fictionalist theses are obviously true. Consider first motion discourse. Some fictionalists hold that we happily say things like “the sun rises” and “that car is moving too quickly” despite knowing fully well that neither sentence is literally true in the relevant contexts of utterance. The idea is that for the literal truth of these sentences a Ptolemaic, absolutist worldview would have to be correct. But obviously, even though we use these sentences to make assertions, we do not believe this sort of worldview to be true. We engage instead in a Ptolemaic and absolutist fiction. Next consider expressions of the form ‘the average F’. We routinely utter declarative sentences containing such expressions in subject position; it seems that for such a sentence to be literally true there would really have to be an average F. This seems absurd. It seems odd that we should cheerfully commit ourselves to such an absurdity. Hence, it is sometimes suggested, hermeneutic fictionalism is true of the use of these expressions.

(3) Both in his (2000) and elsewhere, Yablo draws up a list of analogies between uncontroversially non-literal discourse on the one hand and discourse about “platonic objects” — for present purposes one can think of these simply as would-be objects ripe for fictionalist treatment[2] — on the other. I will not here reproduce the whole list. But here are some representative suggested analogies:

  • Paraphrasability: [Creatures of metaphorical make-believe] are often paraphrasable away with no felt loss of subject matter. ‘That was her first encounter with the green-eyed monster’ goes to ‘that was her first time feeling jealous’. ‘That really gets my goat’ goes to ‘that really irritates me’.

    [Platonic objects] are often paraphrasable away with no felt loss of subject matter. ‘There is a possible world with furry donkeys’ goes to ‘furry donkeys are possible’. ‘She did it one way or another’ goes to ‘she did it somehow’. Etc.

  • Silliness: [Creatures of metaphorical make-believe] invite ‘silly questions’ probing areas the make-believe does not address, e.g. we know how big the average star is, but where is it located? You say you lost your nerve, has it been turned in? Do you plan to drop-forge the uncreated conscience of your race in the smithy of our soul?

    [Platonic objects] invite questions which are similarly silly. What are the intrinsic properties of the empty set? Is the event of the water's boiling itself hot? Are universals wholly present in each of their instances? Do relations lead a divided existence, parcelled out among their relata?

It is obviously debatable exactly how telling these analogies are. One may for example reasonably suspect that the claim that the supposedly silly questions about platonic objects really all are silly will have appeal only for philosophers of a certain bent of mind.

4. Arguments against Fictionalism

Turn now to arguments against fictionalism. As with the arguments for fictionalism, the focus will be on arguments that are relevant to fictionalism as a general metaphysical strategy, rather than arguments that only are relevant to fictionalism about a given subject matter.[3] Many of the arguments are directed primarily against fictionalism of the hermeneutic variety.

4.1 The phenomenological objection

The most obvious objection to fictionalism is that it seems just absurd to assimilate some seemingly sober discourse such as mathematical or modal or moral discourse to make-believe and fiction. (“Mathematical discourse just doesn't seem at all like Cowboys and Indians.”) This is an objection specifically targeted against hermeneutic fictionalism; it is plainly irrelevant as directed against a revolutionary fictionalist.

We have already seen some fictionalist replies to this objection. One reply (section 3.4) is that, philosophically interesting discourses aside, we engage in make-believe and fiction more often than we ordinarily tend to think. Another reply — related to the distinctions drawn in section 2.4 — is that there are variants of fictionalism that do not claim there to be a close analogy between the target discourse on the one hand and fiction and make-believe on the other. For discussion of the phenomenological objection, see, e.g., Brock (2014).

There have been attempts to make what is essentially the phenomenological objection more precise. Jason Stanley (2001) has two related objections concerning the nature of the fictionalist's appeal to pretense. (i) The hermeneutic fictionalist says that we are engaged in make-believe where it doesn't seem to us that we are. Hence, Stanley says, “If the hermeneutic fictionalist is correct, then x can bear the propositional attitude of pretense toward a proposition, without it being in principle accessible to x that x bears the propositional attitude of pretense towards that proposition. But this introduces a novel and quite drastic form of failure of first-person authority over one's own mental states”. (ii) By what the fictionalist says, the same psychological mechanisms as are involved in make-believe are involved in understanding the use of a discourse of which fictionalism is true. But it seems this can be shown to be problematic on empirical grounds. Autistic persons have problems with make-believe, so by the fictionalist's hypothesis they should likewise have problems understanding the use of a discourse of which fictionalism is true. But autistic persons do not have problems with mathematical discourse, or modal discourse, or discourse concerning negative existentials, etc. (For discussion of Stanley's autism objection, see Liggins 2010.)

4.2 Can fictionalism deliver the goods?

Even though there are many different arguments for and motivations behind fictionalism, one main motivation is clearly the ontological one. Fictionalism about a discourse D is often seen as attractive precisely because it promises to get around otherwise potentially serious philosophical problems regarding D's ontology. But fictionalism can, as it were, fail to make good on this promise; or that is a worry. Here are some examples of how this can happen.

First, according to fictionalism about a given discourse, the discourse is in important respects analogous to paradigmatic cases of fiction. This is supposed to have ontological advantages. Specifically, the entities characteristic of the relevant discourse are sometimes supposed then to have the same ontological status as fictional entities. But if fictional entities are problematic in their own right, then not much is gained by this move. Fictionalism about fictional characters — see, e.g., Brock (2002), and Everett (2005), and ch. 10 of Walton (1990) — is one attempt to get around this problem. A different response to the objection is that it takes too seriously the label “fictionalism”. Some prominent types of fictionalism claim only that in ordinary utterances of sentences of some discourse, speakers don’t aim at literal truth. That claim by no means amounts to saying that the putative entities of the discourse have the same ontological status as fictional entities, whatever exactly that is.

Second, consider Peter van Inwagen's (1990) fictionalism about ordinary objects. Van Inwagen suggests that when we say, e.g., “There is a table here”, what we really assert is something like: there are simples arranged tablewise here. Sider (1993) notes a problem: van Inwagen's paraphrase strategy presupposes that there are simples and not gunk (in other words, it presupposes that all objects decompose into minimal parts, ‘simples’) and there is no straightforward way of reformulating it so as to take into account the possibility of gunk. If indeed it seems at all wrong that in our everyday discourse we should manifest a preference for the hypothesis that there are macrophysical objects over agnosticism about the matter, it should anyway seem more wrong still that in our ordinary practices we should manifest a preference for the hypothesis that there are simples rather than gunk. Sider’s point concerns only van Inwagen’s specific strategy. But there is a general lesson nearby: the adequacy of the paraphrases might itself depend on substantive metaphysical assumptions.

4.3 Criticisms concerning systematicity

One main worry that Stanley (2001) presses with respect to hermeneutic fictionalism concerns systematicity. Take the case of mathematics. Infinitely many sentences belong to mathematical discourse, and to be competent with mathematical discourse involves having the competence to grasp these infinitely many sentences. Standard considerations concerning the finitude of our minds require that our grasp of these infinitely many sentences is something we have by virtue of our grasp of some finite set of principles: a compositional semantic theory is required. But it is, the worry goes, unclear what a compositional fictionalist semantic theory might conceivably look like.

Yablo's (2001) response to the systematicity objection is to say, “There are kinds of speech that finite beings clearly do understand, yet whose semantics does not seem to be compositional. One does not expect a compositional semantics for hyperbole, metonymy, or irony: one does not expect a compositional semantics for speech governed by shifting presuppositions. Somehow, though, we understand. This suggests that [hermeneutic fictionalist] analyses directed at kinds of speech that resemble hyperbole, metonymy, or etc. should not be held to the standard of strong-systematicity-or-bust”. There is something odd about this response. The reason why we do not expect a compositional semantics for hyberbole is that we do not really expect a semantics for hyperbole at all. We do not think that there are certain sentences that have hyperbolic meanings — whatever that would amount to — but rather that sometimes some sentences are used hyperbolically. Even so, there is something telling about what Yablo says. The analogy with hyperbole and irony shows Yablo to be a use fictionalist: his hypothesis is not one about the types of meanings mathematical sentences have but about what we ordinarily do with mathematical sentences. From this perspective, the demand for a compositional fictionalist semantics for mathematical sentences is misplaced for the reason that the fictionalist does not propose a different semantics for mathematical sentences at all.

Stanley discusses, and rejects, a response to his argument much like the one here brought up. He considers the question of whether the fictionalist about D should be taken as making a claim about what proposition really is expressed in an ordinary utterance of a declarative sentence of D, or rather just a claim about what is pragmatically communicated. Apparently allowing that the fictionalist gets off the hook in the latter case, Stanley marshals a number of arguments in favor of the former alternative. However, the distinction Stanley draws is clearly different from the distinction between meaning fictionalism and use fictionalism. One can be a use fictionalist while holding that one's view is about what proposition is expressed in an ordinary utterance of a relevant sentence. It is not clear why a fictionalist hypothesis about which proposition is expressed in an utterance should incur an obligation to a compositional fictionalist semantics.

These remarks are not meant to indicate that the mathematical fictionalist does not owe us a systematic account of what is communicated by mathematical sentences. The point is just that what is owed is not a compositional semantics. Yablo's analogy, hyperbole, can be used to make the point, despite the obvious differences between this case and the mathematics case. All that is needed properly to understand hyperbole is an ordinary compositional semantics giving the literal meanings of the sentences involved plus a general principle relating the propositions semantically expressed by the sentences to the inflated propositions the sentences express when used hyperbolically. Similarly, given use fictionalism all that is needed properly to understand what is communicated in ordinary utterances of mathematical sentences is an ordinary compositional semantics together with principles linking the literal contents of mathematical sentences to what the fictionalist says the utterances ordinarily convey.

4.4 The fictionalist's preferred analogies

As noted above, one way that fictionalists try to argue for their doctrines is by appeal to cases where, supposedly, fictionalist theses are obviously true. Two such cases are motion discourse, and talk about ‘the average F’. However, in both of these cases, it can plausibly be argued that proper attention to the semantics undercuts the fictionalist's claim.

First, critics such as Stanley (2001) stress that while terms of the form ‘the average F’ superficially seem like singular terms, they do not behave semantically like ordinary singular terms. But if they do not behave semantically like ordinary singular terms there is no call for a fictionalist account explaining why we do not commit ourselves to there being entities such as the average F when assertively uttering sentences of the form “the average F is G” (see also Kennedy and Stanley 2009).

Turn next to motion discourse. Brendan Jackson (2007) argues that any temptation to be a fictionalist about motion discourse stems from an oversimplified conception of the semantics of the relevant sentences. Compare

(1) Europe is small.
(2) That cell phone is a bit heavy.
(3) The remote is to the left of the television.
(4) A lion is hiding behind the bush.

Jackson notes two things. First, these cases are “analogous to what is going on when we utter typical motion ascriptions. We can describe all these utterances as incomplete, in the sense that there is some parameter — a comparison class, a purpose, a perspective or a frame of reference — that must be taken into account if the utterance is to be regarded as expressing a possibly true proposition, and yet the utterance contains no explicit word or phrase that specifies a value for this parameter”. And second, semanticists typically agree on what is going on in (1)–(4): the sentences are simply context-sensitive. There is no need for a fictionalist proposal to explain why in typical utterances of them we express something true. According to Jackson, the same story can be told in the case of motion ascriptions.

The points concerning motion discourse and ‘the average F’ in the first instance cast doubt only on some specific examples that fictionalists tend to use to motivate their fictionalist theses. But they also suggest a more general lesson: fictionalist theses can often be undercut by closer attention to the semantics of the discourse in question.

4.5 Philosophy of language concerns

The hermeneutic fictionalist about a discourse D typically claims that there is a radical mismatch between on the one hand the assertoric contents of utterances of sentences of D (what is expressed in ordinary utterances of these sentences) and on the other hand the semantic contents of these sentences (what these sentences semantically express, in the contexts of utterance). But when it is stated thus baldly what the strategy is, two related worries should immediately arise, having to do with foundational issues in the philosophy of language.

First, even setting radical use theories to the side, many philosophers have supposed that the semantic content of a sentence is somehow determined, at least largely, by what the sentence is customarily used to express. This would seem to entail that there must be a close connection between the semantic content of a sentence and how the sentence is customarily used. But then it is odd if there is the kind of systematic mismatch between assertoric content and semantic content that the fictionalist claims that there is; or that is the worry.

Second, putting matters in this more technical way highlights another potential difficulty. There are deep and unresolved issues in philosophy of language concerning the nature of assertoric and semantic content, respectively, and concerning the relation between them. While these issues remain unresolved, it may be premature to put forward strong claims about the relation of the assertoric and semantic contents. Generally, and relating back to the points made in the previous subsection, it can be suspected that fictionalists tend to have a too simple view of semantic content.

One fictionalist reply to these concerns is to say that it is only for argument's sake that she adopts a conservative view of the semantic contents of the sentences of the discourse in question. She can say that her basic point is that the discourses are not in fact ontologically committing. If the sentences are not ontologically committing even when they are used literally, that is fine. What she is arguing is that even if the sentences are ontologically committing as used literally, there is reason to think that the discourse is not ontologically committing. Perhaps, in light of the point about how use determines meaning, the fact that our use of the sentences is not ontologically committing should cast doubt on any semantics of these sentences given which they are. But that does not affect the more general philosophical point the fictionalist is typically concerned to make: that the discourse is not ontologically committing.

4.6 Old problems in new bottles?

One kind of worry one might have about fictionalism is that it does not really, by itself, help avoid the problems that beset similar approaches. Here are two examples.

(1) Paraphrase. Since long before fictionalism really came into vogue, philosophers have liked to appeal to paraphrase: it has often been claimed that sentences which seem to express such-and-such propositions, really only express such-and-such other propositions. (E.g., it sounds as if you are genuinely talking about material objects, but really you are only claiming something about actual and possible sense-data.) Often such appeals to paraphrase have foundered upon the details: telling objections have shown how the paraphrases fail to deal with all the sentences within the purview of the proposal. Objections to some fictionalist theories that have been proposed take a similar form, since some fictionalists in effect offer paraphrases. Take for instance van Inwagen's (1985) objection to fictionalism about fictional characters, as espoused for instance by Kendall Walton (1985, 1990, 2000). Consider van Inwagen's pair of sentences,

(S1) There is a fictional character who, for every novel, either appears in that novel or is a model for a character who does.


(S2) If no character appears in every novel, then some character is modeled on another character.

Sentence (S1) seems to entail sentence (S2), but, the charge is, the paraphrases offered by Walton do not respect this. The paraphrases that Walton offers are of the form “To engage in pretense of kind K is fictionally to speak truly in a game of such-and-such a sort”: but then the paraphrase of (S2) is not entailed by the paraphrase of (S1). There is naturally much that can be said about the objection. (The reply Walton (2000) himself gives is that the claim that (S1) entails (S2) is itself pretend-true.) Essentially the same sort of objection is pressed by Richard (2000), Stanley (2001) and Kroon (2004) against Mark Crimmins' (1998) fictionalism about propositional attitude talk and discourse involving empty names.

(2) In his (2005) defense of a version of moral fictionalism, Mark Kalderon argues that would-be non-cognitivists who seek to avoid the Frege-Geach problem (for a presentation of this problem see the Embedding Problem section of the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism) should adopt a version of moral fictionalism. The resulting theory would be one according to which moral sentences have ordinary representational contents, but acceptance of moral sentences does not amount to belief in the literal truth of these contents but rather only to holding a non-cognitive attitude toward them. The reason why this is supposed to get around the Frege-Geach problem would be that arguments like

(P1) Stealing is wrong.

(P2) If stealing is wrong, then getting one's little brother to steal is wrong.

(C) So, getting one's little brother to steal is wrong.

turn out on this revised non-cognitivist view to be straightforwardly valid: for the proposition semantically expressed by the conclusion sentence is entailed by the propositions semantically expressed by the premise sentences.

However, one may reasonably worry that the envisaged fictionalist move doesn't in fact help at all with the Frege-Geach problem. For someone actually presenting an argument like this would be presenting a good argument. But for this to be so, what the arguer actually expresses by the premise sentence must provide good reason to accept what she actually expresses by the conclusion sentence. Since what the arguer actually expresses is, on the fictionalist view, different from what the sentences she utters semantically express, it is not sufficient for the fictionalist to point to how the sentences (P1) and (P2) when taken literally express propositions that entail the proposition expressed by the sentence (C) taken literally. Kalderon's moral fictionalist faces the problem of giving an account that respects the fact that the argument actually put forward is valid. But this seems not to be essentially different from the traditional non-cognitivist's problem of saying what the meanings of the relevant sentences are such that the impression that the argument is valid can be respected. (This objection to Kalderon was stated, more briefly, in the original 2007 version of this entry, and was also presented, independently, in Lenman 2008. Kalderon replied to it in his 2008a and 2008b, and Eklund 2009 is in turn a reply to Kalderon. See also ch. 6 of Miller 2013)

4.7 The Brock-Rosen objection

Here is a simple way to lay out what is known as the Brock-Rosen objection to modal fictionalism. (Taken from Divers and Hagen's (2006) presentation.) Consider the proposition,

(P) There is a plurality of worlds,

where by ‘worlds’ we mean Lewisian possible worlds. The modal fictionalist doesn't want to commit herself to the literal truth of P. But the objection is that she ends up doing so anyway. For

(1) According to the modal fiction, at every world, P.

Now, the modal fictionalist holds, the objection goes, that for every modal sentence ‘A’,

(M) ‘A’ is true iff according to the modal fiction, A*,

where ‘A*’ is the translation of ‘A’ into possible worlds talk.

An instance of (M) is then

(2) ‘Necessarily P’ is true iff according to the modal fiction, at every world, P.

By (1) and (2) together with disquotational principles concerning truth,

(3) Necessarily P.

And hence,

(4) P.

Although the Brock-Rosen objection was first raised against modal fictionalism and has been most discussed in that context, it is important to note that the objection generalizes. For instance, one can run a similar argument in the case of numbers. (This was first stressed in Nolan and O'Leary-Hawthorne 1996.) Here is how the objection goes in that case.

According to mathematical fictionalism,

(#) For any sort of entity F, There are n Fs iff according to the numbers fiction, The number of Fs = n.

But now apply this to numbers. An immediate consequence is that the fictionalist must conclude that (strictly and literally) there are numbers.

One diagnosis — and purported resolution — of this problem relates to the distinctions earlier drawn. According to this diagnosis, what the objection at most shows is that the fictionalist should be a use fictionalist. If any kind of fictionalist has to rely on general translation schemes such as (M) or (#) it is the meaning fictionalist. The use fictionalist can, with no real loss, employ them more selectively: it is only when speaking within the fiction that we rely on them. (For this diagnosis, presented in different terms, see Nolan and O'Leary-Hawthorne 1996, Yablo 2001, and Woodward 2007. For more on the Brock-Rosen objection to modal fictionalism, see the entry on modal fictionalism.)

5. Significance

Let us lastly turn to the broader picture: the general philosophical significance of fictionalism.

Obviously, and as earlier remarked, the hermeneutic fictionalist can come to the eliminativist antirealist's aid: adopting fictionalism is for the eliminativist antirealist a more attractive alternative than to adopt some form of error theory.[4]

Quite apart from positive motivations for antirealism, fictionalism is also of relevance for evaluating particular arguments for realism. Let me discuss two. (a) What we may call ordinary language arguments. An ordinary language argument for the existence of Fs goes as follows. “(1) Sentences thus-and-such are true. (2) (Semantic analysis shows that) for those sentences to be true, there must be Fs. (3) So, there must be Fs.” An argument of this form is clearly valid. The question of the soundness of an argument of this kind comes down to whether the premises are true. Hermeneutic fictionalism presents problems for the justification of premise (1). Maybe all that is evident from ordinary discourse is that we somehow convey or communicate true propositions when uttering the relevant sentences. But hermeneutic fictionalism indicates how we can do so without the sentences semantically expressing true propositions. Thomasson (2013) is a recent extended discussion of the relation between fictionalism and her own preferred ontological view, which is argued for by what she calls “easy arguments”, a kind of ordinary language arguments. Thomasson’s ontological deflationism says, roughly, that all manners of philosophically controversial entities exist, and do so in some sense trivially. The way Thomasson presents things, fictionalism and ontological deflationism are in conflict. But if fictionalism is only a linguistic thesis (compare the distinction between the metaphysical thesis and the linguistic thesis) - and that is how Thomasson appears to understand it, that’s not quite true. What is true is that fictionalism presents problems for Thomasson’s specific way of arguing for ontological deflationism, by appeal to ordinary language arguments. (b) Indispensability. Let us again take mathematics as our example. One of the most influential arguments for platonism in the philosophy of mathematics is the indispensability argument, according to which quantification over mathematical entities is indispensable to our best theory of the world, and hence we should take mathematical entities to exist. (This is a very rough characterization of indispensability arguments. For more detail see the entry on indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics.) But revolutionary fictionalism suggests a complication: even if, in some sense, quantification over mathematical entities is indispensable to our best theory of the world, perhaps it is not literal quantification over mathematical entities that is thus indispensable. The relation between hermeneutic fictionalism and indispensability arguments is a bit more indirect. But hermeneutic fictionalism is relevant to indispensability arguments insofar as it is analyses of what scientists of various stripes actually say and believe that tell us what is “our best theory of the world”.

The arguments for realism just mentioned are arguments that typically would be presented by those who take a ‘Quinean’ approach to ontology. Given this approach — the approach of many of those theorists today who take ontology seriously — we should believe in those entities that our best theory of the world quantifies over. Although fictionalism presents problems for specific Quinean arguments, like the indispensability argument, fictionalists are naturally taken to be methodological allies of orthodox Quineans. They can agree with orthodox Quineans that we should believe in those entities that our best theory of the world quantifies over. It is only that they would stress that we must understand this to mean “literally quantifies over”, and that in some interesting cases the condition of literalness is not satisfied.

More radically, however, the theme of one of Yablo's earliest papers on fictionalism, Yablo (1998), is that the mere availability of fictionalism as a theoretical option presents problems for ontology as a serious enterprise. Given that when the Quinean says that we should believe in what the best theory quantifies over, this must be understood to mean “literally quantifies over”. But then the Quinean program in ontology relies on the literal/fictional distinction. But this distinction is problematic: saying what parts of our speech are fictional and which are literal is, Yablo argues, at least as problematic as saying which sentences are synthetic and which are analytic. So there is at least as good reason to doubt the literal/fictional distinction — and hence the Quinean program in ontology — as there is to doubt the analytic/synthetic distinction. This is ad hominem, since Quine himself famously attacked the analytic/synthetic distinction.

There are two metaontological points that someone might be inclined to make here. A relatively moderate point is that it is often so hard to make out on what side of the literal/fictional distinction some discourse falls that arguments of the Quinean kind seldom are well supported. A different point is that there is sometimes — or, in the most radical version of the idea, always — no fact of the matter as to whether some piece of discourse is literal or fictional. It is the most radical point here that is the most closely analogous to what Quine says about the analytic/synthetic distinction.


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Many thanks to Ian Wells for assistance with an earlier version of this entry.

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