The History of Feminism: Marie-Jean-Antoine-Nicolas de Caritat, Marquis de Condorcet
Marie-Jean-Antoine-Nicolas de Caritat, Marquis de Condorcet (September 17, 1743–March 28, 1794) is most often referred to as one of the last philosophes or as an early champion of social science. An inspired proponent of human rights, Condorcet moved from his first achievements in mathematics into public service, with the aim of applying to social and political affairs a scientific model that he termed a ‘social arithmetic.’ Through educational and constitutional reforms, he hoped to create a liberal, rational and democratic polity. He advocated for the social utility of statistics and probability theory, and he applied mathematical calculations to fiscal crises, the reform of hospital care, jury decision-making and voting procedures. He is best remembered as the author of the posthumously published final work Esquisse d'un tableau historique de l'esprit humain [Sketch for a Historical Picture of the Human Mind] (1794), in which he diagnosed the stages of human progress, including what was yet to come. However, far less well known is Condorcet's extraordinary advocacy of the rights of women. In this regard, he was exceptional even for an enlightened thinker.
What Condorcet termed, in a 1790 essay by that name, “the admission of women to the rights of citizenship” was widely opposed on the grounds that women possessed distinctive natures, which perfectly suited them to the fulfillment of their domestic duties. Women were deemed unqualified for the realm of public affairs because of their alleged greater susceptibility to sensations, flawed rationality, and weaker sense of justice. Women did not get the vote during the French Revolution, but they did benefit from many of the changes that occurred in matters of marriage, divorce, inheritance, and the legal status of unwed mothers and their children. However, they ultimately suffered setbacks as many of these reforms were withdrawn or curtailed during Napoleon's reign. (On the revolutionary record, see Desan 2004; Traer 1980; Heuer 2005; Fraisse 1994); Landes 1988, 1996; Hufton 1999; Hunt 1992; Scott 1996; and Verjus 2002.) A further consequence of the Revolution is that, for the first time, sex was introduced as a constitutional condition for the possession of political rights, even as rights were proclaimed to be universal and inalienable. In contrast to such hypocrisy, Condorcet affirmed woman's equal humanity on the grounds of reason and justice. While never entirely dismissing the influential case for women's difference, Condorcet refused to accept this as an impediment to their equal enjoyment of civil and political rights. He attributed women's limitations, to the extent they existed, not to their sex but rather to their inferior education and circumstances. Appreciating the risks he faced in rebutting one of the age's most deeply held prejudices, he begged for the opportunity to engage in reasoned dialogue with his opponents: “I hope that anyone who attacks my arguments will do so without using ridicule or declamation, and above all, that someone will show me a natural difference between men and women on which the exclusion could legitimately be based” (Condorcet 1790, in McLean and Hewitt 1994, 338–339).
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Gender equality was not the only controversial cause espoused by Condorcet: Even before publicly addressing the woman question, he argued vociferously for the humanity and rights of enslaved Africans, and proposed the abolition of slavery in France's overseas colonies. His 1781 work Réflexions sur l'esclavage des nègres [Reflections on Black Slavery] helped incite the abolitionist movement in France, which came together in early 1788 in the newly created Société des Amis des Noirs [Society of the Friends of Blacks], of which Condorcet became president in January 1789: a counter-lobby to the influential pro-planter Club Massiac. Condorcet published actively throughout the 1780s and later drafted numerous legislative bills for the National Assembly on the question of colonial reform and the slave trade. In addition, he advocated for freedom of commerce, the rights of religious minorities, and criminal law reform. He considered neither sodomy nor suicide as crimes because they “do not violate the rights of any other man,” unlike rape, which “violates the property which everyone has in her person” (“Notes on Voltaire ,” in Condorcet O'Connor and Arago 1968 [orig. 1847–9], vol. IV, 561, 563, 577, cited in McLean and Hewitt 1994, 56). He believed in the right of a woman to plan her pregnancies. His views on female education were especially progressive for his time, as he proposed that girls be educated alongside boys within universal, co-educational institutions; and he would have provided for women's admission to all professions for which they showed talent.
Feminist, abolitionist, and, in his final years, a democratic republican, Condorcet acted in public life to expand the claims of justice, morality, and human rights. Friend, protégé and ally of Jean Le Rond d'Alembert, disciple of Voltaire, collaborator of the Encyclopédie, perpetual secretary of the Academy of Sciences, member of the French Academy and numerous European academies, renowned mathematician and author of biographies of Anne-Robert-Jacques Turgot and Voltaire and many other prominent intellectuals of his time, he also participated actively in the world of political affairs—first under Turgot's short ministry (1774–1776), and then again during the French Revolution. Before the Revolution, he published essays on the application of the theory of probability to popular voting, on the American Revolution and the Constitutional Convention; and he actively polemicized on behalf of Turgot's attempted reforms of economic and political life. He was perhaps the only one of the contributors to Diderot and d'Alembert's celebrated Encyclopédie to live long enough to participate in the French Revolution, helping to draft the 1789 Déclaration des droits de l'homme et du citoyen [Declaration of the Rights of Man and of the Citizen]. Tragically, he was also one of the Revolution's most prominent casualties: Participant in the preparations for the Convocations of the Estates General, elected representative to the Legislative Assembly in 1791 and later to the National Convention, he wrote a report on public instruction and drafted a constitution for France embodying his ideal voting procedures, which was never adopted. The year 1793 was a fateful one for Condorcet. He came under an order of proscription by the Convention in 1793 following his publicly voiced objections to the scrapping of his draft constitution in favor of a hastily prepared version supported by the increasingly dominant Jacobin faction of the Convention, his protests over press censorship and the arrests of the Girondins, and his scathing comparisons of the Jacobins of 1793 to the royalists of 1791. After eight months in hiding, during which time he wrote his unfinished Esquisse [Sketch] (which included the section published first in 1804 as Fragment on the New Atlantis, or Combined Efforts of the Human Species for the Advancement of Science), he fled Paris but was arrested on March 27, 1794, and imprisoned in Bourgla-Reine, where he was found dead in his prison cell on March 29—the cause of his death remains unknown. In the florid phrasing of one of his nineteenth-century admirers: “Of the illustrious thinkers and writers who for two generations had been actively scattering the seed of revolution in France, only Condorcet survived to behold the first bitter in-gathering of the harvest. Those who had sown the wind were no more; he only was left to see the reaping of the whirlwind, and to be swiftly and cruelly swept away by it. Voltaire and Diderot, Rousseau and Helvétius, had vanished, but Condorcet both assisted at the Encyclopaedia and sat in the Convention; the one eminent man of those who had tended the tree, who also came in due season to partake of its fruit; at once a precursor, and a sharer in the fulfillment” (Morley 37).
Condorcet was born on 17 September 1743 in the town of Ribemont-sur-Aisne, in Picardy, to the previously widowed Marie-Magdeleine Gaudry and her spouse, the Chevalier Antoine de Condorcet, a cavalry captain who was killed on maneuvers only weeks after his son's birth. The Condorcets were an old noble family from the Dauphiné. His ancestor Henri de Caritat was among the first to adopt the reformed faith in 1561 prior to its official toleration in 1598 under the terms of the Edict of Nantes. However, during Louis XIV's campaign against the Huguenots and the Revocation of the Edict in 1685, members of the family who did not emigrate were forcibly reconverted to the Roman church. By the time of his birth, like other male heirs of this family, Condorcet would have been expected to serve the military or the church. Following his father's untimely death, Condorcet was brought up in isolation by his deeply pious mother, who dedicated him for his protection to the virgin, clothing him in white dresses until the unconventionally late age of eight. At the instigation of his paternal uncle, the orthodox-leaning bishop of Lisieux, Condorcet began his formal education at age nine with a Jesuit instructor; and at age eleven he was enrolled for four years in the Jesuit school at Reims, where he had his first academic success, winning second prize at age thirteen.
Despite his own successes at school, in later years he decried the role played by competition within the collèges of old régime France; and he joined other enlightened critics of the old order in vehemently opposing the religious control of education. In the first of his 1791 writings on public instruction in the Bibliothèque de l'homme public [The Public Man's Library], he emphasized a cooperative model of education, stating: “Human life is not a struggle in which rivals contend for prizes. It is a voyage that brothers make together: where each employs his forces for the good of all and is rewarded by the sweetness of mutual benevolence, by the pleasure that comes with the sentiment of having earned the gratitude or the esteem of others .… By contrast, the crowns bestowed in our collèges—which induce the schoolboy to believe himself already a great man—only arouse a childish vanity from which a wise system of instruction would seek to preserve us if, by misfortune, its origin lay in our nature and not in our blundering institutions. The habit of striving for first place is either ridiculous or unfortunate for the individual in whom it has been inculcated. It is a real calamity for those whom fate condemns to live with him. The need to deserve esteem, on the other hand, leads to that inner peace which alone makes happiness possible and virtue easy” (Condorcet, “On the Nature and Purpose of Public Instruction” (1791) in Baker 1976, 139–140).
The mix of dogma and corporal punishment that he experienced in his Jesuit schooling equally appalled Condorcet. In an unpublished manuscript he remarked, “They teach children that they cannot do good acts without grace, and that there are two sorts of sins: the venial, for which you are burnt for a few centuries, and the mortal, for which you are burnt eternally…. Humiliation and opprobrium are the natural state of Christians” (unpublished ms. c. 1778, quoted by Badinter 1988, 19; translated and cited by McLean and Hewitt 1994, 3). He advocated for a secular state; considering that since religious views are a matter of one's conscience of which one is the sole legitimate judge, “it is evident that the expense of maintaining such worship should be voluntarily borne by those who believe in it” (Condorcet, La Vie de Voltaire (1789), translated and cited in Rowe 1984, 19). As early as 1774, undoubtedly under the sway of his initial meeting with the illustrious Voltaire in 1770, he addressed the problem of religious intolerance in an anonymous work that was frequently attributed to Voltaire himself. Despite his admiration for his young acolyte, Voltaire (perhaps mischievously) complained, “This is a declaration of a hideous war … I want neither the glory of having penned it nor the punishment that will follow” (cited in Baker, 1976, x). Condorcet, however, persisted in his defense of a more secular society. Following 1789, he publicly promoted the principle of toleration and opposed the intrusion of religion into the new nation's public schools.” As he stated, “…religious opinions cannot form part of the common instruction since they must be the choice of an independent conscience. No authority has the right to prefer one over another” (Condorcet, “Public Instruction” , in Baker 1976, 127).
Between 1758 and 1760, Condorcet continued his studies in ethics, metaphysics, logic and mathematics at the prestigious Collège de Navarre, part of the University of Paris, where the Newtonian abbé Jean-Antoine Nollet held France's first chair of experimental physics. Under the tutelage of the abbé Georges Girault de Kéroudou, regent in philosophy at Navarre, Condorcet's talent for mathematics and philosophy blossomed. After a two-year stay in Ribemont following Navarre, during which time he overcame family objections to his pursuit of a scientific career, Condorcet took up lodgings in Paris for a time with his former teacher, Girault de Kéroudou, undertaking further study in problems of the integral calculus. His first formal paper to the Royal Academy of Science was rejected, although the mathematicians Aléxis-Claude Clairaut and Aléxis Fontaine recognized his mathematical talent. With better results, he read a second paper on the same topic before the Academy in 1764. With the endorsement of Jean Le Rond d'Alembert and Étienne Bézout, he published Essai sur le calcul integral [Essay on Integral Calculus], which merited a section in the annual Histoire de l'Académie des sciences for 1765, of which he was not yet a member. The astronomer Joseph-Jerôme de Lalande, member of the Berlin and French Academies, ranked the then twenty-one year old Condorcet as one of the ten leading mathematicians in Europe; and his further applications of integral calculus impressed such renowned mathematicians as Joseph-Louis Lagrange, Leonhard Paul Euler, and Daniel Bernoulli. Through d'Alembert, Condorcet was granted an introduction to Voltaire, who would henceforth become another great influence on the young man; and he began attending the salon of Julie (Jeanne Julie Éléonore) de Lespinasse, a gathering place for the leading philosophes of the day. There he met and befriended the French economist and statesman Anne-Robert-Jacques Turgot (1727–1781)—a proponent of physiocratic economic theories and enlightened administration—who, like Voltaire and d'Alembert would play an important role in the young mathematician's evolution into an increasingly prominent public intellectual. At Lespinasse's salon, he also met and began a close friendship with another woman of letters and hostess of a literary salon, Amelie Suard, sister of the publisher Charles-Joseph Panckoucke and wife of the academician Jean-Baptiste Suard. Both Lespinasse and Suard not only encouraged the young man's intellectual appetites but also appear to have counseled him on matters of the heart and his social manners, which they regarded as rather unpolished (See Badinter 1988). In this company, he earned a reputation for being a quick-tempered but also painfully shy, socially ill at ease, and introverted young man. It was Lespinasse who called him “a volcano covered in snow,” while Turgot saw him as “the rabid sheep,” calm but always on a short fuse (Williams 2004, 13).
On the professional front, Condorcet's success in the science of mathematical calculus came early, resulting in his appointment to the Royal Academy of Sciences in 1769. In 1777 he became the permanent secretary of the Academy of Sciences. In 1782, he was appointed to the French Academy, in recognition of his contribution to the world of letters. As a result, as Keith Michael Baker reveals, “for almost twenty years Condorcet was the principal spokesman of organized science not only in France but (given the power and prestige of the Paris Academy of Science … [and his post of perpetual secretary]) throughout Europe. Above all, he emerges as the social theorist of science as it developed under the Old Regime to shape some of the fundamental postulates of Enlightenment thought” (Baker 1975, 385).
In the 1770s Condorcet first showed himself to be a talented and passionate polemicist, aiming to turn public administration to the public good, while shrewdly appreciating how much power and position weighed in achieving the latter. As he wrote in an early letter to Turgot, who was then a royal official at Limoges, “To do good, one must have as much power as goodwill” (cited in Baker 1776, x). Upon Turgot's ascension to head of the financial administration of the monarchy as Controller-General [in effect, Minister of Finance], Condorcet freely offered his services in the war of opinion. He defended Turgot's introduction of free trade in grain, the abolition of guilds and corporations, and the suppression of the corvée: the forced labor system or taxation in kind associated with seignurial rights and royal privilege. He pressed for reform of the country's system of weights and measures and participated in hydrodynamic experiments to determine the engineering principles of canal construction. Like Turgot's other short-lived reforms, Condorcet also embraced the latter's unsuccessful proposal to reform the system of political representation in France by introducing a hierarchy of assemblies from the local to the national level. The minister's abrupt fall from power in May 1776 left him in deep despair: “this event has changed the whole of nature for me,” he wrote to Voltaire from Ribemont. “ I no longer take the same pleasure in this beautiful countryside where he would have brought forth happiness… How far we are fallen, my dear and illustrious master, and from such height” (cited in Baker 1776, xii).
Condorcet would continue to honor Turgot's efforts at reform as he developed his own ideas about how best to achieve political justice through the ballot and constitutional revision, as in his essential work Essai sur la constitution et ses functions des assemblées provinciales [Essay on the Constitution and the Functions of Provincial Assemblies] (1788). In La Vie de Turgot [Life of Turgot] (1786), he celebrated his belated friend's contributions to public administration and free trade. Moreover, like his mentor, Condorcet rejected naked self-interest as the only motivator of human behavior, insisting on the role to be played by love and sympathy. In a correspondence concerning Turgot's repudiation of the unmodified utilitarianism of Claude Adrien Helvétius' De l'Esprit [On Mind] (1759), Condorcet advanced his own thoughts on sympathy and ethics: 
I have just received your profession of faith: here is mine. When I left college, I fell to reflecting on the moral ideas of justice and virtue. I felt that I saw that the interest we have in being just and virtuous arose from the pain one sensitive being must needs feel on becoming aware of the pain suffered by another. Since then, [and out of a fear that other interests would make me evil (méchant)] I have tried to preserve this sentiment in all its natural energy. I gave up hunting, which I had enjoyed, and would not even kill an insect unless it was very harmful. (Cited in McLean and Hewitt 1994, 7)
During the 1780s and into the early Revolution, Condorcet would devote himself increasingly to “le bien public” [the public good]. For example, he addressed the subject of healthcare, with the hope of ending a system long associated with indigence and Christian charity. In his 1786 Memoire sur les hôpitaux [Memoir on Hospitals], he suggested closing down the thousand-year old municipal hospital of the city of Paris, the Hôtel-Dieu, and replacing it with a secular, locally-based, municipal health-delivery system composed of small neighborhood hospices. He was also not averse to changing his earlier formulated positions. In 1793, for example, he reversed his argument put forward in 1788 against progressive taxation, in favor of the same (See Greenbaum 1984 and Perkins 1984).
Most significant, however, were the evolution of his political views, from support of a reformed, constitutional monarchy to defense of a democratic republic, from defense of a property-based franchise to universal suffrage. He was elected to the Electoral Assembly to represent the nobility from the bailiwick around his country place at Mantes. Although he did not serve in the first National Assembly following the outbreak of the Revolution in 1789, he was elected by his residential district to the General Assembly of the first Paris Commune. In October 1791, he was elected to the National Legislative Assembly, where he served and then chaired the Committee on Public Instruction. In this same year, he looked optimistically toward the future. Writing under the pseudonym “Un Vieux Bramine” [An Old Brahmin] in La Bouche fer, Bulletin du Cercle Social [The Iron Mouth, the Bulletin of the (club) The Social Circle], he addressed himself to other friends of liberty, proclaiming: “I believe humankind is infinitely perfectible, and that it should thus devote itself to achieving peace, liberty and equality, whose term is impossible to fix. I also believe that this progress must be the work of reason, fortified by meditation, supported by experience. According to these principles, my philosophy has to be cold and patient … I would not say, ‘everything is good’ but rather that “everything will be good,” and, for that, I will offend both sides” [my translation] (cited in Robinet 1968 [orig. 1893], 101).
His evolving republican views were confirmed after the King's flight and capture at Varennes in June 1791, and following the attack on July 17, 1791 on peaceful demonstrators on the Champ-de-Mars (petitioning for a removal of king Louis XVI) by the troops commanded by General Lafayette (an earlier ally of Condorcet), an event which Condorcet took personally as his wife and infant daughter were among the crowd on that day. In the fall of 1792, he gained election to the National Convention of the newly constituted first French Republic, for which he served by election as one of the nine members of the Committee on a Constitution, of which he was then made chairman. In Condorcet's view, “a republican constitution based upon equality was the only one in accordance with nature, reason and justice: the only one that can protect the liberty of citizens and the dignity of the human race” (Rosenblum 1984, 188; for the text of the Projet de Constitution [Project of the Constitution], see Condorcet O'Connor and Arago, vol. 12, 335–415). Yet Condorcet's constitutional plan, which came to be known as “La Girondine” in accordance with the majority of Girondin deputies who served on this committee (although Condorcet was not one), was never acted upon by the Convention. The Jacobin Constitution, accepted by the Convention of June 24, 1793, was never implemented. However, Condorcet's impassioned attack on the latter and defense of his own views in “Aux citoyens français, sur la nouvelle constitution” [To French Citizens, on the New Constitution] led to the order for his arrest on June 8.
In 1786 at age forty-two, Condorcet married the twenty-two year old Sophie de Grouchy (1764–1822), with whom he forged a loving relationship, similar political convictions, and a solid intellectual partnership. Like her husband, de Grouchy was committed to bringing about major judicial and political reforms in France; and her own experiences at a convent left her with a similarly fierce dislike of the Church and a commitment to secular values. The two met through their common interest in the defense of three peasant victims of judicial error and legal abuse, the roués de Chaumont, whose cause had been taken up by de Grouchy's uncle, the magistrate Charles Dupaty, president of the parliament of Bordeaux (see P. A. Perrod, 1984). In addition to collaborating frequently in Condorcet's writings, his wife translated the works of Adam Smith and Thomas Paine, and she hosted a leading salon at l'Hotel des Monnaies, Condorcet's residence following his appointment in 1775 as Inspector-General of the Mint. The salon was attended by many foreign visitors—including Thomas Jefferson, Benjamin Franklin's grandson, Thomas Paine, Charles Stanhope, 3rd earl of Stanhope, and the Marquis de Beccaria (author of the treatise On Crimes and Punishments (1764), which opposed torture and the death penalty)—along with the writer Pierre-Auguste Caron de Beaumarchais, the playwright and pamphleteer Olympe de Gouges (author of the Declaration of the Rights of Woman and the Female Citizen), and the writer and hostess Madame de Staël. During the early years of the Revolution the Condorcet salon was an important venue for followers of the Girondin, and it hosted meetings of the previously mentioned Cercle Social, one of the revolutionary clubs most supportive of women's participation and women's rights. After 1789, Condorcet also frequented other salons associated with the Girondins such as those of Pierre Victurnien Vergniaud and Mme (Marie-Jeanne) Roland (Williams 2004, 13).
Mme de Condorcet was an accomplished translator and author, in her own right; and she shared her husband's liberal and republican views, especially on matters of criminal justice, political reform, and minority and women's rights. For her attendance at the lycée where Condorcet taught mathematics and others gave lessons in history and the sciences, Mme de Condorcet became known as the Vénus Lycéenne. She learned English expressly in order to read in the original and translate the seventh edition of Adam Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments, appearing in 1792 in London, despairing like many of her contemporaries of the inadequacy of the existing French translation. In 1791, along with Thomas Paine, the Condorcets founded la Société républicaine [the Republican Society], sometimes credited as the first republican society in France; and Mme de Condorcet translated Paine's writings for the journal of the Society, La Républicain ou défenseur du gouvernement représentatif [The Republican or defender of representative government]. Separated from one another during his period of flight, with his wife's encouragement the philosopher undertook the writing of his last works, while she too was composing the text known as Lettres à Cabanis sur la sympathie [Letters to Cabanis on Sympathy], in which she sets forth her own ideas on achieving “a society of happiness.” As she wrote in her Eighth Letter, “where is the one who, instead of always looking beyond nature for a new way of enjoying or abusing its blessings, finds each day a new pleasure in changing all the bonds of duty and servitude around him into relations of charity, good faith and kindness …” (S. de G. Condorcet, 1994, 183; cf. the perceptive analysis of this work by Dawson 2004).
In one of his last writings, Condorcet addressed a testament to his infant daughter (b. 1790), which shows the enormous respect he held for his wife's intellect and moral character. “When the moment of justice has come,” he writes, “she will find help in my writings. The advice I have written for her, and her mother's letters on friendship, will provide a moral education. Other writings by her mother give very useful viewpoints on the same subject” (“Condorcet's Testament (March 1794),” in McLean and Hewitt 1994, 290). In his advice to his daughter not to stifle her feelings for all other beings, he also echoes his wife's views on sensibility. He is firm on the need not to let resentment overwhelm the soul's natural disposition to sympathize with others; and, in a striking passage, he cautions the girl that even acts of cruelty toward animals can lead to a brutalization of her originally good nature: “This gentle sensitivity,” he states, “which can be a source of happiness, originates in the natural feelings which makes us share the sorrow of all sentient beings. Preserve it in all its purity and all its strength. Do not limit it to the suffering of men, but extend your humanity even to animals. Do not make any which belong to you unhappy; do not neglect their welfare; do not be insensitive to their naïve and sincere gratitude; cause them no unnecessary pain. Anything of the sort would be a true injustice and an insult to nature, who would punish you by the hardness of heart which habitual cruelty must produce. Lack of foresight in animals is the only excuse for the barbarous law which condemns them to serve as food for one another. Let us remain faithful to nature, and go no further than this excuse permits” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 287). At the same time, he counsels his daughter not to exaggerate her sensitivity, for that too can be a trap: “I shall not give you the useless advice to avoid passion and to beware of being too sensitive, but I will tell you to be sincere with yourself and not to exaggerate your sensitivity, whether for your vanity, to delude your imagination, or to excite that of another” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 287). He cautions her to “ensure that the feelings of equality and justice become second nature to you” and asks her guardians to bring her up “to love freedom and equality, and to have republican values and virtues. Ensure that she harbours no feelings of personal vengefulness, and that she is taught to protect herself from the perils of a sensitive and impulsive nature. Let this be asked of her in my name; and let her be told that I was never prey to such things” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 290).
Perhaps most remarkable about the couple is how they managed to maintain their optimism at the most perilous moment of their lives together. In 1793, despite their forced separation and the dangers they faced, she worked on her Letters, he on his Esquisse, both works that express unwavering faith in human progress and goodness. As A. Pons (preface, A. de G. Condorcet, 1994, 10) remarks, “It is the moment when he was hunted and obliged to hide himself that Condorcet wrote his hymn to progress, which is his Esquisse. It is the moment when she lived with anxiety about her husband, her daughter and herself, and when she was surrounded by the hate of the Jacobin revolutionaries and the members of her class who reproached her for her treason, that Sophie vaunted the sweet effects of sympathy!” [my translation]).
In 1795, after her husband's death, Mme de Condorcet published the Esquisse, and in 1799, his Éloges des academicians [Eulogies for the Academicians]; and she revived her salon at Auteuil at the former home of another salonnière, (Anne-Catherine de Ligniville) Madame Helvétius (1722–1800). Under the Consulate and the Empire, Mme de Condorcet hosted yet another salon, which was a meeting place for dissenting republicans. She worked assiduously to defend Condorcet's reputation and to publish his complete works, a version of which appeared from 1801 to 1804, with the assistance of her brother-in-law, the French physician and prominent Idéologue Pierre Cabanis, along with the revolutionary politician and writer Joseph Garat, and the bibliographer and librarian Antoine Alexandre A.-A. Barbier. The project was continued after her death, resulting in a second collected edition in 1847–1849, undertaken by her daughter Eliza (Louise Alexandrine de Condorcet, b.1790) and son-in-law, the exiled Irish revolutionary Arthur O'Connor, with the assistance of François Arago, Condoret's successor as Secretary of the Academy of Sciences (Institute de France). (The first volume of the second edition of the Oeuvres completes included a sympathetic biography of the philosopher by Arago. A. Condorcet O'Connor and F. Arago 1968 [orig. 1847–9]. For other classic French works on Condorcet, see: Vial 1970 [orig. 1902]; Cahen 1904; Alengry 1971 [orig. 1904]; Koyré 1948; and the recent, influential intellectual biography by E. and R. Badinter, 1988).
Condorcet's partnership with this exceptional woman doubtless confirmed him in his generous views about women's abilities, strengthened his commitment to women's independence and liberty; and, most assuredly, spurred him on to address concretely the need to rectify the injustices to which all women were subjected in an age of purportedly greater enlightenment.
Condorcet's most extensive arguments on women's rights appear in two essays. The first was authored in 1787, prior to the Revolution; the second, published in 1790 in the Journal of the Society of 1789, was composed in the context of a debate over the appropriate constitutional arrangements for the new French nation. In addition, commitment to women's rights informs his Testament to his daughter, and is not forgotten in the section of the Esquisse known as the Fragment sur l'Atlantide [Fragment on the New Atlantis], where he restates his objection to using allegations about physical or intellectual inferiority to justify political exclusion (See C. Fricheau, 1989). In his 1791 Memoirs on Public Instruction, he demands that public education be open to women and men, and that women not be excluded from any curriculum, including science (see Condorcet 1791 web resource; Kintzler 1984). Whereas the eighteenth century has been famously characterized as ‘the age of woman’—owing, in large measure, to its depiction during the nineteenth century by the Goncourt brothers—for the most part, neither the philosophes nor their most intellectually distinguished female contemporaries (in France, Madame de Lambert, Madame du Châtelet, Madame de Graffigny, Madame Riccoboni, Madame de Lambert, Julie de Lespinasse, and Madame de Genlis; in Italy, the University of Bologna professor of mathematics, Françoise Agnesi and professor of anatomy Laura Bassi) addressed the question of women's rights with the same clarity, directness or force as Condorcet. Moreover, enlightened claims about natural human equality were tempered by entrenched assumptions about complementary male and female sex-specific attributes, which provided ammunition for the delayed expansion of women' civil and political rights in modern times. As Steinbrügge (1995, 4) proposes, the eighteenth-century “is the age that saw the emergence of an image of female nature that allowed precisely these exclusions to be considered ‘natural.’” Thus, the defenders of women's rights during the ‘Age of Enlightenment’ were faced with the problem that the denial of women's equality was couched in secular not religious considerations and buttressed by pseudo-scientific claims.
Yet Condorcet never abandoned science in his support for women's rights; nor did he see scientific claims as a barrier to greater equality. Moreover, he anchored his defense in a counter-strain within enlightened thought that dates back to the early 1670s when the ex-theologian and disciple of Descartes Poulain de la Barre challenged male supremacy and advocated gender and racial equality (see Poulain de la Barre 2002; Stuurman 2004). As against the philosophical anthropology that held sway with so many philosophes, Poulain and other contributors to what is known as the “querelle des femmes” offered a rationalist alternative to standard misogynistic positions, which pointed not to the body but the mind. It is to this rationalist tradition that Condorcet is indebted. However, Condorcet's consideration of women's rights is especially noteworthy given the paucity of discussion of women's rights within enlightened circles as well as the absence of any organized campaign for women's rights in France (or elsewhere) in the years immediately leading up to 1789. As the philosopher was well aware, there also existed what he referred to as the comfortable habits of mind by which women were regarded as second-class citizens. Moreover, Condorcet not only expanded upon Poulain's earlier contribution but his 1787 and 1790 arguments boldly anticipated and reinforced the position taken by those relatively few who dared to demand rights for women during the Revolution and with increasingly numbers, and ultimately more successfully, made the same demands in the following centuries.
The Second Letter of Lettres d'un bourgeois de Newhaven à un citoyen de Virginie [Letters from a Freeman of New Haven to a Citizen of Virginia on the Futility of Dividing the Legislative Power among Several Bodies] (1787) defends the justice of a single legislative body, against the American preference for a bicameral legislature (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 292–334). Here Condorcet addresses the scope and limits of a “peaceful, free and lasting constitution,” in light of the principle of natural rights, which he proceeds to define: “These rights are called natural because they derive from the nature of man; because it is a clear and necessary consequence of the very fact that a sentient being capable of reason and moral ideas exists that he must enjoy these rights and could not justly be deprived of them” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 297). From natural rights, inherent in each person as a morally conscious being, Condorcet derives civil rights, including “the right to vote on matters of common interest, either in person or through freely elected representatives,” as well as the true meaning of a republican form of government, in which the interests of its citizens correspond with the general interest. Therefore, he argues, a “state in which some of the inhabitants, or at least some of the landowners, are deprived of these rights ceases to be free … It is no longer a true republic [and] having said this, it is also true to say that no true republic has ever existed.” However, having defined the conditions of republican constitution, Condorcet goes further to discuss sexual discrimination, observing that if government is to be consistent with the principles of reason and justice, then there are no grounds for denying equal rights for women: “If we agree that men have rights simply by virtue of being capable of reason and moral ideas, then women should have precisely the same rights. Yet never in any so-called free constitution have women had the right of citizenship” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 297). Furthermore, he states, if “the right of citizenship requires that a person can act according to his own free will [then, in his opinion] any civil law which establishes sufficient inequality between men and women for the latter to be supposed incapable of free will would simply increase the injustice” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 297–98).
On the basis of natural rights, Condorcet moves immediately to tackle the question of political representation, as it concerns all women as well as the particular circumstances of married women. Alluding to the English principle of no taxation without representation, as popularized in France in Jean-Louis Delolme's 1771 Constitution d'Angleterre [Constitution of England], Condorcet insists that “all women have the right to refuse to pay taxes levied by parliaments;” adding that he has found no “substantial arguments against these points, at least as far as widows and unmarried women are concerned.” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 297) However, while unmarried women and widows might be admitted to political rights, the much thornier problem of married women's rights remains to be tackled. Condorcet confronts the question head-on, knowing that even English law, to which he has just appealed, is strongly prejudiced against married women. Under English common law, an unmarried adult was considered to have the legal status of a feme sole (in law book French), while a married woman had the status of a feme covert. Colloquially speaking, husband and wife were one person as far as the law was concerned, and that person was the husband. Women were restricted from owning property, signing legal documents, entering into contracts, obtaining an education, or keeping her own salary, without her husband's permission. In pre-revolutionary France, as the historian Dominique Godineau (1998, xix) points out, women were likewise conceptualized according to their roles as mothers and spouses, thereby “placed outside of the public and hence outside of the city.” The same was true of their position in the Encyclopédie, she observes, where Diderot considers that the (masculine) word citoyen— that is, one who possesses political rights—is only attributable “to women, young children, or to servants as one would [refer] to the members of a family of a citizen in the strict sense of the word; they aren't really citizens.” Thus, in pre-revolutionary France political individuals represented families (including family servants, where applicable), not merely themselves. In short, if rights inhered in independent persons, then according to tradition and legal reasoning, a woman was not strictly speaking a legal personality. A woman's legal rights were merged with those of her husband (and prior to marriage, with her father). A married woman counted for nothing before the law; and therefore could not count as a citizen whose natural rights had to be respected by the state.
With respect to the issue of who is authorized to represent the family, and the practice whereby only men are granted this prerogative, Condorcet makes a simple observation: If marriage is “a society of two people,” it admits of only one condition under which a necessary inequality be allowed, that is, “the need for someone to have a casting vote on the rare occasions when the different opinions cannot be allowed to act simultaneously, while at the same time the need to act quickly means that we cannot wait for the parties to come to an agreement.” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 298) However, even in these circumstances, Condorcet insists that there need be no permanent inequality introduced between the spouses. He would instead divide and rotate the prerogative, giving “either men or women the casting vote for matters in which one or the other is more likely to express a will which conforms to reason. He also reminds his readers that greater equality between spouses is “not as new as we might imagine,” for Roman women were granted by Emperor Julian the right to initiate divorce proceedings against their spouses. On this point, Condorcet cannot resist a witticism: “Perhaps the least gallant of the Caesars was the most just toward women,” he proposes (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 298).
The principle of justice requires that “we stop debarring women from the right of citizenship.” What then of women's eligibility for public functions? In this section of the Second Letter, Condorcet considers the grounds for excluding women as voters and as public functionaries, and prepares the argument that will reappear in his 1790 essay. He refers first to the principle of utility: “Legal exclusions should therefore be made only when reason clearly proves their utility” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 298). A “good election method” would allow, he maintains, for the elimination of persons tried and found guilty of certain crimes, as well as two categories of dependent persons, those in domestic service and those below the mandated age of civil majority. Except in one important respect, his criteria for the exclusion of these categories of person are consistent with eighteenth-century republican assumptions, which ultimately guided the drafters of the 1791 Constitution, who divided the population into active and passive citizenship. Only the former—approximately 15% of the French population and 61% of men (approximately 4, 298,360)—possessed the full rights of citizenship. They had to be males 25 years or older, who had occupied the same residence for at least one year, and had paid the equivalent of 3 days of salary. By the terms of France's first post-1789 Constitution, all women were assigned the status of passive citizens; and French women did not achieve full citizenship until 1944. In contrast, even before the French Revolution Condorcet had opposed the passage of laws expressly excluding women, even from posts in the military or magistracy. Instead of legal prohibitions he looks to civil law and education to support women's participation. He underscores the role to be played by education in countering the limitations attributed to woman's physical and intellectual limitations, maintaining: “the female constitution means that they would make unsuitable soldiers and, for some of their lives, debars them from posts which require hard work on a daily basis. Pregnancy, childbirth and breast-feeding would prevent them from fulfilling these functions. But I believe all other differences between men and women are simply the result of education.” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 299)
Education not nature is deemed to be the cause of women's inferiority and her presumed unsuitability for given social roles and tasks. Only in certain limited circumstances, or at certain periods of time, are physical limitations a factor. Condorcet believes that women are not intellectually inferior to men; rather, they are victims of an inferior education. “Even if we agree that women might still not have the same mental or physical power as men, this would mean simply that the best women were equal to the second-best men, better than the third best, and so on.” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 299) Complementing Voltaire for what he takes to be the philosophe's generally enlightened views toward women, Condorcet nonetheless disputes the latter's reservations about women's genius and inventiveness. For one thing, he insists, “if posts could be filled only by men capable of invention, many would remain vacant, even in academies. On the contrary, for a great many posts, it is not even in the interests of the public that the time of a man of genius be sacrificed.” Appealing further to the genius of two women of letters, Mme de Sévigné and Mme de la Fayette, he only concedes that women might not equal men in the very highest domains of science and philosophy—an odd admission since Condorcet might well have raised in this regard the example of Voltaire's own lover, the brilliant Newtonian Mme de Chatelet.
There are two other references to women in the Second Letter. In a discussion of what could be termed military and foreign affairs, Condorcet compares the unjust treatment of women to the position of subject populations within republics: in such circumstances, “they cannot speak of freedom as a right” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 312). In another passage, Condorcet sums up and defends himself against the charge of triviality concerning the arguments he has made on behalf of women's rights: “This examination may seem very long,” he writes, “but we are discussing the rights of half of the human race which have been neglected by all legislators. Besides, it cannot harm men's freedom to show how to overcome the only possible objection against republics, and to mark out a real difference between them and States which are not free.” But tellingly, men are not the only audience Condorcet fears may deride his arguments: he worries about women's reactions, since they have been led astray by none other than Jean-Jacques Rousseau's enticements to remain in the domestic sphere (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 299).
Even a philosopher finds it hard not to get a little carried away when discussing women. However, I fear that I shall fall foul of them if ever they read this article. I have discussed their right to equality and not their influence, and so might be suspected of secretly wishing to decrease this influence. And since Rousseau gained their support by saying that they were made simply to look after us and were fit only to torment us, I should not expect their support. But truth is a good thing, even if I lay myself open to ridicule by speaking it. (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 299)
In contrast to his 1787 work, in which women's rights are part of a larger consideration of the elements of a just constitution, Condorcet's 1790 essay Sur l'admission des femmes au droits de la cité [On the Admission of Women to the Rights of Citizenship] stands as one of the most concise and potent defenses of women's rights in the entire history of feminist thought. It also needs to be set within the context of the monumental events that began in 1789 and led up to the adoption by the newly elected national assembly of the Constitution of 1791. By the terms of the 1791 Constitution of the new constitutional monarchy, as already briefly observed, the population was divided between active and passive citizens on the basis on the basis of wealth, thereby excluding the large majority of male citizens from full political participation. Complicated suffrage provisions restricted popular influence further. However, the new laws also categorized all women (without exception) as passive citizens, a departure from old régime legal practice whereby women could sometimes vote and act as regents. In addition to barring women from the voting process or from serving as magistrates or elected representatives, only men were granted the privilege of serving in the newly formed militias, an increasingly important function of republican citizenship during these same years. Gender divisions would, if anything, become even more pronounced after 1792 when the monarchy was abolished and France became a republic, the divisions between active and passive male citizenship were removed, and universal male suffrage established but nothing was done to alter women's secondary political status before the law. Yet from the outset of the Revolution in 1789, in practice women were far from being wholly ‘passive.’ Many militated for rights and participated actively in the clubs and societies of the revolutionary public sphere.
Condorcet was not alone in recognizing the manifest contradiction between the principles of natural rights and reason, on the one hand, and the exclusion of women from full political rights, on the other. Nor was he the only one to link the question of female citizenship to the demand for rights by other groups like Jews, Protestants, and mulattos, whose political and civil rights had been curtailed under the old régime, or even to the radical demand for slave emancipation. Some politically active women protested for improvements in women's condition, and even demanded woman's right to bear arms. The Confédération des amis de la vérité [Confederation of the Friends of Truth] was the first club to admit women as regular members and the first to establish a separate women's section. The club campaigned in support of divorce, and engaged in a heated debate over member Etta Palm d'Aelder's speech calling on men to devote their full attention to the problem of women's rights, insisting “we are your companions not your slaves” (Etta Palm d'Aelders, Appel aux françoises sur la régénération des moeurs et la nécessité de l'influence des femmes dans un gourvernement libre [Appeal to the French concerning the Regeneration of Morals and the Necessity for Women's Influence in a Free Government], cited in Kates 1985, 123–4). Among the other issues taken up by Palm and her confederates in the women's section were elimination of primogeniture, protection against wife beating, a comprehensive divorce bill, and political equality for women. Palm conceived of a Parisian and nationwide system of affiliated clubs to care for and educate children and clinics for indigent women. As early as October 1789, the playwright Olympe de Gouges proposed a reform program to the National Assembly that encompassed legal sexual equality, admission for women to all occupations, and the suppression of the dowry system through a state-provided alternative. In her 1791 Déclaration des droits de la femme et de la citoyenne [Declaration of the Rights of Woman and Female Citizen], Gouges rejoices in the natural equality of all human beings and decries the hypocrisy of denying people on the basis of race and sex the inherent rights to which they are owed. Although always a minority position, still other voices were raised inside and outside France on behalf of full equality, perhaps most famously Mary Wollstonecraft in her equally eloquent 1792 treatise The Vindication of the Rights of Woman.
Condorcet opens his 1790 essay with a powerful indictment of his ‘most enlightened’ compatriots, above all those philosophers and legislators who speak and legislate on behalf of the principle of human rights, yet deny those rights to one-half of the human race:
Habit can so familiarize men with violations of their natural rights that those who have lost them neither think of protesting nor believe they are unjustly treated. Some of these violations even escaped the notice of the philosophers and legislators who enthusiastically established the rights common to all members of the human race, and made these the sole basis of political institutions. Surely they were all violating the principle of equal rights by debarring women from citizenship rights, and thereby calmly depriving half of the human race of the right to participate in the formation of the laws. Could there be any stronger evidence of the power of habit over enlightened men, than the picture of them invoking the principle of equal rights for three or four hundred men who had been deprived of equal rights by an absurd prejudice, and yet forgetting it with regard to 12 million women. (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 335)
Condorcet argues that without the inclusion of women, the nation would have no recourse to a “free constitution.” Recognizing the shift that has occurred in France in grounding rights in individual property, he calls attention to the fact that “the elective assemblies of our bailiwicks gave to feudal rights that which they refused to natural rights. It is to women that several of our noble deputies owe the fact that they sit amongst the national representatives.” Indeed he advises that rather than depriving female feudal property owners of their former rights, would it not be better to extend to all female property owners and heads of households the same rights that men have now achieved? “Why, if we consider it absurd to exercise citizenship rights by proxy, should we deprive women of this right, instead of giving them the freedom to exercise it in person?” The irony, he recalls, is that before 1776 “a woman could rule France [as a regent?] and yet, before 1776 (when Turgot's abolition of the guilds were introduced), she could not become a dressmaker in Paris [without her husband's assistance]” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 339). Truly throwing down the gauntlet, he insists that unless it can be proven that “the natural rights of women are not exactly the same as those of men,” then the new nation is guilty of constituting itself on an “act of tyranny” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 337, 335).
Following this pointed accusation, he proceeds to argue for women's rights in the manner already put forward in his 1787 discussion, although here he explicitly joins women's rights to the rights of religious and racial minorities—no doubt hoping that men of reason will join his cause, even if slave owners and Catholic extremists are likely to oppose it:
The rights of men stem exclusively from the fact that they are sentient beings, capable of acquiring moral ideas and of reasoning upon them. Since women have the same qualities, they necessarily also have the same rights. Either no member of the human race has any true rights, or else they all have the same ones; and anyone who votes against the rights of another, whatever his religion, colour or sex, automatically forfeits his own. (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 335)
Once again, however, Condorcet is forced to consider strongly held views about the social implications of women's bodies. He argues that neither women's duties nor their bodies ought to disqualify them from participating in the public sphere. He begins with the trivial and moves to more serious objections, first comparing the inconveniences of motherhood to such “monthly indispositions” as gout and the common cold. On a more serious note, he observes, “people argue that, differences in education apart, men are still naturally more intelligent than women, but this is far from being proven, and would have to be before women could justly be deprived of a natural right.” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 335) Again he reprises his former arguments regarding women's genius and the inappropriate link between genius and the legitimate exercise of rights: Even if the charge of women's lack of demonstrated genius were true, which he doubts, “we would hardly attempt to limit citizenship rights only to men of genius” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 335). Granting the existence of a small fraction of men possessing true genius, he states, “this small class apart, both sexes have an equal share of inferior and superior minds,” thus there is no more reason to exclude women from the exercise of rights than there would be to exclude the vast majority of men. He mobilizes the examples of Queen Elizabeth of England, Marie Theresa of Austria, and the two Catherines of Russia as ample proof that “women lack neither strength of mind nor the courage of their convictions.” And in a playful paragraph he deliciously debunks the great evils done by a host of supposedly great men, asking whether such women as Catherine Macaulay, Marie le Jars de Gournay, Marie-Anne de la Tremoille, princess of Ursins, Mme du Châtelet, or Mme de Lambert would have undermined freedom of conscience or the rights of citizens, attacked a free constitution, or passed such “absurd and barbarous laws … [as those] against protestants, thieving servants, smugglers and negroes?” In sum, he observes, “Men have no real reason to be so proud when they cast their eyes over the list of those who have governed them” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 336).
Condorcet meets his compatriot's strong objections that women reason differently or perhaps do not reason at all by advocating raised educational standards, improved laws, and the equalization of the social circumstances endured by the sexes. Only with these reforms, he insists, will women come to escape the pull of vanity and self-interest, to which they are doomed in the present, and come to respond to the demands of justice and positive law. As for whatever residual differences between the sexes might still remain, Condorcet finds in them a comprehensible logic: “The fact that they [women] base their conduct on different principles and set themselves different aims does not mean that they are irrational. It is as reasonable for a woman to concern herself with her facial charms as it was for Demosthenes to cultivate his voice and gestures” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 336–7).
Whether it is a question of admirable or contemptible qualities, Condorcet does not blame women's nature but rather points to their upbringing, to which he attributes their ignorance and superstition. Because women are blocked from exercising real power, they resort to using illicit influence. If it is true that women are less egoistic and hardhearted, more gentle and sensitive than men, he credits this to their socialization as well as to their overly protected lives: “They have no experience of business, or of any matter which is decided by positive laws or rigorous principles of justice; the areas which concern them and where they are active are precisely those which are governed by feelings and natural decency. It is quite unfair to justify continuing to refuse women the enjoyment of their natural rights on grounds which are plausible only precisely because they do not enjoy those rights” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 337). In an insightful observation concerning the patriarchal arrangements of his day, Condorcet asserts: If it is true that women are unduly influenced by their husbands, on whom they are dependent, this cannot be grounds for their exclusion “because we could destroy this tyrannical civil law … [and] One injustice must never become a reason to commit another” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 337).
Condorcet looks to education and publicity to eliminate the secret sway that royal mistresses and some other old régime women had exercised. He argues that whatever influence women have, it is far more of “a threat if it acts in secret than if it acts in a public debate” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 337). By becoming public, the undue influence of one person over another would necessarily lose its sway. At the same time, he counsels that the same arguments used to deprive women of their rights could easily be used against laborers—“anyone who was obliged to work constantly and could therefore neither become enlightened nor exercise his reason. Before long, citizenship would be open only to men who had completed a course of public law …” Adopting what was fast-becoming the most damning slogan of republicans during the Revolution, he charges that “all aristocracies were formed or justified by this kind of pretext [my emphasis]” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 337). Certainly, he was not alone in leveling the charge of aristocracy in relation to gender equality. For example, as early as 1789, a radical tract appeared, entitled Requête des Dames à l'Assemblée Nationale [The Ladies' Request to the National Assembly], which protested the “masculine aristocracy” being established by the Assembly, and proposed it be decreed that “all the privileges of the male sex are entirely and irrevocably abolished throughout France; [and that] the feminine sex will always enjoy the same liberty, advantages, rights, and honors as does the masculine sex” (A. Soboul, 1982; cited and translated in K. Offen, 2000, 54–55). Similarly, Olympe de Gouges exclaimed: “Man, are you capable of being just? It is a woman who poses the question; you will not deprive her of that right at least. Tell me, what gives you sovereign empire to oppress my sex? …. Man alone has raised his exceptional circumstances to a principle. Bizarre, blind, bloated with science and degenerated—in a century of enlightenment and wisdom—into the crassest ignorance, he wants to command as a despot a sex which is in full possession of its intellectual faculties; he pretends to enjoy the Revolution and to claim his rights to equality in order to say nothing more about it.” (Gouges 1791).
Finally, then, Condorcet arrives at the most intransigent of objections to women's freedom, those based on utility. What if by gaining rights women would be tempted to abandon their domestic affairs? What if female citizens would move beyond a relatively passive exercise of rights to assume the reigns of government? Condorcet insists that appeals to utility have been abused, serving often as mere pretexts of tyrants for denying “a true right” and resulting in such crimes as the enslavement of Africans, the imprisonment of innocents at the Bastille, the censorship of the press, and the exploitation of workers in trade and industry. However, he also finds it necessary to go beyond merely answering utilitarian objections to women's equality by assuaging to men's fears. In the process, however, he ends up making the greatest concession to his opponents. So, he reassures men,
there is no need to fear that, just because women would be members of the National Assembly, they would immediately abandon their children, their homes and their needlework. In fact, this would only make them better able to raise their children and to make men of them. It is natural for a woman to nurse her children and for her to look after them when they are young. Forced by this to stay at home and weaker than men, it is also natural that she lead a more secluded, more domestic life. Women therefore fall into the same category as men who need to work for several hours a day. This may be a reason not to elect them, but it cannot form the basis of a legal exclusion. Chivalry may lose out by this change, but domestic life would gain from this equality, as from all others. (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 338)
There is no question that Condorcet advanced some of the age's most compelling claims on behalf of women. In closing his brief for female citizenship, he challenges his critics to “show me a natural difference between men and women on which the exclusion could legitimately be based” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 339). Yet even this advocate of reason and sexual equality introduces an asymmetry between the sexes, and he locates that disproportion directly on the reproductive and maternal body of woman. Despite his objection to the argument of natural difference, Condorcet allows that sexual differences would still continue to have social effects within a more rationally organized society. However, he indicates his awareness of the persuasive attacks by Jean-Jacques Rousseau and other like-minded reformers on the very widely practiced custom of wet-nursing the infants and toddlers of the better classes, as well as the same reformers' complaints against the vanity and egotism of women who employed wet-nurses (see Landes 1988, chapter 3). Therefore, it is very likely that Condorcet's reassurances are meant not just for men but also for women. At this point in time public opinion was clearly turning against any woman who would willingly choose to neglect her domestic duties or altogether disavow them, especially should she do so for either social or strictly selfish reasons. Although Rousseau and others did insist on fathers taking a greater involvement and responsibility towards their families, none of this was meant to relieve a woman of her primary domestic role or its attendant burdens. If anything, reformers insisted on both parents simply doing more in family life while preserving the sexual division of labor.
In his defense, however, it is clear that until the tragic end of his life, Condorcet never relinquished the notion that a woman not only can but also must prepare vocationally for her own independence. In his Testament he advises his infant daughter to “get into the habit of working so that you are self-sufficient and need no external help … though you may become poor, you will never become dependent on others.” And such work should not be routine or menial: “choose a type of work which does not occupy the hands alone, but engages the mind without straining; something which compensates your efforts by the pleasure it gives you” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 284). Coming from the titled aristocracy, for whom the idea of a woman's paid employment might have seemed inappropriate, if not bizarre, this is remarkable advice. But Condorcet insists that his daughter be prepared for all circumstances. In the sad prospect of the compounding loss of her mother as well as her father, he asks her guardians to prepare his daughter for a great deal more than “the usual ladylike accomplishments,” advising: “I should like my daughter to learn to draw, to paint and to engrave well enough to be able to earn a living without too much difficulty or repugnance. I should like her to learn to read and to speak English” (McLean and Hewitt 1994, 290). Likewise, in the tenth stage of the progress for the human mind in his Esquisse, he boldly affirms that “among the causes of the progress of the human mind of the human mind that are of the utmost importance to the general happiness, we must number the complete annihilation of the prejudices that have brought about an inequality of rights between the sexes, an inequality fatal even to the party in whose favour it works” (Condorcet 1955 [orig. 1795], 193). In sum, just as tyranny in the political order disfigures the tyrants as much as their victims, Condorcet believes that men will be infinitely better off once they accept the full equality of women.
Indeed, a great deal of the ambivalence that one detects in Condorcet's 1790 essay belongs to the times, not merely in the sense of the day's prejudices—which, as we have seen, he strongly combated—but rather also with respect to the extent to which the opportunity for achieving women's rights was eclipsed by an increasingly negative, even openly hostile climate toward women who were perceived to be overly “public” and insufficiently modest and “domestic”. In the face of women's heightened political involvement during the popular revolution, those few representatives still favoring political equality for women appear to have retracted their former support. Despite his pronounced early and visible commitment to women's voting rights, Condorcet's public silence on the issue when presenting his introductory report on the draft constitution to the Convention in 1793 still remains perplexing. The constitutional debate occurred after the removal of the distinction between passive and active voters, so that the denial of women's rights was made more explicitly than ever a matter of sexual difference rather than one of property or class position. In addition, from the declaration of the Republic in September 1792 until women's political participation was proscribed by the deputies of the Convention in the fall of 1793, popular women's activism in the streets and in the galleries of the Convention was accelerating, but so too was a campaign against women in the revolutionary press. (On this period, see especially Levy, et al. 1979 and Godineau 1998).
Although Condorcet remained silent, others among his friends and political allies spoke up. The Welch-born naturalized French citizen David Williams—friend of the Girondins, participant in Sophie de Condorcet's salon, author of Lettres sur la liberté politique [Letters on Political Liberty], and participant in the preparatory work for the Constitution—wrote his Observations sur la dernière constitution (Observations on the Last Constitution] (published 1793 in Paris). Williams supported education for women, their right to testify in cases involving members of their own sex, and political rights for single women, spinsters as well as widows. Moreover, an appeal for women's voting rights by deputy Pierre Guyomar entitled le Partisan de l'égalité des droits et de l'inégalité en fait [The Partisan of the Equality of Rights and Inequality in Fact] was discussed by the constitutional draft commission. Guyomar seemingly draws upon Condorcet, comparing prejudice in sexual matters to those of race, and calls for its outright abolition. And like Condorcet (and the authors of the 1789 “Ladies’ Request”), he points to the nation's outright hypocrisy, where the Declaration of Rights serves to perpetuate an aristocracy of men and smuggle in old régime principles. However, the weight of official opinion did not support the inclusion of women into full citizenship. The Commission concluded in April 1793 that women lacked sufficient education to participate in the nation's political life (see Roudinesco 1991, 129–130). By the fall of 1793, women would also be barred from participating in clubs and societies. Women in France would not achieve the ballot until 1944, and many of the advancements in civil law passed in the 1790s were withdrawn by Napoleon, and not again fully secured until the last half of the twentieth century.
In a sense, French women's lives were shaped almost entirely for far too long by the very institution against which Condorcet protested. Ironically, this devoted father and husband was perhaps the only philosophe who never kept a mistress, yet he was arguably “the one most critical of the family, as this institution was known in the eighteenth century. The indissoluble character that the Church had conferred upon marriage appeared to him as a veritable seedbed of such evils as adultery, prostitution, and bastardy” (Rowe, in Rosenfield, 1984, 25). In the Esquisse he advocated for making marriage a civil not a religious contract, as was formally accomplished by his fellow republicans in France during the 1790s. He upbraided the despotic role of parents in arranging their children's marriage. He favored divorce, and considered the manner in which child custody and education should be protected in its event. In the place of what he considered the private despotism of family life in old régime France, and with the hope for women's expanded independence, Condorcet envisioned the coming into being of more loving and egalitarian unions, much like the one he fashioned with his wife: “Everything which can contribute to rendering individuals more independent also increases the happiness they can reciprocally bestow upon each other; their happiness will be greater when the individual action is more voluntary” (Bibliothèque nationale ms. N.a. fr 4586, fol. 18, cited and translated in Manuel 1962, 99). Had he lived longer, he would have seen many disappointments, watching as so many of the early Revolution's legislated reforms in marital and personal life, as well as the whole panoply of human rights for which he fought, were retracted, modified or suspended, and while political participation was crushed under the Directory and more emphatically under Napoleon's rule. After his death, Condorcet was not entirely forgotten, and his contribution was honored throughout the nineteenth century in France, Britain, and elsewhere by those men and women who fought to bring down the refortified barriers to women's rights that were paradoxically imposed by democrats and republicans who otherwise saw themselves as liberal opponents of preceding regimes.
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Diderot, Denis | feminism, approaches to | feminist (interventions): liberal feminism | feminist (interventions): political philosophy | liberalism | Montesquieu, Charles-Louis de Secondat, Baron de | republicanism | rights: human | Rousseau, Jean Jacques | Voltaire | Wollstonecraft, Mary