The word ‘hedonism’ comes from the ancient Greek for ‘pleasure’. Psychological or motivational hedonism claims that only pleasure or pain motivates us. Ethical or evaluative hedonism claims that only pleasure has worth or value and only pain or displeasure has disvalue or the opposite of worth. Jeremy Bentham asserted both psychological and ethical hedonism with the first two sentences of his book An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation: “Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain, and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do”. Debate about hedonism was a feature too of many centuries before Bentham, and this has also continued after him. Other key contributors to debate over hedonism include Plato, Aristotle, Epicurus, Aquinas, Butler, Hume, Mill, Nietzsche, Brentano, Sidgwick, Moore, Ross, Broad, Ryle and Chisholm.
In general, pleasure is understood broadly below, as including or as included in all pleasant feeling or experience: contentment, delight, ecstasy, elation, enjoyment, euphoria, exhilaration, exultation, gladness, gratification, gratitude, joy, liking, love, relief, satisfaction, Schadenfreude, tranquility, and so on. Pain or displeasure too is understood broadly below, as including or as included in all unpleasant experience or feeling: ache, agitation, agony, angst, anguish, annoyance, anxiety, apprehensiveness, boredom, chagrin, dejection, depression, desolation, despair, desperation, despondency, discomfort, discombobulation, discontentment, disgruntlement, disgust, dislike, dismay, disorientation, dissatisfaction, distress, dread, enmity, ennui, fear, gloominess, grief, guilt, hatred, horror, hurting, irritation, loathing, melancholia, nausea, queasiness, remorse, resentment, sadness, shame, sorrow, suffering, sullenness, throb, terror, unease, vexation, and so on. ‘Pain or displeasure’ is usually stated below just as ‘pain’ or just as ‘displeasure’. Further economy is sometimes secured by stating, just about pleasure or just about displeasure, points that do or might apply to both. Whether such pleasure-displeasure parallels actually hold is a significant further issue, touched upon only briefly in the present entry.
What sort of entity is pleasure or pain? Candidates include: state, state of affairs, thing, event and property. Second, is it a first-order entity or a higher-order entity? For example, is your pain your toothache, its naggingness, or both? When you enjoy the cityscape below your viewpoint, is your pleasure your view, your enjoyment of it, the pleasurableness of your enjoyment of it, or all three? And so on. Third, does pleasure essentially have a ‘feel’ or phenomenology, a ‘something it is like’ (Nagel 1974). Fourth, does it essentially have directedness or ‘aboutness’ or intentionality? These issues about the nature of pleasure and displeasure are discussed below (see also the entry for pleasure) as they bear on the nature and merits of various forms of hedonism.
- 1. Psychological Hedonism
- 2. Ethical Hedonism
- 3. Concluding Remarks
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Bentham's claim that pain and pleasure determine what we do makes him a psychological hedonist, and more specifically a hedonist about the determination of action. This section focuses instead on the more modest claim that only pleasure or displeasure motivates us. This form of psychological hedonism helpfully allows that some hedonic motivations of ours fail to determine our action, and that some of our hedonically determined actions fail actually to get us pleasure. Weakness of agency can see our motivation fail to generate our action (see weakness of will); and the related ‘paradox of hedonism’ is the plausible claim that some of our hedonically motivated or determined action actually secures less pleasure than we would otherwise have got (e.g., Sidgwick: 48f).
Why believe even the relatively modest motivational form of psychological hedonism? One argument infers it from the motivational egoist claim that each of us is always motivated to maximize what we take to be our own good, plus the claim that we each accept that our good is our maximal or sufficient balance of pleasure over displeasure. But motivational egoism is at best controversial (see entry on egoism). Also controversial is the psychological thesis that each of us accepts hedonism about our own good. For one thing, it ungenerously implies that those who think they reject hedonism about their own good do not even know their own minds on this matter.
Another argument for motivational hedonism is this: sometimes we are motivated by pleasure, every case can be accounted for in this way, the more unified the account the better, and hedonism is the most unified account. But at most, this argument shows only that in the unification respect hedonism is the best account of our motivation. Even if that is so, unification is not the only feature that it is desirable for theories of motivation to have, and the argument is silent on how motivational hedonism scores on any other desirable feature. The argument consequently fails to establish the overall plausibility of motivational hedonism, let alone the thesis that it is the most plausible theory of motivation. In addition, parallel arguments arguably ‘show’ that we are sometimes motivated to improve ourselves, to survive, to attend to our near-and-dear, to live with integrity, and so forth; that every case can be narrated in such terms; and thus that all these rival views are just as unified as is motivational hedonism.
A third argument for motivational hedonism claims that it is a truth of everyday meaning that the words ‘is motivated’ just mean some such thing as ‘aims for the greatest balance of pleasure over pain’. The core trouble here is that motivational hedonism is not a truth of everyday meaning. Even if it were such a truth, the main issue of substance would remain. Rivals would simply re-state the ongoing central issue using neighbouring concepts; for example: ‘however it might be with the narrower concept “motive”, the claim that we are always moved by pleasure is false’. Nor would it help motivational hedonists to make a Humpty Dumpty move here (see Carroll: ch. 6): ‘when I use the words “is motivated”, said Humpty Dumpty, they mean just what I choose them to mean, namely “is aimed at pleasure”’. Such stipulation does not identify any good reason for anyone to join Humpty Dumpty in his eccentric word usage.
Even if all of the above arguments for motivational hedonism fail, other arguments for it could be made. Even if every argument for motivational hedonism fails, failure of a positive is not success of a negative. What then of the arguments against this relatively modest form of psychological hedonism?
Some challenges to motivational hedonism are demands for its thesis to be made more determinate. First, is it about every motivation; or is it only about the motives of ours that predominate, with exceptions when little pleasure or displeasure is at stake and/or when much else is at stake (c.f. Kavka: 64–80 on ‘predominant egoism’)? The present entry takes motivational hedonism to be the first of these views. Second, is it about all motivational entities, including all desires, wants, preferences, inclinations, intentions, decisions, and choices; or is it instead a claim about only an incomplete subset of these? The present entry treats it as a claim just about desires (see the entries on desire and intention). Third and relatedly, is it a pair of claims, one about desires for pleasure and the other about aversions to displeasure; or is it instead a single claim about overall or net desires for a sufficient or maximal net pleasure-displeasure balance? The present entry generally treats it as the latter. Fourth, is it a claim about every desire whatever, or just a claim about every human desire? The present entry treats it as the latter, though it is a good question why human desirers might be thought to be specially pleasure-oriented. Fifth, is it the egoistic claim that one desires only one's own pleasure, or the egocentric claim that one desires only the pleasure of oneself and one's near-and-dear, or is it instead a non-egoistic claim? When it makes a difference, the present entry takes motivational hedonism to be the first of these claims. Sixth, is it the production-based claim that we are motivated to cause pleasure, or does it allow, for example, that being moved to laugh might be being motivated to express rather than to produce pleasure? The present entry considers production-based claims, plus the distinct idea that our desire only ever has pleasure as its object.
From critical demands for more determinacy, turn now to the following articulated ‘incredulous stare’ (after Lewis: 86) challenge to motivational hedonism. We direct our richly various mental lives – our beliefs, musings, intentions, enthusiasms, hopes, aspirations, and so on and on – at massively plural and diverse items in ourselves, in others, in myriad aspects of the non-human world, and in the infinities of contingent future possibility. In keeping with this overall psychological picture, our motivations too have objects that are massively plural and diverse. In the light of such facts, motivational hedonism merits an incredulous stare: why would anyone believe even for a minute that all human motivation takes as its object just one sort of item? On this point, some go beyond incredulity to contempt. Thus Nietzsche: “Man does not strive for pleasure; only the Englishman does” (Nietzsche: ‘Maxims and Arrows’ #12). Perhaps the most promising motivational hedonist response, about all humans including Englishmen, is to say that all our basic motives are directed at pleasure and all our non-basic motives are pleasure-centred too, but less directly so. This move is examined further below in discussion of Butler and Hume.
Some other criticisms of motivational hedonism can be quickly rebutted. One such criticism is that we are often motivated by things that in fact give us neither pleasure nor the best available pleasure-displeasure balance, such as when we step under a shower that we take to be suitably warm but find instead to be scalding hot. Another is that the idea of maximal pleasure, or of the best feasible pleasure-displeasure balance, assumes a common measure that cannot be had. A third criticism is that not every pleasure in prospect motivates us. Hedonists can reply: first, that one is always and only motivated by what one thinks to be one's maximal or sufficient pleasure or pleasure-displeasure balance; second, that this is possible even if the idea of pleasure maximization in such settings does not ultimately make sense; and third, that hedonism does not imply that one is motivated by every pleasure prospect.
Motivational hedonism would be seriously undermined by any case of an individual who is motivated otherwise than by pleasure or displeasure. Here are some standard candidates that seem true to experience: the parent who seeks to give his child good early years and a good start in life for that child's sake, the walker who kicks a small stone ‘just for the hell of it’, the soldier who opts for a painful death for himself to save his comrades, and the dying person who fights to keep a grip on life despite fully grasping that much pain and little or no pleasure now remains to her.
The standard style of hedonist response to attempted counterexamples is to offer rival motivational stories: the soldier was really motivated only by an underlying belief that her dying would secure her a joyful afterlife or at least a half-second's sweet pleasure of hero's self-sacrifice; the parent was actually motivated only by his own pleasurable intention to give the child a good start or by his expectation that his now having this intention will somehow cause him to have pleasure later; the dying non-believer in any afterlife in fact hangs on only because she really believes that in her life there is still pleasure for her; and so on.
The capability of hedonists to tell hedonic stories as to our motives does not in itself generate any reason to think such narratives true. To escape refutation by counterexample, motivational hedonists need to tell the tale of every relevant motive in hedonic terms that are not merely imaginative but are also in every case more plausible than the anti-hedonist lessons that our experience seems repeatedly to teach some of us about many of our motives.
As noted above, some statements of motivational hedonism are indeterminate. Consider now the more precise thesis that each of one's desires or passions or appetites has one's own pleasure and only this as its object, as that at which alone it is aimed or is directed or is about. This thesis was a target of Bishop Joseph Butler in his 1729 work Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel. Butler noted in his Preface that there are: “such passions in mankind as desire of esteem, or of being beloved, or of knowledge”. All of these have objects other than pleasure. Drawing on Butler's critique, David Hume added further examples: that people have bodily appetites such as hunger and thirst; that mental passions drive them to attain such things as fame, power, and vengeance; and that many of us also: “feel a desire of another's happiness and good” (Hume: Appendix 2, 12–13). All these appetites have objects other than just one's own pleasure or displeasure. By appeal to such cases Butler and Hume arguably refuted the strong motivational hedonist thesis that one's every desire has one's own pleasure and that alone as its object.
In pulling things together downstream from the Butler-Hume critique, hedonist responses might first distinguish basic from non-basic desires. A desire is basic if one has it independently of any thought one has about what else this will or might cause or bring about. A desire is non-basic if one's having it does depend on one's having such further thought. Equipped with this distinction, motivational hedonists can claim that one's every basic desire has one's own pleasure as its object, and one's every non-basic desire depends on one's thinking this will or might bring one pleasure. Thus propelled, hedonists can swim back against the broader Butler-Hume stream by claiming, of everyone in every case, that has only non-basic desire for esteem or knowledge or to be beloved, and this only because one thinks it will or might give one pleasure; and likewise with one's appetite for food or drink, one's mental passion for fame or power or vengeance, and one's desire for the happiness or good of any other.
Despite the implicature of the cliché, it is possible to sink even as one swims. Still, the foregoing does supply hedonists with some potential buoyancy aids. They can claim that one's every basic desire is directed at one's own pleasure, and one's every non-basic desire, directed at something other than pleasure, is had only because one thinks this will or might bring one pleasure. The wide range of ways in which one's desire for non-pleasure could bring one pleasure include: by this desire's itself being an instance of pleasure (e.g., by appeal to a desire-pleasure identity thesis; see Heathwood), by the desire's having the property of pleasurableness (e.g., deploying the thought that pleasure is a higher-order property of every desire), by the desire's causing one pleasure independently of whether its object obtains (e.g., a fan's desire to be a vampire or a hobbit might cause him pleasure even though this desire of his is never fulfilled); or by the desire's causing its object to obtain, where this object is an instance of one's pleasure, or has pleasure as one of its properties, or causes one pleasure. Well and good. But again, it is one thing to tell such motivational hedonist stories and it is another thing to identify any reason to think the stories true.
A wider issue about motivational hedonism is this: is it a contingent claim about an aspect of our psychology that could have been otherwise; or does it posit a law of our psychological nature; or is it a necessary truth about all metaphysically or conceptually or logically possible motivations? The answers to such questions also bear on the sorts of evidence and argument we need if we are fully to appraise motivational hedonism. If it is an empirical psychological thesis, as it seems to be, then it is reasonable to expect application of the methods and evidence of empirical psychology, social inquiry, and perhaps also biological science, to do the main work of appraising it. It is also reasonable to expect that most of this work is to be done by specialist scientists and social scientists through their systematic conduct of meta-analyses of large numbers of empirical studies. Philosophical work will continue to be needed too, to weed out incoherent ideas, to separate out the numerous distinct motivational hedonist theses; and to scrutinize whether, and if so with what significance, various empirical findings actually do bear on these various hedonist theses. For instance, even the feasibility of a research design that is capable of empirically separating out our basic from our non-basic motives would be a serious challenge. Philosophical work can also identify the various features that it is desirable for theories of motivation to have and to be appraised against. Unification, determinacy, and confirmation by cases are treated above as desirable. Other desirable features might include consistency and maximal scope. Philosophers and others can systematically appraise theories of motivation in such terms, including through pairwise comparative assessments of rival theories in terms of those desirable features.
This section has critically reviewed motivational hedonism and has found weaknesses in some central arguments for the view, together with some significant problems of determinacy and disconfirmation. It has also found that there are arguments against motivational hedonism that have some force. Ongoing inquiry is continuing to assess whether such troubles for motivational hedonism can be overcome, and whether any of its rivals fare any better overall than it does.
At its simplest, ethical hedonism is the claim that all and only pleasure has positive importance and all and only pain or displeasure has negative importance. This importance is to be understood non-instrumentally, that is, independently of the importance of anything that pleasure or displeasure might cause or prevent. From ethical hedonism, it follows that if our relationships, achievements, knowledge, character states, and so on, have any non-instrumental importance, this is just a matter of any pleasure or displeasure that is in their natures. Otherwise, they have only instrumental importance through the pleasure they cause or displeasure they diminish. At least from the simple forms of ethical hedonism, it also follows that pleasure is good whenever it is had, even in matters that are themselves worthless or worse. Some hedonists are willing to bite such bullets; others develop more complex forms of ethical hedonism that seek to soften the bullets or even to dissolve them.
Some things have both instrumental and non-instrumental importance, and in such cases their overall importance is a function of both. These two matters can also pull in opposite directions. Your pain of being once bitten has non-instrumental negative importance, for example, but it might also have instrumental positive importance through the further pain you avoid by its making you twice shy. Instrumental importance is a contingent matter and it varies widely from case to case. This is why the non-instrumental claims of pleasure and displeasure are the present focus.
Ethical hedonism can be universalist, me-and-my-near-and-dear egocentric, or egoistically focused just on one's own pleasure. It can also be a claim about value, morality, well-being, rationality, reasons or aesthetics. It can be a claim about grounds for action, belief, motivation or feeling; or a claim about ought, obligation, good and bad, or right and wrong. And these are not the only the possibilities. The discussion below aims for both determinacy of formulation and generality across the different forms of ethical hedonism, albeit that these two aims are in some tension with one another. For economy of expression, discussion proceeds below in terms of hedonism about value. At its simplest, this is the thesis that anything has non-instrumental value if and only if it is an instance of pleasure, and has non-instrumental disvalue if and only if it is an instance of pain or displeasure.
Aristotle (1095a15–22) claimed that we all agree that the good is eudaimonia but there is disagreement among us about what eudaimonia is. Similarly, ethical hedonists agree with one another that the good is pleasure, but there is some disagreement among them, and among non-hedonists too, about what pleasure is. Accounts of pleasure are canvassed below, and issues with them are briefly reviewed, especially regarding the various ways in which they bear on the prospects for ethical hedonism.
Phenomenalism about pleasure is the thesis that pleasure is a mental state or property that is or that has a certain something that is ‘what it is like’ for its subject; a certain feel, feeling, felt character, tone or phenomenology. On the face of it, the classic utilitarians Jeremy Bentham and J.S. Mill were phenomenalists about pleasure. With various complexities and qualifications, so too are some more recent writers (e.g., Moore: 64, Broad: 229–33, Schlick: ch. 2, Sprigge: ch. 5, Tännsjö: 84–84, Crisp 2006: 103–109, Bradley, Labukt).
Intentionalism about pleasure is the thesis that pleasure is an intentional state or property and thus has ‘directedness’. Intentional or representational states or properties are many and diverse, but they share a subject-mode-content structure (Crane: ch. 1). You or I or the next person might be the subject, belief or intention or desire or perception or emotion or pleasure might be the intentional mode, and the content of this intentional state or property includes its object or that which it is about. If I delight in the day, for example, I am the subject of this mental state or property that has delight as its intentional mode and the day as its intentional object. My delight in the day is thus an instance of intentional pleasure. Intentionalism implies that pleasure is an intentional state or a property in the pleasure mode that has some object. Brentano (1874/1973) was an intentionalist about pleasure, and so too are some more recent philosophers (e.g., Chisholm, Crane, Feldman 2004).
Intentionalist accounts of pleasure are less well known than phenomenalist accounts, so they merit brief elaboration on several points. First, to say that pleasure is an intentional state or property is not to make any claim about deliberateness, choice or intention. Intentionalism is the thesis that pleasure has ‘about-ness’, it not a thesis about pleasure's relation to the will. Second, if pleasure is an intentional state or property then it has an object, but it does not follow that all pleasures are propositional attitudes, with states of affairs or propositions as their objects. On one standard account, any psychological verb that can be inserted into the φ place in the schema ‘S φs that p’ is an attitude (e.g., ‘thinks’, ‘hopes’, ‘wishes’, ‘prefers’, ‘delights’, ‘enjoys’) to a proposition p. Some accept the universal thesis that all intentional states are propositional attitudes. But this thesis is vulnerable to counterexample from object-directed emotions including personal love and hate, the objects of which seem not to be fully specifiable as states of affairs or as propositions. Relatedly, though some intentional pleasures are indeed propositional attitudes, it is a significant further question whether they all are. A third clarification is this. If there are intentional pleasures then they are such that their objects might or might not exist. I could delight in the concert performance of my favourite musician, for example, even if the actual performer is instead just a talented imposter, or even if the ‘performer’ is in fact just an audio-visual effect of clever sound and light projection. Or, to update and to make concrete an older and more abstract example from Chisholm (28–29), Gore might for a time have enjoyed his victory in the 2000 U.S. presidential election, even though he actually did not win it. These claims about intentional pleasures are instances of the wider and admittedly rather perplexing point that the objects of some intentional states and properties do not exist (see entry on Intentionality).
In various significant ways, issues concerning the phenomenal and intentional nature of pleasure bear on hedonism about value. Such matters are canvassed below.
Intentionalism about the mental is the thesis is that all mental matters are intentional, that they all have directedness or ‘aboutness’ (e.g., Brentano 1874/1973, Crane). Pleasure is a mental matter, so intentionalism about pleasure implies that any pleasure is an intentional matter and thus has an object. Strong intentionalism implies that phenomenal character is purely a matter of intentional character, and this implies in turn that intentional character exhausts phenomenal character. All intentionalist accounts of pleasure are of course consistent with intentionalism about pleasure. But intentionalism about pleasure is inconsistent with any radical phenomenalist account that claims, of some or all pleasure, that it has no intentional character. Moderate phenomenalist accounts instead claim that all pleasure is both phenomenal and intentional; so they are consistent with intentionalism, and some are also consistent with strong intentionalism. Some phenomenalist accounts of pleasure are neither radical nor moderate; but are instead indeterminate on the matter of whether or not pleasure has any intentional character. Such indeterminacy then carries through to any form of hedonism that is built on them. Insofar as such indeterminacy is undesirable in any account of pleasure, and in any hedonist thesis, it is a count against these views.
Phenomenalism about pleasure is the thesis that all pleasure has phenomenal character. Radical intentionalist accounts (e.g., Feldman 2004: 56, Shafer-Landau: 20) claim, of some or all pleasure, that it has no phenomenal or felt character. Any such account is inconsistent with phenomenalism about pleasure. Though Feldman and Shafer-Landau do argue that intentional pleasure need not have any phenomenology or felt character, they also argue, respectively, that there is a distinct ‘sensory’ or ‘physical’ sort of pleasure that does have felt character. Moderate intentionalist accounts, by contrast, claim that all pleasure is both phenomenal and intentional, and this makes them consistent with phenomenalism about pleasure. Most intentionalists are mindful that all pleasure has a phenomenal reputation, and they attempt to account for this.
Moderate phenomenalism and moderate intentionalism can be re-framed as hybrid accounts that build on the idea that pleasure has both phenomenal and intentional character. A strong intentionalist hybrid view (e.g., Crane: chs. 1, 3) is that pleasure is a property or state the phenomenal character of which is fully captured in its intentional character. On one account of this sort, the phenomenal property or state of my delighting in the day just is my having a state or property in the intentional mode of delight, with content that includes directedness at the day. A different hybrid account is that pleasure is an intentional state or property that also has a phenomenal higher-order property. Along these lines, it might be held that delight in the day is a state or property in the delight mode that is directed at the day, and that in addition has a certain felt character. A third hybrid account is that pleasure is an intentional state or property that has a phenomenal object. Along these lines, my delighting in the day might be taken to be my intrinsically desiring a certain day-caused phenomenal delight-state or delight-property of mine. A fourth hybrid account is that pleasure is a phenomenal state or property that in addition meets an object-of-intentional-state condition. For example, one might regard: “Pleasure… as a feeling which … is at least implicitly apprehended as desirable…” (Sidgwick: 127; see also Brandt, Sumner: 90). This fourth sort of hybrid view is rather demanding, because any subject who lacks the capacity ‘implicitly to apprehend as desirable’ is incapable of such pleasure.
Ryle (1954) argued that all sensations have felt location. For example, one feels the pain of toe-stubbing to be located in one's toe. Ryle also argued that pleasure has no felt location, and he concluded that it cannot be a sensation. Phenomenalists about pleasure need not contest any of this. They need not think pleasure is a sensory or a sensation state or property, and if they allow that bodily phenomenal pain does have intentional character, they can account for the felt location of one's pain of toe-stubbing in terms of its being directed at one's toe. Much the same is true of intentionalists. They can claim that pleasure is an intentional state or property, without claiming that its intentional character involves its having any felt location. For example, my delight in the day is about the day, not about any bodily location of mine. Moderate phenomenalism and moderate intentionalism are thus consistent with Ryle on these points. Ryle's arguments do nevertheless present challenges for some pleasure-pain symmetry theses.
It is plausible that at least some pleasures have directedness. These pleasures present challenges for radical phenomenalists who deny that any pleasure has any intentional character. They need not trouble more modest forms of phenomenalism that do allow also for intentional character.
One option is to claim that some pleasures do not have any intentional character and are thus not directed at or about anything. For example, it might be claimed that there is objectless euphoria and ecstasy, or that undirected feelings of anxiety or suffering exist. Such cases would be no trouble for the sorts of phenomenalism that reject any form of intentionalism about pleasure. Intentionalists, by contrast, must insist that every pleasure and displeasure has an object. They might argue, for example, that allegedly objectless euphoria and ecstasy or anxiety in fact do have objects, even if these objects are not fully determinate; perhaps, for example, they are directed at things in general, or one's life in general. Intentionalists might add that the indeterminacy of these objects is part of the charm of ‘objectless’ euphoria and ecstasy, and of the awfulness of ‘objectless’ anxiety and depression. In support of the broader idea that intentional states can have vague or indeterminate objects, while ordinary or substantial objects cannot, Elizabeth Anscombe offered this pugilist's example: “I can think of a man without thinking of a man of any particular height; I cannot hit a man without hitting a man of any particular height, because there is no such thing as a man of no particular height” (Anscombe: 161). A different response to the claim that some pleasures and displeasures are objectless is to move to a fundamentally pluralist view, according to which some pleasure and displeasure is intentional, other pleasure and displeasure is phenomenal, and some of the latter has no intentional character at all.
Monism about pleasure is the thesis that there is just one basic kind of mental state or property that is pleasure. Phenomenal monism holds that there is just one basic kind pleasure feeling or tone, while intentional monism claims there is just one basic kind of pleasure intentional state or property. The disunity objection to monism is based on the claim that there is no unified or common element in all instances of pleasure (e.g., Sidgwick: 127, Alston: 344, Brandt: 35–42, Parfit: 493, Griffin: 8, Sprigge: ch. 5). With few exceptions if any, such objections have to date targeted phenomenal monism. But both the objection and the possible replies to it are under-explored in the different context of intentional monism. The standard phenomenal monist reply is to insist that there is just one basic kind of pleasure and that this is a matter of there being a common element in pleasure's feeling, felt tone, or phenomenology, or in ‘what it is like’ to have pleasure (e.g., Moore: 12–13, Broad: 229, Sumner: 87–91). Broad, for example, wrote that the common phenomenal character of pleasure is something “we cannot define but are perfectly acquainted with” (Broad: 229). Alternatively, if some definition is to be attempted, one thought is that the common phenomenal character of all pleasure is just its felt pleasantness. A different claim is that there is a common feel-good character or felt positivity in all pleasure. This claim is not clear, but can be spelt out in at least the following three different ways: that there is such a property as felt positivity and that all instances of pleasure have it; that all pleasure consists partly in feeling the existence of goodness or value; or that all pleasure has goodness or value as an intentional object, and this is so whether or not goodness or value exists.
Pluralism in the present setting is the thesis that there is more than one basic kind of state or property that is pleasure, that pleasure is multiply or variously or diversely realizable, or that there is a basic plurality of sufficient conditions for pleasure. The core idea is that there is a basic plurality of kinds of feel or of intentional state, each of which is a kind of pleasure (e.g., Rachels, Labukt, perhaps Rawls: 557). The unity objection to any such pluralism is that all instances of pleasure must meet some unitary sufficient condition, and that pluralism is inconsistent with this. The obvious pluralist reply is to reject this demand for unitariness. One rationale for this reply is that multiple or plural realization theses about many kinds of mental states are coherent, widely made and merit serious consideration, so the unity objector is not justified in thus seeking to rule them out at the outset of inquiry into the nature of pleasure.
Reflection on both the disunity objection to monism and the unity objection to pluralism about pleasure suggests a further option. This is the thesis that there is some feature that is phenomenal or intentional or both and that is common to all instances of pleasure, and that in addition, some pleasures differ from others in at least one other respect that has phenomenal or intentional character or both. One motivation for such views is to draw out and combine insights from both monism and pluralism about the nature of pleasure.
Which features of pleasure are most closely related to its value? Bentham claimed that there are at least six ‘dimensions of value in a pleasure or a pain’: intensity, duration, certainty or uncertainty, propinquity or remoteness, fecundity, and purity (Bentham: ch. 4). On one account, fecundity is a matter of being instrumental in other pleasure or pain, purity is a matter of separating pleasure out from non-pleasure, propinquity and remoteness concern temporal and/or spatial nearness or farness, and the essentials of certainty and uncertainty are plain enough. Recalling that non-instrumental value is the present point of focus, Bentham's account suggests the quantitative hedonist idea that the non-instrumental value of pleasure is a matter just of its quantitative features, and that these reduce just to its duration and its intensity.
Quantitative hedonism is consistent with monist phenomenalism about pleasure, with ‘intensity’ here understood as ‘felt intensity’. It is also consistent with pluralist phenomenalism about pleasure, but only on the assumption that none of the plurality-making features of pleasure also adds non-instrumentally to its value. It is less straightforward to see how to combine quantitative hedonism with those forms of intentionalism that deny that pleasure need have any phenomenal character. Such accounts would need to explain the intensity or strength of pleasure in intentional terms and without making any appeal to felt intensity.
Responding especially to the charge that a Benthamite account is a ‘doctrine worthy only of swine’, J.S. Mill (ch. 2) developed an alternative approach according to which there is ‘higher’ and ‘lower’ pleasure, and its value is irreducibly a matter of its quality as well as its quantity. Mill argued that of two sorts of pleasures, if there is one that at least a majority of those who have experience of both prefer then it is the more desirable. The standard criticism of this qualitative hedonism is that pleasure's quality reduces either to its quantity, or to some anti-hedonist claim about value. The best sort of reply for qualitative hedonists is to present an account that does not suffer from either such reduction or such collapse. Pluralism about the nature of pleasure seems to be necessary for this, together with the claim that one or more of the plurality-constituting features of pleasure does also add non-instrumentally add to its value. Qualitative hedonists who are also phenomenalists about pleasure will seek to find the sources of such value differences in phenomenal differences. Qualitative hedonists who are also intentionalists about the nature of pleasure will seek to find the sources of such value differences in irreducibly non-quantitative differences amongst pleasures in the intentional mode, in the intentional content, or in both of these aspects of these mental states or properties. Feldman's ‘Truth-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism’ is a view of this sort, due to its claim that the amount of intrinsic value of a life is a matter of the truth-adjusted amount of its intrinsic attitudinal pleasure (Feldman 2004: 112). The same is true of Feldman's ‘Desert-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism’, according to which the amount of intrinsic value of a life is a matter of the desert-adjusted amount of its intrinsic attitudinal pleasure (Feldman 2004: 121).
One significant objection to hedonism about value is based on claims about the nature and existence of pleasure. It assumes hedonism about value, conjoins this with the eliminativist thesis that there is no such thing as pleasure, infers the nihilist thesis that nothing actually has value, rebounds by rejecting this value nihilism, and then concludes by retaining eliminativism about pleasure while rejecting hedonism about value. The most radical forms of eliminativism about pleasure are across-the-board theses: there is no such thing as pleasure, or there is no such thing as pain (e.g., Dennett; criticized by Flanagan amongst others), or both. Objections of the above sort that are based on the most radical eliminativist thesis speak against all forms of hedonism. Objections based on eliminativism about only phenomenal pleasure, or about only intentional pleasure, or about only sensational pleasure (e.g., Ryle, perhaps Sidgwick: 127, perhaps Aristotle 1175a22f) speak against only the correspondingly narrower forms of hedonism.
Why believe eliminativism about phenomenal or intentional pleasure? One sort of argument for it moves from the premise that there is no phenomenally or intentionally distinctive character common to all instances of, for example, new romantic love, slaking a powerful thirst, sexual orgasm, solving a hard intellectual problem, and fireside reminiscence amongst friends, to the conclusion that there is no such thing as phenomenal or intentional pleasure. This sort of argument relies on monism about pleasure, and monism about pleasure is argued above to be questionable. Why believe eliminativism about sensational pleasure? One sort of argument for it is that any such pleasure must be a sensation, and any sensation must have felt location, but no pleasure has felt location, so no pleasure sensation exists. Perhaps the most promising sort of hedonist response is to argue against eliminativism about pleasure, or at least against eliminativism about pleasure on some particular favoured account of its nature.
This section has discussed the nature of pleasure as it bears on ethical hedonism. It has outlined phenomenalist accounts, intentionalist accounts and hybrid accounts of pleasure. It has examined various critical issues for hedonism that are related to the nature of pleasure, especially: quantitative versus qualitative hedonism, disunity objections to monistic hedonism and unity objections to pluralistic hedonism, and arguments from eliminativism about pleasure to the rejection of hedonism about value. One overall conclusion to draw from this sub-section is that there would be benefit in further philosophical examination of the multiple connections between ethical hedonism and the phenomenal and intentional character of pleasure and displeasure.
At its simplest, ethical hedonism is the thesis that all and only pleasure has positive non-instrumental importance and all and only pain or displeasure has negative non-instrumental importance. The focus below is on hedonism about value, and the discussion is intended to be generalizable also to other forms of ethical hedonism.
Consider the following unification argument for hedonism about value: the case for the value of pleasure is stronger than the case for the value of any non-pleasure; the more unified the theory of value the better it is; unification around the strongest case is better than unification around any other case; therefore: hedonism is the best theory of value. This argument has weaknesses. Its first premise is not obviously true and needs further argument. In addition, the further argument that it still needs is in effect a separate argument for hedonism over its rivals, so this unification argument is not self-standing. Its second premise is also ambiguous between the claim that a theory of value is in one respect better if it is more unified, and the claim that it is all-things-considered better if it is more unified. Plausibility requires the first interpretation, but the unification argument requires the second interpretation. In short, there are significant problems with this unification argument for ethical hedonism.
Here is a motivation argument for hedonism about value: one's basic motivation is always and only pleasure; all and only that which is one's basic motivation has value for one; therefore all and only what is valuable for one is pleasure. On one interpretation, this argument appeals to a form of the motivational hedonist thesis that the only object of our basic motives is pleasure. This form of motivational hedonism is questionable, as Section 1.2 discussed above. In addition, motivational hedonism is most plausible as a claim about the role of pleasure as an object of each of our motives, whether or not that object actually exists in each case; whereas hedonism about value is most plausible as a view just about real states or properties of pleasure. Furthermore, this motivation argument depends on a pro-attitude or motivation theory of value. It thus makes hedonism about value an implication of, and in that respect dependent on, this form of subjectivism about value. On an alternative interpretation of the motivation argument, its first premise is the pleasure-motive identity thesis that our motives just are our pleasures (see Heathwood). For the motivation argument to bear fruit on this second interpretation, its proponents need to show that this pleasure-motive identity thesis is plausible.
One scientific naturalist argument for hedonism is this: in the value domain we should be scientific naturalists in our methods of inquiry; hedonism is the best option in respect of scientific naturalism; therefore, we should be hedonists about value. Various issues arise. Both premises of the argument need support. First, what are scientific naturalist forms of inquiry into value, and why think they should be adopted them in the value domain? One broadly scientific rationale for adopting such methods is the claim that their empirical track record is superior to that of philosophical theorising about value. But the thesis that naturalistic methods have a superior empirical track record or prospect is not obviously true and needs argument. A case also needs to be made that hedonism does do better than its rivals in the scientific naturalist respect. Why think it has better naturalistic credentials, for example, than the numerous non-hedonic and extra-hedonic mental states and properties, and the various forms of agency and of personal relationship, that are amongst the promising rival or additional candidates for non-instrumental value status?
Consider now this doxastic or belief argument for hedonism about value: all or most of us believe hedonism about value, albeit that some of us suffer from self-deception about that; and this state of our beliefs supports hedonism itself. One response is that even if the premise is true it fails to support the conclusion. Consider structurally similar cases. First, even if we all believe we have free will and even if we cannot but believe this, it does not show that we actually have free will. Second, suppose instead that a strong general form of belief involuntarism is true, according to which we are not free to have any beliefs other than those we do in fact have. Again, this would not have any tendency to establish the truth of any of these beliefs of ours, however robustly it might permit our having them. Any convincing form of the doxastic or belief argument would need to overcome such difficulties.
Phenomenal arguments for hedonism move from some aspect of the felt character of pleasure or pain to a thesis about the value of pleasure or pain.Some argue that pain or pleasure or both have felt character or felt quality that generates reason to avoid or alleviate or minimize the former and seek the latter (e.g., Nagel 1986: 156–162). It might be thought that such phenomenal considerations can be deployed also in an argument for some form of ethical hedonism. One overall point is that the most such phenomenal arguments can show is the sufficiency of pleasure for value, and/or of pain for disvalue. Even if the relevant phenomenal character is unique to pleasure and pain, this can establish at most that pleasure is necessary to phenomenal arguments for value, and that pain is necessary to phenomenal arguments for disvalue. It cannot show that pleasure and pain alone have non-instrumental value. Phenomenal arguments also need to avoid appeal to any equivocation on ‘quality’. From the mere fact that pain or pleasure has a certain felt quality in the sense of ‘felt character’, it does not immediately follow that it has any felt quality in the sense of ‘value’ or ‘disvalue’.
Can phenomenal arguments be strengthened? First, one might conjoin the premise that pleasure has certain felt character with the premise that all or most of us believe this felt character to be good. But this is just a doxastic argument again, plus a phenomenal account of the nature of pleasure. Second, one might instead appeal to the epistemic thesis that the felt character of pain and pleasure gives us direct awareness, perception or apprehension of the badness of pain and the goodness of pleasure. One construal of this idea is that pleasure is an intentional feeling that has its own value or goodness as an object. Even if this thesis is granted, however, it is a general feature of intentional states that their objects might or might not exist. This being so, even if its own goodness is an intentional object of pleasure and its own badness is an intentional object of pain, it does not follow that pleasure is good or that pain is bad. A third way to interpret the phenomenal argument is as claiming that pleasure and pain are propositional feels that have feels-to-be-good and feels-to-be-bad intentional and phenomenal character, respectively. Again however, if such feels share the character of propositional attitudes in general, then ‘feels-to-be-good’ does not entail ‘is-good’ and ‘feels-to-be-bad’ does not entail ‘is-bad’.
Causal arguments for hedonism about value move from premises about pleasure's causal relations to the conclusion that pleasure alone is valuable. One thing to note about the particular causal arguments for hedonism that are discussed below (c.f. Crisp 2006: 120–122) is that they are in tension with doxastic arguments for hedonism (and with epistemic arguments, on which see below), because they counsel caution or even skepticism about the epistemic credentials of our hedonism-related beliefs.
One causal argument for hedonism is that autonomy, achievement, friendship, honesty, and so on, generally produce pleasure, and this makes us tend to think they have value of their own; in this way the valuable pleasure produced by these non-pleasures tends to confound our thinking about what has value. Even granting that achievement, friendship and the like tend to cause pleasure, however, why think this merely instrumental consideration also causes us to think these non-hedonic matters have their own non-instrumental value? Is there, for instance, any empirical evidence for this claim? And even granted both causal claims, why think these are the only causes of belief in non-hedonism? Even granted that these are the only causes of non-hedonist belief, why think these causes of belief justify it, and why think they are its only justifiers? Perhaps these questions all have good hedonism-friendly answers, but that needs to be shown. Alternatively, perhaps this causal argument is instead exactly as good as the parallel causal argument from the thesis that pleasure generally produces autonomy, achievement, and the like, to the opposite conclusion that hedonism is false.
Another causal argument for hedonism is that anti-hedonism about value is pleasure-maximizing; this tends to cause anti-hedonist belief; and it also justifies our having anti-hedonist belief without our needing to think such belief true. As it stands, this argument is weak. The issue is whether anti-hedonism is true, and this causal argument fails even to address that issue. Even if anti-hedonist belief has good or ideal consequences, and even if such consequences tend to produce such belief, this does not tend to establish either the truth or the falsehood of anti-hedonism.
Explanatory arguments for hedonism about value invite us to make a list of the things that we regard as good or valuable, to ask of each of them ‘why is it good?’ or ‘what explains its being good?’, to agree that all of the goodness or value of all but one such listed item is best explained by its generation of pleasure, and also to agree that no satisfactorily explanatory answer can be given to such questions as ‘why is pleasure good?’ or ‘what explains pleasure's being good?’. Proponents of the explanatory argument then conclude in favour of hedonism about value.
Those already sympathetic to hedonism about value should find explanatory arguments congenial. It is a good question, partly empirical in nature, how the explanatory argument will strike those not already inclined either for or against hedonism about value. Those already sympathetic to non-hedonist pluralism about value, however, can reasonably respond with some scepticism to explanatory arguments for hedonism. They can hold that the non-instrumental value of each of pleasure, knowledge, autonomy, friendship and achievement (or any other good proposed instead) is best explained by its own non-instrumental features. Subjectivists will add that these non-instrumental features are matters of each item's being some object of some actual or counterfactual pro-stance. Objectivists will instead claim that the non-instrumental features of pleasure, achievement, friendship, knowledge and autonomy that explain its value are independent of its being any object of any pro-stance. All parties can also agree that at least part of the instrumental goodness or value of pleasure, knowledge, autonomy, friendship and achievement is best explained by its generation of pleasure.
Epistemic arguments for hedonism about value claim that pleasure clearly or obviously has value (c.f. Crisp 2006: 124), and that nothing else clearly does; and they conclude that this justifies belief in hedonism about value. But the assertion that pleasure's value claims are clearer or more robust or more obvious than those of any other candidate for value status needs argument. Until this is supplied, perhaps by doxastic, phenomenal, explanatory, or causal arguments, epistemic arguments add little to the case for hedonism about value.
This sub-section has outlined and reviewed some of the main forms of argument for hedonism about value: unification, motivation, scientific naturalist, doxastic, phenomenal, explanatory, causal and epistemic arguments. Arguments of each of these sorts could also be made for other forms of ethical hedonism. Each argument is problematical, but perhaps one or more of them can be made robust. Perhaps other promising arguments for ethical hedonism might also be developed. Even if all such arguments fail, this would still not in itself be a convincing overall case against hedonism. The next sub-section examines arguments against ethical hedonism.
There are many and varied arguments against ethical hedonism. Those that appeal to claims about the nature of pleasure are canvassed in Section 2.1 above. Further arguments against ethical hedonism could be constructed that broadly parallel the unification, motivation, scientific naturalist, doxastic, phenomenal, explanatory, causal and epistemic arguments for ethical hedonism presented and examined in Section 2.2 above. That task is not pursued in this entry. The following sub-sections instead review other objections to ethical hedonism.
2.3.1 Non-Necessity Objections
At its simplest, ethical hedonism is the thesis that all and only pleasure is good non-instrumentally, and all and only pain or displeasure is bad non-instrumentally. The non-necessity objection to this rejects its claim that only pleasure is good, or its claim that only displeasure is bad, or both of these claims. Its thesis is that pleasure is not necessary for positive importance, or that displeasure is not necessary for negative importance, or both. Its basic idea is that something other than pleasure has value, and/or that something other than displeasure has disvalue. Any cases that are hedonic equals but value unequals would deliver what the non-necessity objector seeks.
One expression of the non-necessity objection is the following articulated ‘incredulous stare’ (after Lewis 1986). Why would anyone think, even for a minute, that hedonism is a plausible theory of value? Even if we focus very narrowly, just on those mental states of ours that arguably are instances of pleasure or have pleasure as a higher-order property – contentment, delight, ecstasy, elation, enjoyment, euphoria, exhilaration, exultation, gladness, gratification, gratitude, joy, liking, love, relief, satisfaction, Schadenfreude, tranquility, and so on – each of these mental states or events or properties also has one or more non-hedonic properties that contribute to its importance. Beyond pleasure, our mental lives are full of significant and diverse thoughts, perceptions, emotions, imaginings, wishes, and so on. These engage with massively plural and diverse items in ourselves, in others, in myriad aspects of the non-human world, and in the infinities of contingent future possibility. This is true also of our relationships with ourselves and with others, and with multiple aspects of the wider world. It is true also of our agency – our deliberations, choices, plans, intentions, and so forth. In the light of such reflections, an incredulous stare might be thought an apt response to a profession of belief in ethical hedonism. This incredulous stare argument is far from decisive, but perhaps it should disrupt any complacent presumption in favour of hedonism.
Many well-known criticisms of hedonism can reasonably be interpreted as non-necessity objections. A short survey of some of the more significant of these follows.
Plato pointed out that if your life is just one of pleasure then it would not even include any recollection of pleasure; nor any distinct thought that you were pleased, even when you were pleased. His conclusion was that “your life would be the life, not of a man, but of an oyster” (Philebus 21a). Similarly, on J.S. Mill's account of him at least (Mill: ch. 2), Carlyle held that hedonism is a “doctrine worthy only of swine”.
Nozick (1971) and Nagel (1970) present schematic descriptions of lives that have all the appearance but none of the reality of self-understanding, achievement, loving relationships, self-directedness, and so on, alongside lives that have these appearances and also the corresponding realities. On the face of it, hedonism is committed to the hedonic equality and thus the equal value of these lives. Commenting on his more fantastical and more famous ‘experience machine’ case, Nozick added further detail, claiming that it is also good in itself “to do certain things, and not just have the experience [as if] of doing them”, “to be a certain way, to be a certain sort of person” and not just to be an “indeterminate blob” floating in a tank, and “to make a difference in the world” rather than merely to appear to oneself to do so. He concluded: “something matters to us in addition to experience” (Nozick 1974: 43–44).
Consider further the idea that actually having certain relationships with oneself (e.g., relations of self-understanding) and with others (e.g., mutual relations of interpersonal love) matters, in addition to the value of any experience one has that is just as if one has such relationships. The thought here is that the motto ‘also connect’ expresses something important, even if novelist E.M. Forster's more ambitious ‘only connect’ (Forster: ch. 33) was an exaggeration.
In a famous case description, Moore argued that a world with beauty but without its contemplation, and indeed without any mental states whatever, is better than a world that is “simply one heap of filth” (Moore: sec. 50; contrast Sidgwick: 114). If Moore is right about this ‘beauty and the filth’ case, then pleasure is not necessary for value.
W.D. Ross (138) considered two worlds that are equals both hedonically and in character terms. In one world, the virtuous have the pleasure and the vicious have the pain, while in the other the vicious have the pleasure and the virtuous have the pain. To help secure across all plausible accounts of the nature of pleasure the ‘equality of pleasure’ that is central to this case comparison, suppose that in each world the same pleasures are taken in the same objects. Pleasure is equal across these two worlds, but Ross argues that the well-matched world is better than the mis-matched world. If he is right, then this is a case of ‘same pleasure, different value’, and thereby also a case in which difference of pleasure is not necessary for difference of value.
Imagining oneself to have a hedonically perfect life, a non-necessity objector is apt to respond along the lines of the popular Paul Jabara / Jo Asher song: ‘Something's missing in my life’. One way to fill out the detail is with some variant of that song's second premise: ‘Baby it's you’. The objectors' claim is that there is something that is sufficient for value and that is missing from the life of perfect pleasure. If the objection stands then pleasure is not necessary for value.
There is a range of possible hedonist responses to non-necessity objections. One reply is that the allegedly non-hedonic item on which the objector focuses just is an instance of pleasure, so its being valuable is just what a hedonist would expect. A related reply is that the item to which the objector points is sufficient for value only insofar as it is an instance of pleasure, so the thesis that pleasure is necessary for value again remains unscathed. Responses of these sorts are relatively easy for hedonists to make; but it is less easy to show anyone who is not already a hedonist that these replies provide grounds for taking the hedonist side of the arguments. A third reply hedonists might make to non-necessity objections is to allow that the item in question is or includes non-pleasure that has value, but then to argue that this is merely instrumental value. A fourth and more concessive reply is that the item in question might be a non-pleasure and might be sufficient for non-instrumental value of some sort (e.g., moral value), but to add that there is also at least one sort of value (e.g., prudential value) for which pleasure is necessary. For example, it might be claimed that self-sacrifice that protects the non-sentient environment has non-hedonic moral value but lacks prudential value for the agent. An option that is yet more concessive is for hedonists is to agree that pleasure is not necessary for value or that displeasure is not necessary for disvalue or both of these things, but to continue to insist that pleasure is sufficient for value or that displeasure is sufficient for disvalue or both of these things.
2.3.2 Insufficiency Objections
As noted above, the simplest form of ethical hedonism is the claim that all and only pleasure is good non-instrumentally and all and only pain or displeasure is bad non-instrumentally. The insufficiency objection rejects the ethical hedonist claim that all pleasure is good, or that all displeasure is bad, or both claims. Its contrary thesis is that pleasure is insufficient for good, and/or that displeasure is insufficient for bad; some pleasure has no value, and/or some displeasure has no disvalue. Any pair of cases that are value equals but hedonic unequals would deliver what the insufficiency objector seeks.
Various insufficiency objections are outlined below. Each aims to show that some pleasure is worthless or worse and is thus insufficient for good or value. Some focus on the bad as cause of pleasure, others on the bad as object of pleasure. A third possible focus is on pleasure understood as a property of something bad such as a sadistic thought or act, rather than as an effect of something bad.
Aristotle (Book x, ch. 3) argued that some pleasure is disgraceful or base. Brentano (1889/1969: 90) argued that “pleasure in the bad” both lacks value and has disvalue. Moore (sec. 56) expressed similar thoughts in a bracingly concrete manner by imagining the pleasures of “perpetual indulgence in bestiality” and claiming them to be not good but bad. Self-destructive or masochistic pleasure, pleasure with a non-existent or false object, and contra-deserved pleasure are some other targets of insufficiency objections to hedonism about value.
Hedonists can respond in various ways to insufficiency objections. These are canvassed below.
One sort of hedonist response to an insufficiency objection is to accept that the objector's case is an instance of pleasure, but then to claim that it is sufficient for value. This response is underpinned by insistence on the wider thought that any pleasure is sufficient for value. Consistent with this, but rather concessively, it could also be claimed that pleasure is sufficient for only very little value, and that substantial or major value is present only if further conditions are met. Such further conditions might concern the extent to which the pleasure is ‘higher’ rather than ‘lower’, whether its object exists, or whether its object merits pleasure. Feldman (2004) has formulated and sympathetically examined several views that have this sort of structure, including Altitude-Adjusted, Truth-Adjusted, and Desert-Adjusted forms of Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism.
A second hedonist response is to accept that the insufficiency objector has indeed found a case that is insufficient for value, but then to claim that it is not an instance of pleasure. This sort of response is underpinned by the hedonist's insistence on the wider thought that anything insufficient for value is not pleasure.
A third hedonist response is somewhat concessive. It distinguishes at least two basic kinds of value, and continues to insist that pleasure is sufficient for one of these, while also accepting the objector's thesis that there is at least one other sort of value for which pleasure is not sufficient. One instance of this response is the claim that sadistic pleasure adds prudential value for the sadist but also lacks moral value and indeed has moral disvalue. But such a move is more awkward in other cases, including those of pleasure that is self-destructive or masochistic.
A fourth hedonist response is concessive. It abandons altogether the thesis that pleasure is sufficient for value, while also continuing to insist that pleasure is necessary for value. Consistent with this response, one could claim that pleasure is conditionally valuable; that is, sufficient for value when and only when certain further conditions are met. These conditions could be specified either negatively (e.g., pleasure is valuable only when it does not arise from and is not directed at a bad deed or character state or state of affairs), or positively (e.g., pleasure is valuable only when its object exists, or only when its object is deserving of it). Modified forms of Altitude-Adjusted, Truth-Adjusted, and Desert-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism would have this structure (see Feldman 2004).
The critical discussion of Section 2 above has supplemented the Section 1 consideration of psychological hedonism, by examining arguments both for and against ethical hedonism. On one influential view that John Rawls attributes to Henry Sidgwick, justification in ethics ideally proceeds against “standards of reasoned justification… carefully formulated”, and “satisfactory justification of any particular moral conception must proceed from a full knowledge and systematic comparison of the more significant conceptions in the philosophical tradition” (editor's ‘Foreword’ to Sidgwick). This entry has not attempted any such systematic comparative examination of psychological hedonism or ethical hedonism against its main rivals.
Both psychological hedonism and ethical hedonism remain worthy of serious philosophical attention. Each also has broader philosophical significance, especially but not only in utilitarian and egoist traditions of ethical thought, and in empiricist and scientific naturalist philosophical traditions.
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- Smart, J.J.C. (1973), ‘Outline of a system of utilitarian ethics’, in Jack Smart and Bernard Williams, Utilitarianism: For and Against, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Sobel, D. ‘Pleasure as a Mental State’, Utilitas, 11(2): 230–234.
- Sprigge, T.L.S. (1988), The Rational Foundations of Ethics, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Henry Sidgwick's The Methods of Ethics by Alex Scott.
- What Does Nozick's Experience Machine Argument Really Prove? by Eduardo Rivera-López (University of Buenos Aires).
- The Cyrenaics and the Origin of Hedonism, on hedonism, introduced through key figures in the history of philosophy.
- “Hedonism”, by Daniel Weijers in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.