Qualia

First published Wed Aug 20, 1997; substantive revision Mon Apr 22, 2013

Feelings and experiences vary widely. For example, I run my fingers over sandpaper, smell a skunk, feel a sharp pain in my finger, seem to see bright purple, become extremely angry. In each of these cases, I am the subject of a mental state with a very distinctive subjective character. There is something it is like for me to undergo each state, some phenomenology that it has. Philosophers often use the term ‘qualia’ (singular ‘quale’) to refer to the introspectively accessible, phenomenal aspects of our mental lives. In this broad sense of the term, it is difficult to deny that there are qualia. Disagreement typically centers on which mental states have qualia, whether qualia are intrinsic qualities of their bearers, and how qualia relate to the physical world both inside and outside the head. The status of qualia is hotly debated in philosophy largely because it is central to a proper understanding of the nature of consciousness. Qualia are at the very heart of the mind-body problem.

The entry that follows is divided into ten sections. The first distinguishes various uses of the term ‘qualia’. The second addresses the question of which mental states have qualia. The third section brings out some of the main arguments for the view that qualia are irreducible and non-physical. The remaining sections focus on functionalism and qualia, the explanatory gap, qualia and introspection, representational theories of qualia, qualia as intrinsic, nonrepresentational properties, relational theories of qualia and finally the issue of qualia and simple minds.

1. Uses of the Term ‘Qualia’

(1) Qualia as phenomenal character. Consider your visual experience as you stare at a bright turquoise color patch in a paint store. There is something it is like for you subjectively to undergo that experience. What it is like to undergo the experience is very different from what it is like for you to experience a dull brown color patch. This difference is a difference in what is often called ‘phenomenal character’. The phenomenal character of an experience is what it is like subjectively to undergo the experience. If you are told to focus your attention upon the phenomenal character of your experience, you will find that in doing so you are aware of certain qualities. These qualities — ones that are accessible to you when you introspect and that together make up the phenomenal character of the experience are sometimes called ‘qualia’.

There are more restricted uses of the term ‘qualia’, however.

(2) Qualia as properties of sense data. Consider a painting of a dalmatian. Viewers of the painting can apprehend not only its content (i.e., its representing a dalmatian) but also the colors, shapes, and spatial relations obtaining among the blobs of paint on the canvas. It has sometimes been supposed that being aware or conscious of a visual experience is like viewing an inner, non-physical picture or sense-datum. So, for example, on this conception, if I see a dalmatian, I am subject to a mental picture-like representation of a dalmatian (a sense-datum), introspection of which reveals to me both its content and its intrinsic, non-representationational features (counterparts to the visual features of the blobs of paint on the canvas). These intrinsic, non-representational features have been taken by advocates of the sense-datum theory to be the sole determinants of what it is like for me to have the experience. In a second, more restricted sense of the term ‘qualia’, then, qualia are intrinsic, consciously accessible, non-representational features of sense-data and other non-physical phenomenal objects that are responsible for their phenomenal character. Historically, this is how the term ‘qualia’ was first used in philosophy. It was introduced in 1929 by C.I. Lewis in a discussion of the sense-datum theory. As Lewis used the term, qualia were properties of sense-data themselves.

(3) Qualia as intrinsic non-representational properties. There is another established sense of the term ‘qualia’, which is similar to the one just given but which does not demand of qualia advocates that they endorse the sense-datum theory. However sensory experiences are ultimately analyzed — whether, for example, they are taken to involve relations to sensory objects or they are identified with neural events or they are held to be physically irreducible events — many philosophers suppose that they have intrinsic, consciously accessible features that are non-representational and that are solely responsible for their phenomenal character. These features, whatever their ultimate nature, physical or non-physical, are often dubbed ‘qualia’.

In the case of visual experiences, for example, it is frequently supposed that there is a range of visual qualia, where these are taken to be intrinsic features of visual experiences that (a) are accessible to introspection, (b) can vary without any variation in the representational contents of the experiences, (c) are mental counterparts to some directly visible properties of objects (e.g., color), and (d) are the sole determinants of the phenomenal character of the experiences. This usage of ‘qualia’ has become perhaps the most common one in recent years. Philosophers who hold or have held that there are qualia, in this sense of the term, include, for example, Nagel (1974), Peacocke (1983) and Block (1990).

(4) Qualia as intrinsic, nonphysical, ineffable properties. Some philosophers (e.g, Dennett 1987, 1991) use the term ‘qualia’ in a still more restricted way so that qualia are intrinsic properties of experiences that are also ineffable, nonphysical, and ‘given’ to their subjects incorrigibly (without the possibility of error). Philosophers who deny that there are qualia sometimes have in mind qualia as the term is used in this more restricted sense (or a similar one). It is also worth mentioning that sometimes the term ‘qualia’ is restricted to sensory experiences by definition, while on other occasions it is allowed that if thoughts and other such cognitive states have phenomenal character, then they also have qualia. Thus, announcements by philosophers who declare themselves opposed to qualia need to be treated with some caution. One can agree that there are no qualia in the last three senses I have explained, while still endorsing qualia in the standard first sense.

In the rest of this entry, we use the term ‘qualia’ in the very broad way I did at the beginning of the entry. So, we take it for granted that there are qualia. Later on, in section 8, we discuss specifically the view of qualia as intrinsic, nonrepresentational properties.

2. Which Mental States Possess Qualia?

The following would certainly be included on my own list. (1) Perceptual experiences, for example, experiences of the sort involved in seeing green, hearing loud trumpets, tasting liquorice, smelling the sea air, handling a piece of fur. (2) Bodily sensations, for example, feeling a twinge of pain, feeling an itch, feeling hungry, having a stomach ache, feeling hot, feeling dizzy. Think here also of experiences such as those present during orgasm or while running flat-out. (3) Felt reactions or passions or emotions, for example, feeling delight, lust, fear, love, feeling grief, jealousy, regret. (4) Felt moods, for example, feeling elated, depressed, calm, bored, tense, miserable. (For more here, see Haugeland 1985, pp. 230–235).

Should we include any other mental states on the list? Galen Strawson has claimed (1994) that there are such things as the experience of understanding a sentence, the experience of suddenly thinking of something, of suddenly remembering something, and so on. Moreover, in his view, experiences of these sorts are not reducible to associated sensory experiences and/or images. Strawson's position here seems to be that thought-experience is a distinctive experience in its own right. He says, for example: “Each sensory modality is an experiential modality, and thought experience (in which understanding-experience may be included) is an experiential modality to be reckoned alongside the other experiential modalities” (p. 196). On Strawson's view, then, some thoughts have qualia. (This is also the position of Horgan and Tienson (2002).)

This view is controversial. One response is to claim that the phenomenal aspects of understanding derive largely from linguistic (or verbal) images, which have the phonological and syntactic structure of items in the subject's native language. These images frequently even come complete with details of stress and intonation. As we read, it is sometimes phenomenally as if we are speaking to ourselves. (Likewise when we consciously think about something without reading). We often “hear” an inner voice. Depending upon the content of the passage, we may also undergo a variety of emotions and feelings. We may feel tense, bored, excited, uneasy, angry. Once all these reactions are removed, together with the images of an inner voice and the visual sensations produced by reading, some would say (myself included) that no phenomenology remains.

In any event, images and sensations of the above sorts are not always present in thought. They are not essential to thought. Consider, for example, the thoughts involved in everyday visual recognition (or the thoughts of creatures without a natural language).

What about desires, for example, my desire for a week's holiday in Venice? It is certainly true that in some cases, there is an associated phenomenal character. Often when we strongly desire something, we experience a feeling of being “pulled” or “tugged”. There may also be accompanying images in various modalities.

Should we include such propositional attitudes as feeling angry that the house has been burgled or seeing that the computer is missing on the list? These seem best treated as hybrid or complex states, one component of which is essentially a phenomenal state and the other (a judgment or belief) is not. Thus, in both cases, there is a constituent experience that is the real bearer of the relevant quale or qualia.

3. Are Qualia Irreducible, Non-Physical Entities?

The literature on qualia is filled with thought-experiments of one sort or another. Perhaps the most famous of these is the case of Mary, the brilliant color scientist. Mary, so the story goes (Jackson 1982), is imprisoned in a black and white room. Never having been permitted to leave it, she acquires information about the world outside from the black and white books her captors have made available to her, from the black and white television sets attached to external cameras, and from the black and white monitor screens hooked up to banks of computers. As time passes, Mary acquires more and more information about the physical aspects of color and color vision. (For a real life case of a visual scientist (Knut Nordby) who is an achromotope, see Sacks 1996, Chapter 1.) Eventually, Mary becomes the world's leading authority on these matters. Indeed she comes to know all the physical facts pertinent to everyday colors and color vision.

Still, she wonders to herself: What do people in the outside world experience when they see the various colors? What is it like for them to see red or green? One day her captors release her. She is free at last to see things with their real colors (and free too to scrub off the awful black and white paint that covers her body). She steps outside her room into a garden full of flowers. “So, that is what it is like to experience red,” she exclaims, as she sees a red rose. “And that,” she adds, looking down at the grass, “is what it is like to experience green.”

Mary here seems to make some important discoveries. She seems to find out things she did not know before. How can that be, if, as seems possible, at least in principle, she has all the physical information there is to have about color and color vision — if she knows all the pertinent physical facts?

One possible explanation is that that there is a realm of subjective, phenomenal qualities associated with color, qualities the intrinsic nature of which Mary comes to discover upon her release, as she herself undergoes the various new color experiences. Before she left her room, she only knew the objective, physical basis of those subjective qualities, their causes and effects, and various relations of similarity and difference. She had no knowledge of the subjective qualities in themselves.

This explanation is not available to the physicalist. If what it is like for someone to experience red is one and the same as some physical quality, then Mary already knows that while in her room. Likewise, for experiences of the other colors. For Mary knows all the pertinent physical facts. What, then, can the physicalist say?

Some physicalists respond that knowing what it is like is know-how and nothing more. Mary acquires certain abilities, specifically in the case of red, the ability to recognize red things by sight alone, the ability to imagine a red expanse, the ability to remember the experience of red. She does not come to know any new information, any new facts about color, any new qualities. This is the view of David Lewis (1990) and Lawrence Nemirow (1990).

The Ability Hypothesis, as it is often called, is more resilient than many philosophers suppose (see Tye 2000, Chapter One). But it has difficulty in properly accounting for our knowledge of what it is like to undergo experiences of determinate hues while we are undergoing them. For example, I can know what it is like to experience red-17, as I stare at a rose of that color. Of course, I don't know the hue as red-17. My conception of it is likely just that shade of red. But I certainly know what it is like to experience the hue while it is present. Unfortunately, I lack the abilities Lewis cites and so does Mary even after she leaves her cell. She is not able to recognize things that are red-17 as red-17 by sight. Given the way human memory works and the limitations on it, she lacks the concept red-17. She has no mental template that is sufficiently fine-grained to permit her to identify the experience of red-17 when it comes again. Presented with two items, one red-17 and the other red-18, in a series of tests, she cannot say with any accuracy which experience her earlier experience of the rose matches. Sometimes she picks one; at other times she picks the other. Nor is she able afterwards to imagine things as having hue, red-17, or as having that very shade of red the rose had; and for precisely the same reason.

The Ability Hypothesis appears to be in trouble. An alternative physicalist proposal is that Mary in her room lacks certain phenomenal concepts, certain ways of thinking about or mentally representing color experiences and colors. Once she leaves the room, she acquires these new modes of thought as she experiences the various colors. Even so, the qualities the new concepts pick out are ones she knew in a different way in her room, for they are physical or functional qualities like all others.

One problem this approach faces is that it seems to imply that Mary does not really make a new discovery when she says, “So, that is what it is like to experience red.” Upon reflection, however, it is far from obvious that this is really a consequence. For it is widely accepted that concepts or modes of presentation are involved in the individuation of thought-contents, given one sense of the term ‘content’ — the sense in which thought-content is whatever information that-clauses provide that suffices for the purposes of even the most demanding rationalizing explanation. In this sense, what I think, when I think that Cicero was an orator, is not what I think when I think that Tully was an orator. This is precisely why it is possible to discover that Cicero is Tully. The thought that Cicero was an orator differs from the thought that Tully was an orator not at the level of truth-conditions — the same singular proposition is partly constitutive of the content of both — but at the level of concepts or mode of presentation. The one thought exercises the concept Cicero; the other the concept Tully. The concepts have the same reference, but they present the referent in different ways and thus the two thoughts can play different roles in rationalizing explanation.

It appears then that there is no difficulty in holding both that Mary comes to know some new things upon her release, while already knowing all the pertinent real-world physical facts, even though the new experiences she undergoes and their introspectible qualities are wholly physical. In an ordinary, everyday sense, Mary's knowledge increases. And that, it may be contended, is all the physicalist needs to answer the Knowledge Argument. (The term ‘fact’, it should be mentioned, is itself ambiguous. Sometimes it is used to pick out real-world states of affairs alone; sometimes it is used for such states of affairs under certain conceptualizations. When we speak of the physical facts above, we should be taken to refer either to physical states of affairs alone or to those states of affairs under purely physical conceptualizations. For more on ‘fact’, see Tye 1995.)

Some philosophers insist that the difference between the old and the new concepts in this case is such that there must be a difference in the world between the properties these concepts stand for or denote (Jackson 1993, Chalmers 1996). Some of these properties Mary knew in her cell; others she becomes cognizant of only upon her release. This is necessary for Mary to make a real discovery: she must come to associate with the experience of red new qualities she did not associate with it in her room. The physicalist is committed to denying this claim; for the new qualities would have to be non-physical.

The issues here are complex. What the physicalist really needs to settle the issue is a theory of phenomenal concepts (a theory, that is, of the allegedly special concepts that are deployed from the first person point of view when we recognize our experiences as being of such-and-such subjective types) which is itself compatible with physicalism. There are proposals on offer (see, for example, Hill 1991, Loar 1990, Levine 2000, Sturgeon 2000, Perry 2001, Papineau 2002, Tye, 2003), but there is as yet no agreement as to the form such a theory should take, and some philosophers contend that a proper theory of phenomenal concepts shows that no satisfactory answer can be given by the physicalist to the example of Mary's Room (Chalmers 1999). Another possibility is that the very idea of a phenomenal concept, conceived of as a concept very different in how it functions from concepts applied elsewhere, is itself confused. On this view, physicalists who have appealed to phenomenal concepts to handle the example of Mary's Room have been barking up the wrong tree (Tye 2009).

Another famous anti-reductionist thought-experiment concerning qualia appeals to the possibility of zombies. A philosophical zombie is a molecule by molecule duplicate of a sentient creature, a normal human-being, for example, but who differs from that creature in lacking any phenomenal consciousness. For me, as I lie on the beach, happily drinking some wine and watching the waves, I undergo a variety of visual, olfactory, and gustatory experiences. But my zombie twin experiences nothing at all. He has no phenomenal consciousness. Since my twin is an exact physical duplicate of me, his inner psychological states will be functionally isomorphic with my own (assuming he is located in an identical environment). Whatever physical stimulus is applied, he will process the stimulus in the same way as I do, and produce exactly the same behavioral responses. Indeed, on the assumption that non-phenomenal psychological states are functional states (that is, states definable in terms of their role or function in mediating between stimuli and behavior), my zombie twin has just the same beliefs, thoughts, and desires as I do. He differs from me only with respect to experience. For him, there is nothing it is like to stare at the waves or to sip wine.

The hypothesis that there can be philosophical zombies is not normally the hypothesis that such zombies are nomically possible, that their existence is consistent with the actual laws of nature. Rather the suggestion is that zombie replicas of this sort are at least imaginable and hence metaphysically possible.

Philosophical zombies pose a serious threat to any sort of physicalist view of qualia. To begin with, if zombie replicas are metaphysically possible, then there is a simple argument that seems to show that phenomenal states are not identical with internal, objective, physical states. Suppose objective, physical state P can occur without phenomenal state S in some appropriate zombie replica (in the metaphysical sense of ‘can’ noted above). Intuitively S cannot occur without S. Pain, for example, cannot be felt without pain. So, P has a modal property S lacks, namely the property of possibly occurring without S. So, by Leibniz’ Law (the law that for anything x and for anything y, if x is identical with y then x and y share all the same properties), S is not identical with P.

Secondly, if a person microphysically identical with me, located in an identical environment (both present and past), can lack any phenomenal experiences, then facts pertaining to experience and feeling, facts about qualia, are not necessarily fixed or determined by the objective microphysical facts. And this the physicalist cannot allow, even if she concedes that phenomenally conscious states are not strictly identical with internal, objective, physical states. For the physicalist, whatever her stripe, must at least believe that the microphysical facts determine all the facts, that any world that was exactly like ours in all microphysical respects (down to the smallest detail, to the position of every single boson, for example) would have to be like our world in all respects (having identical mountains, lakes, glaciers, trees, rocks, sentient creatures, cities, and so on).

One well-known physicalist reply to the case of zombies (Loar 1990) is to grant that they are conceptually possible, or at least that there is no obvious contradiction in the idea of a zombie, while denying that zombies are metaphysically possible. Since the anti-physicalist argument requires metaphysical possibility — mere conceptual possibility will not suffice — it now collapses. That conceptual possibility is too weak for the anti-physicalist's purposes (at least without further qualification and argument) is shown by the fact that it is conceptually possible that I am not Michael Tye (that I am an impostor or someone misinformed about his past) even though, given the actual facts, it is metaphysically impossible.

4. Functionalism and Qualia

Functionalism is the view that individual qualia have functional natures, that the phenomenal character of, e.g., pain is one and the same as the property of playing such-and-such a causal or teleofunctional role in mediating between physical inputs (e.g., body damage) and physical outputs (e.g., withdrawal behavior). On this view (Lycan 1987), qualia are multiply physically realizable. Inner states that are physically very different may nonetheless feel the same. What is crucial to what it is like is functional role, not underlying hardware.

There are two famous objections to functionalist theories of qualia: the Inverted Spectrum and the Absent Qualia Hypothesis. The first move in the former objection consists in claiming that you might see red when I see green and vice-versa; likewise for the other colors so that our color experiences are phenomenally inverted. This does not suffice to create trouble for the functionalist yet. For you and I are surely representationally different here: for example, you have a visual experience that represents red when I have one that represents green. And that representational difference brings with it a difference in our patterns of causal interactions with external things (and thereby a functional difference).

This reply can be handled by the advocate of inverted qualia by switching to a case in which we both have visual experiences with the same representational contents on the same occasions while still differing phenomenally. Whether such cases are really metaphysically possible is open to dispute, however. Certainly, those philosophers who are representationalists about qualia (see Section 7) would deny their possibility. Indeed, it is not even clear that such cases are conceptually possible (Harrison 1973, Hardin 1993, Tye 1995). But leaving this to one side, it is far from obvious that there would not have to be some salient fine-grained functional differences between us, notwithstanding our gross functional identity.

Consider a computational example. For any two numerical inputs, M and N, a given computer always produces as outputs the product of M and N. There is a second computer that does exactly the same thing. In this way, they are functionally identical. Does it follow that they are running exactly the same program? Of course, not! There are all sorts of programs that will multiply together two numbers. These programs can differ dramatically. At one gross level the machines are functionally identical, but at lower levels the machines can be functionally different.

In the case of you and me, then, the opponent of inverted qualia can claim that, even if we are functionally identical at a coarse level — we both call red things ‘red’, we both believe that those things are red on the basis of our experiences, we both are caused to undergo such experiences by viewing red things, etc. — there are necessarily fine-grained differences in our internal functional organization. And that is why our experiences are phenomenally different.

Some philosophers will no doubt respond that it is still imaginable that you and I are functionally identical in all relevant respects yet phenomenally different. But this claim presents a problem at least for those philosophers who oppose functionalism but who accept physicalism. For it is just as easy to imagine that there are inverted qualia in molecule-by-molecule duplicates (in the same external, physical settings) as it is to imagine inverted qualia in functional duplicates. If the former duplicates are really metaphysically impossible, as the physicalist is committed to claiming, why not the latter? Some further convincing argument needs to be given that the two cases are disanalogous. As yet, to my mind, no such argument has been presented. (Of course, this response does not apply to those philosophers who take the view that qualia are irreducible, non-physical entities. However, these philosophers have other severe problems of their own. In particular, they face the problem of phenomenal causation. Given the causal closure of the physical, how can qualia make any difference? For more here, see Tye 1995, Chalmers 1996).

The absent qualia hypothesis is the hypothesis that functional duplicates of sentient creatures are possible, duplicates that entirely lack qualia. For example, one writer (Block 1980) asks us to suppose that a billion Chinese people are each given a two-way radio with which to communicate with one another and with an artificial (brainless) body. The movements of the body are controlled by the radio signals, and the signals themselves are made in accordance with instructions the Chinese people receive from a vast display in the sky which is visible to all of them. The instructions are such that the participating Chinese people function like individual neurons, and the radio links like synapses, so that together the Chinese people duplicate the causal organization of a human brain. Whether or not this system, if it were ever actualized, would actually undergo any feelings and experiences, it seems coherent to suppose that it might not. But if this is a real metaphysical possibility, then qualia do not have functional essences.

One standard functionalist reply to cases like the China-body system is to bite the bullet and to argue that however strange it seems, the China-body system could not fail to undergo qualia. The oddness of this view derives, according to some functionalists (Lycan 1987), from our relative size. We are each so much smaller than the China-body system that we fail to see the forest for the trees. Just as a creature the size of a neuron trapped inside a human head might well be wrongly convinced that there could not be consciousness there, so we too draw the wrong conclusion as we contemplate the China-body system. It has also been argued (e.g., by Shoemaker 1975) that any system that was a full functional duplicate of one of us would have to be subject to all the same beliefs, including beliefs about its own internal states. Thus the China-Body system would have to believe that it experiences pain; and if it had beliefs of this sort, then it could not fail to be the subject of some experiences (and hence some states with phenomenal character). If this reply is successful (for an updated version of this reply and a new related thought experiment, see Tye 2006), what it shows is that the property of having some phenomenal character or other has a functional essence. But it does not show that individual qualia are functional in nature. Thus one could accept that absent qualia are impossible while also holding that inverted spectra are possible (see, e.g., Shoemaker 1975).

5. Qualia and the Explanatory Gap

Our grasp of what it is like to undergo phenomenal states is supplied to us by introspection. We also have an admittedly incomplete grasp of what goes on objectively in the brain and the body. But there is, it seems, a vast chasm between the two. It is very hard to see how this chasm in our understanding could ever be bridged. For no matter how deeply we probe into the physical structure of neurons and the chemical transactions which occur when they fire, no matter how much objective information we come to acquire, we still seem to be left with something that we cannot explain, namely, why and how such-and-such objective, physical changes, whatever they might be, generate so-and-so subjective feeling, or any subjective feeling at all.

This is the famous “explanatory gap” for qualia (Levine 1983, 2000). Some say that the explanatory gap is unbridgeable and that the proper conclusion to draw from it is that there is a corresponding gap in the world. Experiences and feelings have irreducibly subjective, non-physical qualities (Jackson 1993; Chalmers 1996, 2005). Others take essentially the same position on the gap while insisting that this does not detract from a purely physicalist view of experiences and feelings. What it shows rather is that some physical qualities or states are irreducibly subjective entities (Searle 1992). Others hold that the explanatory gap may one day be bridged but we currently lack the concepts to bring the subjective and objective perspectives together. On this view, it may turn out that qualia are physical, but we currently have no clear conception as to how they could be (Nagel 1974). Still others adamantly insist that the explanatory gap is, in principle, bridgeable but not by us or by any creatures like us. Experiences and feelings are as much a part of the physical, natural world as life, digestion, DNA, or lightning. It is just that with the concepts we have and the concepts we are capable of forming, we are cognitively closed to a full, bridging explanation by the very structure of our minds (McGinn 1991).

Another view that has been gaining adherents of late is that there is a real, unbridgeable gap, but it has no consequences for the nature of consciousness and physicalist or functionalist theories thereof. On this view, there is nothing in the gap that should lead us to any bifurcation in the world between experiences and feelings on the one hand and physical or functional phenomena on the other. There aren't two sorts of natural phenomena: the irreducibly subjective and the objective. The explanatory gap derives from the special character of phenomenal concepts. These concepts mislead us into thinking that the gap is deeper and more troublesome than it really is.

On one version of this view, phenomenal concepts are just indexical concepts applied to phenomenal states via introspection (see Lycan 1996). On an alternative version of the view, phenomenal concepts are very special, first-person concepts different in kind from all others (see Tye 2003). This response to the explanatory gap obviously bears affinities to the second physicalist response sketched in Section 3 to the Knowledge Argument. Unfortunately, if the appeal to phenomenal concepts by the physicalist is misguided, then it cannot be used to handle the gap.

There is no general agreement on how the gap is generated and what it shows.

6. Qualia and Introspection

In the past, philosophers have often appealed directly to introspection on behalf of the view that qualia are intrinsic, non-intentional features of experiences. Recently, a number of philosophers have claimed that introspection reveals no such qualities (Harman 1990, Dretske 1995, Tye 1995, 2000). Suppose you are facing a white wall, on which you see a bright red, round patch of paint. Suppose you are attending closely to the color and shape of the patch as well as the background. Now turn your attention from what you see out there in the world before you to your visual experience. Focus upon your awareness of the patch as opposed to the patch of which you are aware. Do you find yourself suddenly acquainted with new qualities, qualities that are intrinsic to your visual experience in the way that redness and roundness are qualities intrinsic to the patch of paint? According to some philosophers, the answer to this question is a resounding ‘No’. As you look at the patch, you are aware of certain features out there in the world. When you turn your attention inwards to your experience of those features, you are aware that you are having an experience of a certain sort but you aware of the very same features; no new features of your experience are revealed. In this way, your visual experience is transparent or diaphanous. When you try to examine it, you see right through it, as it were, to the qualities you were experiencing all along in being a subject of the experience, qualities your experience is of.

This point holds good, according to the philosophers above, even if you are hallucinating and there is no real patch of paint on the wall before you. Still you have an experience of there being a patch of paint out there with a certain color and shape. It's just that this time your experience is a misrepresentation. And if you turn your attention inwards to your experience, you will ‘see’ right through it again to those very same qualities.

These observations suggest that qualia, conceived of as the immediately ‘felt’ qualities of experiences of which we are cognizant when we attend to them introspectively, do not really exist. The qualities of which we are aware are not qualities of experiences at all, but rather qualities that, if they are qualities of anything, are qualities of things in the world (as in the case of perceptual experiences) or of regions of our bodies (as in the case of bodily sensations). This is not to say that experiences do not have qualia. The point is that qualia are not qualities of experiences. This claim, which will be developed further in the next section, is controversial and some philosophers deny outright the thesis of transparency with respect to qualia (see Block 1991, 2000; Stoljar 2004; Nida-Rümelin 2007). According to Block, for example, qualia are not presented to us in introspection as intrinsic, non-intentional properties of our experiences. Still it does not follow from this that we are not introspectively acquainted with such properties. For we do know on the basis of introspection what it is like to undergo a visual experience of blue, say. So, if what a state is like is a matter of which intrinsic, non-intentional properties it tokens, then obviously we are introspectively aware of properties of this sort (in the de re sense of ‘of’). On this view, whether qualia are properties of experiences (in particular, intrinsic, non-intentional properties) is a theoretical matter. Introspection does not settle the matter one way or the other.

7. Representational Theories of Qualia

Talk of the ways things look and feel is intensional. If I have a red after-image as a result of a flashbulb going off, the spot I ‘see’ in front of the photographer's face looks red, even though there is no such spot. If I live in a world in which all and only things that are purple are poisonous, it is still the case that an object that looks purple to me does not thereby look poisonous (in the phenomenal sense of ‘looks’). If I feel a pain in a leg, I need not even have a leg. My pain might be a pain in a phantom limb. Facts such as these have been taken to provide further support for the contention that some sort of representational account is appropriate for qualia.

If qualia are not qualities of experiences, as some philosophers maintain on the basis of an appeal to introspection, and the only qualities revealed in introspection are qualities represented by experiences (qualities that, in the perceptual case, if they belong to anything, belong to external things), a natural representational proposal is that qualia are really representational contents of experiences into which the represented qualities enter. This would also explain why we talk of experiences *having* qualia or *having* a phenomenal character. For the representational content of an experience is something the experience has; just as meaning is something a word has. Moreover, just as the meaning of a word is not a quality the word possesses, so the phenomenal character of an experience is not a quality the experience possesses.

If qualia are representational contents, just which contents are these? Obviously there can be differences in the representational contents of experiences without any phenomenal difference. If you and I see a telescope from the same viewing angle, for example, then even if I do not recognize it as a telescope and you do (so that our experiences differ representationally at this level), the way the telescope looks to both of us is likely pretty much the same (in the phenomenal sense of ‘looks’). Likewise, if a child is viewing the same item from the same vantage point, her experience will likely be pretty similar to yours and mine too. Phenomenally, our experiences are all very much alike, notwithstanding certain higher-level representational differences. This, according to some representationalists, is because we all have experiences that represent to us the same 3-D surfaces, edges, colors, and surface-shapes plus a myriad of other surface details.

The representation we share here has a content much like that of the 2 1/2-D sketch posited by David Marr in his famous theory of vision (1982) to which further shape and color information has been appended (for details, see Tye 1995). This content is plausibly viewed as nonconceptual. It forms the output of the early, largely modular sensory processing and the input to one or another system of higher-level cognitive processing. Representationalists sometimes claim that it is here at this level of content that qualia are to be found (see Dretske 1995, Tye 1995, 2000; for an opposing representational view, see McDowell 1994).

One worry for this view is that if qualia are to be handled in terms of representational content, then there had better be a content that is shared by veridical visual experiences and their hallucinatory counterparts. Disjunctivists have disputed the supposition that there is a common content (see, e.g., Hinton 1973, Martin 1997, Snowdon 1990). Perhaps veridical experiences have only singular contents and hallucinatory experiences have gappy contents or no content at all (for an extended discussion of visual experience and content, see Pautz 2010, Siegel 2011).

An alternative possibility is that qualia are properties represented by experiences. On this view, there need be no common content shared by veridical experiences and their hallucinatory counterparts. It suffices that the same properties be represented. Of course, such a view requires that a further account be provided of what it is that makes a property represented by an experience a quale.

Some philosophers try to ground qualia in modes of representation deployed by experiences within their representational contents. On one version of this view, visual experiences not only represent the external world but also represent themselves (for a recent collection of essays elaboarating this view, see Kriegel and Williford 2006). For example, my current visual experience of a red object not only represents the object as red (this is my focal awareness) but also represents itself as red (this is normally a kind of peripheral awareness I have of my experience). When I introspect, the experience alone provides me with awareness of itself — no higher order thought is necessary. What the experience is like for me is supposedly its redness, where this is a mode of representation my experience uses to represent real world redness.

This view is incompatible with the phenomenon of transparency (see section 6) and it is very close to the classic qualiaphile view, according to which when the subject introspects, she is aware of the token experience and its phenomenal properties. The new twist is that this awareness uses the token experience itself and one of its contents.

Representationalists about qualia are often also externalists about representational content (but not always — see, for example, Chalmers 2004). On this view, what a given experience represents is metaphysically determined at least, in part, by factors in the external environment. Thus, it is usually held, microphysical twins can differ with respect to the representational contents of their experiences. If these differences in content are of the right sort then, according to the wide representationalist, microphysical twins cannot fail to differ with respect to the phenomenal character of their experiences. What makes for a difference in representational content in microphysical duplicates is some external difference, some connection between the subjects and items in their respective environments. The generic connection is sometimes called ‘tracking’, though there is no general agreement as to in what exactly tracking consists.

On wide representationalism, qualia (like meanings) ain't in the head. The classic, Cartesian-based picture of experience and its relation to the world is thus turned upside down. Qualia are not intrinsic qualities of inner ideas of which their subjects are directly aware, qualities that are necessarily shared by internal duplicates however different their environments may be. Rather, they are representational contents certain inner states possess, contents whose nature is fixed at least in part by certain external relations between individuals and their environments (Byrne and Tye 2006; for an opposing but still representationalist view, see Pautz 2006).

Representationalism, as presented so far, is an identity thesis with respect to qualia: qualia are supposedly one and the same as certain representational contents. Sometimes it is held instead that qualia are one and the same as certain representational properties of experiences (or properties represented in experiences); and sometimes it is is argued that these representational properties are themselves irreducible (Siewert 1998). There is also a weaker version of representationalism, according to which it is metaphysically necessary that experiences exactly alike with respect to their representational contents are exactly alike with respect to their qualia. Obviously, this supervenience thesis leaves open the further question as to the essential nature of qualia.

For further discussion, see Section 3 of the entry on representational theory of consciousness. Objections to representationalism are covered in the next section.

8. Qualia as Intrinsic, Nonrepresentational Properties of Experiences

As noted in section 1, the term ‘qualia’ is sometimes used for intrinsic nonrepresentational, consciously accessible properties of experience. Representationalists deny that there are qualia in this sense, while identifying qualia in the broad sense (that is, qualia as phenomenal character) with representational properties. However, some philosophers hold that there are qualia in the sense of intrinsic nonrepresentational properties of experience. These philosophers deny representationalism, and identify qualia in the broad sense with intrinsic nonrepresentational properties of experience. This view is the subject of the present section.

As noted earlier, some philosophers deny that experience is transparent. They claim that introspection does not show that experiences lack introspectible, intrinsic, nonrepresentational properties. Further, they insist that representationalism encounters decisive objections. These objections may be seen as making up one pillar in the main foundation for the view that experiences have qualia, conceived of now as intrinsic, nonrepresentational properties. The second pillar consists in what is sometimes called “the common kind assumption”, namely that veridical and hallucinatory experiences sometimes share the same phenomenal character (have the same qualia). This assumption is accepted by all the advocates of the views discussed so far but it is denied by advocates of relational theories of qualia (see section 9).

Objections to representational views of qualia often take the form of putative counter-examples. One class of these consists of cases in which, it is claimed, experiences have the same representational content but different phenomenal character. Christopher Peacocke adduces examples of this sort in his 1983. According to some (e.g., Block 1990, Shoemaker forthcoming), the Inverted Spectrum also supplies an example that falls into this category. Another class is made up of problem cases in which allegedly experiences have different representational contents (of the relevant sort) but the same phenomenal character. Ned Block's Inverted Earth example (1990) is of this type. The latter cases only threaten strong representationalism, the former are intended to refute representationalism in both its strong and weaker forms. Counter-examples are also sometimes given in which supposedly experience of one sort or another is present but in which there is no state with representational content. Swampman (Davidson 1986) — the molecule by molecule replica of one of us, formed accidentally by the chemical reaction that occurs in a swamp when a partially submerged log is hit by lightning — is one such counter-example, according to some philosophers. But there are more mundane cases. Consider the exogenous feeling of depression. That, it may seem, has no representational content. Likewise, the exogenous feeling of elation. Yet these experiences certainly differ phenomenally.

There isn't space to go through all these objections. We briefly discuss just one: Inverted Earth. Inverted Earth is an imaginary planet, on which things have complementary colors to the colors of their counterparts on Earth. The sky is yellow, grass is red, ripe tomatoes are green, and so on. The inhabitants of Inverted Earth undergo psychological attitudes and experiences with inverted intentional contents relative to those of people on Earth. They think that the sky is yellow, see that grass is red, etc. However, they call the sky ‘blue’, grass ‘green’, ripe tomatoes ‘red’, etc. just as we do. Indeed, in all respects consistent with the alterations just described, Inverted Earth is as much like Earth as possible.

In Block's original version of the tale, mad scientists insert color-inverting lenses in your eyes and take you to Inverted Earth, where you are substituted for your Inverted Earth twin or doppelganger. Upon awakening, you are aware of no difference, since the inverting lenses neutralize the inverted colors. You think that you are still where you were before. What it is like for you when you see the sky or anything else is just what it was like on earth. But after enough time has passed, after you have become sufficiently embedded in the language and physical environment of Inverted Earth, your intentional contents will come to match those of the other inhabitants. You will come to believe that the sky is yellow, for example, just as they do. Similarly, you will come to have a visual experience that represents the sky as yellow. For the experiential state you now undergo, as you view the sky, is the one that, in you, now normally tracks yellow things. So, the later you will come to be subject to inner states that are intentionally inverted relative to the inner states of the earlier you, while the phenomenal aspects of your experiences will remain unchanged.

Perhaps the simplest reply that can be made with respect to this objection is to deny that there really is any change in normal tracking with respect to color, at least as far as your experiences go. “Normal”, after all, has both teleological and nonteleological senses. If what an experience normally tracks is what nature designed it to track, what it has as its biological purpose to track, then shifting environments from Earth to Inverted Earth will make no difference to normal tracking and hence no difference to the representational contents of your experiences. The sensory state that nature designed in your species to track blue in the setting in which your species evolved will continue to do just that even if through time, on Inverted Earth, in that alien environment, it is usually caused in you by looking at yellow things.

The suggestion that tracking is teleological in character, at least for the case of basic experiences, goes naturally with the plausible view that states like feeling pain or having a visual sensation of red are phylogenetically fixed (Dretske 1995). However, it encounters serious difficulties with respect to the Swampman case mentioned above. On a cladistic conception of species, Swampman is not human. Indeed, lacking any evolutionary history, he belongs to no species at all. His inner states play no teleological role. Nature did not design any of them to do anything. So, if phenomenal character is a certain sort of teleo-representational content, as some representationalists hold, then Swampman has no experiences and no qualia. This, for many philosophers, is very difficult to believe.

There are alternative replies available (see Lycan 1996, Tye 2000) in connection with the Inverted Earth problem. These involve either denying that qualia do remain constant with the switch to Inverted Earth or arguing that a non-teleological account of sensory content may be elaborated, under which qualia stay the same.

As noted above, the second pillar in the foundation of the view that qualia are intrinsic, nonrepresentational properties of experiences is the common kind assumption. Those philosophers who accept this assumption see it (in the perceptual case) as providing the simplest, best explanation of the fact that hallucinations and veridical perceptions sometimes seem exactly alike to their subjects. It is granted, of course, that it does not follow that there is something common between hallucinations and perceptions in such cases from the fact that they seem alike. Nonetheless, it is a challenge to those who reject this assumption (see section 9) to provide a better explanation.

9. Relational Theories of Qualia

Relational theories of qualia typically begin with the naive realist thesis that in normal circumstances perceivers are directly aware of the objects around them and various properties that they have. It is then proposed that since perceivers are also directly aware of what their experiences are like, the phenomenal character of their experiences in such cases is to be understood in terms of the relevant objects and their properties along with the viewpoint from which they are being observed. More precisely, it is urged that the phenomenal character is constituted by the objects that the perceiver sees, some of their properties and how they are arranged relative to the viewer.(Campbell 2002; Brewer 2011)

Of course, when one is (completely) hallucinating, there are no objects that one sees. So, relationism cannot allow that the phenomenal character in this case is the same as in the veridical case. Accordingly, relationists reject what was called in the last section “the common kind assumption”. One possible view consistent with relationism is that in hallucinatory cases the phenomenal character is a matter of the representational content of the experience, as is claimed on some versions of representationalism. Another view, held by some relationists, is that there is nothing more to the phenomenal character of a hallucinatory experience — for example, an experience of a red triangle — than its being indiscriminable or indistinguishable from a veridical experience of a red triangle (Martin 2004, Fish 2009). On this view, in giving a mental characterization of a hallucinatory experience, there is nothing more to be said than that it has a certain relational and epistemological property, namely that of being indiscriminable from the relevant perceptual experience.

Sometimes relationists try to motivate their view by arguing that since the seen objects are constituents of veridical visual experiences and they are not in the case of hallucinatory experiences, the experiences in the two cases must themselves be different. However, even if this is correct, it does not follow that they cannot share the same phenomenal character. What follows is rather that if they do share a common phenomenal character, then the conscious experiences are not to be individuated (solely) by that phenomenal character.

One problem facing Martin's relational account of hallucinatory phenomenal character is that of cognitively unsophisticated perceivers. Dogs can hallucinate but they lack the cognitive wherewithal to judge that their hallucinatory experiences of bones are the same or different from their veridical experiences of squirrels. In at least one clear sense of ‘indiscriminable’, then, their hallucinatory experiences of bones are indiscriminable to them from their veridical experiences of squirrels. But the phenomenal character of these experiences is certainly different. (For a discussion of this problem and a response to it, see Martin 2004. For criticisms, see Siegel 2009.)

Another problem for the relational view is that it cannot easily handle cases of normal misperception, for example, the Muller-Lyer illusion. Campbell tells us that idiosyncrasies of the perceiver may affect phenomenal character, but he has no account to offer of cases in which something looks other than it is even to normal observers in normal circumstances. Here the scene before the eyes fails to capture the phenomenology. Brewer says that illusions are to be accounted for in terms of visually relevant similarities to paradigms of a kind of which the perceived object is not an instance. In the case of the Muller-Lyer, the paradigm is a pair of lines one longer and more distant than its plane, the other shorter and less distant. This proposal encounters various potential difficulties (Pautz 2010). For example, in the waterfall illusion, the water appears to be moving and not moving at the same time. Here there are no suitable paradigms in the real world. (See the entry on the disjunctive theory of perception.)

10. Which Creatures Undergo States with Qualia?

Do frogs have qualia? Or fish? What about honey bees? Somewhere down the phylogenetic scale phenomenal consciousness ceases. But where? It is sometimes supposed that once we begin to reflect upon much simpler beings than ourselves — snails, for example — we are left with nothing physical or structural that we could plausibly take to help us determine whether they are phenomenally conscious (Papineau 1994). There is really no way of our knowing if spiders are subject to states with qualia, as they spin their webs, or if fish undergo any phenomenal experiences, as they swim about in the sea.

Representationalism has the beginnings of an answer to the above questions. If what it is for a state to have phenomenal character is (very roughly) that it be a state that (i) carries information about certain features, internal or external, and (ii) is such that this information stands ready and available to make a direct difference to beliefs and desires (or belief- and desire-like states), then creatures that are incapable of reasoning, of changing their behavior in light of assessments they make, based upon information provided to them by sensory stimulation of one sort or another, are not phenomenally conscious. Tropistic organisms, on this view, feel and experience nothing. They have no qualia. They are full-fledged unconscious automata or zombies, rather as blindsight subjects are restricted unconscious automata or partial zombies with respect to a range of visual stimuli.

Consider, for example, the case of plants. There are many different sorts of plant behavior. Some plants climb, others eat flies, still others catapult out seeds. Many plants close their leaves at night. The immediate cause of these activities is something internal to the plants. Seeds are ejected because of the hydration or dehydration of the cell walls in seed pods. Leaves are closed because of water movement in the stems and petioles of the leaves, itself induced by changes in the temperature and light. These inner events or states are surely not phenomenal. There is nothing it is like to be a Venus Fly Trap or a Morning-Glory.

The behavior of plants is inflexible. It is genetically determined and, therefore, not modifiable by learning. Natural selection has favored the behavior, since historically it has been beneficial to the plant species. But it need not be now. If, for example, flies start to carry on their wings some substance that sickens Venus Fly Traps for several days afterwards, this will not have any effect on the plant behavior with respect to flies. Each Venus Fly Trap will continue to snap at flies as long as it has the strength to do so.

Plants do not learn from experience. They do not acquire beliefs and change them in light of things that happen to them. Nor do they have any desires. To be sure, we sometimes speak as if they do. We say that the wilting daffodils are just begging to be watered. But we recognize full well that this is a harmless façon de parler. What we mean is that the daffodils need water. There is here no goal-directed behavior, no purpose, nothing that is the result of any learning, no desire for water.

Plants, on the representational view, are not subject to any qualia. Nothing that goes on inside them is poised to make a direct difference to what they believe or desire, since they have no beliefs or desires.

Reasoning of the above sort can be used to make a case that even though qualia do not extend to plants and paramecia, qualia are very widely distributed in nature (see Tye 1997, 2000). Of course, such a case requires decisions to be made about the attribution of beliefs and desires (or belief- and desire-like states) to much simpler creatures. And such decisions are likely to be controversial in some cases. Moreover, representationalism itself is a very controversial position. The general topic of the origins of qualia is not one on which philosophers have said a great deal.

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Other Internet Resources

  • Bibliography on Qualia by David Chalmers, at consc.net.
  • Introduction to Part II: Color”, by David Chalmers, from Towards a Science of Consciousness III: The Third Tucson Discussions and Debates, edited by Stuart R. Hameroff, A.W. Kaszniak and D. Chalmers, Cambridge: MIT Press, 1999.

Acknowledgments

The editors would like to thank Pat Hayes for bringing a corruption of the text to our attention.

Copyright © 2013 by
Michael Tye <mtye@mail.utexas.edu>

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