First published Wed Jun 22, 2016

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by C. Mantzavinos replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous authors.]

Hermeneutics as the methodology of interpretation is concerned with problems that arise when dealing with meaningful human actions and the products of such actions, most importantly texts. As a methodological discipline, it offers a toolbox for efficiently treating problems of the interpretation of human actions, texts and other meaningful material. Hermeneutics looks back at a long tradition as the set of problems it addresses have been prevalent in human life, and have repeatedly and consistently called for consideration: interpretation is a ubiquitous activity, unfolding whenever humans aspire to grasp whatever interpretanda they deem significant. Due to its long history, it is only natural that both its problems, and the tools designed to help solve them, have shifted considerably over time, along with the discipline of hermeneutics itself. The article focuses on the main problem areas and presents some proposals that have been put forward for tackling them effectively.

1. Introduction

There has been a highly developed practice of interpretation in Greek antiquity, aiming at diverse interpretanda like oracles, dreams, myths, philosophical and poetical works, but also laws and contracts. The beginning of ancient hermeneutics as a more systematic activity goes back to the exegesis of the Homeric epics. The most remarkable characteristic of ancient exegesis was allegorisis (allegoría, from alla agoreuein, i.e., saying something different). This was a method of nonliteral interpretation of the authoritative texts which contained claims and statements that seemed theologically and morally inappropriate or false (Tate 1934). Such exegetical attempts were aiming at a deeper sense, hidden under the surface—hypónoia, i.e., underlying meaning. Allegorisis was practiced widely from the sixth century BCE to the Stoic and Neoplatonistic schools and even later (Scholz 2016: 18ff). In the Middle Ages the most remarkable characteristic of the interpretative praxis was the so-called accessus ad auctores; this was a standardized introduction that preceded the editions and commentaries of (classical) authors. There were many versions of the accessus, but one of the more widely used was the following typology of seven questions (Detel 2011: 84f.):

  1. Who (is the author) (quis/persona)?
  2. What (is the subject matter of the text) (quid/materia)?
  3. Why (was the text written) (cur/causa)?
  4. How (was the text composed) (quomodo/modus)?
  5. When (was the text written or published) (quando/tempus)?
  6. Where (was the text written or published) (ubi/loco)?
  7. By which means (was the text written or published) (quibus faculatibus/facultas)?

Johann Conrad Dannhauer was the first to present a systematic textbook on general hermeneutics (Jaeger 1974), the Idea boni interpretis et malitiosi calumniatoris (1630) introducing the Latin neologism hermeneutica as the title of a general modus sciendi. The intention of this work was to supplement the Aristotelian Organon and its subject matter to distinguish between the true and false meaning of any text (verum sensum a falso discernere). It is explicitly general in scope, relevant for all scientific domains (una generalis omnibus scientiis communis) and applicable to the oral discourse and texts of all authors (in omnibus auctorum scriptis et orationibus). A series of authors followed the lead of Dannhauer who established the systematic locus of hermeneutics within logic (Schönert and Vollhardt 2005). Most remarkable is the work of Johann Clauberg (1654), who introduced sophisticated distinctions between the rules of interpretation with respect to their generality and clarified the capturing of the intention of the author as a valuable aim of interpretative praxis. Thus, a general hermeneutics had existed at least two centuries before Schleiermacher offered his own conception at the beginning of the 18th century—so his claim that such a discipline did not already exist before him is simply false (Schönert and Vollhardt 2005: 9; Detel 2011: 119ff., Scholz 2016: 68ff.)

The scope of the more recent discussions on interpretation has become broader, often starting with the question whether human actions are to be viewed as physical phenomena or not and how they should be treated. Naturalists since Mill (1843/1974, Book VI), have contended that actions have to be viewed as phenomena on a continuum with other phenomena in nature, and that they should be studied accordingly. Issues of interpretation hardly emerge if one adopts such a view. Interpretivists like Dilthey (1883/1990; 1924/1990;1927/1992), on the contrary, have argued forcefully that human actions cannot be viewed as natural phenomena since their meaningfulness makes them categorically distinct. Unstructured bodily movements, i.e., purely physiological reactions, are not constitutive of a human action—there is a consensus on that. The disagreement concerns the issue as to whether it is constitutive for a human action to have meaning or not (Mantzavinos 2012). If one adopts the interpretivist view, then issues of interpretation necessarily arise in the space of the mental. Human actions are meaningful, and the outcomes of these actions constitute meaningful material which calls for interpretation.

It is important to distinguish carefully between two levels of analysis, the ontological and the epistemological. Heidegger has proposed a hermeneutic phenomenology as a Hermeneutik der Faktizität (1923/1995) that should replace traditional ontology: its centerpiece being an existential analytic of Dasein, i.e., human existence (1927/1993). The meaning of Being should be disclosed as a result of analyzing the unique features of Dasein, and Auslegung (interpretation) is proposed as a concrete way of being in the world. Gadamer (1960/1990; 1986/1993; 2000) partly adopted this view of ontology, so that the so-called philosophical hermeneutics emerged as a philosophical program largely based on the work of these two protagonists (Malpas and Gander 2014). Although epistemological studies on hermeneutics can, they need not share these or any other commitments with respect to ontology. Epistemological approaches, either descriptive or normative, can start with problems of interpretation and propose solutions to the problems independently of the ontological constitution and structure that underlies each problem area.

Even when the distinction between the ontological and epistemological level is largely acknowledged, it has been a matter of dispute whether it is indeed fruitful to completely neglect the constitution and structure of the material that one deals with, when one is engaged in the activity of interpretation. In fact, the age-old “Verstehen vs. Erklären” debate is largely about this question: whether there is a distinct method for the apprehension of meaningful material, employable in the social sciences and the humanities (Geisteswissenschaften; Kulturwissenschaften), which deal with such material, i.e., Verstehen (understanding), or whether the general method employed in the natural sciences is successfully employable in the social sciences and humanities as well, i.e., Erklären (explanation). Methodological dualists like Dilthey famously pleaded for the autonomy of the social sciences and humanities which must follow the method of Verstehen. The neo-Kantian philosophers Wilhelm Windelband and Heinrich Rickert focused on the methods of concept formation and judgment in the different groups of sciences, the Kulturwissenschaften and the natural sciences. For Windelband (1894) the logic of the Kulturwissenschafen is characterized by an idiographic interest in singular judgments about the past opposed to the natural sciences’ nomothetic interest in formulating laws. For Rickert (1929) the Kulturwissenschaften are characterized by an individualizing form of concept formation which solved the problem of how the general concepts essential to any scientific representation could capture an individual object, without simply subsuming it under a general law in the fashion of natural scientific concept formation.

By contrast to this dualistic approach, methodological monists like Mill reject the dichotomy and plead for a single method applicable to all sciences, convinced as he is that discovering and establishing lawlike hypotheses is also possible in the social sciences and humanities. At the heart of this controversy (Ricoeur 1981; L. Anderson 2003) lies a question about the acceptance of what can be called “the method-object-argument”, i.e., the position that the scientific method has to be suited to its object. If the object of the scientific analysis demonstrates a certain ontological constitution and structure, then we must use a method that is suitable for dealing with that constitution and structure. The argument postulates the primacy of the object of inquiry over the method of inquiry, and depending on one’s view regarding the acceptability of the argument, one normally adopts either Verstehen or Erklären, although other ingenious attempts like the possibility of a “verstehendes Erklären” (an understanding explanation) has been proposed by Max Weber (1922/1985).

In any case, the ontological and epistemological levels are not consistently segregated in the discussion. This is notably the case with respect to the hermeneutic circle which serves as the dominant argument for all those who raise a claim to the autonomy of the humanities, and to which we turn now.

2. The Hermeneutic Circle

The hermeneutic circle is a prominent and recurring theme in the discussion ever since the philologist Friedrich Ast (1808: 178), who was probably the first to do so, drew attention to the circularity of interpretation: “The foundational law of all understanding and knowledge”, he claimed, is “to find the spirit of the whole through the individual, and through the whole to grasp the individual”. Friedrich Schleiermacher in a lecture of 1829 adopts as a principle the notion

that the same way that the whole is, of course, understood in reference to the individual, so too, the individual can only be understood in reference to the whole. (1999: 329ff.)

Emilio Betti (1962: 15ff.) designates the principle as “Grundsatz der Ganzheit” and Charles Taylor (1985: 18) states:

This is one way of trying to express what has been called the “hermeneutical circle”. What we are trying to establish is a certain reading of text or expressions, and what we appeal to as our grounds for this reading can only be other readings. The circle can also be put in terms of part-whole relations: we are trying to establish a reading for the whole text, and for this we appeal to readings of its partial expressions; and yet because we are dealing with meaning, with making sense, where expressions only make sense or not in relation to others, the readings of partial expressions depend on those of others, and ultimately of the whole.

Many philosophers follow the lead of Heidegger who conceptualizes the hermeneutical circle as an ontological issue (1927/1962: 195):

The “circle” in understanding belongs to the structure of meaning, and the latter phenomenon is rooted in the existential constitution of Dasein—that is, in the understanding which interprets. An entity for which, as Being-in-the-world, its Being is itself an issue, has, ontologically, a circular structure.

This conceptualization has been severely criticized as a fruitless attempt to immunize his conception from criticism by deliberately sheltering it under a mantle of apriorism (Albert 1994: 19).

Others view the hermeneutic circle as a logical or methodological problem. To begin with, it is clear that the hermeneutic circle is not a logical problem in a strict sense: it is neither concerned with circular argumentation in a deduction arising from proving something by using the statement that one was supposed to prove nor with a circular definition, arising from the concept to be defined already having been used in the text. Stegmüller (1979/1988) contends that the hermeneutic circle constitutes a dilemma of a methodological nature or, more particularly, one of six specific forms of dilemmas depending on what exactly is meant when one speaks of a “hermeneutic circle”. He maintains that, in its most important variations, the circle is by no means a narrow epistemological problem of the humanities, but a problem to be confronted in all disciplines. This is the case, for example, in what is known as the dilemma regarding the appropriate distinction between background knowledge and facts. Using examples from astronomy and literature, Stegmüller shows that similar difficulties arise for both when testing hypotheses concerning the differentiation between facts and background knowledge. Testing of a hypothesis requires a clear separation between hypothetical components in the observational data, on the one hand, and the theoretical background knowledge, on the other—a problem that by no means arises only in the humanities and characterizes according to Stegmüller the natural sciences as well. It can only be solved if, through critical discussion the members of the relevant community of inquirers agree on what should count as fact and what as background knowledge in respect to the specific hypothesis tested. Føllesdal, Walløe and Elster (1996: 116ff.) also hold that the hermeneutic circle is a methodological problem. They discuss a series of methodological issues that arise during the processes of understanding, and claim that they all appear in the context of the justification of an interpretation. They distinguish four variations: the whole-and-part circle, the subject-object circle, the Hypothetico-Deductive-Method circle and the question-answer circle.

Instead of viewing the hermeneutic circle as a methodological problem that emerges when testing an interpretative hypothesis, one can take it that the problem of the relationship between the meaningful whole and its elements emerges in the process of formulating a hypothesis. In this case, the hermeneutic circle is an empirical phenomenon that arises when one does not manage to understand a linguistic expression (or other signs) immediately, i.e., more or less automatically (Mantzavinos 2009). It is then necessary to create interpretative hypotheses, and it is during this activity that one gets confronted with the problem of the meaningful whole and its elements. Language processing is a complex skill which has become routinized once one has gained experience in all levels which are important when understanding expressions: the phonologic, the semantic, the syntactic and the pragmatic. Over the course of time, sounds, words, sentences, and entire texts are automatically classified in one’s cognitive system (Nehamas 1987: 275f.) and therefore language processing takes place largely unconsciously under standard conditions. If a difficulty arises in the language comprehension process, and if one cannot understand one or more linguistic expressions immediately, then cognitive resources in the form of attention are activated, and an interpretative hypothesis is generated. In psycholinguistics this conscious process is often modeled as an interactive process of all relevant levels of information processing: the phonologic, the semantic, the syntactic, and the pragmatic. There is enough evidence that supports the claim that the discourse on the hermeneutic circle can be appropriately viewed as the search process that is activated if the interpreter of a linguistic expression does not understand something immediately (J. Anderson 2005: ch. 12; Danks, Bohn, and Fears 1983; Simon 1986). The process of parsing during which the words in a linguistic expression are transformed into a mental representation with the combined meaning of the words, as studied by cognitive scientists, is especially relevant: during this procedure the meaning of a sentence is processed phrase-by-phrase and people tend to integrate both semantic and syntactic cues, in order to achieve an incremental understanding of a statement or a text (Pinker 1994).

3. Text Interpretation

It is prima facie plausible to postulate that there is nothing beyond understanding a text, than understanding the sentences which compose it; and that there is nothing beyond understanding a sentence than understanding the words which compose it. This widespread view is based on the belief in the validity of the principle of compositionality (Szabo 2013): the meaning of a complex expression is supposed to be fully determined by its structure and the meanings of its constituents. Gottlob Frege has famously declared in section 60 of his Grundlagen der Arithmetik (1884) that only within complete sentences do words have meaning. This different, but related principle to the principle of compositionality is usually referred to as the context principle. He writes:

Es genügt, wenn der Satz als Ganzes einen Sinn hat; dadurch erhalten auch seine Theile ihren Inhalt.
(It is enough if the sentence as whole has meaning; thereby also its parts obtain their meanings.)

There is a consensus in many contemporary theories that the semantic value of a sentence is a function of the semantic value of its constituents, insofar the principle of compositionality is applicable. However, the temptation to assume an analogous principle for texts should be resisted: the semantic value of a text is not a function of the semantic value of its constituents and its structure. Whereas a sentence may express a thought which is a plausible mental correlate, a text expresses a sequence of thoughts which cannot be grasped directly: the meaning of a sentence can be grasped, memorized and processed; the meaning of a text as a whole on the macro-level requires for its comprehension a more complex cognitive process (Scholz 2012).

Acknowledging the complexity of text comprehension as a process is the first step towards looking for models that can successfully come to grips with that complexity. Such models have been proposed and discussed in cognitive psychology. A prominent example of such a model has been put forward by Kintsch and van Deijk (1978) and focuses on the information processing taking place once syntactic and semantic analysis have been undertaken. In other words, the focus of the model is directly on the comprehension of the whole text, after the initial set of propositions have been identified and after parsing processes have been applied to them. A crucial factor is the capacity limit of the cognitive system, namely the number of propositions that can be kept active in working memory. The consequence of this is that sets of propositions are cognitively processed in cycles, i.e., the first n1 propositions are processed together in one cycle, then the next n2 propositions and so on. Thus, it becomes necessary to use criteria of relevance according to which propositions are kept active, so that the meaning of the entire text can be conveyed. The suggested criteria are temporal proximity and the importance of the information conveyed. In accordance with what is called “leading-edge strategy”, subjects keep active the proposition that has most recently been processed and the propositions that, in the hierarchical representation of the text, have priority over the rest. This is done under the presupposition that there is a hierarchical relationship between the propositions in the text. In a parallel process of elaboration “bridge inferences” are made in which the interpreter adds inferences in order to associate otherwise unrelated terms, and “macro-propositions” are established that contain a summary of the gist of the text. During this complex process, the interpreter actively construes the meaning of the whole text and grasps its meaning (Kintsch 1998).

Such models of text comprehension are empirically tested and amount to a significant step forward towards the formulation of an account of text interpretation based on solid empirical evidence. However, a standard philosophical critique questions the possibility of providing testable models of text comprehension without appropriately acknowledging the normative presuppositions underlying all interpretative praxis. There are two lines of argument that have been influential in this context. The first has been propagated most emphatically in the Anglo-Saxon philosophical discussion of the second half of the twentieth century with respect to what is known as “radical interpretation”. In an imaginary situation, an interpreter is confronted with the (verbal) behavior of a human being, in an entirely alien culture, without any kind of knowledge about his or her beliefs, desires or the meanings of what he or she expresses. The problem consists of getting to know the beliefs, desires and meanings of this person starting from scratch, i.e., viewing this person as a physical system without any help in translation (Lewis 1983: 108). In the context of this largely artificial problem, it is contended that one is inclined to or bound to adopt a general interpretative principle of a normative nature, which is supposed to be imperative for correct (translation and) interpretation. According to Quine (1960: 59) the assertions of the native

startlingly false on the face of them are likely to turn on hidden differences of language. […] The common sense behind the maxim is that one’s interlocutor’s silliness, beyond a certain point, is less likely than bad translation.

Davidson in a similar vein contends that the interpretation is bounded by a “principle of charity” (1984: 27):

Charity in interpreting the words and thoughts of others is unavoidable in another direction as well: just as we must maximize agreement, or risk not making sense of what the alien is talking about, so we must maximize self-consistency we attribute to him, on pain of not understanding him.

Grandy (1973: 443) views the “principle of humanity” as a guide: the requirement that the pattern of relations among beliefs, desires and the world ascribed to the author be as similar to our own patterns as possible.

In fact, none of the principles proposed in this discussion is new. As early as 1654 Johannes Clauberg has worked out in admirable detail principles of “in bonam partem interpretari” in Chapter XIII of the third part of his Logica, Vetus & Nova, the principle of charity—“benignitas”—being the most important one. And 1757 Georg Friedrich Meier proposed the principle of hermeneutic equity as the most general principle of all interpretive rules of a hermeneutica universalis (Meier 1757/1996: §39):

Hermeneutic equity (aequitas hermeneutica) is the tendency of the interpreter to hold that meaning for hermeneutically true that best comports with the flawlessness of the originator of the sign, until the opposite is shown.

It is important to stress that the principle of hermeneutic equity is explicitly formulated as a presumption: a rule which can fail to stand up to evidence. In the Anglo-Saxon discussion on radical interpretation referred to above, the general thrust of the argument is that these rules are constitutive for the practice of interpretation; they occupy a specific status that must accordingly be recognized as an important presupposition of all interpretation. However, their apparent indispensability can simply be traced to the fact that they have been particularly well corroborated, as they have often been employed with success. Accordingly, it is only their greater corroboration that leads to a presumption that they are indispensable to every interpretation (Mantzavinos 2005: 134).

The second line of argument regarding the normative presuppositions of interpretative praxis, centers around the indispensability of a rationality assumption in all interpretation (Livingston 1993). According to this argument, it is possible to apprehend linguistic expressions only if it is assumed that speakers or authors manifest complex features that are appropriately conceptualized as rational. Most importantly, deductive rationality plays an important role: it is assumed that in bringing about linguistic expressions, the rules of inference of propositional and predicate logic must be respected. Only in this case is the appropriation of the meaning of texts and linguistic expressions in general possible (Føllesdal 1982: 311). So, according to this view, rationality is constitutive of the beliefs of the author which give rise to his or her linguistic expressions and, thus, rationality is a (or the) normative presupposition which must underlie all interpretative praxis. However, the rationality assumption is surely not an uncontested principle (Mantzavinos 2001: ch. 4), and many questions regarding whether rationality is indeed constitutive and how much rationality is necessary if (successful) interpretation is to take place remain (Scholz 2016: 228ff.).

Thus, the process of text interpretation which lies in the center of hermeneutics as the methodological discipline dealing with interpretation can and has been analyzed empirically with the help of testable models. The question whether there are certain normative presuppositions of the interpretative praxis—like specific principles of interpretation that are constitutive of this praxis and indispensable rationality principles—is a focal issue of obvious philosophical importance (Detel 2014). Regardless of the position that is assumed with respect to this issue, it is hardly possible to deny that the interpretative praxis can take on multiple forms and can take place according to diverse aims, an issue to which we turn next.

4. Aims of Text Interpretation

We have seen that text interpretation goes beyond the interpretation of simple or complex sentences since it crucially includes a number of inferences that are necessary in order to glean the meaning of a text. Text interpretation as a goal-directed activity can assume different forms, but must be distinguished from highlighting the significance of a text. In fact, a series of serious misunderstandings and confusions can be easily avoided, if a clear distinction is made between interpretation as an activity directed at the appropriation of the meaning of a text and textual criticism as an activity that is concerned with the significance of a text with respect to different values. As Hirsch (1967: 7f.) has correctly pointed out:

Probably the most extreme examples of this phenomenon are cases of authorial self-repudiation, such as Arnold’s public attack on his masterpiece, Empedocles on Etna, or Schelling’s rejection of all the philosophy he had written before 1809. In these cases there cannot be the slightest doubt that the author’s later response to his work was quite different from his original response. Instead of seeming beautiful, profound, or brilliant, the work seemed misguided, trivial, and false, and its meaning was no longer one that the author wished to convey. However, these examples do not show that the meaning of the work had changed, but precisely the opposite. If the work’s meaning had changed (instead of the author himself and his attitudes), then the author would not have needed to repudiate his meaning and could have spared himself the discomfort of a public recantation. No doubt the significance of the work to the author had changed a great deal, but its meaning had not changed at all.

[…] Meaning is that which is represented by a text; it is what the author meant by his use of a particular sign sequence; it is what the signs represent. Significance, on the other hand, names a relationship between that meaning and a person, or a conception, or a situation, or indeed anything imaginable. […] Significance always implies a relationship, and one constant, unchanging pole of that relationship is what the text means. Failure to consider this simple and essential distinction has been the source of enormous confusion in hermeneutic theory.

Even if one acknowledges the difference between meaning and significance, and decides to honor the distinction between text interpretation and textual criticism, it is undisputable that interpretation can be directed at many different goals. For a long time the discussion has centered around the appropriate objective of interpretation and a focal point has been the so-called intentional fallacy, influentially formulated by Wimsatt and Beardsley (1946: 468), which states that “the design or intention of the author is neither available nor desirable as a standard for judging the success of literary work of art”. The crux of the matter in the debate has been whether grasping the intention of the author of a text is the only aim of interpretation or not and assuming that authorial intention is indeed the goal of interpretation, how exactly it can be tracked. The essential question with which we are confronted in studying any given text, as Quentin Skinner (1969: 48f.) influentially argued, is

what its author, in writing at the time he did write for the audience he intended to address, could in practice have been intending to communicate by the utterance of this given utterance. It follows that the essential aim, in any attempt to understand the utterances themselves, must be to recover this complex intention on the part of the author. And it follows from this that the appropriate methodology for the history of ideas must be concerned, first of all, to delineate the whole range of communications which could have been conventionally performed on the given occasion by the utterance of the given utterance, and, next, to trace the relations between the given utterance and this wider linguistic context as a means of decoding the actual intention of the given writer.

Besides Quentin Skinner (1972, 1975), Axel Bühler, among others, has contended that it is possible to identify the author’s intentions, as long as the sources and the transmission of the text allows this (1999a: 62ff.); and that it is even possible to specify the communicative intention of the author in fictional texts, in highlighting how the author moves those he or she is addressing to “act as if” the contents of fictional speech were real (1999a: 66ff.). This position, broadly known as Hermeneutic Intentionalism (Bühler 1993, 1999b, 2003; see also 2010, in Other Internet Resources), provides arguments designed to show that capturing the intention of the author is perfectly desirable and fully accessible as an aim of interpretation and that the intentional fallacy is not a fallacy at all.

Whereas the notion of intention is certainly useful in providing a methodological account of interpretation, its use is surely part of a later development; and it has been largely imported into hermeneutic methodology from discussions in philosophy of mind and language that took place in the analytic tradition in the 20th century. It was itself a reaction against two orthodoxies prevailing at the time. On the one hand, that interpretation should aim only at the concrete text itself; and on the other, that interpretation should aim at the social context which gave rise (or caused) the creation of the concrete text (Skinner 1969).

The term “nexus of meaning” (Sinnzusammenhang) used by Dilthey and others in the tradition of classical hermeneutics is, however, more appropriate as a terminus technicus than the notion of intention. A nexus of meaning, connected with a specific linguistic expression or a specific text, is construed by the author against the background of his goals, beliefs, and other mental states while interacting with his natural and social environment: such a construal of meaning is a complex process and involves both the conscious and unconscious use of symbols. Text interpretation can be conceptualized as the activity directed at correctly identifying the meaning of a text by virtue of accurately reconstructing the nexus of meaning that has arisen in connection with that text. One way to describe the nexus of meaning is by using the notion of intention—a legitimate but surely not an exclusive way. It may well be that the specification of the author’s intention is adequate for the description of the nexus of meaning but the reconstruction of the nexus of meaning can also be more complex than that. In other words, in reconstructing the nexus of meaning, it is not necessary to comply with a specific descriptive system: the process of reconstruction need not be committed to the use of the concept of intention. Since what is to be reconstructed is a whole nexus of meaning, a completely different descriptive system can be used. It is possible to use the intention of the author as well as to incorporate an analysis of the grammatical elements and other elements in order to produce an adequate reconstruction.

The notion of the nexus of meaning is central for the methodology of hermeneutics, mainly because it can accommodate the hermeneutic practices of a series of disciplines. Coseriu (1994/2006) in his influential Textlinguistik used the notion of “Umfeld” in order to delineate the same phenomenon that the notion of the nexus of meaning does. The reconstruction of the “Umfeld”—in the tradition of the Organon Model of Karl Bühler who spoke of “sympraktischem, symphysischem and synsemantischem Umfeld” (1934/1965: 154ff.)—aims at the appropriation of the meaning of a text by virtue of describing its whole context, as far as possible. It is obvious, then, that interpretation in the hermeneutic tradition is conceptualized as a process of reconstructing nexuses of meaning and represents a process diametrically opposite to the process of deconstruction as proposed for example by Derrida and his followers. As Rescher (1997: 201) points out:

The crucial point, then, is that any text has an envisioning historical and cultural context and that the context of a text is itself not simply textual—not something that can be played out solely and wholly in the textual domain. This context of the texts that concern us constrains and limits the viable interpretations that these texts are able to bear. The process of deconstruction—of interpretatively dissolving any and every text into a plurality of supposedly merit-equivalent construction—can and should be offset by the process of reconstruction which calls for viewing texts within their larger contexts. After all, texts inevitably have a setting—historical, cultural, authorial—on which their actual meaning is critically dependent.

Viewing interpretation as a process of reconstructing the nexus of meaning of a text does pay due attention to the context of the text, without assuming that the social and historical context had caused the production of the text. This view also enables the reconciliation in a different facet of the age-old controversy regarding the aims of interpretation. We have seen that it has long been an object of fierce dispute whether capturing the intention of the author is the only legitimate objective of an interpretation or not. However, this dispute can be successfully arbitrated if one bears in mind the character of hermeneutics as a technological discipline (Albert 2003). Its technological character manifests itself in positively acknowledging the plurality of aims towards which interpretative activities can aim. These objectives need not necessarily be reduced to a common denominator nor do some of them need to be sacrificed for the sake of others. A critical discussion of the significance of the different aims of interpretation is, of course, possible, but it need not end up with definite results that are binding for everyone. In fact, this will hardly ever be the case, since consensus on appropriate aims of interpretation will typically be of a provisional character: it is sufficient to provisionally accept a series of objectives that have emerged in the discussion and then formulate and test alternative hypotheses in relation to every one of them. In other words, one only needs to accept an aim of interpretation hypothetically, and then inquire into the ways that it can be accomplished. Such a technology operates with hypothetical rather than categorical imperatives. Stated differently, the standards for the comparative evaluation of interpretative hypotheses can be oriented towards various regulative ideals. For example, the reconstruction of the nexus of meaning of a text can take place in relation to the idea of accuracy: interpretative activities would then aim at accurately depicting the nexus of meaning of a text. But such a reconstruction of the nexus of meaning could also take place with respect to other objectives, for example aesthetic ones, like beauty. Whether accuracy or beauty should be a legitimate aim of interpretation with respect to a specific text, for example, is a discourse which can take place at another level and need not be concluded via a dogmatic decision once and for all. In opposition to “authorial intention” the “nexus of meaning” is a complex phenomenon and the interpreters can opt to highlight and apprehend it with respect to different aims and standards—indeed this is very often the case. What lies at the heart of this epistemic activity, i.e., of inventing interpretations as reconstructions of nexuses of meaning with respect to different aims, and how it can be best methodically captured is the subject of the following section.

5. The Hypothetico-Deductive Method

The application of the hypothetico-deductive method in the case of meaningful material has been proposed as a plausible way to account for the epistemic activity of text interpretation (Føllesdal 1979; Tepe 2007). Hypothetico-deductivism has been originally debated in connection with the philosophical theory of scientific explanation and it has indeed been the case that the main protagonists, Hempel and Popper (Popper1959/2003; 1963/1989), have portrayed scientific activity as exclusively an explanatory activity—largely aiming at answering “why?”–questions. This influential and, very often, only implicitly shared view that all scientific activity is explanatory need not be followed, however. Moreover, answers to “what was the case?”–questions rather than only to “why?”–questions can be allowed to enter the field of science, appropriately accommodating the activities of all those whose daily work consists in text interpretation. The application of the hypothetico-deductive method is a way to show that the standards currently used when dealing with problems of explanation—intersubjective intelligibility, testability with the use of evidence, rational argumentation and objectivity—can also apply to problems of interpretation. It will be very briefly shown how this method can be applied in five steps (Mantzavinos 2014).

In order to reconstruct the nexus of meaning which is connected with a specific text, interpretative hypotheses need to be established as a first step. The system of propositions that constitutes these interpretative hypotheses is in principle hypothetical, because it is not certain whether it will accomplish its epistemic aim, i.e., the identification of the meaning of the text. In the construction of such hypotheses, diverse hermeneutic principles can be employed like the already discussed “principle of charity” or “principle of humanity”, as presumptive rules that can break down in the light of experience. These interpretative hypotheses can partly consist of not directly observable “theoretical terms”, which could, for example, refer to the intentions of the author. In such cases one can, in a second step, deduce from such interpretative hypotheses, in conjunction with other statements, consequences which could be more observable, that is, consequences that could be (more easily) testable. In a third step, these observable consequences can be tested with the help of evidence primarily provided with the help of research techniques from the social sciences and humanities. The evidence can include what the author claims about his or her own work, his or her other works, details of rhyme, rhythm, frequency of occurrence of words, other linguistic or biographical considerations (Nehamas 1981: 145) and so on. In a fourth step, the different interpretative hypotheses are checked against the evidence. A comparative evaluation is necessary here, in order to distinguish good from bad interpretations. Such an evaluation can take place with respect to different values, so that a reconstruction of a nexus of meaning of a text can be oriented towards diverse ideals. One such ideal can be truth, which can be conceptualized as the accurate depiction of the nexus of meaning, and interpretations are hypotheses precisely by virtue of the fact that one searches for reasons for their truth and falsity. Other values, for example aesthetic ones, can also be deemed important, and the comparative evaluation of the offered interpretations can also take place with respect to such values—for example, beauty. In the fifth step of the application of the hypothetico-deductive method, a multi-dimensional evaluation of the same interpretative hypothesis with respect to different values or of a set of hypotheses with respect to one value is possible. Such evaluations do not take place according to any kind of algorithmic procedures. The employment of specific calculi which can supposedly lead to determinate evaluations and choices is not possible either in textual interpretation or, indeed, in scientific explanation. Human choices involving imagination are at work in this kind of cognitive praxis, choices that are bound to be fallible. It is only the institutionalization of the possibility of criticism that can lead to the correction of errors when these evaluations and choices are involved. Our fallible judgments are all what we have here as elsewhere and enabling a critical discussion is the prerequisite of making informed choices.

It is important to stress that the fifth step of this method has the important consequence of impeding a serious problem which has been exhaustively elaborated in the theory of confirmation. If contingent evidence E confirms hypothesis H given background beliefs B, then E also confirms the conjunction HX for any arbitrary X consistent with H. This peculiarity can render the confirmation process extremely permissive and so the whole method useless. A substantial critical discussion conducted by arguments among the various interpreters of a text is therefore a conditio sine qua non for the fruitfulness of the hypothetico-deductive method. Scholz (2015) has in fact questioned the productivity of this method precisely on these grounds—he calls this “the relevance problem”—, and has suggested that it be solved by employing an inference to the best explanation (Lipton 2004). According to this alternative, the hypothesis that best explains the evidence should be accepted from among the various hypotheses proposed. However, this alternative move is problematic since it is based on the assumption that it is possible to provide necessary and sufficient conditions of what constitutes an explanation and that there is a universal agreement on what counts as “the best explanation”—both assumptions being in fact untenable (Mantzavinos 2013, 2016).

In conclusion, the hypothetico-deductive method can help establish hermeneutic objectivity, ultimately based on a critical discussion among the participants to the discourse on the appropriateness of different interpretations regarding the fulfillment of the diverse aims of interpretation. Intersubjective intelligibility, testability with the use of evidence, rational argumentation and objectivity are, thus, feasible also in the case of text interpretation. A series of examples from diverse disciplines demonstrate this (Føllesdal 1979; Mantzavinos 2005: ch. 6; Detel 2011: 394ff; Detel 2016).

6. Epilogue

Hermeneutics as the methodology of interpretation can provide guidance for solving problems of interpretation of human actions, texts and other meaningful material by offering a toolbox based on solid empirical evidence. Throughout its historical development hermeneutics has dealt with specific problems of interpretation, arising within specific disciplines like jurisprudence, theology and literature, which have not been the focus of this article. The aim was indeed to show what kind of general problems of interpretation are treated by the discipline of hermeneutics and to identify some important procedures leading to their efficacious solution—always keeping in mind that these procedures, like all epistemological procedures, are bound to remain fallible.


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I would like to thank Wolfgang Detel, Eleni Manolakaki, Alexander Nehamas and Quentin Skinner for very helpful comments that greatly improved the manuscript and Felicity Povoas for many linguistic corrections.

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C. Mantzavinos <cmantzavinos@phs.uoa.gr>

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