# The Frege-Hilbert Controversy

*First published Sun Sep 23, 2007; substantive revision Thu Aug 30, 2012*

In the early years of the twentieth century, Gottlob Frege and David Hilbert, two titans of mathematical logic, engaged in a controversy regarding the correct understanding of the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and the correct way to demonstrate consistency and independence results for such axioms. The controversy touches on a number of difficult questions in logic and the philosophy of logic, and marks an important turning-point in the development of modern logic. This entry gives an overview of that controversy and of its philosophical underpinnings.

## 1. Introduction

In June 1899, at a ceremony marking the installation of the new
Gauss-Weber monument in Göttingen, David Hilbert delivered a
lecture on the foundations of geometry. Published later that year by
Teubner under the title “*Grundlagen der Geometrie*”
(“Foundations of Geometry”), the piece stands as a
watershed in the development of modern mathematics and logic. Though
the subject-matter of the work is geometry, its lasting influence
concerns more broadly the role of axioms in mathematical theories, and
the systematic treatment of such metatheoretical questions as
consistency and independence. By presenting a rich trove of consistency
and independence demonstrations, Hilbert displays here the power of the
“formal” approach to axioms, and lays the groundwork for
what soon becomes our own contemporary model-theoretic approach to
formal systems. (For the historical background to Hilbert's
treatment of axioms, see
Nineteenth Century Geometry;
for the role of Hilbert's work in the development of model theory,
see
model theory.)

Hilbert's lecture and monograph inspired a sharp reaction from his contemporary Gottlob Frege, who found both Hilbert's understanding of axioms, and his approach to consistency and independence demonstrations, virtually incomprehensible and at any rate seriously flawed. Frege's reaction is first laid out in his correspondence with Hilbert from December 1899 to September 1900, and subsequently in two series of essays (both entitled “On the Foundations of Geometry”) published in 1903 and 1906. Hilbert was never moved by Frege's criticisms, and did not respond to them after 1900. Frege, for his part, was never convinced of the reliability of Hilbert's methods, and held until the end that the latter's consistency and independence proofs were fatally flawed.

The correspondence and essays involved in the Frege-Hilbert debate
shed light both on the emergence, at the turn of the 20^{th}
century, of the modern, formal conception of logic and of axiomatic
theories as evidenced in Hilbert's work, and also on the very
different approach to these issues found in Frege's work. The
difference of opinion over the success of Hilbert's consistency
and independence proofs is, as detailed below, the result of
significant differences of opinion over such fundamental issues as: how
to understand the content of a mathematical theory, what a successful
axiomatization consists in, what the “truths” of a
mathematical theory really are, and finally, what one is really asking
when one asks about the consistency of a set of axioms or the
independence of a given mathematical statement from others.

In what follows, we look briefly at Hilbert's technique in
*Foundations of Geometry*, detail Frege's various
criticisms thereof, and finally outline the overall conceptions of
logic that give rise to the differences.

## 2. Hilbert's *Foundations of Geometry*

Hilbert's work in *Foundations of Geometry* (hereafter
referred to as “*FG*”) consists primarily of laying
out a clear and precise set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and of
demonstrating in detail the relations of those axioms to one another
and to some of the fundamental theorems of geometry. In particular,
Hilbert demonstrates the consistency of various sub-groups of the
axioms, the independence of a number of axioms from others, and various
relations of provability and of independence of important theorems from
specific sub-groups of the axioms. Included are new demonstrations of
the consistency of the entire set of axioms for Euclidean geometry, and
of the independence of the axiom of parallels from the other Euclidean
axioms.

Hilbert's consistency demonstrations in *FG* are all
demonstrations of *relative* consistency, which is to say that
in each case the consistency of a set *AX* of geometric axioms
is reduced to that of a familiar background theory *B*,
demonstrating that *AX* is consistent if *B* is. The
important technique Hilbert employs is the *reinterpretation*
of the geometric terms appearing in *AX* in such a way that, as
reinterpreted, the members of *AX* express theorems of
*B*. For example, Hilbert's first consistency-proof interprets
the terms “point,” “line,” and “lies
on” as standing respectively for a particular collection of
ordered pairs of real numbers, for a collection of ratios of real
numbers, and for an algebraically-defined relation between such pairs
and ratios; under this reinterpretation, the geometric sentences in
question express theorems of the background theory of real
numbers.

That such a reinterpretation strategy guarantees relative
consistency can be seen via the following reasoning: If the set
*AX* were inconsistent, then it would logically imply a
contradiction. But as logical implication is independent of the
specific meanings of such terms as “point” and
“line,” *AX* would continue to imply a contradiction
under its reinterpretation. But that is just to say that a set of
theorems of *B* would imply a contradiction, hence that
*B* itself would be inconsistent.

Independence is demonstrated in exactly the same way. To show that a
statement *I* is independent of a set *AX* of statements
(relative to the consistency of *B*), one interprets the
relevant geometric terms in such a way that the members of *AX*,
as interpreted, express theorems of *B*, while *I*
expresses the negation of a theorem of *B*. That is, the
independence of *I* from *AX* (relative to the
consistency of *B*) is demonstrated by proving the consistency
of *AX* ∪ {~*I*} relative to that of *B*.

The reinterpretation technique used by Hilbert here is not entirely new
in 1899, but Hilbert's systematic and extremely fruitful use of
it marks a turning-point in the development of modern views about the
nature of axioms and about meta-theoretic reasoning. Once
Hilbert's re-interpretation technique is applied to the sentences
of a fully formalized language, we have essentially the modern
understanding of models, whose use today in demonstrations of
consistency and independence differs only in detail from that of
Hilbert's
technique.^{[1]}

Hilbert's central idea, again, is to focus not on particular
geometrical concepts like *point* and *line*, but to pay
attention instead to the logical relations that are said, by the
axioms, to hold between those concepts. The question of whether the
parallels axiom is independent of the other Euclidean axioms has
entirely to do with the logical structure exhibited by these axioms,
and nothing to do with whether it is geometric *points* and
*lines* one is talking about, or some other subject-matter
altogether. As Hilbert says,

[I]t is surely obvious that every theory is only a scaffolding or schema of concepts together with their necessary relations to one another, and that the basic elements can be thought of in any way one likes. If in speaking of my points I think of some system of things, e.g. the system: love, law, chimney-sweep … and then assume all my axioms as relations between these things, then my propositions, e.g. Pythagoras' theorem, are also valid for these things. In other words: any theory can always be applied to infinitely many systems of basic elements. (Letter to Frege of December 29, 1899, as excerpted by Frege (ellipsis Hilbert's or Frege's) in Frege 1980, p. 40.)

This understanding of the geometric terms as susceptible of multiple
interpretations enables one to see the geometric sentences themselves,
and sets of them, as providing *definitions* of a certain kind.
Specifically: A set *AX* of sentences containing *n* geometric
terms defines an *n*-place relation *R _{AX}* holding of
just those

*n*-tuples which, when taken respectively as the interpretations of

*AX*'s geometric terms, render the members of

*AX*true. (For example: if

*AX*is the set {There are at least two

*points*; Every

*point*

*lies on*at least two

*lines*}, then

*R*is the relation that holds of any triple <

_{AX}*P*,

*LO*,

*L*> such that

*P*has at least two members,

*L*has at least two members, and

*LO*is a relation that holds between each member of

*P*and at least two members of

*L*.) The defined relation is simply the abstract structure, or as Hilbert puts it the “scaffolding,” shared by any interpretation that will render the axioms true.

We can now redescribe Hilbert's technique, in a nutshell, as
follows: Given a set *AX* of sentences, Hilbert appeals to a
background theory *B* to construct an interpretation of
*AX*'s geometric terms under which the members of
*AX* express theorems of *B*. This interpretation is,
assuming the consistency of *B*, an *n*-tuple satisfying
the relation *R _{AX}* defined by

*AX*. Its existence demonstrates the satisfiability of

*R*and consequently the consistency of

_{AX}*AX*relative to that of

*B*. Both the satisfiability of

*R*and the consistency of

_{AX}*AX*, in the sense under discussion here, are matters that hold entirely independently of the meanings of such geometric terms as “point” and “line,” which serve in Hilbert's work essentially as empty place-holders, susceptible of multiple interpretations.

## 3. Frege — Background

For Frege, things are radically different. Frege takes it that the
*sentences* we use in mathematics are important only because of
the nonlinguistic propositions (or, as he puts it, the
“thoughts”) they express. Mathematicians working in French
and in German are working on the same subject because, as Frege sees
it, their sentences express the same thoughts. Thoughts are on this
view the things that logically imply or contradict one another, they
are the things that are true or false, and they are the things which
together constitute mathematical theories. Each thought is about a
determinate subject-matter, and says something true or false about
that
subject-matter.^{[2]}

The question of the consistency of a set of geometric axioms is, as Frege understands it, a question about a specific set of thoughts. And because thoughts are determinately true or false, and have a determinate subject-matter, it makes no sense to talk about the “reinterpretation” of thoughts. The kind of reinterpretation that Hilbert engages in, i.e. of assigning different meanings to specific words, is something that can apply only to sentences, and never to thoughts, from the Fregean point of view. The first difficulty Frege notes with Hilbert's approach is that it is not clear what Hilbert means by “axioms:” if he means the kinds of things for which issues of consistency and independence can arise, then he must be talking about thoughts, while if he means the kinds of things which are susceptible of multiple interpretations, then he must be talking about sentences.

The difficulties multiply from here. When Hilbert provides a specific
reinterpretation of the geometric terms *en route* to proving
the relative consistency of a set *AX*, Frege notes that we now
have two different sets of thoughts in play: the set we might call
“*AX _{G}*” of thoughts expressed when

*AX*'s terms take their ordinary geometric meanings (e.g. on which “point” means

*point*) and the set we might call “

*AX*” of thoughts expressed when

_{R}*AX*'s terms take the meanings assigned by Hilbert's re-interpretation (on which e.g. “point” means

*pair of real numbers from the field*Ω). Hilbert's reinterpretation strategy involves, from Frege's point of view, simply shifting our attention from the set

*AX*of thoughts ordinarily expressed by the sentences

_{G}*AX*(and in whose consistency we are interested) to the new set

*AX*of thoughts expressed by

_{R}*AX*under the reinterpretation. Granting the reliability of the background theory of real numbers, the set

*AX*is clearly a set of true thoughts and hence is consistent; but as far as Frege is concerned, the inference from the consistency of

_{R}*AX*to the consistency of the very different set

_{R}*AX*is fallacious.

_{G}
Frege acknowledges that the set *AX* can be seen to provide an
implicit definition of an abstract
structure.^{[3]}
As he puts it, the set (with its
geometric terms now understood as variables) characterizes a
“general case,” of which e.g. *AX _{G}* and

*AX*are “special cases,” or “special geometries.” But again he takes it that Hilbert's treatment of these cases involves a crucial, illegitimate inference:

_{R}[G]iven that the axioms in special geometries are all special cases of general axioms, one can conclude from lack of contradiction in a special geometry to lack of contradiction in the general case, but not to lack of contradiction in another special case. (Letter of January 6, 1900 in Frege 1980, p. 48.)

Again, the “lack of contradiction” in
*AX _{R}* is insufficient to establish the “lack of
contradiction” in

*AX*.

_{G}## 4. The Deeper Disagreement

The bulk of Frege's critique of Hilbert consists of criticizing Hilbert's lack of terminological clarity, particularly as this applies to the differences between sentences and various collections of thoughts. He takes Hilbert to task for misleadingly using the same sentences to express different thoughts, and points out repeatedly that Hilbert's use of axioms as definitions needs considerably more-careful treatment than Hilbert affords it. The more-substantial criticism flows naturally from this terminological critique: Frege takes it that once one disentangles Hilbert's terminology, it becomes clear that he is simply not talking about the axioms of geometry at all, since the sets of thoughts he actually deals with are the misleadingly-expressed thoughts about e.g. real numbers. And, adds Frege, one cannot infer the consistency of the geometric axioms proper from that of the thoughts Hilbert treats.

Frege's complaints against Hilbert essentially end here. Having
pointed out what he takes to be the illegitimate shift in
subject-matter from geometric thoughts to non-geometric ones, and noted
that Hilbert's reinterpretation strategy will always introduce
such an illegitimate shift, he takes himself to have discredited that
strategy. The interesting philosophical question which receives
considerably less emphasis from Frege is that of why, exactly, the
shift is illegitimate. Why is it that the consistency of
*AX _{G}* doesn't follow from that of the
structurally-similar

*AX*, particularly when each of these sets is expressible via the same set

_{R}*AX*of sentences?

We should note, to begin with, that from Frege's point of view
the burden of argument is squarely with Hilbert: if Hilbert thinks that
the consistency of *AX _{G}* follows from either the
consistency of

*AX*or from the truth of

_{R}*AX*'s members, then it is up to Hilbert to show this. Frege does not go out of his way to demonstrate that the crucial inference is invalid, but seems to take his point to have been essentially made once he has pointed out the need for a justification here.

_{R}
From Hilbert's point of view, of course, there is no need for
such a justification. The differences that Frege insists on over and
over again between the sets of sentences (*AX*) and the
different sets of thoughts (*AX _{G}*,

*AX*etc.) are entirely inconsequential from Hilbert's standpoint. Because consistency as Hilbert understands it applies to the “scaffolding” of concepts and relations defined by

_{R}*AX*when its geometric terms are taken as place-holders, the consistency he has in mind holds (to put it in terms of thoughts) of

*AX*iff it holds of

_{G}*AX*, since both sets of thoughts are instantiations of the same “scaffolding.” The same point can be put in terms of sentences: Frege insists that the consistency-question that arises for the sentences under their geometric interpretation is a different issue from the one that arises for those sentences under their real-number interpretation; for Hilbert on the other hand, there is just one question, and it is answered in the affirmative if there is any interpretation under which the sentences express truths. Hence while Frege takes it that Hilbert owes an explanation of the inference from the consistency of

_{R}*AX*to that of

_{R}*AX*, for Hilbert there is simply no inference.

_{G}
We turn now to the more substantial issue, namely, why the inference
from the consistency of *AX _{R}* to that of

*AX*is in fact fallacious from Frege's point of view. Frege clearly takes it that the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed by a set Σ of sentences is sensitive not just to the overall structure of those sentences, but also to the meanings of the non-logical (here, geometrical) terms that appear in the members of Σ. What we need to understand, in order to see why this should be the case for him, is how Frege understands the relationship between the meanings of terms and the logical implications that hold between thoughts expressed using those terms. This relationship comes out most clearly when we turn to Frege's method of demonstrating that a given thought follows logically from other thoughts.

_{G}
In general, for Frege, we can show that a given thought τ follows
logically from a set *T* of thoughts via a two-step procedure in
which we (i) subject τ and/or the members of *T* to conceptual
analysis, bringing out previously-unrecognized conceptual complexity in
those thoughts, and (ii) prove the thus-analyzed version of τ from the
thus-analyzed members of *T*. The clearest examples of this
procedure appear in Frege's work on arithmetic. Frege holds for
example that the thought expressed by

- The sum of two multiples of a number is a multiple of that number

follows logically from the thoughts expressed by

- (∀
*m*)(∀*n*)(∀*p*)((*m*+*n*)+*p*=*m*+(*n*+*p*))

and by

- (∀
*n*)(*n*=*n*+0).

He demonstrates this by providing a careful analysis of the notion of
“multiple of” in terms of addition, giving us in place of
(i) a more-complex (i′) which is then derived from (ii) and
(iii).^{[4]}
Similarly, a significant part of Frege's logicist project
consists of the careful analysis of such arithmetical notions as
*zero* and *successor*, analysis which brings out
previously-unnoticed complexity, and facilitates the proof of
arithmetical truths. (For a discussion of the logicist project, see
Frege.)

As Frege puts it in the early pages of his *Foundations of
Arithmetic*, when we are trying to prove the truths of arithmetic
from the simplest possible starting-points,

… we very soon come to propositions which cannot be proved so long as we do not succeed in analysing concepts which occur in them into simpler concepts or in reducing them to something of greater generality. (Frege 1884, §4.)

In short: the components of thoughts can sometimes be analyzed in terms of simpler or more general constituents, in a way that brings to light previously-hidden relations of logical entailment. Hence when we want to know whether a given thought is logically entailed by a set of thoughts, we need to pay attention, from Frege's point of view, not just to the overall structure exhibited by the sentences expressing those thoughts, but also to the contents of the individual terms that appear in those sentences.

Because we can sometimes discover that a thought τ is logically
entailed by a set *T* of thoughts only after a careful analysis
of some of the apparently-simple components of those thoughts, so too
we will sometimes be able to discover that a set of thoughts is
inconsistent, i.e. that it logically entails a contradiction, on the
basis of such conceptual analysis. Hence the consistency of the set of
thoughts expressed by a set Σ of sentences is something which
turns not just on the overall structure of the sentences in Σ,
but on the meanings of the terms appearing in Σ's
sentences.

To clarify this last point, let's look at a non-mathematical
example, one which neither Hilbert nor Frege explicitly dealt
with. Consider the set of sentences {Jones had a nightmare, Jones
didn't have a dream }, or equivalently its first-order rendition,
{*Nj*, ~*Dj*}. The set is clearly consistent in the
sense used by Hilbert in FG; it is a straightforward matter to provide
interpretations of “Jones,” “*x* had a
nightmare” and “*x* had a dream” (or of
“*j*”, “*N*”, and
“*D*”) such that the sentences, so interpreted,
express truths. (Consider, for example, an interpretation on which
“*j*” is assigned the number 7,
“*N*” the set of prime numbers, and
“*D*” the set of numbers greater than 12.) But from
the Fregean point of view, the thoughts expressed are inconsistent,
since part of what it is to have a nightmare is to have a dream. The
inconsistency from Frege's point of view can be demonstrated by
providing an analysis of the thoughts expressed, and noting that the
results of this analysis yield the set {Jones had a disturbing dream,
Jones didn't have a dream}.

For the same reason, two sets of thoughts that are structurally similar in the sense that they can be expressed, under different interpretations, by the same set of sentences, can differ with respect to Frege-consistency. The inference from the consistency of one such set of thoughts to the other will be fallacious.

Frege does not claim to be able to give specific geometric analyses which contradict particular consistency-claims of Hilbert's, and there is no evidence that he takes any of those claims to be false. That he might well have had some such analyses in mind is hinted at in a letter to Hilbert in which he claims that in his own unfinished investigations into the foundations of geometry, he was able to “make do with fewer primitive terms,” which presumably means that he takes some of the terms treated as primitive by Hilbert to be susceptible of analysis via others. (See the letter to Hilbert of December 27, 1899 in Frege 1980, p. 34.) Any such analysis would reveal relations of logical dependence (from Frege's point of view) where Hilbert would find independence. Because none of Frege's work on this topic has survived, we have no details about the specific analyses he might have given. The crucial point in Frege's criticism of Hilbert, however, is not a disagreement about particular analyses or the consequent failure of particular consistency and independence claims, but instead concerns the general methodology of consistency and independence proofs. Because for Hilbert the consistency of a set of sentences turns entirely on the overall structure they exhibit, while for Frege the consistency of the set of thoughts expressed turns additionally on the contents of the non-logical terms appearing in the sentences, Hilbert-consistency doesn't imply Frege-consistency.

## 5. Conclusion

Because the content of the geometric terms is irrelevant to the issues of consistency and independence with which Hilbert is concerned, it is immaterial from his point of view whether one understands his axioms to be (a) fully-interpreted sentences whose geometric terms have their ordinary geometric meanings, (b) fully-interpreted sentences whose geometric terms take on one of Hilbert's re-interpretations, or (c) partially-interpreted sentences whose geometric terms appear simply as place-holders. Hilbert's own discussion indicates sometimes one, and sometimes another of these ways of regarding the axioms, and given his purposes, it is clear that there is no need for precision here: the differences between (a), (b), and (c) are irrelevant to the kind of consistency in which Hilbert is interested. That a set of sentences is consistent in Hilbert's sense is a matter that's entirely independent of what its geometric terms mean, and this consistency is immediately implied by the satisfiability of the relation defined by those sentences when their geometric terms are treated as place-holders.

For Frege on the other hand, the differences just listed are crucial, particularly since the consistency of the thoughts expressed by the sentences construed as in (a) above is not implied either by the consistency of the thoughts expressed by those sentences understood as in (b) or by the satisfiability of the relation defined by the sentences understood as in (c). Hence we can see both why Frege found Hilbert's cavalier attitude regarding the distinctions between (a), (b), and (c) to be virtually incomprehensible, and why Hilbert found Frege's criticisms entirely unconvincing.

Despite the clear failure of communication between Hilbert and Frege, their debate brings to light a number of important issues, not least of which are (i) the role of schematically-understood sentences in providing implicit definitions, which Frege articulates more clearly on Hilbert's behalf than Hilbert had yet done, and (ii) the extent to which the logical relations are to be treated as “formal.” On this last issue, the difference between Frege and Hilbert is instructive. Long before the debate with Hilbert, Frege already held that logical rigor requires the use of formal systems of deduction, “formal” in the sense that all thoughts are expressed via precisely-determined sentences, and that all inference-rules and axioms are presented syntactically. (See e.g. Frege (1879).) Most important for our purposes is the fact that Frege's formal systems are entirely modern in the sense that the derivability in such a system of a sentence from a set of sentences turns just on the syntactic form of those sentences. The famous conceptual analyses on which much of Frege's work turns are all provided prior to proof; it is on the basis of conceptual analyses that one arrives at the appropriate sentences to treat within the formal system, but the analyses themselves play no role within the proofs proper. Hence when it comes to the positive work of demonstrating that a given sentence is derivable from a set of sentences, Frege is just like Hilbert: meanings don't matter. Indeed, at the time of their correspondence, Frege's work was considerably more “formal” than Hilbert's, since Hilbert at this time was not using an explicit syntactically-defined system of deduction.

Nevertheless, Frege's conception of logic has the result that there
is only a one-way connection between logical implication as this holds
between thoughts and formal derivability as this holds between
sentences. Given a good formal system, a sentence σ is deducible
from a set Σ only if the thought expressed by σ is in fact
logically entailed by the thoughts expressed by the members of
Σ. (This simply requires that one's axioms and rules of
inference are well-chosen.) But the converse is false: that σ is
*not* deducible in such a system from Σ is no guarantee
that the thought expressed by σ is independent of the set of
thoughts expressed by the members of Σ. For it may well be, as
in the cases treated explicitly by Frege's own analyses, that further
analysis of the thoughts and their components will yield a
more-complex structure. When this happens, the analysis may return
yet-more complex (sets of) sentences σ′ and Σ′
such that σ′ is, after all, deducible from
Σ′. In short, because considerable logical complexity can
lie undiscovered in the thoughts expressed by relatively-simple
sentences, non-derivability is no guarantee of independence, in the
Fregean scheme of things. There is a significant gap, as one might put
it, between the logical and the formal.

For Hilbert on the other hand, at least in the context of axiomatized geometry, the logical relations simply are the formally-describable relations, since they have entirely to do with the structure exhibited by the sentences in question, or equivalently with the “scaffolding” of concepts defined by these sentences. It is because consistency in Hilbert's sense turns just on this abstract structure, and not on the contents of the terms instantiating the structure, that the reinterpretation strategy is effective.

Hilbert is clearly the winner in this debate, in the sense that roughly his conception of consistency is what one means today by “consistency” in the context of formal theories, and a near relative of his methodology for consistency-proofs is now standard. This is not to say that Frege's objections have been met, but rather that they have essentially been sidestepped via the enshrinement of the formal notion of consistency, and a lack of concern, at least under that title, with what Frege called “consistency.”

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- Sterrett, Susan G., 1994, “Frege and Hilbert on the Foundations of Geometry”, [PDF] (1994 Talk).

## Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | geometry: in the 19th century | Hilbert, David | model theory

### Acknowledgments

Thanks to Edward N. Zalta for helpful suggestions on this entry.