Formalism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Wed Jan 12, 2011

The guiding idea behind formalism is that mathematics is not a body of propositions representing an abstract sector of reality but is much more akin to a game, bringing with it no more commitment to an ontology of objects or properties than ludo or chess. This idea has some intuitive plausibility: consider the tyro toiling at multiplication tables or the student using a standard algorithm for differentiating or integrating a function. It also corresponds to some aspects of the practice of advanced mathematicians in some periods—for example, the treatment of imaginary numbers for some time after Bombelli's introduction of them, and perhaps the attitude of some contemporary mathematicians towards the higher flights of set theory. Finally, it is often the position to which philosophically naïve respondents will gesture towards, when pestered by questions as to the nature of mathematics.

1. Introduction

The locus classicus of formalism is not a defence of the position by a convinced advocate, but a demolition job by a great philosopher, Gottlob Frege. Not that he was attacking a straw man position: the highly influential diatribe by Frege in volume II of his Grundgesetze Der Arithmetik (Frege, 1903) is an attack on the work of two real people, H. E. Heine and Johannes Thomae. Moreover, philosophers of mathematics are wont to claim that the position is still widely adopted by mathematicians. It must be emphasised, however, that ‘formalism’ in this sense—the Heine/Thomae position as interpreted by Frege, and its descendants—is to be distinguished from a more sophisticated position, Hilbertian formalism. (For more information, consult the entries on Hibert's program and the Frege-Hilbert controversy.)

It is the non-Hilbertian approach we will be concerned with in this entry, but for the sake of completeness, we briefly discuss the Hilbertian approach. The Hilbertian position differs because it depends on a distinction within mathematical language between a finitary sector, whose sentences express contentful propositions, and an ideal, or infinitary sector. Where exactly Hilbert drew the distinction, or where it should be drawn, is a matter of debate. Crucially, though, Hilbert adopted an instrumentalistic attitude towards the ideal sector. The formulae of this language are, or are treated as if they are, uninterpreted, having the syntactic form of sentences to which we can apply formal rules of transformation and inference but no semantics. Nonetheless they are, or can be useful, if the ideal sector conservatively extends the finitary, that is if no proof from finitary premisses to a finitary conclusion which takes a detour through the infinitary language yields a conclusion we could not have reached, albeit perhaps (herein lies the utility) by a longer, more unwieldy proof. The goal of the Hilbert programme was to provide a finitary proof of this conservative extension result; most, though not all, think this goal was proved impossible by Gödel's second incompleteness theorem.

Returning now to our non-Hilbertian focus, the earlier formalism which Frege attacked does not divide mathematics into the aforementioned dual categories of the finitary/contentful, and the infinitary/essentially meaningless but, on the contrary, treats all of mathematics in a unitary and heterogeneous fashion. I will use ‘formalism’, then, to refer to the non-Hilbertian formalism and I will provide an account of the formalist views distilled by Frege from Heine and Thomae and the criticisms he made of them. These criticisms are widely believed now to contain conclusive refutations of the Heine/Thomae approach. But there are a number of post-Fregean views which seem heavily influenced by, or strongly analogous to, formalism. I will go through these in turn:

  • Wittgenstein's views on mathematics, primarily the conception to be found in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus;
  • formalism for the Logical Positivists, particularly Carnap;
  • Goodman and Quine's nominalist formalism, and
  • Haskell Curry's version of formalism.

I will conclude with an overall assessment of the prospects for formalism in contemporary philosophy of mathematics.

2. Game and Term Formalism

Frege does not extract a unified, consistent position from the work of Heine and Thomae, and much of his criticism is devoted to showing that they inconsistently slip into modes of thought which are only appropriate for ‘contentful’ arithmetic, which Frege takes to be a body of truths expressed by utterances in which numerical expressions designate abstract referents independent of the mind (or at least any particular individual's mind). Heine and Thomae talk of mathematical domains and structures, of prohibitions on what may be uttered (e.g. against writing ‘3÷0’ which is deemed, in some special sense, meaningless), of numbers being greater than less than one another (rather than physical marks being larger or smaller, darker or lighter)—all things which make no sense if arithmetic is a theory of marks and their physical properties or is just a body of transformations of referent-less symbols. (Heine however reserves, with Kronecker, a special place for arithmetic, treating it in non-formalist fashion; this position may thus be more coherent than Thomae's. See Simons (2009) especially pp. 293-6.)

Nonetheless two distinct positions emerge from the material Frege works over, doctrines which Resnik (1980 p.54), and likewise Shapiro (2000, pp.41–48) describe as term formalism and game formalism, respectively. The term formalist views the expressions of mathematics, arithmetic for example, as meaningful, the singular terms as referring, but as referring to symbols such as themselves, rather than numbers, construed as entities distinct from symbols. Thus Heine writes:

I define from the standpoint of the pure formalist and call certain tangible signs numbers. (Frege, 1903/80 §87, p. 183).

The game formalist sticks with the view that mathematical utterances have no meaning; or at any rate the terms occurring therein do not pick out objects and properties and the utterances cannot be used to state facts. Rather mathematics is a calculus in which ‘empty’ symbol strings are transformed according to fixed rules. Thomae puts it this way:

For the formalist, arithmetic is a game with signs which are called empty. That means that they have no other content (in the calculating game) than they are assigned by their behaviour with respect to certain rules of combination (rules of the game) (Frege, 1903/80 §95, p. 190).

Thomae also remarks “the formal standpoint rids us of all metaphysical difficulties” (ibid. p. 184). One main motivation for formalists, then, is to block, avoid, or sidestep (in some way) any ontological commitment to a problematic realm of abstract objects. For standard mathematics entails a plethora of theorems affirming the existence of infinite realms of entities- numbers, functions, sets and so forth, entities which do not seem to be concrete. Formalists, in general, wish to divest themselves of any commitment to these domains which do, indeed, seem hard to fit into a thoroughly naturalistic conception of reality.

Frege concentrates most of his fire on the term formalist pronouncements of his targets; but game formalism is the only game in town for the anti-platonist worried about the ontological commitment to a realm of abstract objects. For term formalism treats mathematics as having a content, as being a kind of syntactic theory; and standard syntactic theory entails the existence of an infinity of entities—expression types—which seem every bit as abstract as numbers. Indeed, as Gödel's arithmetisation of syntax showed, the elements and inter-relationships of standard formal syntax can modelled as an infinite substructure inside the standard model of arithmetic.

Frege mercilessly exposes the inadequacies of Heine and Thomae's position—their confusions as they slip from term to game formalism; their conflation of sign and signified; the fact that they do not set out an account of the syntax and proof theory which is remotely adequate as an account of the mathematics with which they deal; their hopeless attempts to extend their position from arithmetic to treat of analysis and real numbers, by this stage in mathematical history construed by Weierstrass, Cantor and others not geometrically but as infinite sequences. Thus Frege writes:

In order to produce it [an infinite series] we would need an infinitely long blackboard, an infinite supply of chalk, and an infinite length of time. We may be censured as too cruel for trying to crush so high a flight of the spirit by such a homely objection; but this is no answer. (p. 219)

Now Frege, himself, ironically, had revolutionised mathematics by introducing hitherto unprecedented standards of rigour in the formalisation of mathematical theories. He recognised (§90, pp. 185–6) that one could improve vastly on Heine and Thomae by treating mathematical theories, their language, axioms and rules, as formal, mathematical objects in their own right. This is exactly what the Hilbert programme set out successfully to achieve, creating the new disciple of metamathematics.

However Frege lays down very stiff challenges even for a rigorous game formalist fully equipped with the techniques and results of metamathematics. Such a theorist gives us a characterisation of a language, for example by setting out what the basic elements are- primitive symbols, and strings thereof- and then gives a recursive specification of which strings count as well-formed. Similarly we will be given a rigorous specification of which arrangements of well-formed formulae count as proofs in a given system, and of which theorems in each case. If strings such as ‘3+1=0’ or ‘3 > 2’ come out as provable in the system (arithmetic modulo 4, say) then that is enough to count them as correct utterances of the system. No further issue of truth need arise; nor do we need to assume that there is only one system for a given set of symbols. Nor, furthermore, need we assume that each such system is complete (though Frege took Thomae to task for the incompleteness, massive though readily rectifiable, of his arithmetic calculus). We need make no assumption that the numerals in these strings refer to anything outside the system, indeed we need not assume they refer to anything at all. (This game formalist, then, is not subject to the objection that ‘3 > 2’ should come out as false, on any legitimate formalist reading of ‘>’; no need to think of the numerals as referring to concrete marks and ‘>’ meaning physically greater in size.)

Such a game formalist is a more worthy opponent for the platonistic Frege to tackle, but there are two main objections he sets out which still apply to this more sophisticated position. The first is the question of applicability: if mathematics is just a calculus in which we shuffle uninterpreted symbols (or symbols whose interpretation is a matter of no importance), then why has it been applied so successfully—and in so many ways, to so many different things—ordinary physical objects, sub-atomic objects, fields, properties, and indeed from one part of mathematics to another (we can count the number of dimensions in a pure geometric space)? Frege writes:

It is applicability alone which elevates arithmetic from a game to the rank of a science. (§91 in Frege 1903/1980 p. 187.)

Secondly, Frege quite rightly and insistently distinguishes on the one hand the ‘game’—arithmetic, set theory, topology or whatever—treated simply as a mathematical object in its own right, a formal system, and, on the another, the theory of the game. “Let us remember that the theory of the game must be distinguished from the game itself” (§107, p. 203). Thus in the ‘game’ of trigonometry we might derive

sin2θ + cos2θ = 1

from the Pythagorean Theorem. In the metatheory we can prove:

⊢ ≺sin2θ + cos2θ = 1≻,

the claim that the formula with such and such a code in the mathematical representation of the syntax (represented in the meta-meta-theory here by ‘≺sin2θ + cos2θ = 1≻’) is provable. Likewise in the meta-theory we can prove lots of other things about proof and refutation, for instance we may be able to show that lots of sentences are neither provable nor refutable.

The problem this raises for the formalist is this: the metatheory is itself a substantial piece of mathematics, ostensibly committed to an infinite realm of objects which are not, on the face of it, concrete. Tokens of the expressions of the object language game calculus may be finite—ink marks and the like; but since there are infinitely many expressions, theorems and proofs, these themselves must be taken to be abstract types. At best, the formalist can achieve no more than a reduction in commitment from the transfinite realms of some mathematical theories, such as set theory, to the countably infinite, but still presumably abstract, realm of arithmetic, wherein the syntax and proof theory of standard countable languages such as those of standard set theory, can, as Gödel showed, be modelled.

Can formalism be developed in such a way as to surmount these two crucial objections, the problem of applicability and the problem of the metatheory, as I will call it? (Not that these are the only objections to formalism, but they are two fundamental ones.) Because Frege's critique did not quash all formalistic impulses in later philosophers of mathematics, we shall look, now, at future developments, to see how they fare.

3. Tractarian Formalism

Wittgenstein was a keen student of Frege's work, directed to further his studies under Bertrand Russell by Frege himself in the course of a visit he made to see Frege in Jena. One might, then, think him inoculated against formalism. But definite formalistic elements surface in Wittgenstein's Tractatus.

True, the Tractatus is a notoriously difficult work to interpret. Even the question as to whether the main portion of the book, essentially all of it other than the ‘frame’ of the preface and the end, is to be taken as a serious attempt to present a metaphysics is controversial. If we leave that hermeneutic controversy aside, and consider the metaphysics which is offered to us, the formalistic aspects one finds are twofold. Firstly, mathematical sentences are said to express ‘pseudo-propositions’, and so are devoid of truth value (only contingent propositions have a truth value). Secondly, mathematics is described as a ‘calculus’ which is not to be used to represent the world as it is in itself but whose value is entirely instrumental. To be sure, the most explicit statement of this is not in the Tractatus but in comments Wittgenstein wrote on Ramsey's copy of it:

The fundamental idea of math. is the idea of calculus represented here by the idea of operation The beginning of logic presupposes calculation and so number. Number is the fundamental idea of calculus and must be introduced as such (Lewy, 1967, pp. 421–2).

In the Tractatus proper we do get the idea that mathematical propositions are mere instruments (all of mathematics, not just an ‘ideal’ fragment, as in Hilbert):

Indeed in real life a mathematical proposition is never what we want. Rather, we make use of mathematical propositions only in inferences from propositions that do not belong to mathematics to others that likewise do not belong to mathematics. (In philosophy the question, “What do we actually use this word or this proposition for?” repeatedly leads to valuable insights.) Tractatus ¶6.211.)

This idea is prefaced by the statements:

Mathematics is a logical method. The propositions of mathematics are equations, and therefore pseudo-propositions. (ibid, ¶6.2)
A proposition of mathematics does not express a thought. (ibid, ¶6.21)

Care must be taken, however. Wittgenstein distinguishes utterances which are sinnlos, which lack sense (including logical tautologies and contradictions here) from those which are unsinnig, nonsensical and it is not clear into which class mathematical utterances fall. One might well think that the game formalist should treat mathematical utterances, on that view just strings of meaningless marks, as unsinnig, not just sinnlos. One clear difference from game formalism however is this: for Wittgenstein mathematics should not be conceived of as a calculus separate from other uses of language. Rather he attempts to show that parts of arithmetic, at least, can be seen as grounded in non-mathematical uses of language. Frege by contrast, whilst arguing that a proper account of arithmetic (and analysis) should show how its generality enables one to give a uniform account of multifarious different applications (cf. Dummett, 1991 Chapter 20) also argued strongly for the view that mathematical utterances have a meaning independent of, in conceptually prior to, their use in applications.

Wittgenstein attempts no theory of mathematics in the Tractatus beyond arithmetic, a rather narrow fragment of arithmetic at that. The theory clearly shares the anti-platonism of the game formalist. There are no numbers, arithmetic is to be construed as a calculus in which one manipulates exponents or indices of operators. What is an operator? Wittgenstein distinguishes operator terms from function terms. A perhaps uncharitable reading of the distinction is this. Wittgenstein held that two occurrences of a function term f applied to different strings t and u have different meaning. That is, ‘f’ in “f(t)” does not mean the same as the outermost f in “f(f(t)”; this is supposed to be the basis of the solution to Russell's paradox (3.333). In particular ‘the father of’ in “the father of John”, means something different there compared to its outermost occurrence in “the father of the father of John”. There can be no genuine iterated application of functions in other words. But then, retreating somewhat from this bizarre and unwarranted conclusion, Wittgenstein wished to exclude certain functions, particularly functions on propositions or related entities, from the doctrine; these favoured functions he calls ‘operators’ (5.251).

Sentential operators are conceived as mapping not signs, nor inscriptions, to other signs and ascriptions but rather propositions, (in Wittgenstein's rather course-grained sense of the term) to propositions. On Wittgenstein's account of proposition, repeated application of an operation such as negation … p, ~p, ~~p … may take one back to an earlier point. Nonetheless Wittgenstein attempts to explicate arithmetic in terms of sentential operators applied to non-mathematical language. In slogan form, numbers are exponents of operations (ibid., ¶6.021). Thus where Ω is schematic for an operator and Ωp (or Ω(p)) for its application to a proposition, then we can view the series

p, Ωp, ΩΩp, ΩΩΩp, ΩΩΩΩp, …

as the starting point for a ‘definition’ of numbers, to be had by rewriting it as

Ω0p, Ω0+1p, Ω0+1+1p, Ω0+1+1+1p, Ω0+1+1+1+1p, ….

Here, then, we have infinitely many schematic rewrite rules. Indices such as ‘0+1+1+1+1’ can be abbreviated by numerals in the obvious fashion, with ‘0+1+1+1+1’ being abbreviated ‘4’ and so on.

Wittgenstein's examples show (though he did not explicitly state this) that addition of two number/exponents Ωnp + Ωmp (likewise Ωn+mp) is given by the rule:

Ωnp + Ωmp ⇒ Ωnmp)

telling us we may replace the expression on the left in a formula by the one on the right.

This is what underlies the ‘correctness’ of identities such n + m = r except that for Wittgenstein no such identity expresses a truth. On his account, the identity sign disappears in a full analysis of language, wherein sameness and distinction are shown by sameness and distinctness of names, no two of which refer, in fully analysed language, to the same object (this view gives grounds for interpreting mathematical utterances in the Tractatus as unsinnig). Wittgenstein himself did not trouble to show that abandonment of an identity sign would not cripple the expressive power of language but others such as Hintikka (1956) and Wehmeier (2004) have done so. What is left in the underlying language, with identity excised, are substitution rules (Tractatus ¶ 6.23).

These have to be interpreted in a general, and schematic, fashion. Thus when we plug in ~ for Ω, we find that (Wittgenstein had no intuitionist scruples here) a double application ~~p takes us back to (has the same sense as) p. But this does not ground the truth of 2 = 0, since for many other operations ΩΩp is not equivalent to p. On the other hand

ΩΩ(ΩΩΩp) always has the same sense as ΩΩΩ(ΩΩp)

Wittgenstein implicitly assumes suitable rules for the interaction of brackets with operators, in particular, generalised associativity. (In fact, he uses a mix of brackets and the notation Ω′p to express Ω(p).)

Since an equation Ωnpmp is, in its underlying logical form, not a universal generalisation ∀n, mnpmp) but a purely schematic generalisation, there is no form ∃n, mnp≠ Ωmp) with which we can express inequality, even if we can make sense of ‘≠’. Nor can we express the inequality nm schematically as the holding of the inequivalence of Ωnp from Ωmp for every choice for Ω. Otherwise 2 ≠ 0 would fail since ~~p is equivalent to p. The Tractarian theory cannot handle inequalities.

So much for addition and the limitations of its account of that operation. What of multiplication? Wittgenstein does define it, at ¶6.241, by:

Ωn×mp ⇒ (Ωn)mp

but to grasp this as a general principle we need to know how to interpret the notation (Ωn)m. In more conventional mathematics, one might simply define (xn)m as xn×m but clearly this (or rather the equivalent for the interaction of exponents of operators) would introduce a circularity into Wittgenstein's account. Alternatively one could appeal to a recursive theory of exponents—am×0= a, am×(n+1) = am + am×n. Since the principle of induction needed to show that the recursion is coherent features nowhere in Wittgenstein's system, these rules would presumably have to be taken as primitive.

Overall, then, Wittgenstein in the Tractatus gives us no account of mathematics in general other than for a fragment of arithmetic, basically positive identities involving only addition. And there he denies that the sentences express propositions with truth values. Perhaps his account could have been developed further and more plausibly, despite the difficulties noticed above (but for some scepticism on that front, see Landini, 2007). If not, we have the choice of either abandoning all of mathematics except, at most, a fragment of the arithmetic of addition; or else of rejecting the Tractarian account. One does not need to be slavishly uncritical of contemporary mathematics to see what the reasonable option is here. (Admittedly, rejecting the Tractatus account is also the option Wittgenstein himself seems to adopt at the end of the book; here then we enter the issue of what the point is of taking us through such a bizarre and unconvincing theory in order to throw it away at the end.)

Wittgenstein's later work on philosophy of mathematics, such as the Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics 1956/1978), for a long time attracted even less approval than the Tractarian account, though recently philosophers such as Juliet Floyd and Hilary Putnam have come to its defence as an interesting and informed account of mathematics (Floyd/Putnam, 2000). Its themes include the rejection of the actual infinite (indeed the tendency in his writings is strongly finitist); the denial that undecidable sentences are meaningful; a rejection of Cantor's powerset proof; the idea that proof discovery changes the very meaning of the terms involved; and other very radical ideas. Among them we find a continued adherence to formalist motifs:

In mathematics everything is algorithm and nothing is meaning; (Philosophical Grammar, 468).

Another persistent theme in Wittgenstein's thought is that the meaning of mathematics resides entirely in its utility in non-mathematical applications. But there is no systematic theory of how this applicability comes about, no proof of a conservative extension theorem, for example, showing how application of mathematical calculi to empirical premisses will never lead us to derive an empirical conclusion which does not follow from those premisses. And there is no resolution of the problem of the metatheory. (On the other hand, we should observe that these notes of Wittgenstein on the philosophy of mathematics were not published by him, but by others after his death.)

4. Formalism and the Positivists

Wittgenstein greatly influenced the positivists. The ‘official’ positivist theory of mathematics, as it were, is not a formalist one. Mathematical theorems express truths, albeit in a special way: true by virtue of meaning alone. The most influential positivist has been Carnap, if one does not classify Quine as a positivist (but Quine's views, in the 1930s at any rate, were very close to Carnap's, indeed arguably Quine remained truer to Carnap's radical empiricism than Carnap did). And one can certainly discern strong elements of formalism in some of Carnap's writings, for instance in Logische Syntax der Sprache (1934/37) and ‘Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology’ (1950/56).

The former book was translated into English as The Logical Syntax of Language in 1937. In it, Carnap argued that the correct method in philosophy is to engage in conceptual analysis conceived of as ‘logical syntax’, roughly speaking syntax proper and proof theory. To address philosophical differences, one proposes regimenting the disputed positions in formal languages or ‘frameworks’ which include a system of axioms and rules of proof; given these, some sentences are ‘determinate’, are provable or refutable. These are the analytic, and contradictory, sentences, relative to that framework. How do we choose which system to adopt? Carnap's Principle of Tolerance (1934/7 p. 52) allows us to adopt any system we wish:

In logic, there are no morals. Everyone is at liberty to build up his own logic, i.e. his own form of language, as he wishes. [Italics in original]

Carnaps extends this unbridled permissiveness to mathematics:

The tolerant attitude here suggested is, as far as special mathematical calculi are concerned, the attitude which is tacitly shared by the majority of mathematicians.

Any such calculus can count as a piece of mathematics, even an inconsistent one. By downplaying or outright discarding semantic notions, we simply bypass traditional ontological disputes concerning the nature of the entities mathematics is ‘about’. The only issue is the pragmatic utility, or otherwise, of any given mathematical calculus.

A number of concerns arise here. How can Carnap distinguish between empirical, scientific theories, and mathematical ones? Secondly, if pragmatic utility is primarily a matter of empirical applications, how does the Carnapian formalist know that a given calculus will conservatively extend empirical theory, how can this be known without appeal to meaningful mathematical results? Carnap writes:

The formalist view is right in holding that the construction of the system can be effected purely formally, that is to say without reference to the meaning of the symbols; … But the task which is thus outlined is certainly not fulfilled by the construction of a logico-mathematical calculus alone. For this calculus does not contain … those sentences which are concerned with the application of mathematics … For instance, the sentence “In this room there are now two people present” cannot be derived from the sentence “Charles and Peter are in this room now and no one else” with the help of the logico-mathematical calculus alone, as it is usually constructed by the formalists; but it can be derived with the help of the logicist system, namely on the basis of Frege's definition of ‘2’. (Carnap 1934/37, p. 326)

adding (italics are Carnap's) “A structure of this kind fulfils, simultaneously, the demands of both formalism and logicism.”

But what is to stop us freely stipulating, in accordance with the principle of tolerance, ‘bridge principles’ for operators which proof-theoretically behave like numerical operators— ‘the number of φ's’—via their definitional occurrence in formulations of arithmetic axioms and where the bridge principles include the likes of:

the number of φ's = 0 ↔ ∃xx & ~∃yy & yx))
the number of φ's = 1 ↔ ~∃xφx.

That is, we link the numeral for zero with a sentence stating there is exactly one entity of the appropriate type, the numeral for one with a sentence stating there are no such entities. If we do so, add the rules for standard decimal arithmetic, and then try to apply this calculus, disaster will ensue; but do we not need a contentful conservative extension result to show that for the calculi we do use, no disaster can occur?

Gödel's incompleteness theorems pose very difficult problems for Carnap in this and other regards. The first incompleteness theorem tells us that in any (ω-) consistent formal theory whose theorems are recursively enumerable and which entails a certain (rather limited) amount of arithmetic, there will be an arithmetical sentence such that neither it nor its negation is provable. In Carnap's terminology, this seems to yield non-determinate sentences, which is a problem for him if we are convinced that nonetheless some of these sentences are true; and indeed the key type of sentence used to prove the incompleteness result—‘Gödel sentences’—are in fact true in the standard model of arithmetic if these sentences are constructed in an appropriate way (there are different ways of doing this) from a theory itself true in that model.

Gödel himself wrote, but did not publish, a searching critique of Carnap's position (Gödel, 1953–9/95). Gödel focuses not on his first incompleteness theorem but on the corollary he drew in his second theorem: that, under a certain natural characterization of the property of consistency, a characterization which can be given mathematically via his arithmetization of syntax, no formal theory of the type Gödel considered could prove its own consistency. He argued that Carnap, in order to make good his positivistic thesis that mathematical theorems are devoid of content, needed to give a consistency proof for mathematical calculi in order to show that they do not have empirical content, an abundance thereof indeed, by dint of entailing all empirical sentences. Warren Goldfarb notes, however, (1995, p. 328) that this point fails to appreciate the deep holism of Carnap's 1937 position where the distinction between analytic and synthetic is relative to the system in question, the ‘linguistic framework’. (This deep holism, of course, has the counter-intuitive consequence that there is no framework-transcendent distinction between mathematics and empirical sciences.)

Carnap, in fact, understood the import of Gödel's theorems (Tennant, 2008); he knew of the results directly from Gödel, who indeed read drafts of the Logical Syntax. Despite this he displayed what looks like remarkable insouciance with respect to its implications for his position. He acknowledged the need, in demonstrating consistency, to move to a stronger language (§60c), and freely helped himself to mathematical techniques which could in no sense be classed as finitary (in §14 he used, for example, rules with infinitely many premisses, notably one which was later to be called the ω-rule). In this way he can deny, for arithmetic at least, that there are any non-determinate sentences since every true arithmetic sentence is provable using the ω-rule (relative to a fairly weak finitary logic, considerably weaker than classical logic).

Carnap's relaxed attitude stems from his abandonment of the search for epistemological foundations. If one hopes to secure our knowledge of mathematics by appeal to a formalist interpretation then the search for a consistency proof of the type Hilbert sought makes sense and one will look for a vindication of mathematics as a whole from within a limited fragment with respect to which our knowledge seems hard to impugn. But Carnap, perhaps as a result of Gödel's deep theorems, seems to have abandoned that goal and thought the Principle of Tolerance absolved him of any such need. One can stipulate what one likes, including stronger axiom systems from which one can prove the consistency of a weaker theory. This does not give any firmer grounds for believing or accepting the weaker theory, but one does not need such grounds anyway.

Few nowadays look for Cartesian certitude in mathematics, so Carnap's position here may seem reasonable. It is not so clear, however, that he has answered the problem of applicability. Even if a conservative extension result can only be given in a more powerful system, we need the result to be a contentful truth, not just a string of symbols we can derive from some system, if we are to have reassurance that a particular calculus we are about to use in designing bridges or computers will be pragmatically useful. And if the Carnapian grants that the result is a contentful truth, we can ask what, according to this formalistic position, constitutes that truth. Carnap, to be sure, was motivated by a horror of becoming embroiled in metaphysical disputation. But if his standpoint is emptied not only of epistemological ambition but is so deflationistic as to say little more than that metamathematical techniques can be applied to formalisations of mathematical and scientific theories then it is also emptied of all philosophical interest and ceases to make an intervention in the debates in philosophy of mathematics.

Not that Carnap really is abandoning metaphysics: this erstwhile opponent of metaphysics is really a brother metaphysician with a rival theory of his own, as F. H. Bradley might have said. Thus the main import of the later ‘Empiricism, Semantics, and Ontology’ is the dismissal of ontological worries as pseudo-problems by dint of the (highly contentious) distinction between ‘internal’ questions, to be settled by the rules of the framework—of mathematics, ordinary ‘thing’ talk or whatever—and ‘external’ questions such as ‘which framework to adopt?’. To these external questions there correspond, Carnap claimed, no propositions with truth values; to no such question, for example, is there a true answer of the form: “Yes, infinitely many abstract numbers exist”. Rather, they are to be answered by decisions, decisions to adopt or not based on pragmatic criteria regarding the efficiency, fruitfulness and utility of the framework with respect to the aims of the discourse in question. But what aims could these be? Predicting the flow of ‘sense data’, taken for granted as forming the ultimate furniture of the world? If so, we see that the vaunted ontological neutrality is a sham and we have a radical form of empiricist anti-realist metaphysics.

The vestige of formalism lies in this: Carnap takes ‘correctness’ to be determined by rules which govern a system and not to consist, for example, in correspondence with a realm of facts independent of the system of rules. And he thinks this approach dissolves ontological worries and frees us from any obligation to explain how finite, flesh-and-blood creatures like ourselves could come to have detailed knowledge of this independent realm of facts, this domain of configurations of abstract, non-temporal, non-causal objects and properties, a realm exposed by Carnap as a metaphysical illusion. One strong disanalogy with formalism is that Carnap takes this line with all areas of discourse, not just mathematics.

5. Nominalist Formalism

W. V. Quine famously rejected the positivist's doctrine of truth in virtue of meaning and the quasi-logicist conception of mathematics as a body of analytic truths (and, partly as a result, also rejected his mentor Carnap's internal/external distinction). Quine, in conjunction with Nelson Goodman, produced instead what amounts to a formalist manifesto. His formalist phase does not seem to have lasted very long: he later settled on a form of mathematical platonism, downplaying, if not largely ignoring, his relatively youthful flirtation with ‘nominalism’. But while it lasted he and Goodman greatly advanced the discussion of formalism by tackling head-on the questions which other formalists shirked or ignored.

Goodman and Quine's ‘Steps towards a constructive nominalism’ (1947) sets forth an uncompromising game formalism:

The gains which seem to have accrued to natural science from the use of mathematical formulas do not imply that these formulas are true statements. No one, not even the hardiest pragmatist, is likely to regard the beads of an abacus as true; and our position is that the formulas of platonistic mathematics are, like the beads of an abacus, convenient computational aids which need involve no question of truth. (p. 122).

They regard

the sentences of mathematics merely as strings of marks without meaning

so that

such intelligibility as mathematics possesses derives from the syntactical or metamathematical rules governing those marks. (p. 111)

Commendably, Goodman and Quine do not shy away from the metatheory problem, the difficulty that syntax and metamathematics itself seems as ontologically rich and committed to abstract objects as arithmetic. On the contrary, they face it squarely and attempt to make do entirely with an ontology of concrete objects, finitely many such objects in fact. (However they do assume fairly powerful mereological principles, essentially universal composition: they assume that any fusion of objects, however scattered or diffuse, is also an object in good standing.)

With much ingenuity they try to develop a syntax which “will treat mathematical expressions as concrete objects” (ibid.)—as actual strings of physical marks—and give concrete surrogates for notions such as ‘formula’, ‘axiom’ and ‘proof’ as platonistically defined. However they do not address the issue of the application of mathematics, construed in this concrete, formalistic fashion.

In addition to the applicability problem, there are two further crucial problems for formalism as developed by Goodman and Quine. Firstly it is not clear that they are entitled to the general claims they make about syntax, construed as a theory about certain concrete marks and fusions of marks. Thus when arguing that their definition of formula in terms of ‘quasi-formula’ gives us the results we want, they say:

By requiring also the next more complex alternative denials in x to be alternative denials of quasi-formulas, the definition guarantees these also will be formulas in the intuitively intended sense; and so on, to x itself. (p. 116)

(‘Alternative denial’ is the Sheffer stroke operation P|Q which is true if and only if one component is false.) The problem lies with the ‘and so on’. Goodman and Quine are trying to work their way up through an arbitrary formula showing that their definition will ensure that each larger component is a formula. It is not clear how we can have a guarantee of this for arbitrary x, without something like induction over formula complexity; but this is not available as formulas are not generated in the usual inductive set-theoretic fashion. Similar remarks apply to the demonstration that proofs, as defined nominalistically on p. 120, have the internal order of precedence among immediate sub-premisses and conclusions that we intuitively expect. The demonstration proceeds with a generalisation over all numbers k which number the axioms in a concrete proof and then performs a sequence of selections on them. This seems to presuppose the truth of generalisations over all numbers and indeed countable choice, resources unavailable to a strict nominalist.

Secondly, what can Goodman and Quine say about a sentence such as

222222+1 is prime  ?

(That is—with ‘2^n’ representing ‘2 to the power n’—‘[2^(2^(2^(2^(2^2))))]+1 is prime’; cf. Tennant, 1997 p. 152.) They cannot deny the sentence exists, for there is the token before our very eyes. But there are strong grounds for thinking that no concrete proof or disproof will exist, for the only methods available may use up more time, space and material than any human could have at her disposal, perhaps than actually exists. There are countless sentences with this property: concrete tokens of them exist but no concrete proof or refutation actually exists, none that a human could manipulate as a meaningful utterance anyway. (Cf. George Boolos' ‘A Curious Inference’, 1987.) Formalists of Goodman and Quine's persuasion seem forced to the conclusion that sentences like the above, sentences which are decidable in the usual formal sense, are neither true nor false, since neither (concretely) provable nor refutable. To embrace this view, however, would be to butcher mathematics as currently practiced; such a consequence should rather be viewed as a reductio ad absurdum of their position.

6. Term Formalism: Curry

The most substantive attempt at a non-Hilbertian formalist philosophy of mathematics is Haskell Curry's book Outline of a Formalist Philosophy of Mathematics (Curry, 1951). Curry is no game formalist, his position is closer to term formalism, of the two views we started out from. Curry's philosophy of mathematics, however, is, or attempts to be, a highly anti-metaphysical one, at least to the extent that he thinks he can remain neutral on the issue of the ontological commitments of mathematics.

Mathematics can be conceived as a science in such a way as to be independent of any except the most rudimentary philosophical hypotheses. (p. 3)

Hence he is not motivated by an anti-platonist horror of abstract objects. His neutrality, indeed, is somewhat compromised by the fact that Curry is perfectly happy to commit to an infinite ontology of presumably abstract expression types. Officially he evinces disinterest in what the primitives—he misleadingly calls them ‘tokens’—of his formal systems are

We can take for those tokens any objects we please, and similarly we can take for operators any ways of combining these objects which have the requisite formal properties. (p. 28)

But since for many systems there are infinitely many primitive ‘tokens’, they cannot all be identified with concrete marks which mathematicians have actually produced.

Like the term formalist, Curry takes mathematics, properly reconstructed after philosophical reflection, to have an essentially syntactic subject matter, namely formal systems. Unlike Frege's adversaries, though, Curry, writing after the development of the discipline of metamathematics, is able to give a far more rigorous (albeit in his case somewhat eccentric) account of what a formal system is.

No restrictions are placed on what form the axioms, rules and therefore theorems of a formal system are to be. Truth for elementary propositions of a formal system consists simply in their provability in the system. One of his formal systems (Example 7, p. 23) has only one predicate “a unary predicate expressed by Gödel by the words ‘ist beweisbar’” (p. 23), i.e., a provability predicate. The elementary truths of this system can be interpreted as claims about provability in the underlying system. Any formal system of the usual sort could be ‘reduced’ into one in which there is only one provability predicate and truth (= provability) in the reducing system of the elementary proposition ⊢ ≺φ≻ holds only when φ is provable in the reduced system (pp. 34–35). Curry allows that one can form compounds from elementary propositions by means of the usual logical operators in order to express complex propositions in the language of proof theory (Chapter IX).

The upshot is that mathematics in general becomes metamathematics, a contentful theory—Curry's sentences express propositions with truth values—setting out the truths about what is provable from what in underlying formal systems whose interpretation, or rather interpretations, are not taken to be mathematically important. This standpoint, however, threatens to collapse into structuralism, into viewing mathematical utterances as schemata implicitly generalising over a range of (in general) abstract structures which satisfy the schemata. As to the problem of the metatheory, Curry does not seek to answer this; there is no real attempt to avoid commitment to a rich ontology of objects, except that, by considering only standard formal systems, one could make do with a countable ontology which can play the role of linguistic expressions. Only, however, at the cost of grossly distorting mathematical practice. Set theorists, topologists, analysts et al. entertain conjectures, and try to prove things ‘about’ sets, topological spaces, functions on the complex numbers and so on. In their philosophical moments they may wonder just what the concepts they are wrestling with are ‘about’, but they do not in general entertain conjectures or try to prove things ‘about’ expression strings, except where it is of instrumental value to them in proving things about sets, spaces, the complex plane and so on (cf. Resnik pp. 70–71).

7. Contemporary Formalism

Later developments have been primarily in the ‘Hilbertian’ wing of the formalist movement. P. J. Cohen's work on the generalised continuum hypothesis showed, in tandem with Gödel's relative consistency proof, that it and countless related set-theoretic propositions concerning the relations of the cardinality of a set to that of its powerset are undecidable by current axioms. With no obvious, non-ad hoc ways to extend the axioms to decide these questions, this led some mathematicians, such as Cohen himself (Cohen, 1971) and Abraham Robinson, (Robinson, 1965, 1969) to despair of a realistic interpretation of higher set theory. They therefore treat branches of mathematics in which no plausible axiom set will decide the key questions as ‘ideal’ parts of mathematics, lacking the content to be found in other areas.

As to game formalism, although philosophers may accuse mathematicians of a tendency to lapse into this discredited position, very few philosophers advance views resembling the game formalists. However Azzouni (2005) has defended a viewpoint in mathematics he describes as formalist and Weir's approach (1991, 1993, 2010) is in the game formalist camp.

The latter's position starts from a fairly common ‘post-Fregean’ or ‘neo-Fregean’ perspective on language. Frege, at least early in his career, held that the truth value of a sentence is determined by two factors, the sinn—the sense, literal meaning or informational content, of the sentence—and the way the world is. Indexicality and wider context relativity of sentences he initially supposed could be met by assuming speakers who uttered and grasped such sentences took them as elliptical for more complete utterances whose sense fixed, in combination with the world, a unique truth value.

Later work (including Frege's own) revealed the inadequacy of this picture, revealed that some indexicality, for instance, is ‘essential’ in John Perry's phrase, to the thought expressed. I can utter “it's hot now” truly without knowing where, when or even who (if sufficiently disoriented or out my head) I am. Those who are not utterly sceptical, as radical contextualists are, of systematic theories of meaning, will amend Frege's view to a tripartite one. A sentence's truth value, in a particular context, is determined by its informational content, by contextual circumstances related to, ‘fitted to’ the utterance by aspects of the speakers’ practice, and finally by the mind and language-independent world. The contextual circumstances need not figure in the sense or informational content of the utterance; thus a specification of them may include dates and locations, though this is not part of the sense of “it's hot now”.

This picture in turn suggests the idea that the contextual circumstances which ‘make true’, in conjunction with independent reality, an utterance, may make it true in a non-realist fashion. For instance, in cognitivist forms of expressivism or projectivism, internal sentiments may make true “that haggis is tasty”, though reference or conceptualisation of those sentiments is no part of the literal meaning of ‘tasty’. Likewise in Weir's version of game formalism, what makes true (or false) “sin2θ + cos2θ = 1” in a particular system is the existence of a concrete proof or refutation, though the statement that such a concrete proof exists is no part of the literal meaning or sense of the claim.

The advantage of this type of formalism is that it not only affirms the meaningfulness, the possession of sense, of mathematical utterances; in sharp contrast with traditional game formalism, it holds that such utterances have truth values, where proofs or refutations exist. The problem of the metatheory is met if one can give, after the fashion of Goodman and Quine, a non-mathematical account of concrete proof. Of course severe problems remain. The problem of applicability has to be met, by providing conservative extension proofs for example. And of course the theory is threatened not only by Gödel-type incompleteness and the undecidable—but intuitively truth-valued—sentences it throws up; even more devastating indeterminacy looms in the form of ‘concretely undecidable’ sentences such as the primality claim above. The formalist who espouses the meaningfulness and indeed truth of standard mathematical theories, including proof theory for example, has more resources to meet such claims than classic game formalism; the question is whether these are enough to salvage a position most still think hopeless.

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