Notes to The History of Feminism: Marie-Jean-Antoine-Nicolas de Caritat, Marquis de Condorcet

1. The philosophes were a heterogeneous group of eighteenth-century intellectuals, including (François Marie Arouet) Voltaire, (Charles-Louis de Secondat, baron de La Brède et de) Montesquieu, Denis Diderot, Jean le Rond d’Alembert, Anne-Robert-Jacques Turgot, the Swiss-born Jean-Jacques Rousseau and the German-born Paul-Henri Thiry, baron d’Holbach in France; along with Cesare Beccaria and Gianbattista Vico in Italy; Gotthold Lessing, Johann Gottfried Herder, Immanuel Kant in the German lands; David Hume, Adam Smith and Edward Gibbon in Britain; and the Americans Benjamin Franklin, as well as Condorcet's near contemporaries Thomas Paine and Thomas Jefferson. The philosophes maintained wide-ranging interests in science, mechanics, literature, philosophy, medicine, physiology, religion, society and politics. They were, “above all, critics, aiming to put human intelligence to use as an engine for understanding human nature, for analyzing man as a sociable being, and the natural environment in which he lived.” (Porter 2001, 3) In contrast to the stereotypical philosopher of today, they were overwhelmingly “men of the world: journalists, propagandists, activists, seeking not just to understand the world but to change it” (Ibid.) Modern social science also traces its roots to the thought of this period, widely known as the Enlightenment, especially to the search for a true ‘science of man,’ to be grounded in empirical methods and observation and devoted to the goal of human progress.

2. For Jean-Pierre Schandeler, Condorcet is surely one of those “who are born posthumously” in Nietzsche's memorable self-reference in The Anti-Christ (Schandeler 2000, 1). Despite having achieved “something approaching iconic status in European political circles,” by the end of his life, according to his most recent scholarly biographer David Williams, the following two hundred years have been far less generous in its appraisal of his reputation. As Williams (2004, 4–5, 7) remarks, “Condorcet must now surely be counted in the ranks of the posthumous newly born. For him posterity has really only just started” and even then, “the birth of Condorcet's reputation, in the Nietzschean sense, has … been a slowly evolving event…” In the English-language world, the belated Condorcet reception was sparked by the rediscovery of his work on probability theory and social choice. (See Arrow 1963 [orig. 1951] and D. Black 1958). His place in social science and economic thought is excellently presented by Baker 1975 and Rothschild 2001. Williams’ splendid 2004 study is among the first to address in full scope Condorcet's contribution to modern political thought. Williams (2003) has also edited a French edition of Condorcet's writings on race and he is preparing a translation and edition of the Idées sur le despotisme to appear in Volume II of the new Cambridge Reader in Western Political Thought, edited by I. Harris and G. Parry.

3. According to D. Williams (2004, 159) “Condorcet saw Voltaire as an ally in the matter of women's rights: ‘one of the men who has shown most justice towards them, and who has understood them best.’” Yet Voltaire never advocated publicly in defense of women, as he did on the question of religious fanaticism and legal injustice. Overall, as Williams points out, Voltaire's record on women's rights is muted. Denis Diderot's (posthumously published) Sur les femmes (1772) maintains that women's inferiority is owed to their legal subordination and poor education, a position shared by Baron d’Holbach's Des Femmes (1773), published in the third volume of Le Système social, ou Principes naturels de la morale et de la politique, avec un examen de l’influence du gouvernement sur les moeurs. L. Steinnbrügge (1995, 26) argues that the heavy emphasis on women's biological nature in the Encyclopédie owes much to their physiocratically oriented social theory. “Woman's value as a human being—like man's—lay in her usefulness to society. This usefulness, however, lay not so much in the productivity of her labor as in her biological capacity to produce human life.” Furthermore, Trouille (1994, 192–193) finds in Diderot's essay on woman a striking example of a “pseudo-feminist rhetoric, that is, ”a subtle paternalism and a tacit complicity with the status quo.” Despite his seeming feminist rhetoric, she insists, Diderot offers no concrete proposals nor does he evidence a genuine desire for change. On Montesquieu's and Rousseau's views on women, see Landes 1988, part 1.

4. This title was given in the translation first published in England in 1912 as part of the campaign for women's suffrage (The First Essay on the Political Rights of Women, translated by Dr. Alice Drysdale Vickery [Letchworth, 1912]), republished in Baker 1976, 97-104). More recently, McLean and Hewitt (1994) have differently rendered Condorcet's title as “On giving Women the Right of Citizenship,” from which version I primarily cite in this entry. However, the older, overly literal wording better conveys in English the original title as it appeared in the Journal of the Society of 1789 on 3 July 1790—Sur l’admission des femmes au droits de la cité—as well as reminding readers of the wording by which Condorcet's contribution came to be known by earlier generations, thanks to Drysdale's frequently reproduced version.

5. His initial interest in slavery has been accredited to his friendship with Benjamin Franklin, Thomas Jefferson, and Tom Paine. His first interest in these matters appears in his letters to Jefferson in 1773 (Williams 2006, 20). E. and R. Badinter find the first mark of interest in the condition of blacks in a letter he addressed to Benjamin Franklin 2 December 1773: “Je voudrais bien savoir si dans les colonies anglaises, il y a des Negres qui ayant eu leur liberté y aient vécu sans se mêler avec les Blancs. Si leurs enfants nègres nés libres et élevés comme libres ont conserve l’esprit et le caractère nègre ou ont pris le caractère européen”, to which Benjamin Franklin replied, “The Negroes who are free live among the white people, but are generally improvident and poor. I think they are not deficient in natural understanding, but they have not the advantage of education. They make good musicians” (cited in Badinter 1988, 175n; cf. ibid., 175–78, and 297–307 comparing his support for Jews, Blacks, and women). For a letter sent in 1791 by Jefferson to Condorcet on the question of intellectual parity between the races, see Jordan 1968, 452. For more on these matters, see the critical edition of Condorcet's writings on race, Williams 2003.

6. Baker (1976, xxvii–xxviii) correctly points out the programmatic distinction between instruction and education in the title of Condorcet's Memoirs on Public Instruction, a series of articles published in 1791 in the journal Bibliothèque de homme public (The Public Man's Library). “Condorcet was invoking a distinction fundamental to educational debate in the eighteenth century. Education implied the formation of the whole personality: the inculcation of ideas, beliefs, and attitudes through control of the entire environment of youth, in accordance with the model of communal education among the ancients. Many revolutionaries were prepared to argue that such education was the only effective method to form citizens worthy of the new state. Instruction implied what we would normally think of today as schooling: the communication of ideas, techniques, and skills necessary for the conduct of everyday life, and the encouragement and training of talent appropriate for the various occupations and professions. This alone, Condorcet insisted, must constitute the responsibility of government in a modern society.” Moreover, according to Condorcet, the ancient ideal of communal education rested on two assumptions which did not pertain to modern society: First, a slave class, which in turn freed a small group of citizens to perform civic functions; and second, the assumption that “citizens existed only to be molded for service to the state.” Modern social and economic differentiation “implies a need for a differentiated system of public instruction to meet the needs of all social classes, [wherein] the attempt to form all citizens in a rigorously identical mold would be utterly inappropriate. It would also be entirely contrary to the true principles of liberty—the liberty of the individual thinking being to form his own ideas—which the ancients never understood … The aim of public instruction was to be limited to teaching men and women how to think, not telling them what to think. ‘The Duty of the public authority is to arm the full force of truth against error, which is always a public evil. But it does not have the right to decide where truth resides or where error is to be found’ [Memoir on Public Instruction].” Condorcet presented his plan for educational reform to the Legislative Assembly in April 1792. “Although never adopted in the precise form proposed by Condorcet,” observes Baker, “this educational plan influenced the shape of French education throughout the nineteenth century and into the twentieth” (Baker 1976, xxvii).

7. Given his aversion to competitions, it is slightly incongruous (in practice, if not in spirit) that since 1993, Le Prix Condorcet has been awarded in his memory by the Mouvement laïque québécois to honor a public person who has worked for the defense of secularism (laïcité) and liberty of conscience ( In 1883 the Lycée Fontanes in Paris was renamed the Lycée Condorcet. Among its illustrious alumni are Paul Verlaine, Henri Bergson, François Poulenc, Eugène Haussmann, Marcel Proust, Claude Lévi-Strauss, Raymond Aron, Henri Cartier-Bresson, André Citroën, Jean Cocteau, Serge Gainsbourg, Victor Schoelcher, Henri Toulouse-Lautrec and William Carlos Williams. Its famous teachers include Paul Bénichou, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Stéphane Mallarmé.

8. He is reported to have remarked, “Quant à la religion, je conseille de n’en point parler” (As for religion, I advise that we not speak about it). Unpublished ms. 884, ff 46-47, in the Bibliothèque de l’Institut, quoted in Albertone 1979, 35, note 61, and in Rosenfield 1984, 5.

9. The pertinent works include: Condorcet's Lettres sur le commerce des grains [Letters on the Grain Trade] (1775); Essai sur l’application de l’analyse à la probabilité des decisions rendue à la pluralité des voix [Essay on the Application of Probability Analysis to Decisions Made by Popular Vote] (1785); De l’influence de la Révolution sur l’Europe [On the Influence of the American Revolution on Europe] (1786); Quatre letters d’un bourgeois de Newhaven à un citoyen de Virginie [Four Letters from a Newhaven Bourgeois to a Citizen of Newhaven] (1788); Essai sur la constitution et ses functions des assemblées provinciales [Essay on the Constitution and the Functions of Provincial Assemblies] (1788).

10. Against Helvétius's proposition that “interest is the only principle which leads to action,” Turgot had insisted that “man has need of love” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 7).

11. I have amended in brackets this translated version by reference to the original text as reproduced in Buisson 1929, 2.

12. “Je crois l'espèce humaine indéfiniment perfectible, et qu'ainsi elle doit faire vers la paix, la liberté et l’égalité, est impossible de fixer le terme. Je crois aussi que ces progrès doivent étre l'ouvrage de la raison, fortifiée par la meditation, appuyé par l’expérience. D’après ces principes, ma philosophie doit être froide et patiente … Jen e dirai point: Tout est bien,” mais “Tout sera bien,” et par la, je déplairai aux deux parties.” Condorcet, under the pseudonym “Un Vieux Bramine”, “Lettre aux amis de la liberté Lettre XXXVII” La Bouche de fer, Bulletin du Cercle Social, 1791, reproduced in Robinet 1968 [orig. 1893], 101.

13. Barbara Brookes speculates that the lycée and the Condorcet salon were important in offering an opportunity for serious study to women otherwise deprived of a challenging education (Brookes 1980, 325). She also argues that Condorcet's increasingly radical view of liberal democracy was accompanied by the extension of his ideas about the political role of women” (Brookes, 327).

14. Her translation of Smith's essay on the origin of languages was appended to the work when it was published in Paris in 1798. As Deidre Dawson remarks, “For two centuries de Grouchy's was the ‘definitive’ French translation of the Theory of Moral Sentiments. The translators of the first new French translation in over two hundred years acknowledge that the elegance of de Grouchy's prose is still without equal” (Dawson 2004, 267).

15. As famously stated by the Goncourt brothers, “La femme au XVIIIe siècle est le principe qui gouverne, la raison qui dirige, la voix qui commande; elle est la cause universelle et fatale, l’origine des évènements, la sources des choses” [“The eighteenth-century woman is the principle which governs, the reason which directs, the voice which commands. She is the universal and fatal cause, the origin of events, the source of [all] things” (Goncourt 1982, 291) [my translation].

16. Emerging in fifteenth and sixteenth century Europe, and continuing long thereafter, the “debate over woman” or the “woman question”—literally the “quarrel over woman”—is usually referred to its French phrase as the “querelle des femmes”. Scholars, theologians, merchants and others voiced their thoughts on all matter of things concerning women's role in society: their ownership of property, the appropriateness of their place at the head of state, their role in church, in owning property, their sexuality, and, not least, their education and the intellect. (See Poulain de la Barre 2002; Stuurman 2004; Fauré 1991; Harth 1992; Schiebinger 1991).

17. Multiple scholars detect Tom Paine's influence on the wording of the program of reform in this text. See, for example, Badinter 1988, 234.

18. It was in this period that Condorcet contradicted his principles, as stated in the 1787 Letters from a Newhaven Bourgeois, as well as the peaceable assumptions underlying his draft plan for egalitarian public education by voting for war.

Copyright © 2010 by
Joan Landes <>

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