Gadamer's Aesthetics

First published Wed Jun 13, 2007

Gadamer (1900–2002) does not provide an account of the aesthetic in any customary sense. His approach to art runs, in many ways, against conventional philosophical expectations. Aesthetic qualities are not debated in the manner of the analytic tradition of modern philosophy, nor does he concern himself overtly with the problems of aesthetic pleasure. Gadamer's approach to aesthetic experience stands squarely in the phenomenological tradition. He is primarily concerned with the place of art in our experience of the world. Furthermore, his approach to aesthetic theory is one of those rare intellectual achievements which are simultaneously deconstructive and constructive. He dismantles elements of the grand tradition of Platonic, Kantian and Hegelian aesthetics and yet offers a phenomenological reconstruction of many of the central insights of that tradition to demonstrate their continuing relevance to our contemporary experience of art. Gadamer is primarily concerned with the cognitive dimension of such experience, with what art works address and what they put at issue. This makes for a flexible philosophical approach capable of ranging freely over a number of art forms and styles, discussing both the singularity of works and their broader significance. The approach is clearly hermeneutical in that it endeavours to re-acquaint us with those received meanings and pre-occupations which underlie our experience of art. Openly influenced by Heidegger, his later essays on language and poetry in particular, Gadamer's aesthetics is far from traditional. His key claims are:

  • Aesthetics is not the study of specific types of subjective pleasures derived from art. It is a study of what objectively informs our subjective awareness of art.
  • Hermeneutical aesthetics seeks to break through the pleasurable distractions of aesthetic consciousness in order to disclose the cultural and linguistic realities that manifest themselves within it.
  • Hermeneutical aesthetics presupposes phenomenological involvement with the subject matters of art rather than disinterested detachment.
  • Hermeneutical aesthetics regards aesthetic appearance not as a distraction from the real but as the vehicle through which real subject matters reveal themselves. It over-turns the notion that art works are at one remove from reality.
  • Hermeneutical aesthetics is dialogical in character. It recognises that practitioner and theoretician share in bringing a subject matter to light and plays down any theory/ practice division in the arts. Interpretation is a means to a work's realisation.
  • Hermeneutical aesthetics is not a theory of art per se, more a set of practical contemplative notes for enhancing one's encounter with art. The end of hermeneutical aesthetics is not to arrive at a concept of art but to deepen our experience of art. In hermeneutical aesthetics, theory is deployed to deepen contemplation of artworks rather than to categorise their nature.
  • Gadamer's aesthetics is deeply respectful of art's ability to disrupt and challenge customary expectations. It attributes an ethical significance to art as being able to reveal the limitations of fixed cultural expectancy and to open the spectator towards the other and the different.

In this entry, we discuss the leading arguments which inform these contentions.


1. Art as Interlocutor

Gadamer's aesthetics fosters an attentiveness towards the mystery of the given and its unexpected folds of meaningfulness. Gadamer's arguments are varied, ushering the reader towards an aesthetic attentiveness rather than making iconoclastic declarations about what the aesthetic is. They embrace close readings of the poets Rilke and Celan as well as broad strategic manoeuvres which defend the cognitive status of aesthetic and hermeneutical judgements. Hermeneutics (the art and discipline of interpretation), of which Gadamer (1900–2002) is one of the twentieth century's most formidable exponents, is deeply involved in philosophical disputes over the legitimacy of claims to understanding in the visual and literary arts. It does not oppose “scientific” modes of knowledge but resists their cultural privileging. For Gadamer aesthetics stands on experientially accumulative modes of learning (Bildung) which orientate and ground sound judgement in the arts. Conversation and its unpredictable turns is, appropriately, a central thread within hermeneutical aesthetics. A late exchange between Carsten Dutt and Gadamer (Dutt 1993, 61–67) offers a gentle point of entry into how philosophical hermeneutics approaches art and aesthetic experience.

Gadamer insists that a picture or image that is worthy of being called a work of art, has the power to affect us immediately. (GW 8, 374). Art addresses us. The claim that “art is able to say something directed to somebody” (Palmer 200170) alludes to the surprise, shock and, sometimes, dismay at being directly affected by what is in a work and of being forced to reflect on its claim so that it becomes more understandable to both oneself and others. Gadamer argues that “the experience of art is an experience of meaning, and as such this experience is something that is brought about by understanding.” To this extent, then, “aesthetics is absorbed into hermeneutics” (Palmer 2001 76). This distances Gadamer from more conventional justifications of the aesthetic as offering a special kind of pleasure. The essay The Relevance of the Beautiful suggests that “the mere on-looker who indulges in aesthetic or cultural enjoyment from a safe distance, whether in the theatre, the concert hall, or the seclusion of solitary reading, simply does not exist” (RB 130). A person who takes himself to be such an onlooker, misunderstands himself. “Aesthetic self-understanding is indulging in escapism if it regards the encounter with the work of art as nothing but enchantment in the sense of liberation from the pressures of reality, through the enjoyment of a spurious freedom” (RB 130). These remarks divorce Gadamer's thinking from Dilthey's Erlebniss-Ästhetik in which artworks are proclaimed the site of intense but momentary experience enjoyed for their own sake independent of their cognitive content. The hedonistic personalisation of aesthetic response has two alienating consequences. On the one hand, the judgement that aesthetic experience is purely subjective severs the individual from communal networks of meaning capable of illuminating personal experience from the perspective of what is socially shared. On the other, attempts to render subjective experience academically legitimate by presenting it as a social product further estrange the individual from his experience, by translating it into third-person terms he or she may not endorse or recognise: individual experiences of beauty can suddenly become embodiments of class prejudice. In contrast to Dilthey (1833–1911), Gadamer defends an Erfahrungs-Ästhetik which claims that like significant life-experiences, our relationships with artworks are deep and on-going: we re-visit them and in doing so understanding is continually re-negotiated. Gadamer speaks of the “interminability” of such experience (die Unabschliessbarkeit aller Erfahrung, Palmer 2001, 66). It is forever open because of its cognitive movement. The cumulative nature of such experience is an instance of Bildung (formation and learning through experience) and is, as such, a living process of becoming (Werden).

Gadamer's aesthetics is strictly anti-Kantian. It abjures phenomenalist disinterestedness for the sake of phenomenological involvement. It is also anti-idealist. It refuses the idea that in aesthetic experience we perceive “a pure integration of meaning”. His aesthetics is consequently anti-representationalist. There is in the artwork something which Gadamer describes as its resistance to integration, to being reduced to a concept (Palmer 2001 25). He contends that Hegel's definition of the beautiful as the “sensuous appearing of the Idea” presumes that aesthetic experience is able to reach beyond the specific type of appearance to its underlying idea. In this model, aesthetic experience becomes the expectation of a semantic fulfilment. Once the idea behind the appearance is grasped, “the whole of its meaning would have been understood once and for all and thus brought in to our possession so to speak”. The work of art becomes a carrier of meaning, to be abandoned once the lead story has been grasped. But, Gadamer argues, “our understanding of art works is manifestly not of this type. Everyone knows this from his or her own encounters with art, from concerts, visits to museums, and from his or her reading”(Palmer 2001 66). This denial of idealist aesthetics is at the basis of his claim that an artwork is essentially enigmatic.

Gadamer's opposition to aesthetic idealism is supported by the claim that art “cannot be satisfactorily translated in terms of conceptual knowledge” (RB 69). A work does not simply refer to a meaning which is independent of itself. Its meaning is not to be grasped in such a way that that it can be simply transferred to another idiom. Indeed, because it invites many interpretations, an artwork acquires an ideality of possible meanings which cannot be obviated by any possible realisation (RB 146). The work has, therefore, an autonomy which cannot be substituted by anything else or, to put it another way, the work is always in excess of its readings, its meanings are always more than its interpretations. Two important consequences arise from this.

First: Gadamer's conceives art as presentational (darstellen) rather than representational (vorstellen). In the essay “Word and Picture” (1992), he claims that he tries “to undermine the idea that the picture is a mere copy” (GW 8, 374). As a work does not represent anything other than itself, the meanings it carries can only come to the fore in its self-presentation. Yet the emergent meaning is never given in its entirety nor obviated by any realisation. This is consistent with the eventual nature of art. “When a work of art truly takes hold of us, it is not an object that stands opposite us which we look at in hope of seeing through it to an intended conceptual meaning … The work is an Ereigniss – an event that ”appropriates us“ to itself. It jolts us, it knocks us over and sets up a world of its own, into which we are drawn” (Palmer 2001 71). What is revealed, however, remains but an aspect of the work which when it appears drives others into the background. Disclosure and hiddenness are not contraries in Gadamer's aesthetics, but mutually dependent: the disclosed reveals the presence of the undisclosed in the disclosed. “It is in the sheer being there (Dasein) of the work of art that our understanding experiences the depths and the unfathomability of its meaning (Palmer 2001 72). The claim that a work's meaning can never be completely fulfilled is supported by a linguistic analogy concerning the speculative. Art has a language in that its signs and symbols function like semantic units. Gadamer comments on the living virtuality of meaning contained in each word, an inner dimension of multiplication. Accordingly language is not the representation (mimesis) of a set of pre-given meanings but a ”coming to language“ of a constant reserve of meanings (Palmer 2001 67). The finitude of linguistic expression is such that no utterance can be complete. Nothing comes forth in one meaning that is simply offered us (PH 103). ”The only thing that constitutes language … is that one word leads to another, each word is, so to speak, summoned, and on its side holds open the further progress of speaking“ (Palmer 2001 67). No meaning can be completely revealed. Because we can re-visit art works repeatedly, the meaning disclosed initially can be expanded or changed. The partial nature of any given meaning disclosure enhances rather than diminishes the possibility of meaning within a work. ”The work of art consists in its being open in a limitless way to ever new integrations of meaning“ (PH 98) and furthermore, ”the inexhaustibility that distinguishes the language of art from all translation into concepts rests on an excess of meaning (PH 102).

Gadamer's conversation on aesthetics paints its bolder themes: art is interrogative by nature, art works work through a disclosure of meaning, disclosures of meaning establish art's cognitive status, the cognitive content of art is partly intelligible and partly enigmatic, and artworks are always open to re-interpretation. These are, however, not free-standing arguments. Gadamer's position is hermeneutical not because of an underlying thesis which goes unremarked but because it is informed by a constellation of various arguments which shape the central position. To the broader arguments we now turn.

2. The “Substance” of Aesthetic Subjectivity

Gadamer's determination to reveal the cognitive content of aesthetic experience requires him to expose the ontological grounding of subjectivity. To approach art works solely on the basis of subjective responses to them or, to read them only in terms of an artist's intentionality, is, for Gadamer, always to miss the point. Hermeneutically speaking, the philosophical focus should be on what shapes subjectivity and guides its expectations. This initiates a speculative re-figuring of aesthetic subjectivity. In Truth and Method he writes,

All self-knowledge arises from what is historically pre-given, what with Hegel we call “substance,” because it underlies all subjective intentions and actions, and hence both prescribes and limits every possibility for understanding any tradition whatsoever in its historical alterity. This almost defines the aim of philosophical hermeneutics: its task is to retrace the path of Hegel's phenomenology of mind until we discover in all that is subjective the substantiality that determines it … (TM 302).

In The Relevance of the Beautiful Gadamer elucidates substance as follows.

“Substance” is understood as something that supports us, although it does not emerge into the light of reflective consciousness, it is something that can never be fully articulated, although it is absolutely necessary for the existence of all clarity, consciousness, expression and communication (RB 78).

Uncovering the ontological foundations of aesthetic experience does not undermine the primacy Gadamer gives to art's immediate address. The aim is to demonstrate the cognitive legitimacy of subjective experience by revealing how aesthetic experience is both involved in something larger than itself and, indeed, reflects (speculum) that larger actuality within itself. The ability of aesthetic experience to express trans-individual phenomenological structures explains what is meant by substance and his speculative attitude towards it. Gadamer's aesthetics is properly concerned with experiencing what underlies its more abstract concepts. This is not a matter of naming or describing the reality which manifests itself in aesthetic experience but of trying to say something about the experience an individual has of it. Gadamer's reflections commence with the immediacy of art's claim, its contemporaneous nature, and then explore what influences the experience of that claim. The aim is seemingly paradoxical: to understand that which shapes, lies beyond but only “shows” itself in aesthetic experience.

3. The Contemporaneous and Art Experience

Of all things that speak to us, it is the art work that does so most directly (PH 95). The phenomenological immediacy of art which initiates Gadamer's hermeneutic enquiry into aesthetic experience may not seem a promising starting point from a hermeneutic perspective. It declares an unconventional hermeneutical approach to art: “if we define the task of hermeneutics as the bridging of personal or historical distance between minds, then the experience of art would seem to fall entirely outside its (hermeneutics') provenance” (PH 95/97). However, Gadamer does not define hermeneutics this way. It is not the reconstruction of artistic intention which forms the object of his enquiry, but the question of what informs the immediacy of an artwork's claim. The artwork is an object of hermeneutical investigation not because of any provenance in psychological events but because of the fact that it says something to us (PH 98). Hermeneutic involvement is required because the meaning transmitted can never be fully complete and is unambiguous. It demands interpretive involvement. Hermeneutics is required wherever there is a restricted transposition of thought. The historical finitude of meaning and the fact that no meaning can be given completely necessitates hermeneutical involvement in our experience of an art-work. The task of interpretation is to probe the possible meanings held within the experience of a work, and by drawing them to bring that experience to greater completeness.

It should be noted that Gadamer's talk of integrating the alien into what is understood as meaningful is not to be grasped as subsumption within the same. Assimilation is not the equivalent of translating the alien into a stable set of meanings which do not change as a consequence of that subsumption. Integration implies a reciprocity: the integrated changes its character as well as the character of the whole within which integration occurs. Furthermore, whatever is given in subjective consciousness as contemporaneous has dimensions of meaning that transcend what that consciousness initially grasps. Gadamer is concerned to probe the ontic dimensions of aesthetic experience. The thesis that experience of the contemporaneousness of art involves us in more than what we are presently aware of (i.e., the “substance” of underlying and on-going trans-individual linguistic and cultural practices) is supported by the three arguments from analogy concerning the character of play, the festival and the symbol.

4. Play

Gadamer's discussion of the relation between art and play should not be equated with any argument that art is a trivial game or pastime. He follows the precedent of Schiller's Letters on Aesthetic Education, which contend that artworks are dramatic in that they place something in play. The underlying motif is that aesthetic consciousness is far from self-contained but is rather drawn into the play of something much larger than what is evident to subjective consciousness. The analogy with drama and, indeed sporting events implies that art is eventual, an occasion that consciousness surrenders to and participates in. Spectatorial participation (like much art research) demands immersion in that which cannot be fully anticipated or controlled by individual consciousness. The game and the art work are both forms of self-movement which require that the spectator play along with what they bring into being. (RB 23). Gadamer asserts the “primacy of the play” over consciousness: “the players are merely the way the play comes into presentation” (TM 92 and 98). Participation takes the individual players out of themselves. The individual subject is that upon which success, satisfaction or loss is imposed from within the game. By analogy, the work of art is also “the playing of it”. An autonomous event comes into being, something comes to stand in its own right which “changes all that stand before it” (RB 25). Like the ancient theoros, the spectator not only participates in the event which is the artwork, but is potentially transformed by it (RB 24).

The game analogy also serves to undermine approaches to art which are exclusively intentional, material and conventional. First: the subjectivity of an artist cannot be an appropriate interpretive starting point. Grasping what transpires in a player's consciousness does not reveal the nature of the game being played. Reconstructing the conscious life of an artist, pace Dilthey's hermeneutics of nacherleben (re-living), may reveal interesting aspects of an artist's intentions but it does not uncover what informs that subjectivity. Second: like with the game, art is not to be understood by reference to its tools and equipment alone. Art requires materials certainly, and an appreciation of how a specific tool might be used. Yet neither game nor art is constituted by its equipment. Third: comprehending a game or an artwork requires an appreciation of the appropriate rules or conventions. What constitutes fair or foul play depends upon a set of pre-understood principles just as what is esteemed excellent in art requires normative expectancies of appraisal. Yet art's vitality clearly does not reside in the following of conventions.

The overall argument is not that game or artwork cannot be reduced to intention, material or convention but rather that each of these elements comes into their own when taken up within the playing of the game or in the practice which is art. It is the playing that draws spectator, player, intention, equipment and convention into the one event. This promotes an interactive view of art as a communicative event. It lends a dialogical dimension to art. An artwork involves more than one voice as, indeed, the word inter-pretation implies. Furthermore, the conception of art as an event requires a different ontological structure to those mode standard accounts of aesthetic experience grounded in subjectivity alone. An artwork is not an object completely independent of the spectator yet somehow given over to the spectator for his or her personal enjoyment. To the contrary, the game analogy suggests that the act of spectatorship contributes to enhancing the being of the art work by bringing what is at play within it to fuller realisation. The spectator just as much as the artist plays a crucial role in developing the subject-matters that art activates. The aesthetic spectator is swept up by her experience of art, absorbed in its play and potentially transformed by that which spectatorship helps constitute. Though Gadamer's argument distances itself from traditional subject-object paradigms, it does retain certain features of Kant's aesthetics.

Whereas Kant attributes a non-purposive rationality to the aesthetic attitude, Gadamer attributes it to the playful process of art practice itself. Both art and the game share a to-and-fro movement not tied to any specific goal other than to fulfil themselves for their own sake (TM 103): no one knows how a game will end and no one knows to what end an art work works (Lawn 2006, 91). However, what is clear is that it is what occurs when the art work or the game is in-play that matters. Often contrary to their own willing and doing, the spectator is taken over by a substantial and consequential event that transcends the boundaries of everyday consciousness and which has no purpose other than to bring something forth.

5. The Festival

Conventional accounts of aesthetic experience stress its intense and individuating nature (Erlebniss). Yet despite its intimacy, Gadamer emphasises that within experience (Erfahrung) one is always participating, perhaps unwittingly, in something beyond oneself. Aesthetic involvement is in some respects, therefore, a communal activity. The analogy between aesthetic experience and the festive is telling.

… work is something that separates and divides us. For all the cooperation necessitated by joint enterprise and the division of labour in our productive activity, we are still divided as individuals as far as our day to day purposes are concerned. Festive celebration, on the other hand, is clearly distinguished by the fact that here we are not primarily separated but rather gathered together (RB 40).

Gadamer's thinking here betrays a further Kantian inflection. The Kantian conception of aesthetic pleasure, as a variety of experience which arises only where the egotistical interests that constitute the commerce of everyday life are not in play, suggests the possibility of a community forming around shared non-hostile pleasures. Gadamer's account of aesthetic experience is not concerned with a putative kingdom-to-come but with rediscovering and forging the communality that we are. Despite this difference, aesthetic experience establishes for both thinkers a meditative space in and through which something can be occasioned. The underlying point remains. Whereas for Kant it is a change in the disposition of subjective consciousness (i.e., its adoption of an aesthetic attitude) which initiates a better disposition towards the community, for Gadamer it is the participation in a trans-subjective event which effects a change in subjective dispositions towards the community.

When Gadamer argues that “the mystery of festive celebration lies in this suspension of time”, he refers to how festivity suspends work-time. This initiates that “play-time” in which another order of events emerges. It is in such time that an art work “comes to stand” irrespective of whether it is a painting, drama or symphony. The festive “represents a genuine creation, (for) something drawn from within ourselves takes shape before our eyes in a form that we recognise and experience as a more profound presentation of our own reality” (RB 60). This distances Gadamer from the view that aesthetic experience is a solitary subject's personal response to an art work. In the festive—an analogy for the communal dimensions of aesthetic experience—the individual subject comes to stand differently in its relationship to others. Just as the artwork comes to stand in the festival, so too does the artwork bring its spectators to stand as a community: “in the festive the communal spirit that supports us all and transcends each of us individually represents the real power of the festive and indeed the real power of the art work” ( RB 63). The festival occasions individuals surpassing their everyday view of themselves as potentially hostile competitors and coming to see themselves as a community formed around a shared interest in what the artwork brings forth. This is an analogy for something more fundamental.

Instrumentalist conceptions of language persuade us that the spoken and written word are but communicative tools, but for Gadamer participation in language acknowledges that an individual is located within a substantive horizon of meanings which transcends subjective consciousness. Pragmatic concerns encourage the forgetting of such interconnectedness but when such individualism is suspended by the festival or, indeed, by the adoption of an aesthetic attitude, the re-discovery of oneself as belonging to an extensive community of shared meanings and involvements becomes possible. The artwork's communicative capacity awakens the realisation that in as much as I understand myself as being addressed, I must acknowledge that I already belong to something larger than myself. The art work festivises: it reveals our personal indebtedness to past and future communities of meaning. The thesis that we belong to a hermeneutic collective which is the effective underpinning of art's ability to communicate is further elaborated in Gadamer's discussion of the symbol.

6. The Symbol

A discussion of the symbol forms the third aspect of Gadamer's case that aesthetic experience involves an ex-stasis of the aesthetic subject. It provides a further analogue for the speculative dimension of aesthetic experience. The word “symbol” is a Greek term for a token of remembrance (tessera hospitalis) that could be broken in two so that should a descendent of a former guest enter his house, the co-joined pieces would kindle into an act of recognition. (RB 31). The symbol connotes (explicitly) what we recognise implicitly (RB 31). It is associated with the fragmentary and a promise of completeness which “in turn alludes to beauty and the potentially whole and holy order of things” (RB. 32). The symbol is associated, then, with notions of repetition and the hope for an abundance of meaning. Its connection with the speculative is best appreciated by reference to the sign.

If the sign's proper function is to refer to its referent, it is self-cancelling. The road sign that is so attractive that it distracts from the danger it refers to and causes a new one by prompting drivers to pull up and admire it, does not function properly. The symbol, however, does not refer to something outside itself. It presents its own meaning. The material symbol is, indeed, the place where that meaning becomes present. Yet the symbolically delivered meaning is never given completely. Its meaning is indeterminate. References to the symbol as fragmentary nevertheless anticipate the possibility of wholeness. The speculative dimension of such reasoning resides in the premise that every stated meaning involves bringing forth more than is actually spoken. Resonance and depth depends upon animating the statement's hermeneutic Hintergrund, lighting up unstated meanings or revealing anticipated ones. The “speculative” capacity of an image or word concerns its ability to sound out or insinuate the unstated nexus of meanings which sustain a given expression but which are not directly given in it. The speculative power of an image or phrase has something in common with the sublime: it illuminates in the spoken or visual image a penumbra of unstated meanings whose presence can be sensed but never fully grasped or conceptualised. Hence, an artwork can always mean more, that is, insinuate a transcendent dimension of meaning which though never exhausted by the symbols which carry it do not exist apart from the symbols that sustain it. The symbol is resonant with the suggestion of meaning because it constantly invokes what is not immediately given. This not-given does not exist apart from the given but is inherent within it. Hence, the hermeneutical sublime, the excess of meaning, the promise of meaning more and meaning something different which is made apparent by the symbol, is held within, is immanent in the given.

7. Presentation, Representation and Appearance

Gadamer's account of the symbol establishes that art works are presentational rather than representational. Presentations occasion the meanings they invoke and do not represent a meaning independent of themselves. The argument effects a profound and significant change in the meaning of aesthetic appearance. The representational view of art relegates art to a secondary status: the art work brings to mind something other than the art work, an original state of affairs, a specific meaning or reality. Art's objective co-relative is, accordingly, positioned outside the work so that the work becomes the mere appearance of something else. The presentational account of art is consistent with Gadamer's phenomenological orientation. If the meaning invoked by a work is not independent of the work that summons it, the work is the occasion of the coming-into-appearance of that meaning. Appearing becomes synonymous with original creation. Aesthetic appearance is not secondary to reality or truth but is the medium through which the work's truth shows/presents itself. Even as presentation, appearance does retain a certain negativity, though in Gadamer's hands it has a positive quality. Appearance always hints at semblance, of something incomplete or not yet fully realised. Gadamer's ontology openly re-enforces if not requires such negativity. The claim that each art work has its own temporality implies that each will never reveal itself completely. The claim that the reception of all art is contemporaneous dictates that what appears to us as meaningful is not necessarily what appeared to a previous generation as meaningful. Like the symbol, appearance is always partial. However, appearance, when considered aesthetically, has the cadence of the symbolic: it alludes to something beyond itself but which nevertheless inheres within it as the yet-to-be-revealed.

Such arguments support Gadamer's conception of the art work as that which stands-in-itself. That which comes to stand is intelligible as the presentation of a certain meaning, but because of the indeterminacy of that meaning it retains something of the enigmatic. This eminent quality – a genuine work can never be measured the original way it was shown (RB 146)—Gadamer as also refers to as its hermeneutic identity. The truth of an artwork is not its simple manifestation of meaning but rather the unfathomableness and depth of its meaning (PH 226). Its truth embraces a tension between revelation (what appears) and what is concealed (what has yet to be shown). The artwork does not simply offer a “a recognisable surface contour” but has an inner depth of self-sufficiency which Gadamer calls after Heidegger a “standing-in-itself”. In short, the mark of a substantial work is that it veils possibilities of meaning. Such resistance is a stimulus to further interpretation. Substantive works, like significant symbols, have an opaque aspect.

The symbol and its reticence about revealing the withheld aspects of its meaning does not connote something utterly alien to us. The yet-to-be revealed is a dimension of meaning overlooked, forgotten, or not perceived within what has already been shown or grasped. In other words, the power of the symbol resides in its ability to reveal that unbeknown to ourselves we are in communion with something much larger than ourselves, that is, horizons of meaning which implicitly sustain reflection and which can when made explicit bring us to think quite differently of ourselves. The mystery of the symbol is its promise of transcendence: an effective and affecting symbol reveals that we belong to a hermeneutic community always larger than we envisage. The analogy of the festival once again is telling. In the festival, individuated work roles are renounced as we rediscover communal ties. Gadamer's arguments about play, festival and symbol serve, then, as the basis for his claim that aesthetic experience, our experience of art, is a demonstrable instance of how subjectivity is informed by a substantiality that transcends an individual consciousness.

8. The Issue in Question

Gadamer's aesthetics involve a variety of inter-locking arguments, one of the most significant of which concerns the Sache selbst. The term is difficult to translate, but it refers, loosely speaking, to a work's subject matter, to what it addresses or to what issue has been placed in question. Philosophical usage of the word evokes phenomenological notions of intentionality: what a work is directed at or points toward. The Sache is not a determinate concept but an area of significant meaningfulness, a constellation of concerns which orbit the affective, conative and cognitive complexities of subject matters such as grief or love. The Sache underpins Gadamer's claim that aesthetic experience has a significant cognitive content. Subject matters may transcend an individual work in that no one work can exhaust their significance, but as ideas Sachen are not independent of the body of works that exemplify them. If they were ontologically distinct, the idealism Gadamer rejects would be forced on him and he would be compelled to argue that art is representational, refers to a concept beyond itself and, indeed, disappears into that concept once evoked. Art becomes philosophy once more. If, however, art is presentation, as Gadamer insists, a work's meaning is not independent of it. Art does not therefore copy and thereby represent a subject-matter, but configures a visual or literary space in which a subject-matter can be summoned. Gadamer counters an ancient line of argument that regards art as secondary to, inferior to and a corrupter of the real. Contrary to the Platonic tradition, his argument implies that art adds to the reality of its subject-matters. Gadamer's evaluation of the aesthetic contrasts vividly with Kant's in this respect. Kant considers aesthetic experience to be indifferent to whether or not its object is real (cf. TM 89). A work's credibility does not dependent on its relationship to an original object or co-relative. Whether what is represented exists or not is inconsequential. What matters is the aesthetic merit of the work, not the strength of its likeness. Should the artwork be harmed, the being of the correlative is unaffected. Gadamer's presentational aesthetics is, by contrast, profoundly anti-Platonic: a work's disappearance diminishes the reality of that which presents itself through it.

Although subject matters transcend the individual works which embody them, they do not exist apart from their historical embodiments but, unlike Platonic forms, they do not transcend history but mutate and develop ever new permutations. Any diminishment of art diminishes the historical effectiveness of a given subject-matter. Were John Donne's love poems all lost, our understanding of the exquisite joys and pains of human love would be irreparably diminished. A semi-Platonic argument about mimesis re-enforces a discernibly non-Platonic argument concerning the historically fluid character of subject matters. The argument that artworks direct us to a subject matter irrespective of whether they be realist or abstract constructions, suggests a moment of return and repetition. An issue, question or subject-matter is recognised.

Where something is recognised it has liberated itself from the uniqueness and contingency of the circumstances in which it was encountered. It is a matter of neither of there and then, nor of here and now but it is encountered as the very self-same. Thereby it begins to rise to its permanent essence and is detached from anything like a chance encounter (RB 120).

The passage strengthens the presentational approach to art but its reference to essences requires clarification.

It is part of the process of recognition that we see things in terms of what is permanent and essential unencumbered by the contingent circumstances in which they were seen before and are seen again. What imitation reveals is the real essence of the thing (RB 99).

It is not suggested that we see repeatedly the same essence in a work of art. Were this to be suggested, works would become dull and uninformative and make no new contribution to a genre. Gadamer's insistence is that works should speak directly to and, indeed, transform our self-understanding. Such transformative power implies recognising in a work what was previously understood of a subject-matter, but transformed, as if seen for the first time. Mimesis does not entail seeing an unchanging and endlessly repeated. The life of a subject matter is one of change and development. Gadamer's mimesis argument claims that through repeated re-working and re-interpretation a subject matter not only accrues more aspects but also, in so doing, they allow that subject-matter to become more fully what it is. “A work of art belongs so closely to what it is related to that it enriches the being of that as if through a new event of being” (TM 147). The “joy of recognition is rather the joy of knowing more than is already familiar”. Art works allows subject-matters to become more what they are. In conclusion, Gadamer's phenomenological aesthetics effectively destroys the Platonic separation of art and reality. Art works are the sites in which trans-individual both present and transform themselves. Whereas, as we have seen, for Kant the destruction of an artwork has absolutely no bearing upon the objectivities it represents, we can now understand why Gadamer is committed to the opposing view that the destruction of an art work diminishes the reality of the subject-matters that come forth through it.

9. Art and Language.

The strategic centrality of language in Gadamer's aesthetics is beyond doubt. The ability of artworks to bring things to mind and to hint at unseen meanings is reason to claim that in its speculative capacities, art functions essentially like a language. Yet he acknowledges that linguistic means of expression are inadequate to the task of conveying what occurs within an experience of art.

Language often seems ill-suited to express what we feel. In the face of the overwhelming presence of works of art, the task of expressing in words what they say to us seems like an infinite and hopeless undertaking … One says this, and then one hesitates (TM 401).

Two claims underwrite this scepticism: words do not readily capture the sheer complexity aesthetic experience, and the finitude of language itself prevents it from capturing the totality of such experience. In other words, the experience of art always just eludes theoretical containment. These are not difficulties with language per se, but rather reflect the limited capacity of the human mind to grasp the totality of its involvements. Yet in Gadamer's thought these negative aspects incentivise further hermeneutic involvement in aesthetic experience. The incompleteness of any interpretation of an artwork opens us to the possibility that there is always something more or something else that can be said. The temporal nature of experience and its interpretation prevent closure or, in other words, both are by nature always open to further ways of thinking and speaking about art. The argument re-enforces the claim that art and its interpretation extend the being of the subject-matters addressed and furthermore, that aesthetic experience itself has a temporal continuity which is linked to its cumulative character as a mode of Bildung.

The issue about the relationship between art and language is not one of linguistic capture but of finding the appropriate words to open the content of aesthetic experience. What is meant by the notion that an art work addresses us with a meaning? Although an agent of the linguistic turn of the twentieth century, Gadamer's reflections on language run counter to many semiotic theories. According to Weinsheimer, “the dualism of signifier and signified has no phenomenological basis” for Gadamer “since in speaking we have no awareness of the world as being distinct from the word” (Weinsheimer 1993 162). Gadamer speaks of the perfection of the word as being the disappearance of any gap between sense and utterance. Poetry would be the “paradigm case” of an art work with a clear and immediate presentation of meaning. Yet this is seemingly inconsistent with notion of a work that “stands-in-itself”. If aspects of its meaning are withheld, sense and utterance are once again separated. The word, it would appear, signifies something beyond itself after all. There is, in other words, a tension between Gadamer wanting to hold that the work of art and the world that comes forth within it are indivisible and saying that the world which a work invokes is larger than the work itself. The poetic word, insofar as it is poetic, stands-in-itself; and yet as word it invokes something beyond itself. Gadamer's speculative account of meaning collapses, it would seem, into a referential account of signs. Speculatively charged words refer to other signs or patterns of meaning beyond themselves. This suggests that words are self-negating signs: when they function as they should, they disappear into what it is referred to. To conclude that words operate as representational signs seems quite contrary to the account of art functioning in the manner of a symbol. Closer inspection suggests that Gadamer's account of speculative account meaning is presentational after all. Let us re-state the question.

If the art work is an autonomous entity that stands-in-itself and does not refer to anything outside itself, what of art's speculative capacity to refer to other complexes beyond its immediate horizon? The theological notion of a host can dissolve the inconsistency. On the one hand, for an art work to have a speculative capacity, it must invoke perimeters of meaning which transcend its own immediate circumstance. Without this, an art work cannot connect us with frameworks of otherness. Yet this argument threatens to turn Gadamer's aesthetics into an idealism referring specifically to the idea which the art work was invoking. Art would once again be subordinated to a vehicle of philosophy. On the other hand, there is something within the constitution of an art work that makes it resist theoretical reduction. Its invocation of an excess of meaning resists conceptual capture. This brings us to the crux of the matter. Do those the excess of meaning which a work can speculatively invoke exist apart from the work that summons them? The speculative dimensions of art suggest that an art work is indeed a host for that which lies beyond it and yet, at the same time, the transcendent dimensions of meaning (its excess of meaning), remains immanent within the work that invokes them. The presence of the transcendental only manifests itself through the work that hosts it. To put it another way, it is in the work that the transcendental set of meanings achieve their presence. The full resonance of a subject-matter which of course extends well beyond any one work is nevertheless only discernible in the works that host them. Indeed, subject-matters do not exist apart from the works that manifest their presence. Ontologically speaking they inhere within the work. The work is the occasion in which these dimensions of meaning appear and they command the attention of the viewer so long as the work holds them in play. In other words, with regard to the tension between representation and presentation in Gadamer's position, the speculative charge of artworks does indeed suggest that they function as representational signs always referring beyond the given meaning. Yet this is another way of saying that, ontologically speaking, artworks functions as symbols. Considered as referential sign, what the art work refers to is not a world independent of the sign but another set of signs. However, such other configurations of meaning may mean more than the signs that invoke them but they are inherent within those very signs. In other words, the very signs which refer speculatively to other dimensions of meaning also function symbolically in that the other horizons of meaning invoked are immanent within the work's autonomy. As a symbolic host, the artwork holds that which refers beyond itself within itself.

10. Tradition

Art seems to solve the riddle of the temporal core of truth (Adorno). A work that proves itself a “classic” through the ages and remains constant in its effect remains binding, no matter how the interpretations and the criteria of evaluation change in the course of time (Habermas quoted by Krajewski 2004, 20).

What binds us to a tradition, according to Gadamer, is not a misplaced conservatism but the questions a canon or body of work asks of us. However, the question of tradition is one of the most controversial within Gadamer's philosophy. It arises because of the way Gadamer establishes individual and collective learning on the acquisition of accrued experiences (Bildung) and practices, rather than upon any methodological norm. His argument exposes the Enlightenment prejudice against prejudice. The liberating and universalising aspects of reason tend to marginalise and chastise both the culturally different and the historically particular as divisive and irrational. Gadamer contends, however, that such an unqualified hypostasisation of reason and its methods has the unfortunate consequence of condemning as methodologically groundless the very valuations that ordinary linguistic and experiential practices are based on. Gadamer is not unsympathetic to Nietzsche, who rejects the claim that humanity is shaped by external necessity. Our existence within the world and our place within it is, metaphysically speaking, utterly contingent. If there is no metaphysical necessity that governs human practices, why should we even ask for a methodological grounding, when language has neither required nor functioned with such a license? Like Wilhelm Dilthey before him, Gadamer insists that nothing justifies and gives meaning to life other than life itself. This is not the invocation of nihilism, for life does not occur in a vacuum. Creatures such as humans, which have no pre-determined essence, only survive by both remembering what has worked well within a practice and by constantly testing it against contemporary needs and circumstances. There is a constant tension between acquired experience and the need to stabilise its lessons and the need to question and thereby destabilise the tried and the tested. All expressive practices depend upon an inheritance of insight and valuation. They are dependent upon accrued learning and experience. Such observations agitate Gadamer's critics, who see in the unreflective acceptance of the given an irresponsibly conservative privileging of the received, a wilful blindness to possible repressive or exclusionary practices within inherited modes of operation. In response to such scepticism, it must be acknowledged that inherited practices can, logically speaking, have negative entailments. However, a commitment to tradition, is not a commitment to remaining the same, and nor is it indicative of a wilful refusal to confront the negative entailments within what is transmitted historically. Traditions which are incapable of changing risk becoming outmoded. Traditions are not founded upon core and fixed identities. As vibrant religious and artistic traditions demonstrate, those which are in constant debate over aim and direction often prove engaging and influential. Traditions capable of subjecting their self-understanding to critique constitute continuities of conflict. The importance of received understanding for Gadamer is not its historical provenance but how it opens us towards and engages us with issues in a community of debate. The Cartesian project of subjecting all beliefs to sceptical examination until they can be methodologically affirmed is, in Gadamer's view, nihilistic. The project is implausible since the range and depth of pre-understanding is so extensive as to be untheorisable. To condemn pre-understanding as unjustifiable because it cannot be methodologically grounded is highly dangerous as it devalues those very insights upon which our initial world-orientation depends. It is not that these insights are instrinsically valuable but that they are essential staging posts in the journeys of understanding they enable. It is the continuous debate and dialogue over practice that enables participants to move on, widen and transform acquired experience. Movement and development is intrinsic to the German word for tradition: Überlieferung has the active connotation of both transmitting and handing something on. What a tradition transmits from age to age are questions, problems and issues. The importance of canonic works is not that they are peerless exemplars of an idiom or style but rather that they raise issues and difficulties in an exemplary way. Traditions can check their self-understanding against their own historical projections. A commitment to tradition is not a commitment to an academic antiquarianism. It is, essentially, a commitment to a field of debate. Tradition is presented as a resource and a provocation for thinking and creativity: whereas sameness is the currency of a conservative conception of tradition, instability, questions and the challenge of otherness are the drivers of Gadamer's more dialogical concept of tradition.

It has been argued against Gadamer that his revaluation of tradition does not really bring its content to a point of critical reflection. He acknowledges that like any other temporal phenomenon, not all of its vistas can be adequately thematised or articulated. This does not mean, however, that tradition is beyond critical appraisal. Traditions can, as Pannenberg argues, check their normative assumptions against their self-projections. Other critics suggest that Gadamer's approach to tradition and aesthetics is overtly Classical in its pre-occupation with forms that maintain a continuity through time rather than radically alter themselves. It does not allow for those radical intrusions or revolutionary interjections which alter the perceptual paradigm of an age. The counter-objection is not only that the charge overlooks Gadamer's embrace of Heidegger's quite radical phenomenological re-working of the Classical Tradition, but also the fact that for one paradigm to replace another, there must be certain relation between them. One must address an absence, fulfil an unseen possibility or a lack, within the other. Cubism, for example, implies a visual orientation quite different from realism, but both idioms belong to a common tradition in that they strive to show us something of the real. Without a degree of continuity with tradition, any radical emergence would have no bearing upon the received and thereby lack the ability to call into question received notions and understanding. It is, however, precisely the challenge of the different and the other which is the driver of Gadamer's dialogical conception of tradition. It is a conception which is in part modernistic: tradition is presented as being in constant debate with itself. Its renewal demands change and transformation. Furthermore, a virtue of this dialogical conception of tradition is not culturally specific. Because its main focus is on the subject-matters which different cultural practices address, it offers a model of cognitive engagement that can operate between distinct traditions rather than in just any one.

11. Paradox of the In-between

There is a creative tension at play within Gadamer's aesthetic theory. One the one hand, Gadamer stalwartly defends the autonomy of the art work and, on the other, despite his resistance to any subsumption of art within philosophy, he insists nevertheless that aesthetics should be absorbed within hermeneutics, which is for the most part understood as a theoretical enterprise. This tension replicates aspects of the so-called hermeneutic circle. Schleiermacher, for example, argues that it is only possible to grasp an individual's personal utterances if one can understand the general structure of the language which that individual operates within. Conversely, general structures are only intelligible in terms of particular exemplifying utterances. Wilhelm Dilthey operates within a similar part-whole structure, namely, an individual's personal experiences will mean little to the reader unless they can be contextualised within a historical context. A movement between part and whole also takes place in Gadamer's thinking. The art work is initially presented in its singularity. But then, the particular is illuminated by being brought under a subject-matter. To engage with artworks discursively is to bring generalisations about a work to bear, placing it in a wider context of associations. The movement to the wider level of generalisation also returns the spectator to the particular, since generalisation enables an understanding of what is singular about a work by locating it within a broader background. This double hermeneutic movement is highly characteristic of Gadamer's aesthetic. It recognises that the cognitive dimension of of aesthetic experience is like all linguistic experience both centrifugal and centripetal in nature. When a work addresses us its impact is centrifugal: it upsets and transforms what we customarily recognise. It awakens us to the hermeneutical sublime, to what lies beyond but nevertheless shapes our normal range of understanding. Thus, Gadamer can argue that, “something is a poetic structure when everything pre-structured is taken up into a new, unique form … as if it were being said for the first time to us in particular” (GW 8, 62). Yet this estranging moment initiates a centripetal return, a homecoming. “The poem and the art of language generally as a heard or written text is always… something like a recognition in every single word” (GW 8, 62). Yet the question remains: is the passage from the immediacy of the given art work to theoretical contemplations about its subject matter not an instance of moving from the particular givenness of a work to a more abstract level of reflection about its subject-matter? Does not the contemplative movement away from the work betray its particularity and suggest that the sense of a work lies beyond it, in its concept? Were Gadamer to have fallen into this impasse, an idealist and representationalist account of art would be forced upon him. The vehemence of his resistance to these stances suggests that something other than a simple shift from the particular immediacy of a work to a theoretical contemplation of its content must be at play.

The accusation of inconsistency requires the assumption that the aesthetic experience of a work on the one hand and its contemplation on the other, are separable. However, it is in Gadamer's mind part of an intense experience that it impels us towards seeking to bring it into words. Experience endeavours to bring itself words. These words will by virtue of their semantic associations place the experience in a wider context (the centrifugal) and at the same time these words will because of their poetic capacity for singularity make the experience clearer and more distinct.

Experience is not wordless to begin with, subsequently becoming an object of reflection by being named, by being subsumed under the universality of the word. Rather experience itself seeks and finds words that express it. We seek the right word—i.e., the word that really belongs to the thing (or experience) so that in it the thing comes into language (TM 417).

This suggests that Gadamer is not applying a hermeneutic method to aesthetic experience but seeking to expose the hermeneutical movement from part to whole within aesthetic experience. In other words, the claim that aesthetics should be taken up within hermeneutics is not an attempt to reduce aesthetics to another idiom. It announces an endeavour to articulate the hermeneutic dynamic of aesthetic experience itself. Let us briefly recapitulate the argument.

The tension in Gadamer's position arises from (1) asserting art's autonomy and (2) demanding that aesthetics be subsumed within hermeneutics. Undoubtedly, the weight of argument is on the latter. He systematically criticizes Kantian aesthetics for its narrow-minded concentration on the subjectivity of momentary pleasures and offers in its place a substantial reconstruction of the cognitive content of art's address. In other words, Gadamer switches the status of autonomy from the sensible irreducibility of a work to its hermeneutic autonomy. This entails the argument that a work which challenges our outlook does so because it is enigmatic by nature: it gives rise to difficulties of meaning and interpretation which cannot be explained away by a more fundamental level of understanding. The autonomous work that stands in itself is a work that both presents a meaning and at the same time holds something back. It is in other words always pointing beyond itself but within itself. This substantiates Gadamer's claim that the hermeneutical constitution of an autonomous work resists theoretical reduction. In the essay “Word and Picture”, he expresses sympathy with Schleiermacher's remark, “I hate all theory that does not grow out of practice” (GW 8, 374). However, as has been argued, the transcendent dimensions of meaning which a work speculatively invokes are not outside the work but immanent within it. In other words, we do not need a special hermeneutic method to access the withheld but just a deeper, more attentive contemplative acquaintance. When Gadamer speaks of being attentive to what an art work says, of discerning its enigmatic quality and of becoming aware of its speculative resonances, he is indeed speaking in a hermeneutical idiom, but this is most clearly not a case of Gadamer submitting aesthetic experience to an externally derived theory. To the contrary, Gadamer is trying to draw out the hermeneutical dynamics of aesthetic experience itself. Thus the tension between the immediacy of experience and reflection upon the content of that experience is not a tension between experience on the one hand and theory on the other. It is a tension within aesthetic experience between what an artwork invokes of its subject-matter and how what is invoked changes the character of that which invokes it. What hermeneutical reflection reveals of aesthetic experience is nothing extraneous to such experience but a further disclosure of what is held within it. To conclude, if aesthetic experience is hermeneutical in that art works speculatively illuminate meanings beyond what is immediately disclosed, hermeneutical experience should equally be taken up by aesthetics in that subject-matters only manifest their presence in the singular and particular.

Bibliography

Gadamer Bibliographies

Two Gadamer bibliographies are worthy of note. Lewis Edwin Hahn's The Philosophy of Hans-Georg Gadamer, Chicago, Open Court, 1993 has a “Selected Gadamer Bibliography” with five sections. The second bibliography is a recently extended edition of Etsuro Makita's excellent Gadamer Bibliographie, Frankfurt, Lang, 1995.

Primary Literature

In German

  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, Wahrheit und Methode, Tübingen, J.C.B. Mohr, 1975
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1993 (GW), Gesammelte Werke (9 Bände), Tübingen: (UTB) Mohr Siebeck.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1993 (GW 8), Kunst als Aussage (Gesammelte Werke Band 8), Tübingen: J.C.B.Mohr (Paul Siebeck).

In English

  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1976 (PH), Philosophical Hermeneutics, D. Linge (ed.), Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1986 (RB), The Relevance of the Beautiful, London: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1989 (TM), Truth and Method, London: Sheed and Ward.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1992, On Education, Poetry and History, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1994, Literature and Philosophy in Dialogue, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Gadamer, Hans-Georg, 1994 (HW), Heidegger's Ways, Albany: State University of New York Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Barnes, Annette, 1988, On Interpretation, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Bruns, Gerald, 1992, Hermeneutics Ancient and Modern, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Connor, Steven, 1992, “Modernism and Postmodernism” in Cooper 1992, pp. 288–293.
  • Cooper, David E., 1992, A Companion to Aesthetics, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Davey, Nicholas, 2006, Unquiet Understanding, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Dilthey, Wilhelm, 1976, Selected Writings, P. Rickman (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dostal, Robert J., 2002, The Cambridge Companion to Gadamer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dutt, Carsten, ed., 1993, Hermeneutik-Ästhetik-Praktische Philosophie: Hans-Georg Gadamer im Gespräche, Heidelberg: C. Winer Universitäts Verlag. An English translation of this volume appears in 2001, Gadamer in Conversation: Reflections and Commentary, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
  • Grondin, Jean, 1995, Sources of Hermeneutics, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Harrington, Austin, 2004, Art and Social Theory: Sociological Arguments in Aesthetics, Cambridge: Polity.
  • Heywood, Ian, 1997, Social Theories of Art: A Critique, London: Macmillan.
  • Krajewski, Bruce, 2004, Gadamer's Repercussions: Reconsidering Philosophical Hermeneutics, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Lawn, Chris, 2006, Gadamer: A Guide for the Perplexed, London and New York: Continuum.
  • Szondi, Peter, 1995, Introduction to Literary Hermeneutics, London: Cambridge University Press.
  • Weinsheimer, Joel, 1991, Philosophical Hermeneutics and Literary Theory, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Wolff, Janet, 1975, Hermeneutic Philosophy and the Sociology of Art, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

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Gadamer, Hans-Georg | Heidegger, Martin | hermeneutics | phenomenology

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