Methodological Holism in the Social Sciences

First published Mon Mar 21, 2016

The debate between methodological holists and methodological individualists concerns the proper focus of explanations in the social sciences: to what extent should social scientific explanations revolve around social phenomena and individuals respectively? The discussion takes two main forms.

The most enduring debate surrounds the issue of dispensability. Methodological holists engaged in this debate defend the view that explanations that invoke social phenomena (e.g., institutions, social structures or cultures) should be offered within the social sciences: their use is indispensable. Explanations of this sort are variously referred to as holist, collectivist, social (-level), or macro (-level) explanations. They are exemplified by claims such as “the unions protested because the government wanted to lower the national minimum wage”, or “the rise in unemployment led to a higher crime rate”. Holist explanations may be contrasted with explanations that are expressed in terms of individuals, their actions, beliefs, desires, and the like. The latter are variously termed individualist, individual (-level), or micro (-level) explanations. They are illustrated by claims such as “Anna baked a cake because Susan wanted it”, or

as a result of individuals a, b, c, etc. losing their jobs, and feeling very frustrated about having little money and no job opportunities, the crime rate went up.

Methodological holists may or may not hold that individualist explanations should be offered in addition to holist explanations. Whatever methodological holists’ stand on this issue, they are opposed by methodological individualists who insist that individualist explanations alone should be provided within the social sciences, and thus, that holist explanations should be dispensed with.

The other, more recent dispute between methodological holists and individualists is concerned with the issue of microfoundations. Methodological holists involved in this debate defend the view that in some cases, purely holist explanations (i.e., explanations stated solely in terms of social phenomena) may stand on their own: they do not invariably need individual-level microfoundations. A purely holist explanation might be “the economic depression was the main reason why the war broke out”. Methodological holists may maintain that this explanation is fine as it stands; it need not be supplemented with further details specifying how the economic depression incited individuals to adopt certain beliefs, act in certain ways, etc., that in turn led to the outbreak of the war. Methodological individualists disagree, insisting that such additional accounts must always be provided.

Within philosophy and the social sciences, whether in the context of the dispensability or the microfoundations debate, proponents of methodological holism do not necessarily describe their position in such terms. In fact, this is seldom so within the social sciences. In certain cases, some alternative label is used, for example, when “explanatory holism” and “collectivism” are employed to denote the view that holist explanations are indispensable. In other cases, no label at all is attributed to one or both of the views that are here described as methodologically holist. In this entry, differences of terminology will be disregarded: the term “methodological holism” is used to describe both the thesis that holist explanations are indispensable, as well as the thesis that purely holist explanations do not always need individual-level microfoundations.

The methodological individualism—holism debate that concerns the proper focus of social scientific explanations is just one among several individualism—holism disputes. Most notably, there are individualism—holism debates about ontology, confirmation, and morality. Within these discussions, holism is the view that social phenomena exist sui generis, or in their own right (the ontological debate); that social scientific explanations need not always be confirmed by looking at what happens at the level of individuals (the debate on confirmation); and that moral responsibility may sometimes be ascribed to social phenomena such as groups (one version of the moral debate). It is perfectly possible, and in fact quite common, to subscribe to methodological holism in the sense defined in this entry without endorsing these other forms of holism. Though interesting, these debates will not be directly addressed here.

The following discussion of methodological holism consists of two parts. Sections 1 and 2 examine the dispensability debate, and Sections 3 and 4 consider the microfoundations debate. Both parts focus on methodological holists’ views—and arguments—in these disputes. For a characterization of methodological individualism, see the entry on methodological individualism.

1. The Dispensability Debate

The defense of methodological holism dates back to at least the turn of the nineteenth century. Around this time, Emile Durkheim advocated the indispensability of holist explanations in a number of writings (see e.g., Durkheim 1938[1895], 1951[1897]). He famously stated that the

determining cause of a social fact should be sought among the social facts preceding it and not among the states of the individual consciousness. (Durkheim 1938 [1895]: 110—italics in the original)

His work is typically juxtaposed to that of Max Weber, who is regarded as the main proponent of methodological individualism during this period. In the subsequent history of the debate, there are two phases that particularly stand out. The first began around the 1950s, when Friedrich Hayek, Karl Popper, and J.W.N. Watkins argued ardently in support of methodological individualism. In response, Ernest Gellner, Leon G. Goldstein, Maurice Mandelbaum, and others maintained that there were alternative ways of cashing out, and defending, methodological holism that were left unscathed by Hayek’s, Popper’s and Watkins’ objections (see Gellner 1973 [1956]; Goldstein 1973a [1956], 1973b [1958]; Mandelbaum 1955, 1973 [1957]. They all appear in O’Neill 1973, which also contains other important contributions from this period).

The second significant period stretches from around the 1980s up until today. From the perspective of methodological holism, this phase is marked by the appearance of a number of new, or new versions of, arguments in support of the indispensability of holist explanations. In this phase, seminal contributions to the dispensability debate were made by Roy Bhaskar, Alan Garfinkel, Harold Kincaid, Frank Jackson and Philip Pettit to mention just a few (see Bhaskar 1979; Garfinkel 1981; Kincaid 1996, 1997; Jackson and Pettit 1992a, 1992b). The following section focuses on the most important arguments advanced during this last—and still unfolding—period. (See Zahle and Collin 2014a for a collection of papers from this period.) The remainder of the present section is concerned with the further introduction of the positions at play within the dispensability debate. As noted above, special attention will be paid to the methodological holist stance.

There are three basic views within the debate:

Strong methodological holism: Holist explanations alone should be offered within the social sciences; they are indispensable. Individualist explanations may, and should, be dispensed with.

Moderate methodological holism: In certain cases, holist explanations should be advanced; in other cases individualist explanations should be advanced; both holist and individualist explanations are indispensable within the social sciences.

Methodological individualism: Individualist explanations alone should be put forward within the social sciences; they are indispensable. Holist explanations may, and should, be dispensed with.

Among these positions, the thesis of strong methodological holism has enjoyed relatively little support and today it has few, if any, proponents. The vast majority of methodological holists are of the moderate variety. Accordingly, the debate has mainly played itself out between the moderate holist view and the individualist position. Because both parties agree that individualist explanations should be advanced, their efforts have first and foremost been directed toward the question of whether holist explanations are indispensable or not.

The three basic positions may be further characterized in three ways. First, each relies on a distinction between holist and individualist explanations. This raises the issue of exactly how to differentiate between these two categories of explanation. The answer to this question is a matter of dispute among participants in the debate. One possible formulation of the distinction is that holist explanations appeal to social phenomena, whereas individualist explanations invoke individuals, their actions, beliefs, etc. To elaborate further on this suggestion, it may be specified that holist explanations contain social terms, descriptions, or predicates set apart by their reference to, and focus on, social phenomena. By contrast, individualist explanations contain individualist terms, descriptions, or predicates distinguished by their reference to, and focus on, individuals, their actions, beliefs, desires, etc.

One issue still left open by this supplementary characterization is how to understand the notion of a social phenomenon. Methodological holists commonly take the following list of items to exemplify social phenomena: (a) Organizations—like universities, firms, and churches; (b) social processes—like revolutions and economic growth; (c) statistical properties—like the literacy rate or the suicide rate within a group; (d) cultures and traditions—like the Mayan culture or a democratic tradition; (e) beliefs, desires, and other mental properties ascribed to groups—like the government’s desire to stay in power; (f) norms and rules—like the proscription of sex with family members and the rule requiring cars to drive on the right-hand side of the road; (g) properties of social networks—like their density or cohesion; (h) social structures, typically identified with one or more of the items already listed; and (i) social roles—like being a bus driver or a nurse. The list includes social phenomena in the form of social entities, social processes, and social properties. The latter are first and foremost properties ascribed to social groups or constellations of individuals. Yet social properties also include certain features ascribed to individuals, such as an individual’s social role. These properties are social properties, it is sometimes suggested, because they presuppose the social organization of individuals, or the existence of social entities. (For a discussion of different kinds of social properties, see also Ylikoski 2012, 2014.)

Methodological individualists typically disagree that all the items listed above constitute social phenomena. They contend that some exemplify individualist properties because they are properties of individuals. For instance, some methodological individualists maintain that norms and rules are individualist properties since they express individuals’ beliefs as to how they should—or should not—act. Likewise, many hold that social roles are individualist properties because they are ascribed to individuals. (For holist defenses of the view that social roles should be classified as social properties, see e.g., Kincaid 1997; Lukes 1968; Elder-Vass 2010; Hodgson 2007.) In this fashion, the dispute about how to distinguish between holist and individualist explanations translates into a difference in opinion concerning what constitutes social phenomena. Methodological holists consider more phenomena to be social and hence they classify more explanations as holist, whereas methodological individualists view fewer phenomena as social, the result being that they categorize fewer explanations as holist and more as individualist. Due to such disagreements, methodological holists and individualists often talk past one another: each offers arguments presupposing a distinction between holist and individualist explanations that is at odds with that relied upon by their opponent (see Zahle 2003, 2014).

The question of how to differentiate between holist and individualist explanations may also be approached by drawing on the analysis of explanations as consisting of an explanans, i.e., what does the explaining, and an explanandum, i.e., what is in need of explanation. Consider the following options: (a) both the explanans and the explanandum are expressed in terms of social phenomena (e.g., the government’s decision to lower the national minimum wage led to protests from the unions); (b) the explanans is stated in terms of social phenomena while the explanandum is described in terms of individuals, their actions, etc. (e.g., the government’s decision to lower the national minimum wage resulted in several individuals writing public letters of protest); (c) both the explanans and the explanandum are expressed in terms of individuals, their actions, etc. (e.g., because the small children started crying, a number of people came over to help out); (d) the explanans is stated in terms of individuals, their actions, etc. while the explanandum is described in terms of social phenomena (e.g., the fact that many individuals withdrew their money at once had the result that the bank exhausted its cash reserves). With these options in mind, three different ways of circumscribing holist and individualist explanations may be registered:

  • (1) Holist explanations: The explanans is stated in terms of social phenomena; the explanandum is expressed either in terms of social phenomena, or in terms of individuals, their actions, etc.
  • Individualist explanations: The explanans is stated in terms of individuals; the explanandum is expressed either in terms of social phenomena, or in terms of individuals, their actions, etc.
  • (2) Holist explanations: The explanans is stated in terms of social phenomena; the explanandum is described in terms of social phenomena.
  • Individualist explanations: The explanans is stated in terms of individuals, their actions, etc.; the explanandum is described in terms of social phenomena.
  • (3) Holist explanations: The explanans is stated in terms of social phenomena; the explanandum is expressed in terms of social phenomena.
  • Individualist explanations: The explanans is stated in terms of individuals, their actions, etc.; the explanandum is expressed in terms of individuals, their actions, etc.

All three conceptions have been advocated in the dispensability debate. Among them, the first position is the most inclusive, while also being the most widespread.

Second, the basic positions of strong methodological holism, moderate methodological holism and methodological individualism can be further characterized by noting that holist and individualist explanations may be categorized into different types. For instance, both holist and individualist explanations may be classified according to whether they are functional, intentional, or straightforward causal explanations. This point may be illustrated in relation to holist explanations. Holist explanations of the functional variety state that the continued existence of a social phenomenon is explained by its function or effect. For instance, it may be suggested that “the state continues to exist because it furthers the interests of the ruling class”. In the past, but no longer today, methodological holism has often been associated with the advancement of holist explanations of this type. (On the use of functional holist explanations, see e.g., Macdonald and Pettit 1981: 131ff.) Intentional holist explanations purport to explain an action ascribed to a group by reference to the group’s reasons for performing it. For example, it may be affirmed that “the government decided to call a general election in May because it believed this would increase its chances of being reelected”. (On the use of intentional holist explanations, see e.g., Tollefsen 2002; List and Pettit 2011.) Nowadays, both functional and intentional explanations are often regarded as special kinds of causal explanation to be distinguished from more straightforward causal explanations. This latter kind of causal explanation is illustrated by assertions such as “the rise in unemployment led to an increase in crime”, or “the government’s lowering of the taxes led to an increase in the consumption of luxury goods”.

Alternatively, to note an additional example, holist and individualist explanations may be categorized by reference to their focus. In this spirit, holist explanations may be classified according to whether they focus on, say, the statistical properties of social groups, on social organizations and their actions, and so on. Likewise, individualist explanations may be categorized according to whether, say, their descriptions of individuals are informed by rational choice models, by accounts that stress how actions are largely habitual and based on various forms of tacit knowledge, etc. The advocacy of a basic position may go together with the favoring of certain types of holist or individualist explanations over others.

Third, the positions of strong methodological holism, moderate methodological holism and methodological individualism can be further explicated by observing that each stance may either be formulated as a claim about explanations in general, that is, all explanations advanced within the social sciences, or as pertaining to final explanations only, that is, explanations that are satisfactory rather than being merely tolerable in the absence of better ones. Sometimes methodological individualists tend to regard the discussion as revolving solely around final explanations. Accordingly, they maintain that though holist explanations may be advanced, they are only tolerable as stopping points that are temporarily acceptable in anticipation of individualist explanations that, alone, will qualify as final explanations. Among both strong and moderate methodological holists, it is less commonly maintained that the debate concerns final explanations only.

There are additional dimensions along which the three basic positions within the dispensability debate may be clarified. For instance, each stance is compatible with different views of what constitutes an explanation, different notions of causation, and so on. Occasionally, the divergence of opinion with respect to these issues will surface in the discussion that follows.

2. Why Holist Explanations are Indispensable

This section examines some of the most important arguments offered in support of the claim that holist explanations are indispensable within the social sciences. All the arguments have been advocated by moderate methodological holists. Only the first version of the first argument has also, and perhaps mainly, been propounded by strong methodological holists. The arguments should all be read as defenses of the indispensability of holist explanations understood as final explanations.

2.1 The Argument from Social Phenomena as Causes

The argument from social phenomena as causes takes it that holist explanations are indispensable if social phenomena are causally effective. The basic structure of the argument is as follows. First, a characterization of social phenomena as causally effective is presented. Next, it is maintained that in order to explain the events generated by the causally effective social phenomena, holist explanations must be offered: holist explanations alone state how social phenomena bring about certain events. Lastly, it is concluded that since the events brought about by social phenomena should not be left unexplained, holist explanations are indispensable. The argument comes in various versions set apart by the way in which they characterize social phenomena as causally effective phenomena.

According to one line of reasoning, social entities like nations and societies have causal powers that are independent of, and override, the causal powers of the individuals who comprise these entities. For instance, it is held that nations develop in such a way so as to realize some goal, yet without the implicated individuals having any influence on this development. Alternatively, it is contended that societal structures may ensure that individuals perform certain functions in society; the individuals have no choice in this matter. However specified, social phenomena that have these independent and overriding causal powers produce effects that cannot be accounted for by offering individualist explanations; individuals are simply not causally responsible for these effects. The explanation of such social phenomena is only possible by way of holist explanations that lay out how the phenomena brought about the effects in question.

The contention that social entities have independent and overriding causal powers is often ascribed to Comte, Hegel, Marx, and their followers. Today the claim enjoys very few adherents. One important reason for this is that the claim is regarded as incompatible with the widely held view that social phenomena are noncausally determined by individuals and their properties, and sometimes by material artifacts too. Particularly since the 1980s, the notions of supervenience, realization, and emergence have received a lot attention as ways of spelling out this non-causal dependency relation between social phenomena, on the one hand, and individuals and their properties, on the other. These notions have served as the basis for alternative versions of the argument from social phenomena as causes.

Consider first the notions of supervenience and realization. Supervenience is a relationship between properties, kinds, or facts. Roughly speaking, social properties supervene upon individualist properties if and only if there can be no change at the level of social properties unless there is also a change at the level of individualist properties. Otherwise put, the individualist properties fix the social properties. Too see how this works, assume that a football club supervenes on a constellation of individuals with certain beliefs, bearing certain relations to each other, and so on. This being the case, the football club cannot transform into a golf club, say, unless the individuals change some of their beliefs, the relations they stand in, or the like. The individuals’ beliefs, relations, etc. fix the property of their being a football club. The notion of supervenience is often used interchangeably with the notion of realization. Thus, it is said that a constellation of individuals with certain beliefs, relationships, etc. realizes the property of being a football club. Several moderate methodological holists have, in varying ways, expanded on the account of social properties as supervenient properties by presenting considerations in support of supervenient social properties being, in certain cases, causally effective properties (see e.g., Kincaid 1997, 2009; List and Spiekermann 2013; Sawyer 2003, 2005). Their reflections are a response to the so-called exclusion argument, which states that supervenient properties are epiphenomenal because all the causal work is done by the properties that they supervene upon (on this argument, see e.g., Kim 2005). Here is how Christian List and Kai Spiekermann purport to establish that some supervenient social properties are causally effective (List and Spiekermann 2013).

List and Spiekermann begin by appealing to the difference-making or counterfactual conception of causation, which asserts that “a property C (within a system of interest) is the cause of another property E if and only if C systematically makes a difference to E” (2013: 636). By implication, a supervenient social property, S, qualifies as a cause of E, when S makes a systematic difference to E. This means that, other things being equal, if S occurred E would do so too, and that if S did not occur, then neither would E. Now assume that S is microrealization-robust: S would also have brought about E if it had been realized by a compound of individualist properties other than the one that actually realizes it. In situations of this sort, the compound of individualist properties that realizes S does not make a systematic difference to E. While it is the case that if the compound occurred then so would E, it is not the case that if the compound did not occur, E would not occur either. Hence it is S, rather than the compound of individualist properties realizing S, that qualifies as the cause of E. List and Spiekermann underline that in these circumstances, a holist explanation—that is, an explanation describing how a given supervenient social property brought about some effect—is needed.

As an anecdotal illustration of these points, they refer to the failed climate summit in Copenhagen in 2010 (2013: 637). They suggest that the summit failed at least in part because there were so many parties, and no common interest. Moreover, they note that these—and other—social properties of the situation are microrealization-robust: even had they been realized by individuals with somewhat different individualist properties, the social properties would have still resulted in a failed summit. The social properties of the meeting should thus be regarded as the cause of the failure; that is, a holist explanation must be offered in order to explain why the summit was unsuccessful.

Turn now to the notion of emergence. While emergent properties are sometimes regarded as identical to, or as a special class of, supervenient properties, emergent properties may also be differently characterized. These alternative specifications of social properties as emergent properties have similarly served as the basis for insisting that holist explanations are indispensable. Currently, this line of reasoning is often associated with the social scientific school of Critical Realism, founded by Roy Bhaskar and further developed by many others (see e.g., Archer 1995, 2000; Bhaskar 1979, 1982; Elder-Vass 2007, 2010, 2014). Main representatives of the movement have offered a variety of specifications of the notion of emergence. Among these, Dave Elder-Vass’ account will be briefly discussed.

According to Elder-Vass, social entities like firms and universities are composed of individuals (and sometimes material things as well) that stand in certain relation to one another (Elder-Vass 2007: 31). In virtue of being composed, at a given moment in time, of interrelated individuals, social entities have various causally effective social properties. Most notably, they have emergent social properties, of which there are two kinds. The first is constituted by emergent social properties that are ascribed to social entities as wholes. These are exemplified by a government’s power to introduce a new tax, or a quartet’s ability to deliver a harmonized performance. The second kind consists in emergent social properties that are ascribed to individuals. These are illustrated by a boss’s power to hire or fire employees. Individuals have these properties in virtue of being interrelated so as to form a social entity, and that’s why they constitute emergent social properties (Elder-Vass 2010: 74). Individuals who form part of social entities have non-emergent properties too. These are the causally effective properties, like the ability to read or talk, which individuals have independently of being, at a given moment in time, part of a social entity. From these reflections, Elder-Vass contends, it follows that holist explanations cannot be dispensed with. The effects of emergent social properties should be explained. To this end, it is necessary to offer holist explanations—that is, explanations that state how a social property partially brought about some effect. Individualist explanations are not up to this task inasmuch as they are confined to describing how individuals, in virtue of their non-emergent properties, partially brought about some effect. Simply pointing to the properties that individuals have independently of being, at a given moment in time, part of social entities, does not add up to an explanation of the effects of emergent social properties (see 2010: 66).

Contemporary moderate methodological holists largely agree that social phenomena are non-causally determined by individuals and their properties, and occasionally by material artifacts too. As illustrated in the foregoing, some defend the claim that thus conceived, social phenomena are causally effective, while such defenses often depend heavily on the particular notion of causation espoused. Many moderate methodological holists, however, see no need for arguments in support of social phenomena being causally effective. They simply assume this to be the case while pursuing alternative strategies in the attempt to establish that holist explanations are indispensable.

2.2 The Argument from the Impossibility of Translation

The argument from the impossibility of translation takes it that the indispensability of holist explanations is a matter of these explanations being untranslatable into individualist explanations. The argument begins by observing that holist explanations contain social descriptions or concepts, and goes on to note that the meaning of social descriptions cannot be captured by specifications that contain descriptions of individuals alone. Or, put otherwise, social concepts are not reductively definable solely in terms of individualist concepts. As a result, it is impossible to translate holist explanations into individualist ones: holist explanations cannot be replaced by individualist explanations through translation. Finally, the argument concludes that since the events accounted for by holist explanations should not go unexplained holist explanations are indispensable.

The argument from the impossibility of translation is famously presented by Maurice Mandelbaum in a paper from 1955 (Mandelbaum 1955). Here Mandelbaum defines social concepts as concepts that refer to forms of organization within a society. He remarks that concepts of this sort “cannot be translated into psychological [i.e., individualist] concepts without remainder” (1955: 310—italics in the original). In order to drive this point home, Mandelbaum considers the social concept of a bank teller. In order to specify what a bank teller is, it is necessary to invoke the social concept of a bank. The definition of a “bank”, in turn, must contain social concepts such as “legal tender” and “contract”. And these social concepts, too, can only be defined in ways that involve yet other social concepts, such that the definition of a social concept inevitably contains other social concepts. Given that the distinctive feature of holist explanations is their very containment of social concepts, these explanations can thus not be translated into, and as such replaced by, individualist explanations.

Mandelbaum’s argument, including his example of the bank teller, is widely cited in subsequent contributions to the debate between moderate methodological holists and individualists (see e.g., Bhargava 1992; Danto 1973 [1962]; Epstein 2015; Gellner 1973 [1956]; Goldstein 1973b [1958]; James 1984; Kincaid 1986, 1997; Zahle 2003). However, few moderate methodological holists have followed Mandelbaum in holding that holist explanations are indispensable if they indeed cannot be translated into individualist explanations.

2.3 The Argument from the Impossibility of Intertheoretic Reduction

The argument from the impossibility of intertheoretic reduction presumes that holist explanations cannot be dispensed with if holist theories are irreducible to individualist ones. The argument rests on the view that holist explanations draw on social theories, whereas individualist explanations involve individualist theories. From within this context, it is argued that social theories are oftentimes irreducible to, and hence irreplaceable by, individualist theories. Accordingly, when holist explanations make use of irreducible social theories, they cannot be substituted by individualist explanations that appeal to individualist theories. Since the events that are explained by appeal to irreducible social theories should not go unexplained, holist explanations are therefore indispensable.

Typically, discussions of the argument rely on some version of the Nagelian model of intertheoretic reduction. The model conceives of theories as statements issued mainly in the form of laws. Adapted to the present focus, it requires that two conditions be fulfilled in order to reduce a social theory to an individualist one. The first requirement is the condition of connectability, which must be met because it is assumed that holist theories are distinguished by their use of social predicates or descriptions, whereas individualist theories are characterized by containing individualist predicates or descriptions only. Following one common interpretation, the condition states that the social predicates in the social theory to-be-reduced must be linked, on a one-to-one basis, to individualist descriptions in the reducing individualist theory. The resulting bridge laws, as they are called, express that the linked descriptions are co-extensive, that is, that they have the same reference, in a law-like manner. (Note that this is a weaker condition than the demand considered in 2.2, requiring that the meaning of social terms must be captured by specifications that contain descriptions of individuals only.) The condition of connectability implies that if, say, the social term “church” occurs in the social theory to-be-reduced, then it must be demonstrated that this term is co-extensive, in a law-like manner, with a single individualist description of individuals and their properties as realizing a church. Once this condition has been met, the second requirement, the condition of derivability, should be fulfilled. It states that the social theory to-be-reduced must be deduced from, and in that sense explained by, the reducing individualist theory, plus the bridge laws.

Moderate methodological holists have primarily focused on demonstrating that social theories cannot be reduced to individualist theories because of difficulties that relate to meeting the requirement of connectability. The most prominent argument to this effect is the argument from multiple realization. The argument originates from within philosophy of mind, from whence it was developed into a generalizable argument against intertheoretic reduction (see Putnam 1967 and Fodor 1974). In the 1980s, it began to appear as an argument against the possibility of reducing social to individualist theories (see e.g., Kincaid 1986, 1996, 1997; Little 1991; Rios 2005; Sawyer 2002, 2005).

The argument begins by noting that social properties supervene on, or are realized by, individualist properties. It is then pointed out that this relationship between social and individualist properties is compatible with social properties being realizable not only by a single compound of individualist properties, but by different—in fact indefinitely many—compounds of individualist properties. An empirical claim is made next, asserting that many social properties are indeed multiply realizable. This point is typically supported by way of example. For instance, Kincaid lists several social predicates such as “revolution”, “bureaucracy”, and “peer group”, and remarks that “any number of different relations between individuals, individual psychological states, beliefs, etc. could realize the referent of these terms” (Kincaid 1986: 497). In a similar vein, Keith Sawyer states that “‘being a church’ could be realized in disjunctive [and hence multiple] ways in different cultures and social groups” (Sawyer 2002: 550). Finally, it is observed that the condition of connectability cannot be met whenever social theories contain social predicates that refer to social properties that have multiple and highly different, or indefinitely many, realizations. In these cases, the social predicates cannot be linked via bridge laws to single individualist descriptions. Instead, they will have to be linked to a disjunction of individualist descriptions. To see this, return to the example of the social property of being a church. Insofar as a church is multiply realizable, the term “church” will have to be linked up with a disjunction of individualist descriptions, each characterizing a possible compound of individualist properties that may realize a church. The upshot is that social theories that refer to multiply realizable social properties cannot be reduced to individualist theories. Thus, holist explanations that appeal to these theories cannot be substituted by individualist explanations.

Within recent discussions in the philosophy of science, the Nagelian model of intertheoretic reduction has been criticized on a number of grounds that likewise challenge its suitability as a model of reduction in the context of the dispensability debate. Insofar as the model is deemed inadequate, arguments in favor of the indispensability of holist explanations that rest on this model lose their significance.

2.4 The Argument from Explanatory Regress

The argument from explanatory regress focuses on the tenability of a standard reason for holding that holist explanations should be dispensed with. The standard reason in question is the following. Given that holist explanations focus on larger units in the form of social entities and processes, they are less preferable than individualist explanations that zero in on the components of these larger units, viz. individuals, their actions, etc. The argument from explanatory regress states that this claim may likewise be used to justify the contention that individualist explanations are less preferable than explanations that focus on the biological components of individuals. The claim may be further used to motivate the assertion that these explanations, too, should be dismissed in favor of explanations that concentrate on the chemical components of individuals’ biological units, and so on. To avoid this undesirable consequence, the argument continues, the standard reason for holding that holist explanations are always less preferable than individualist ones should be dismissed. Accordingly, since explanatory practices should not be changed unless there are good reasons to do so, the existing practice of offering holist explanations should not be discontinued. From the perspective of carrying on existing explanatory practices, holist explanations are indispensable.

Considerations of this sort have been presented by a number of theorists (see e.g., Hodgson 2007; Jackson and Pettit 1992a; Jones 1996; Tannsjö 1990). It should be noted that the regress argument makes a purely negative point in that it offers no guidance as to when—and why—holist explanations are indispensable in the social sciences as they are currently practiced. In this respect, the argument differs from the others considered in this section.

2.5 The Argument from Differing Explanatory Interests

The argument from differing explanatory interests asserts that holist explanations are indispensable insofar as they are capable of satisfying explanatory interests that are distinct from the interests that individualist explanations are able to satisfy. The argument has the following basic structure. First, it is made clear that a certain notion of explanation is adopted. By appeal to this notion, it is then argued that some holist explanations may serve explanatory interests that cannot be satisfied by individualist explanations. It is concluded that since the social sciences should satisfy these explanatory interests, holist explanations are indispensable.

The argument has mainly been advanced since the early 1980s. One common version of it relies on the erothetic model of explanation, according to which an explanation is an answer to a why-question. It has been presented by Alan Garfinkel, and subsequently by other theorists as well (see e.g., Garfinkel 1981; Kincaid 1996, 1997; Risjord 2000; Weber and Van Bouwel 2002). The principal point made is that some why-questions can only be adequately answered by offering holist explanations. Consequently, since an interest in answers to these why-questions should be met, holist explanations are indispensable. Another well-known version of the argument from differing explanatory interests relies on the causal information view of explanation. It states that an explanation provides information about the causal process leading to the event in need of explanation. The key idea is that some information can only be provided via holist explanations. Since an interest in this information should be satisfied, holist explanations are thus indispensable. This version of the argument has been presented by Frank Jackson and Philip Pettit (see Jackson and Pettit 1992a, 1992b; for a comparison of the erothetic and the causal information view of explanation, see Marchionni 2007). Their influential account will be examined in more detail.

Equipped with the causal information view of explanation, Jackson and Pettit consider the explaining of particular events (Jackson and Pettit 1992a). A holist explanation provides information about the manner in which the instantiation of a social property, S, resulted in a certain event. Now, due to social properties being supervenient on individualist ones, it is always possible to offer a corresponding individualist explanation of the same event: the individualist explanation offers information as to how the individuals who realized S produced the event in question. For example, assume that the particular event in need of explanation is a rise in crime. Here, the holist explanation might be that the rise in crime was the result of a rise in unemployment, whereas the individualist explanation might state that the crime rate went up because individual a, b, c, etc. lost their jobs, and felt frustrated about having little money and no job opportunities.

The key claim made by Jackson and Pettit is that these two explanations provide different information. The holist explanation conveys that given the rise in unemployment, an increase in crime was almost bound to occur. The reason is that

had the motivations and opportunities of those particular individuals not changed, the motivations of others would have done so. (1992a: 11)

Thus the holist explanation provides modally comparative information, that is, information that brings out that what happened in the actual world would also have taken place in a variety of possible worlds. By contrast, the individualist explanation confines itself to pointing out that these particular individuals, with their changed job situations and altered motivations, were responsible for the rise in crime. As such, it offers modally contrastive information, that is, information that sets the actual world apart from other possible worlds. Because of this divergence in the information provided, Jackson and Pettit conclude that holist explanations are indispensable. Unlike individualist explanations, holist explanations may satisfy an explanatory interest in modally comparative information, and an interest in this sort of information should be met.

Jackson and Pettit’s version of the argument from differing explanatory interests has been criticized for not taking into account that pragmatic considerations may determine whether the information provided by a holist explanation is considered to be of more—or less—interest than that offered by an individualist explanation (see Weber and Van Bouwel 2002). The idea that pragmatic considerations have a role to play is given center stage in the argument from pragmatic concerns.

2.6 The Argument from Pragmatic Concerns

The argument from pragmatic concerns states that whether holist explanations are indispensable is a matter of whether they are pragmatically preferable to individualist explanations. The argument rests on the assumption that whenever a holist explanation of an event is possible, an individualist explanation of that same event is likewise feasible. It is claimed that the choice between these two explanations should be made by appeal to pragmatic considerations. It is maintained, moreover, that it is sometimes preferable from a pragmatic perspective to offer a holist, rather than an individualist explanation. On this basis, it is concluded that holist explanations are indispensable.

An argument along these lines has been offered by Jones (1996). He notes that it is sometimes less costly to establish a holist rather than an individualist explanation of some event (1996: 126). What he likely has in mind is that gathering evidence about individuals, their doings, intentions, etc. with the aim of offering an individualist explanation may take more time, and hence come with a higher monetary cost, than producing the evidence needed to advance a holist explanation. Jones additionally asserts that a holist explanation is sometimes easier to teach: because holist explanations tend to be simpler in that they do not include an abundance of detail about individuals, their doings, beliefs, etc. (1996), they may be easier for individuals to grasp. In these sorts of situations, Jones contends that holist explanations are preferable to individualist ones: in view of pragmatic concerns like those outlined above, holist explanations are indispensable.

3. The Microfoundations Debate

The microfoundations debate gained prominence around the beginning of the 1980s when a number of philosophers and social scientists began to defend the view that purely holist explanations, as they may be termed, should be supplemented by an account of the underlying individual-level mechanisms. Jon Elster and Daniel Little, among others, argued in favor of this view in the context of Marxist social theorizing (Elster 1983, 1985, 1989; Little 1986, 1991, 1998). Raymond Boudon was also an early and important proponent (Boudon 1976, 1979). Their contention that social theorists must pay attention to individual-level microfoundations was soon met by opposition from methodological holists, and a debate developed. Within current philosophical discussions, the advocacy of the methodological individualist stance is often associated with the approach of analytical sociology or with key representatives thereof (Hedström 2005; Hedström and Swedberg 1996; Demeulenaere 2011). Yet the view is also defended by others, both from within and without sociology. Arguments in support of the opposing holist stance are not tied to any specific approach within the social sciences or philosophy.

There are two basic positions within the microfoundations debate:

Methodological holism: Purely holist explanations may sometimes stand on their own; they need not always be supplemented by accounts of the underlying individual-level microfoundations.

Methodological individualism: Purely holist explanations may never stand on their own; they should always be supplemented by accounts of the underlying individual-level microfoundations.

The debate may be further characterized by considering its key notions, possible qualifications of the individualist stance, and the standard motivation behind the demand for microfoundations.

To begin, purely holist explanations are ones in which both the explanans and the explanandum are expressed in terms of social phenomena. They are exemplified by claims such as “the protestant ethic caused the rise of capitalism in Western Europe”, or “the country’s high economic growth was partly due to its stable political environment”. Drawing on the discussion of holist explanations in connection with the dispensability debate, the explanans and explanandum may be said to be in terms of social phenomena when they contain social terms, descriptions, or predicates set apart by their reference to, and focus on, social phenomena. In turn, social phenomena may then be specified as social entities, social processes and social properties as exemplified by universities, revolutions, the literacy rate, and so on. Moreover, it is possible to distinguish between different types of purely holist explanation. For instance, purely holist explanations may be classified according to whether they are of the functional, intentional, or straightforward causal type, as introduced above. Or, purely holist explanations may be individuated according to their focus on, say, organizations, the statistical properties of groups, etc.

Turn now to the accounts of the individual-level microfoundations. These are specifications of the underlying individual-level mechanisms understood as causal chains of events, that occur at the level of individuals, and that link some cause in the form of a social phenomenon to its effect in the form of another social phenomenon. Very often, accounts of this sort are taken to consist of three parts. Part I lays out how a social phenomenon resulted in individuals forming various beliefs and desires, and having certain opportunities. Part II states how these beliefs, desires, and opportunities gave rise to individuals acting and interacting in a certain manner. Part III outlines how these actions and interactions, intentionally or unintentionally, brought about a certain social phenomenon. As an illustration of an account along these lines, consider the example of the purely holist explanation that “the protestant ethic caused the rise of capitalism in the West”. A very rough three-part account of the underlying individual-level mechanisms might go as follows. The protestant ethic compelled individuals to adopt certain values. These, in turn, induced them to engage in certain new forms of economic behavior. Those, finally, caused the rise of capitalism in the West. Frequently, Coleman’s well-known boat model is used to depict how purely holist explanations must include such three-part accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms (Coleman 1986, 1990). The model uses a boat form to illustrate the move from one social phenomenon down to individual-level events and up again to another social phenomenon.

As may already be clear, the accounts of the underlying mechanisms are individual-level accounts in the sense that they invariably contain descriptions of what happens to, and what is made to happen by, individuals. It is standard to invoke descriptions of individuals by reference to their roles and other properties they possess as a result of being part of social organizations. In this sense, a permissive notion as to what counts as individual-level descriptions is endorsed. The accounts of individuals may draw on different theories of the actor. In earlier phases of the debate, there was a clear tendency to base the accounts on rational-choice models. Today, other models are used as well.

The claim that purely holist explanations are in need of microfoundations may be qualified in various ways. Sometimes, it is made clear that purely holist explanations should always be accompanied by accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms. Very often, this position is motivated by appeal to the “mechanism model” of explanation. It states that to explain is to show how one phenomenon, via underlying mechanisms, brought about another phenomenon; to borrow Elster’s words, to explain is “to provide a mechanism, to open up the black box and show the nuts and bolts, the cogs and wheels” (Elster 1985: 5). Accordingly, purely holist explanations do not actually constitute explanations unless they are supplemented by accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms. In other instances, it is only held that purely holist explanations must be supplemented by accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms in order to qualify as satisfying or complete explanations. This view is commonly motivated by a weaker version of the mechanism model of explanation, according to which a satisfactory or complete explanation, rather than an explanation as such, must describe how one phenomenon, via underlying mechanisms, brought about another.

However qualified, the assertion that purely holist explanations are always in need of microfoundations is a weaker form of methodological individualism than the one defended within the indispensability dispute. Methodological individualists who are engaged in the microfoundations debate do not insist that holist explanations should be dispensed with. The target is only purely holist explanations, i.e., ones in which both the explanans and the explanandum are expressed in terms of social phenomena, and it is simply held that these explanations are in need of supplementation by accounts of individual-level mechanisms. Also, there is no objection to the use of holist explanations in which the explanans is stated in terms of social phenomena and the explanandum is described in terms of individuals, their actions, etc. In fact, explanations along these lines are offered as part of the accounts of the individual-level mechanisms when it is specified how a social phenomenon resulted in individuals forming various beliefs and desires, and having certain opportunities. Even though the demand for microfoundations is a weaker form of methodological individualism, the position has nonetheless met with opposition. As noted, methodological holists who are engaged in the microfoundations debate insist that purely holist explanations may sometimes stand on their own in that they need not be supplemented by accounts of the individual-level mechanisms; purely holist explanations qualify as explanations, or as satisfying or complete explanations.

4. Why Purely Holist Explanations Can Sometimes Stand on Their Own

Methodological holists have offered a number of arguments in support of the claim that purely holist explanations can sometimes stand on their own. In the following, some of their main arguments are examined.

4.1 The Argument from Underlying Social-Level Mechanisms

The argument from underlying social-level mechanisms purports to establish that purely holist explanations may sometimes be accompanied by underlying social-level rather than individual-level mechanisms (see e.g., Kaidesoja 2013; Kincaid 1997: 111; Mayntz 2004; Vromen 2010; Wan 2012; Ylikoski 2012).

The argument begins by noting that social phenomena are at a higher level of organization than individuals. Note that this is why accounts of individual-level mechanisms qualify as specifications of the underlying mechanisms. What is sometimes overlooked, the argument continues, is that social phenomena may themselves be at higher or lower levels of organization. For instance, a nation or a state is typically at a higher level of organization than a small firm or a school. This observation paves the way for the contention that a purely holist explanation should sometimes be accompanied by an account of the underlying mechanisms involving lower-level social phenomena. These explanations are still holist explanations. Accordingly, it is concluded, holist explanations may sometimes stand on their own in that they do not need individual-level microfoundations.

The argument from underlying social-level mechanisms makes it plain that the adoption of the mechanism model of explanation does not lend support to the view that purely holist explanations need always be accompanied by accounts of individual-level microfoundations. The model states that an explanation, or a satisfactory or complete explanation, describes how one phenomenon, via underlying mechanisms, brought about another phenomenon, and this is perfectly compatible with accounts of the underlying mechanisms consisting in descriptions of mechanisms at the level of other (though lower-level) social phenomena. Thus the argument from underlying social-level mechanisms does not challenge the mechanism model of explanation. Other arguments offered by methodological holists, however, aim to do exactly this.

4.2 The Argument from Mechanism Regress

The argument from mechanism regress is directed at the mechanism model of explanation. The endorsement of this model is taken to support the insistence that purely holist explanations must always be accompanied by accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms (see e.g., Van Bouwel 2006; Norkus 2005; Kincaid 1997: 26; Opp 2005).

The starting point of the argument involves the observation that when two social phenomena are linked by a causal chain of events at the level of individuals, then these events are themselves connected by underlying mechanisms involving events that are, in turn, linked by underlying mechanisms, and so on. In this fashion, it is mechanisms all the way down until some physical bottom-level mechanisms are probably reached. According to the argument from mechanism regress, this point brings into view a problem faced by the mechanism model of explanation. The model requires that the underlying mechanisms that causally link two phenomena must be specified. Consequently, due to social phenomena being connected by underlying mechanisms that extend all the way down to some bottom physical level, the model seems to require that all such mechanisms be specified each time a purely holist explanation is offered. But, of course, this is an absurd requirement, and so the mechanism view of explanation should be rejected. Without it, there is no longer any basis for holding that purely holist explanations can never stand on their own.

4.3 The Argument from Explanatory Practices

The argument from explanatory practices likewise targets the mechanism view of explanation that is taken to underwrite the claim that purely holist explanations must be complemented by accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms. The argument has been presented by Kincaid, who observes that both in everyday and scientific contexts, we offer explanations that lack specifications of the underlying mechanisms while still regarding these explanations as being perfectly acceptable (Kincaid 1997: 28). For instance, that a flying ball hit the window is typically regarded as a successful explanation as to why the window broke, even though no account of the underlying mechanisms is offered. This shows that our standard explanatory practices conflict with the mechanism model of explanation and, on this ground, the model should be dismissed. If this is so, there is no longer any reason for holding that purely holist explanations must always be accompanied by accounts of the underlying individual-level microfoundations.

The argument from explanatory practices and the earlier argument from mechanism regress intend to reject the mechanism model of explanation, so that it cannot serve as justification for the claim that purely holist explanations can never stand on their own. This makes it natural to wonder whether the demand for accounts of individual-level microfoundations may be upheld without appeal to this model of explanation. This issue has also been addressed in the debate.

4.4 The Argument from Non-Mechanistic Explanatory Considerations

The argument from non-mechanistic explanation purports to show that if non-mechanistic considerations as to what constitutes an explanation (or at least a satisfactory or complete explanation) are adopted, then purely holist explanations may sometimes stand on their own.

One version of the argument takes as its starting point the erothetic model of explanation, according to which explanations are, roughly speaking, answers to why-questions. Equipped with this model of explanation, Jeroen Van Bouwel considers the contrastive question as to why the French Revolution broke out in 1789, and not in 1750 (Van Bouwel 2006). Following Theda Skocpol’s work, he suggests that certain structural conditions made the revolution possible in 1789, and that these conditions were not present in 1750. In 1789, but not in 1750, the French state was economically weak because of the substantial resources that had gone into the American War of Independence, and because of the growing economic competition with England. This contrastive explanation is expressed in purely holist terms. Moreover, Van Bouwel contends that it constitutes a perfectly satisfactory—and complete—answer to the contrastive question. Adding an account of how the state’s weakness led various individuals to adopt certain beliefs and desires, and to act in ways that ultimately led to the French Revolution, would not render the explanation any better. Elaborating on this point, Van Bouwel concludes that in response to contrastive questions, purely holist explanations do not invariably need to be complemented by accounts of the underlying individual-level mechanisms.

Another version of the argument has been offered by Julian Reiss, who draws attention to the fact that two types of social phenomena may be causally linked by many different types of underlying individual-level mechanisms (Reiss 2013: 111). As an illustration of this point, he notes that an increase in the supply of currency tends to make prices go up, and that this may happen via multiple types of underlying individual-level mechanisms. Consequently, when faced with the task of explaining a particular case of prices having gone up, there are two options. One option is to appeal to the tendency of an increase in the money supply to make the prices go up; the other is to refer to this tendency while supplementing this with an account of the underlying individual-level mechanisms. The point is that we may sometimes prefer explanations that are applicable to a large number of individual cases, in which case we should opt for the purely holist explanation. If an account of the underlying individual-level mechanisms is included, the explanation will not hold for all the cases in which the mechanisms are of a different type (2013: 114). Therefore, Reiss argues, it is not correct that purely holist explanations should always be accompanied by accounts of the individual-level microfoundations; sometimes purely holist explanations may stand on their own.

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Other Internet Resources

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Acknowledgments

This entry draws, and expands, on Zahle (2007, 2013) and Zahle and Collin (2014b). Thanks to Harold Kincaid and Petri Ylikoski for their very helpful comments.

Copyright © 2016 by
Julie Zahle <jzahle@hum.ku.dk>

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