Personal Identity

First published Tue Aug 20, 2002; substantive revision Thu Oct 28, 2010

Personal identity deals with questions that arise about ourselves by virtue of our being people (or, as lawyers and philosophers like to say, persons). Many of these questions are familiar ones that occur to nearly all of us now and again: What am I? When did I begin? What will happen to me when I die? Others are more abstruse. Personal identity has been discussed since the origins of Western philosophy, and most major figures have had something to say about it. (There is also a rich literature on this topic in Eastern philosophy, which I am not competent to discuss; Collins 1982 and Jinpa 2002 are useful sources.)

I will first survey the main questions of personal identity. Most of the entry will then focus on the one that has received most attention in recent times, namely our identity over time. I will discuss what the question means and the main proposed answers. I will also say a little about how these answers relate to some of the other questions of personal identity and to more general questions in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind.

1. The Problems of Personal Identity

There is no single problem of personal identity, but rather a wide range of loosely connected questions. Here are the most familiar ones:

Who am I? We often speak of one's “personal identity” as what makes one the person one is. Your identity in this sense consists roughly of what makes you unique as an individual and different from others. Or it is the way you see or define yourself, or the network of values and convictions that structure your life. This individual identity is a property (or set of properties). Presumably it is one you have only contingently: you might have had a different identity from the one you in fact have. It is also a property that you may have only temporarily: you could swap your current individual identity for a new one, or perhaps even get by without any. (Ludwig 1997 is a typical discussion of this topic.)

Personhood. What is it to be a person? What is necessary, and what suffices, for something to count as a person, as opposed to a non-person? What have people got that non-people haven't got? This amounts more or less to asking for the definition of the word person. An answer would take the form “Necessarily, x is a person if and only if … x …”, with the blanks appropriately filled in. More specifically, we can ask at what point in one's development from a fertilized egg there comes to be a person, or what it would take for a chimpanzee or a Martian or an electronic computer to be a person, if they could ever be. (See e.g. Chisholm 1976: 136f., Baker 2000: ch. 3.)

Persistence. What does it take for a person to persist from one time to another—that is, for the same person to exist at different times? What sorts of adventures could you possibly survive, in the broadest sense of the word ‘possible’, and what sort of event would necessarily bring your existence to an end? What determines which past or future being is you? Suppose you point to a child in an old class photograph and say, “That's me.” What makes you that one, rather than one of the others? What is it about the way she relates then to you as you are now that makes her you? For that matter, what makes it the case that anyone at all who existed back then is you? This is the question of personal identity over time. An answer to it is an account of our persistence conditions, or a criterion of personal identity over time (a constitutive rather than an evidential criterion: the second falls under the Evidence Question below).

Historically this question often arises out of the hope (or fear) that we might continue to exist after we die—Plato's Phaedo is a famous example. Whether this could happen depends on whether biological death necessarily brings one's existence to an end. Imagine that after your death there really will be someone, in the next world or in this one, who resembles you in certain ways. How would that being have to relate to you as you are now in order to be you, rather than someone else? What would the Higher Powers have to do to keep you in existence after your death? Or is there anything they could do? The answer to these questions depends on the answer to the Persistence Question.

Evidence. How do we find out who is who? What evidence bears on the question of whether the person here now is the one who was here yesterday? What ought we to do when different kinds of evidence support opposing verdicts? One source of evidence is first-person memory: if you remember doing some particular action, or at least seem to remember, and someone really did do it, then that person is probably you. Another source is physical continuity: if the person who did it looks just like you, or even better if she is in some sense physically or spatio-temporally continuous with you, that is reason to think she is you. Which of these sources is more fundamental? Does first-person memory count as evidence all by itself, for instance, or only insofar as we can check it against publicly available physical evidence?

The Evidence Question dominated the philosophical literature on personal identity from the 1950s to the 1970s (Shoemaker 1963 and Penelhum 1970 are good examples). It is important to distinguish it from the Persistence Question. What it takes for you to persist through time is one thing; how we might find out whether you have is another. If the criminal had fingerprints just like yours, the courts may conclude that he is you. But even if that is conclusive evidence, having your fingerprints is not what it is for a past or future being to be you: it is neither necessary (you could survive without any fingers at all) nor sufficient (someone else could have fingerprints just like yours).

Population. If we think of the Persistence Question as asking which of the characters introduced at the beginning of a story have survived to become the ones at the end of it, we may also want to ask how many are on the stage at any one time. What determines how many of us there are now? If there are some seven billion people on the earth at present, what facts—biological, psychological, or what have you—make that the right number? The question is not what causes there to be a certain number of people at a given time, but what there being that number consists in. It is like asking what sort of configuration of pieces amounts to black's winning a game of chess, rather than what sorts of moves typically lead to its winning.

You may think that the number of people at any given time is simply the number of human organisms there are then (perhaps discounting those in a defective state that don't count as people, and ignoring non-human people if there are any). But this is disputed. Surgeons sometimes cut the nerve bands connecting one's cerebral hemispheres. This results in behavior that suggests some sort of radical disunity of consciousness, such as simultaneously pulling one's trousers up with one hand and pulling them down with the other. You might think that this gives us two people sharing one organism. (See e.g. Nagel 1971. Puccetti 1973 argues that there are two people within the skin of each normal human being.) Or maybe a human being with split personality could literally be the home of two or more thinking beings (Wilkes 1988: 127f.; see also Olson 2003b).

This is sometimes called the problem of “synchronic identity”, as opposed to the “diachronic identity” of the Persistence Question (and the “counterfactual identity” of the How could I have been? Question below). These terms need careful handling, however. They are apt to give the impression that identity comes in two kinds, synchronic and diachronic: a serious blunder. The truth is simply that there are two kinds of situations where we can ask how many people (or other things) there are: synchronic situations involving just one moment and diachronic ones involving a stretch of time.

What am I? What sort of things, metaphysically speaking, are you and I and other human people? What is our basic metaphysical nature? For instance, what are we made of? Are we made up entirely of matter, as stones are, or partly or wholly of something else? If we are made of matter, what matter is it? (Just the matter that makes up our bodies, or might we be larger or smaller than our bodies?) Where, in other words, do our spatial boundaries lie? More fundamentally, what fixes those boundaries? Are we substances—metaphysically independent beings—or is each of us a state or an aspect of something else, or perhaps some sort of process or event?

One possible answer to this broad question is that we are biological organisms. (Surprisingly perhaps, most philosophers reject this. We will return to it later.) Another is that we are partless immaterial substances—or compound things made up of an immaterial soul and a material body (Swinburne 1984: 21). Hume suggested that each of us is “a bundle of perceptions” (1978: 252; see also Quinton 1962 and Campbell 2006). A popular view nowadays is that we are material things “constituted by” organisms: you are made of the same matter as a certain animal, but you and the animal are different things because what it takes for you to persist is different (Shoemaker 1984: 112–114 and 1999, Baker 2000). Another is that we are temporal parts of animals (Lewis 1976, Hudson 2001). There is even the paradoxical view that there is nothing that we are: we don't really exist at all (Russell 1985: 50, Wittgenstein 1922: 5.631, Unger 1979). (Olson 2007 discusses these matters at length.)

How could I have been? How different could I have been from the way I actually am? Which of my properties do I have essentially, and which only accidentally or contingently? Could I, for instance, have had different parents? Frank Sinatra and Doris Day might have had children together. Could I have been one of them? Or could they only have had children other than me? Could I have existed in the womb and died before ever becoming conscious? Are there possible worlds just like the actual one except for who is who—where people have “changed places” so that what is in fact your career is mine and vice versa? Whether these are best described as questions about personal identity is debatable. (They are not about whether beings in other worlds are identical with people in the actual world: see van Inwagen 1985.) But they are sometimes discussed in connection with the others.

What matters in identity? What is the practical importance of facts about our identity and persistence? Why should we care about it? Why does it matter? Imagine that surgeons are going to put your brain into my head and that neither of us has any choice about this. Will the resulting person—who will presumably think he is you—be responsible for my actions or for yours? (Or both? Or neither?) Suppose he will be in terrible pain after the operation unless one of us pays a large sum in advance. If we were both entirely selfish, which of us would have a reason to pay?

The answer may seem to turn entirely on whether the resulting person would be you or I. Only you can be responsible for your actions. The only one whose future welfare you cannot rationally ignore is yourself. You have a special, selfish interest in your own future and no one else's. Identity itself matters practically. But some deny this. They say that someone else could be responsible for your actions. You could have an entirely selfish reason to care about someone else's well-being for his own sake. Perhaps what gives me a reason to care about what happens to the man people will call by my name tomorrow is not that he is me, but that he is then psychologically continuous with me as I am now (see Section 4), or because he relates to me in some other way that does not imply that he and I are one. If someone other than me were psychologically continuous tomorrow with me as I am now, he would have what matters to me, and I ought to transfer my selfish concern to him. Identity itself has no practical importance. (See Shoemaker 1970: 284; Parfit 1971, 1984: 215, 1995; Martin 1998.)

That completes our survey of problems. Though these eight questions are obviously related, it is hard to find any important common feature that makes them all questions about personal identity. In any case they are different, and failing to keep them separate will only bring trouble.

2. Understanding the Persistence Question

Let us turn now to the Persistence Question. Few concepts have been the source of more misunderstanding than identity over time. The Persistence Question is often confused with other questions, or stated in a tendentious way.

The question is what is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be you. If we point to you now, and then describe someone or something existing at another time, we can ask whether we are referring to one thing twice, or referring once to each of two things. (There are precisely analogous questions about the persistence of other objects, such as dogs.) The Persistence Question asks what determines the answer to such questions, or makes possible answers true or false.

The question is about numerical identity. To say that this and that are numerically identical is to say that they are one and the same: one thing rather than two. This is different from qualitative identity. Things are qualitatively identical when they are exactly similar. Identical twins may be qualitatively identical—there may be no telling them apart—but not numerically identical, as there are two of them: that's what makes them twins. A past or future person need not be, at that past or future time, exactly like you are now in order to be you—that is, in order to be numerically identical with you. You don't remain qualitatively the same throughout your life. You change: you get bigger or smaller; you learn new things and forget others; and so on. So the question is not what it takes for a past or future being to be qualitatively just like you, but what it takes for a past or future being to be you, as opposed to someone or something other than you.

(Someone might say, as Hume apparently did, that a past or future being could not be you unless he or she were then qualitatively just like you are now. That would be a highly contentious metaphysical claim. It amounts to denying that anyone can survive any change whatever: even blinking your eyes would be fatal, resulting in your ceasing to exist and being replaced with someone else. It would mean that you did not exist even a moment ago. There would be no point in asking the persistence question if this were the case. Virtually all discussions of personal identity over time assume that it is possible for a person to change.)

The confusion of qualitative with numerical identity is one source of misunderstanding about the Persistence Question. Here is another. People sometimes ask what it takes for someone to remain the same person from one time to another. The idea is that if I were to alter in certain ways—if I lost most of my memory, or my personality changed dramatically, or I underwent a profound religious conversion, say—then I should no longer be the person I was before.

The question of what it takes for someone to remain the same person is not the Persistence Question. It is not even a question about numerical identity. If it were, it would answer itself: I necessarily remain numerically the same for as long as I exist. Nothing could make me a numerically different person from the one I am now. For someone existing tomorrow to be numerically different from me is precisely for him not to be me. Nothing can start out as one thing and end up as another thing—a numerically different one. This has nothing to do with personal identity in particular, but is simply a fact about the logic of identity.

Those who say that after a certain sort of adventure you would be a different person, or that you would no longer be the person you once were, presumably mean that you would still exist, but would have changed in some important way. They are usually thinking of one's individual identity in the Who am I? sense: about the possibility of your losing some or all of the properties that make up your individual identity and acquiring new ones. This has nothing to do with the Persistence Question.

It is inconvenient that the words ‘identity’ and ‘same’ mean so many different things: numerical identity, qualitative identity, individual psychological identity, and more. To make matters worse, some philosophers speak of “surviving” in a way that does not imply numerical identity, so that I could survive a certain adventure without existing afterwards (Parfit 1971). Confusion is inevitable.

Here is a more insidious misunderstanding. Many people try to state the Persistence Question like this:

  1. Under what possible circumstances is a person existing at one time identical with a person existing at another time?

In other words, what does it take for past or future person to be you? We have a person existing at one time and a person existing at another, and the question is what is necessary and sufficient for them to be one person rather than two.

This is not the Persistence Question. It is too narrow. We may want to know whether you were ever an embryo or a foetus, or whether you could survive in an irreversible vegetative state or as a corpse. These are clearly questions about what it takes for us to persist, and an account of our identity over time ought to answer them. (Their answers may have important ethical implications: it matters to the morality of abortion, for instance, whether something that is an embryo or foetus at one time can be an adult person at another time, or whether the adult person is always numerically different from the foetus.) But many philosophers define ‘person’ as something that has certain special mental properties. Locke, for instance, famously said that a person is “a thinking intelligent being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing, in different times and places” (1975: 335). Presumably this implies that something is a person at a given time if and only if it has those mental properties then. And neurologists say that early-term foetuses and human beings in a persistent vegetative state have no mental properties at all then. If anything like Locke's definition is right, such beings are not people—not at that time, anyway. In that case we cannot infer anything about whether you were once an embryo or could come to be a vegetable by discovering what it takes for a past or future person to be you.

We can illustrate the point by considering a particular answer to question 1:

Necessarily, a person who exists at one time is identical with a person who exists at a second time if and only if the first person can, at the first time, remember an experience the second person has at the second time, or vice versa.

That is, a past or future person is you just in the case that you can now remember an experience she had then, or she can then remember an experience you are having now. (This view is also sometimes attributed to Locke, though it is doubtful whether he actually held it.) Call it the Memory Criterion.

The Memory Criterion may seem to imply that if you were to lapse into an irreversible vegetative state, the resulting vegetable would not be you, as it would be unable to remember anything: you would have ceased to exist, or perhaps passed on to the next world. But in fact it implies no such thing. Assuming that a human vegetable is not a person, this is not a case involving a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time. The Memory Criterion purports to tell us which past or future person you are, but not which past or future thing. In other words, it says what it takes for one to persist as a person, but not what it takes for one to persist without qualification. So it implies nothing at all about whether you could come to be a vegetable or a corpse. For the same reason it tells us nothing about whether you were ever an embryo. (Olson 1997: 22–26, Mackie 1999: 224–228).

So rather than Question 1, we ought to ask what it takes for any past or future being, person or not, to be you or I:

  1. Under what possible circumstances is a person who exists at one time identical with something that exists at another time (whether or not it is a person then)?

This is the Persistence Question. Philosophers typically ask 1 rather than 2 because they assume that every person is a person essentially: nothing that is in fact a person could possibly exist without being a person. (By contrast, something that is in fact a student could exist without being a student: no student is essentially a student, and it would be a mistake to inquire about the conditions of student identity by asking what it takes for a student existing at one time to be identical to a student existing at another time.) This claim, “person essentialism”, implies that whatever is a person at one time must be a person at every time when she exists, making the two questions equivalent. Whether person essentialism is true, however, is a serious question (an instance of the How could I have been? Question). Person essentialism—together with something like the Lockean account of personhood—implies that you could not possibly have been an embryo: the embryo that gave rise to you is not strictly you; you came into being only when it developed certain mental capacities. Nor could you come to be a human vegetable. For that matter, it rules out our being biological organisms, since no organism is a person essentially: every human organism starts out as an unthinking embryo and may end up in a vegetative state.

Whether we are organisms or were once embryos are substantive questions that an account of personal identity ought to answer, not matters to be settled in advance by the way we frame the debate. So we cannot assume at the outset that we are people in something like Locke's sense essentially. Asking Question 1 prejudges the issue by favoring some accounts of what we are, and what it takes for us to persist, over others. In particular, asking 1 effectively rules out the Somatic Approach described in the next section. It is like asking which man committed the crime before ruling out the possibility that it might have been a woman.

3. Accounts of Our Identity Through Time

Almost all proposed answers to the Persistence Question fall into one of three categories. The first is the Psychological Approach, according to which some psychological relation is necessary or sufficient (or both) for one to persist. You are that future being that in some sense inherits its mental features—beliefs, memories, preferences, the capacity for rational thought, that sort of thing—from you; and you are that past being whose mental features you have inherited in this way. There is dispute over what sort of inheritance this has to be—whether it must be underpinned by some kind of physical continuity, for instance, or whether a “non-branching” requirement is needed. There is also disagreement about what mental features need to be inherited. (I will return to some of these issues.) But most philosophers writing on personal identity since the early 20th century have endorsed some version of the Psychological Approach. The Memory Criterion mentioned earlier is an example. Advocates of the Psychological Approach include Johnston (1987), Garrett (1998), Hudson (2001), Lewis (1976), Nagel (1986, 40), Noonan (2003), Nozick (1981), Parfit (1971; 1984, 207), Perry (1972), Shoemaker (1970; 1984, 90; 1997; 1999), and Unger (1990, ch. 5; 2000).

A second idea is that our identity through time consists in some brute physical relation. You are that past or future being that has your body, or that is the same biological organism as you are, or the like. Whether you survive or perish has nothing to do with psychological facts. Call this the Somatic Approach. (It should not be confused with the view that physical evidence has some sort of priority over psychological evidence in finding out who is who. That has to do with the Evidence Question.) Its advocates include Ayers (1990: 278–292), Carter (1989), Mackie (1999), Olson (1997), van Inwagen (1990), and Williams (1956–7, 1970).

You may think the truth lies somewhere between the two: we need both mental and physical continuity to survive, or perhaps either would suffice without the other. Views of this sort are usually versions of the Psychological Approach as I have defined it. Here is a test case. Imagine that your brain is transplanted into my head. Two beings result: the person who ends up with your cerebrum and most of your mental features, and the empty-headed being left behind, which may perhaps be biologically alive but will have no mental features. Those who say that you would be the one who gets your brain usually say so because they believe that some relation involving psychology suffices for you to persist: they accept the Psychological Approach. Those who say that you would be the empty-headed vegetable say so because they take your identity to consist in something entirely non-psychological, as the Somatic Approach has it.

Both the Psychological and Somatic Approaches agree that there is something that it takes for us to persist—that our identity through time consists in or necessarily follows from something other than itself. A third view, Anticriterialism, denies this. Mental and physical continuity are evidence for identity, it says, but do not always guarantee it, and may not be required. No sort of continuity is both necessary and sufficient for you to survive. The only correct and complete answer to the Persistence Question is the trivial statement that a person existing at one time is identical with a being existing at another if and only they are identical (Swinburne 1984, Lowe 1996: 41ff., Merricks 1998; see also Zimmerman 1998). Anticriterialism is poorly understood, and deserves more attention than it has received.

It seems that the Persistence Question must have an answer. One of these three views, or another that I haven't mentioned, must be true. If there is such a thing as you—if there is anything sitting there and reading this now—then some conditions must be necessary and sufficient for it to persist. Those conditions will involve psychology, or only brute physical continuity, or something else—or they are trivial and uninformative, as Anticriterialism has it. Moreover, at most one such view can be true. We will revisit this claim in Section 8, however.

4. The Psychological Approach

Most people—most Western philosophy teachers and students, anyway—feel immediately drawn to the Psychological Approach. It seems obvious that you would go along with your brain if it were transplanted, and that this is so because that organ would carry with it your memories and other mental features. This would lead the recipient to believe that he or she was you. And why should this belief be mistaken? This makes it easy to suppose that our identity over time has something to do with psychology. It is notoriously difficult, however, to get from this conviction to a plausible answer to the Persistence Question.

What psychological relation might our identity through time consist in? We have already mentioned memory: a past or future being might be you if and only if you can now remember an experience she had then, or vice versa. This proposal faces two objections, discovered in the 18th century by Seargeant and Berkeley (see Behan 1979), but more famously discussed by Reid and Butler (see the snippets in Perry 1975).

First, suppose a young student is fined for overdue library books. Later, as a middle-aged lawyer, she remembers paying the fine. Later still, in her dotage, she remembers her law career, but has entirely forgotten not only paying the fine but everything else she did in her youth. According to the Memory Criterion the young student is the middle-aged lawyer, the lawyer is the old woman, but the old woman is not the young student. This is an impossible result: if x and y are one and y and z are one, x and z cannot be two. Identity is transitive; memory continuity is not.

Second, it seems to belong to the very idea of remembering that you can remember only your own experiences. To remember paying a fine (or the experience of paying) is to remember yourself paying. That makes it trivial and uninformative to say that you are the person whose experiences you can remember—that is, that memory continuity is sufficient for personal identity. It is uninformative because you cannot know whether someone genuinely remembers a past experience without already knowing whether he is the one who had it. Suppose we want to know whether Blott, who exists now, is the same as Clott, whom we know to have existed at some time in the past. The Memory Criterion tells us that Blott is Clott if Blott can now remember an experience of Clott's that occurred at that past time. But Blott's seeming to remember one of Clott's experiences from that time counts as genuine memory only if Blott actually is Clott. So we should already have to know whether Blott is Clott before we could apply the principle that is supposed to tell us whether she is. (Note, however, that this is no objection to the claim that memory connections are necessary for us to persist. There is nothing trivial or uninformative about that.)

One response to the first problem is to modify the Memory Criterion by switching from direct to indirect memory connections: the old woman is the young student because she can recall experiences the lawyer had at a time when the lawyer remembered the student's life. The second problem is traditionally met by replacing memory with a new concept, “retrocognition” or “quasi-memory”, which is just like memory but without the identity requirement: even if it is self-contradictory to say that I remember doing something I didn't do but someone else did, I could still “quasi-remember” it (Penelhum 1970: 85ff., Shoemaker 1970; for criticism see McDowell 1997).

Neither move gets us far, however, as both the original and the modified Memory Criteria face a more obvious problem: there are many times in my past that I can't remember or quasi-remember at all, and to which I am not linked even indirectly by an overlapping chain of memories. For instance, there is no time when I could recall anything that happened to me while I was dreamlessly sleeping last night. The Memory Criterion has the absurd implication that I have never existed at any time when I was completely unconscious. The man sleeping in my bed last night was someone else.

A better solution appeals to causal dependence (Shoemaker 1984, 89ff.). We can define two notions, psychological connectedness and psychological continuity. A being is psychologically connected, at some future time, with me as I am now just if he is in the psychological states he is in then in large part because of the psychological states I am in now. Having a current memory (or quasi-memory) of an earlier experience is one sort of psychological connection—the experience causes the memory of it—but there are others. Importantly, one's current mental states can be caused in part by mental states one was in at times when one was unconscious. For example, most of my current beliefs are the same ones I had while I slept last night: those beliefs have caused themselves to continue existing. We can then define the second notion thus: I am now psychologically continuous with a past or future being just if some of my current mental states relate to those he is in then by a chain of psychological connections.

Now suppose that a person x who exists at one time is identical with something y existing at another time if and only if x is, at the one time, psychologically continuous with y as it is at the other time. This avoids the most obvious objections to the Memory Criterion.

It still leaves important questions unanswered, however. Suppose we could somehow copy all the mental contents of your brain onto mine, much as we can copy the contents of one computer drive onto another. And suppose this process erased the previous contents of both brains. Whether this would be a case of psychological continuity depends on what sort of causal dependence counts. The resulting being (with my brain and your mental contents) would be mentally like you were before, and not like I was. He would have inherited your mental properties in a way—but a funny way. Is it the right way? Could you literally move from one human animal to another via “brain-state transfer”? Advocates of the Psychological Approach disagree (Shoemaker 1984: 108–111 and 1997, Unger 1990: 67–71). (Schechtman 1996 gives an interesting objection to the psychological-continuity strategy, without abandoning the Psychological Approach.)

5. Fission

Whatever psychological continuity may amount to, a more serious worry for the Psychological Approach is that you could be psychologically continuous with two past or future people at once. If your cerebrum—the upper part of the brain largely responsible for mental features—were transplanted, the recipient would be psychologically continuous with you by anyone's lights (even if there would also be important psychological differences). The Psychological Approach implies that she would be you. If we destroyed one of your cerebral hemispheres, the resulting being would also be psychologically continuous with you. (Hemispherectomy—even the removal of the left hemisphere, which controls speech—is considered a drastic but acceptable treatment for otherwise-inoperable brain tumors: see Rigterink 1980.) What if we did both at once, destroying one hemisphere and transplanting the other? Then too, the one who got the transplanted hemisphere would be psychologically continuous with you, and according to the Psychological Approach would be you.

But now suppose that both hemispheres are transplanted, each into a different empty head. (We needn't pretend, as some authors do, that the hemispheres are exactly alike.) The two recipients—call them Lefty and Righty—will each be psychologically continuous with you. The Psychological Approach as I have stated it implies that any future being who is psychologically continuous with you must be you. It follows that you are Lefty and also that you are Righty. But that cannot be: Lefty and Righty are two, and one thing cannot be numerically identical with two things. Suppose Lefty is hungry at a time when Righty isn't. If you are Lefty, you are hungry at that time. If you are Righty, you aren't. If you are Lefty and Righty, you are both hungry and not hungry at once: a contradiction.

Friends of the Psychological Approach have proposed two different solutions to this problem. One, sometimes called the “multiple-occupancy view”, says that if there is fission in your future, then there are two of you, so to speak, even now. What we think of as you is really two people, who are now exactly similar and located in the same place, doing the same things and thinking the same thoughts. The surgeons merely separate them (Lewis 1976, Noonan 2003: 139–42; Perry 1972 offers a more complex variant).

The multiple-occupancy view is almost invariably combined with the general metaphysical claim that people and other persisting things are made up of temporal parts (often called “four-dimensionalism”; see Heller 1990: ch. 1, Sider 2001). For each person, there is such a thing as her first half: an entity just like the person only briefer, like the first half of a race. On this account, the multiple-occupancy view is that Lefty and Righty coincide before the operation by sharing their pre-operative temporal parts, and diverge later by having different temporal parts located afterwards. They are like two roads that coincide for a stretch and then fork, sharing some of their spatial parts but not others. At the places where the roads overlap, they are just like one road. Likewise, the idea goes, at the times before the operation when Lefty and Righty share their temporal parts, they are just like one person. Even they themselves can't tell that they are two. Whether people really are made up of temporal parts, however, is disputed (see section 8).

The other solution to the fission problem abandons the intuitive claim that psychological continuity by itself suffices for one to persist. It says, rather, that you are identical with a past or future being only if she is then psychologically continuous with you and no other being is. (There is no circularity in this. We need not know the answer to the Persistence Question in order to know how many people there are at any one time; that comes under the Population Question.) This means that neither Lefty nor Righty is you. They both come into existence when your cerebrum is divided. If both your cerebral hemispheres are transplanted, you cease to exist—though you would survive if only one were transplanted and the other destroyed. (Shoemaker 1984: 85, Unger 1990: 265, Garrett 1998: ch. 4; see also Noonan 2003: 12–15 and ch. 7).

This proposal, the “non-branching view”, has the surprising consequence that if your brain is divided, you will survive if only one half is preserved, but you will die if both halves are. Fission is death. That is just the opposite of what most of us expect: if your survival depends on the functioning of your brain (because that is what underlies psychological continuity), then the more of that organ we preserve, the greater ought to be your chance of surviving. In fact the non-branching view implies that you would perish if one of your hemispheres were transplanted and the other left in place: you can survive hemispherectomy only if the excised hemisphere is immediately destroyed. And if brain-state transfer is a case of psychological continuity, you would cease to exist if your total brain state were copied onto another brain without erasing your own brain. (“Best-candidate” theories such as Nozick 1981 attempt to avoid this.)

The non-branching view makes the What matters? Question especially acute. Faced with the prospect of having one of your hemispheres transplanted, there would seem to be no reason to prefer that the other be destroyed. Most of us would rather have both preserved, even if they go into different heads. Yet on the non-branching view that is to prefer death over continued existence. This leads Parfit and others to say that that is precisely what we ought to prefer. Insofar as we are rational, we don't want to continue existing. Or at least we don't want it for its own sake. What I really want is for there to be someone in the future who is psychologically continuous with me, whether or not he is me. The usual way to achieve this is to continue existing; but the fission story shows that I could have it without continuing to exist. Likewise, even the most selfish person has a reason to care about the welfare of the beings who would result from her undergoing fission, even if, as the non-branching view implies, neither would be her. In the fission case, the sorts of practical concerns you ordinarily have for yourself seem to apply to someone who isn't strictly you. This suggests more generally that facts about who is numerically identical with whom have no practical importance. All that matters practically is who is psychologically continuous with whom. (Lewis 1976 and Parfit 1976 debate whether the multiple-occupancy view can preserve the conviction that identity is what matters practically.)

This may cast doubt on the principal argument for the Psychological Approach. Suppose you would care about the welfare of your two fission offshoots in just the way that you ordinarily care about your own welfare, even though neither offshoot would be you. Then you would care about what happened to the person who got your whole brain in the original transplant case, even if she would not be you. Even if you would regard that person as yourself for all practical purposes—if you would anticipate her experiences just as you anticipate yours, for instance—that would in no way support the claim that she was you. So our reactions to the brain-transplant case may not support the view that we persist by virtue of psychological continuity, but only the claim that psychological continuity is what matters practically, which is compatible with other accounts of our persistence. In that case we may wonder whether we have any reason to accept the Psychological Approach.

It is sometimes said that fission is not a special problem for the Psychological Approach, but afflicts all answers to the Persistence Question equally, apart (perhaps) from Anticriterialism. Whether this is so is a hard question. Even if it is, though, the fission problem looks especially worrying for the Psychological Approach, as it threatens the support for that view without affecting the arguments for rival views. (It does not undermine arguments for the Somatic Approach, for instance.)

6. The Too-Many-Thinkers Problem

Another apparent difficulty for the Psychological Approach is that it rules out our being organisms (Carter 1989, Ayers 1990: 278–292, Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997: 80f., 100–109, 2003a). It says that our persistence consists in some sort of psychological continuity. As we have seen, this means that you would go along with your transplanted brain or cerebrum, because the one who ended up with that organ, and no one else, would be psychologically continuous with you. Likewise, if you were to lapse into an irreversible vegetative state, you would cease to exist, because no one would then be psychologically continuous with you. But the persistence of a human organism does not consist in any sort of psychological continuity. If we transplanted your cerebrum, the human organism—your body—would not go along with that organ, but would stay behind with an empty head. The transplant simply moves an organ from one organism to another. If you were an organism, then you would stay behind with an empty head, contrary to the Psychological Approach. Likewise, no human organism ceases to exist by lapsing into an irreversible vegetative state. If you were an organism, you could survive as a human vegetable, which again conflicts with the Psychological Approach. What the Psychological Approach says about our persistence through time is not true of human organisms: no sort of psychological continuity is either necessary or sufficient for a human animal to persist. So if that view is true, we could not be organisms. Not only are we not essentially organisms. We are not organisms at all, even contingently: nothing that is even contingently an organism would go with its transplanted cerebrum.

The difficulty is that the organism that is your body would appear to think and to be conscious. In fact it would seem to be psychologically indistinguishable from you. So if you are not that animal but something else, it follows that there is a conscious, intelligent being other than you, now sitting there and reading this entry. More generally, there are at least two conscious, intelligent beings wherever we thought there was just one: a person who is not an organism and an organism that is (presumably) not a person. Moreover, it seems that you ought to wonder which of the two thinkers is you. You may believe that you are the person and not the animal (because you accept the Psychological Approach, perhaps). But the animal would seem to believe, for the same reason, that it is a person and not an organism. If so, it is mistaken. And for all you know, you might be the one making this mistake. If you were the animal and not the person, you would never be any the wiser.

Here is an analogy. Imagine a three-dimensional duplicating machine. When you step into the “in” box, it reads off your information and assembles a perfect duplicate of you in the “out” box. The process causes temporary unconsciousness but is otherwise harmless. Two beings wake up, one in each box. The boxes are indistinguishable. Because each being will have the same apparent memories and perceive identical surroundings, each will think that he or she is you, and will have the same evidence for this belief. But only one will be right. If this actually happened to you, it is hard to see how you could ever know, afterwards, whether you were the original or the duplicate. (Suppose the technicians who work the machine are sworn to secrecy and immune to bribes.) You would think, “Who am I? Am I who I think I am? Did I do the things I seem to remember doing? Or did I come into being only a moment ago, complete with false memories of someone else's life?” And you would have no way of answering these questions.

In the same way, the Psychological Approach raises the questions, “What am I? Am I a human person, who persists by virtue of psychological continuity? Or am I an animal?” And here too there seem to be no grounds on which to answer these questions. So even if the Psychological Approach is true, it seems that you could never know whether it applied to you: for all you can tell, you may instead be an organism with brute physical persistence conditions. This is the “too-many-minds” or too-many-thinkers problem. The only way to avoid the trouble altogether is to say that we are organisms (and that there are no beings who persist by virtue of psychological continuity); but that is incompatible with the Psychological Approach.

Friends of the Psychological Approach have responded in three ways. One is to say that human animals have psychological persistence conditions. (This may be the view of Wiggins 1980: 160, 180 and McDowell 1997: 237; see also Olson 1997: 114–119). Despite appearances, the Psychological Approach is compatible with our being animals, and the problem does not arise. The surgeons do not move your cerebrum from one animal to another in the transplant story. Rather, one animal has its parts cut away until it is the size of a cerebrum. It is then moved across the room and given a new complement of parts. The animal into which your cerebrum is implanted then presumably ceases to exist. This view has not proved popular, however.

A second response is to deny that human animals can think in the way that we do. Although our animal bodies share our brains, are physically just like us, and show all the outward signs of consciousness and intelligence, they themselves do not think and are not conscious. Thinking animals are not a problem for the Psychological Approach because there are none.

If human organisms cannot be conscious, then presumably no biological organism of any sort could have any mental properties at all. This surprising fact would need an explanation. It may be because organisms are material things, and only an immaterial thing could think or be conscious, though few philosophers nowadays accept this.

Shoemaker attempts to explain why organisms should be unable to think in a way that is compatible with our being material. He says that whatever thinks or is conscious must persist by virtue of psychological continuity. That is because it belongs to the nature of a mental state that it tend to have certain characteristic causes and effects in the being that is in that state, and not in any other being. (This is a version of the functionalist theory of mind.) For instance, my preference for chocolate over vanilla must tend to cause me, and no one else, to choose chocolate. If an organism were to have such a preference, though, that state might cause another being to choose chocolate, because an organism's cerebrum might be transplanted into another organism. That would violate the proposed account of mental states. It follows that no organism could have a preference; and similar reasoning goes for the mental generally. The persistence conditions of organisms are incompatible with their having mental properties. But a material thing that would go with its transplanted cerebrum—a being of which the Psychological Approach was true—could have mental states. It would follow that you and I, who obviously do have mental states, persist by virtue of psychological continuity, and thus are not organisms. This would both solve the too-many-thinkers problem and show that the Psychological Approach is true. (See Shoemaker 1984: 92–97, 1999, 2004, Olson 2002b.)

Finally, friends of the Psychological Approach can concede that human organisms think as we do, so that you are one of two beings now thinking your thoughts, but try to explain how we can still know that we are not those organisms. One strategy for doing this focuses on the nature of personhood and first-person reference. It proposes that not just any being with mental properties of the sort that you and I have—rationality and self-consciousness, for instance—counts as a person. A person must also persist by virtue of psychological continuity. It follows from this that human animals, despite being psychologically just like us, are not people. Further, personal pronouns such as ‘I’ refer only to people. So when your animal body says or thinks ‘I’, it does not refer to itself. Rather, it refers to you, the person who says it at the same time. When the animal says ‘I am a person’, it does not thereby express the false belief that it is a person, but rather the true belief that you are. It follows that the animal is not mistaken about which thing it is: it has no first-person beliefs about itself at all. And you are not mistaken either. You can infer that you are a person from the linguistic facts that you are whatever you refer to when you say ‘I’, and that ‘I’ never refers to anything but a person. You can know that you are not the animal thinking your thoughts because it is not a person and personal pronouns never refer to non–people. (For discussion of this view see Noonan 2010, Olson 2002a.)

7. The Somatic Approach

There appears to be a thinking animal located where you are. It also appears that you are the thinking thing—the only one—located there. If things are as they appear, then you are that animal. This view has become known as Animalism.

Animalism does not imply that all animals, or even all human animals, are people: as we saw earlier, human embryos and animals in a persistent vegetative state may not count as people. Being a person may be only a temporary property of you, like being a philosopher. Nor does animalism imply that all people are animals. It is consistent with the existence of wholly inorganic people: gods or angels or conscious robots. It does not say that being an animal is part of what it is to be a person (a view defended in Wiggins 1980, 171 and Wollheim 1984, ch. 1 and criticized in Snowdon 1996). Animalism leaves the answer to the Personhood Question entirely open.

If we are animals, we have the persistence conditions of animals. And as we saw, animals appear to persist by virtue of some sort of brute physical continuity. So Animalism seems to imply a version of the Somatic Approach.

A few philosophers endorse the Somatic Approach without saying that we are animals. They say that we are our bodies (Thomson 1997), or that our identity through time consists in the identity of our bodies (Ayer 1936: 194). This has been called the Bodily Criterion of personal identity. Its relation to Animalism is uncertain. If a person's body is by definition a sort of animal, then perhaps being identical to one's body is the same as being an animal. But whether this is so is unclear.

We have already seen the most common objection to the Somatic Approach: it implies that you would stay behind if your cerebrum were transplanted, which can seem incredible (Unger 2000; for an important related objection see Johnston 2007).

That said, the Somatic Approach has the virtue of being compatible with our beliefs about who is who in real life. Every actual case in which we take someone to survive or perish is a case where a human animal survives or perishes. The Psychological Approach, or at any rate the view that psychological continuity is necessary for us to persist, does not share this virtue. Most of us believe that we were once foetuses. When we see an ultrasound picture of a 12-week-old foetus, we ordinarily think we are seeing something that will, if all goes well, be born, learn to speak, and eventually become an adult human person. Yet none of us is in any way psychologically continuous with a 12-week-old foetus.

Some versions of the Somatic Approach face their own version of the too-many-thinkers problem. The mere fact that you are an organism does not imply that you are the only thinker of your thoughts (Shoemaker 1999, Hudson 2007, Olson 2007: 215-236). This would of course be no more of a problem for the Somatic than for the Psychological Approach; but it would undermine the principal argument for the Somatic Approach, the one based on the too-many-thinkers problem.

8. Wider Issues

We have compared the virtues of two important accounts of our identity over time. We saw that the Psychological Approach, though attractive, has trouble with fission cases. The usual non–branching response is both implausible in itself and suggests that identity has no practical importance, which in turn threatens the original support for the view. The Psychological Approach also implies that we are not animals, raising the awkward problem of how we relate to the apparently intelligent animals we call our bodies. The Somatic Approach—in particular when combined with the view that we are animals—is also intuitively attractive, and appears to avoid the too-many-thinkers problem. But it has implausible consequences concerning brain transplants.

The debate between these competing views is likely to turn on more general issues in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. For instance, advocates of the Psychological Approach appear to be committed to the view that each normal human organism is associated with a non-organism that thinks and is conscious. They will need an account of the metaphysical nature of this non-organism, and of how it relates to the animal. If they hope to solve the thinking-animal problem by denying that human animals can think, they will need an account of the nature of the mental that is consistent with this.

Some general metaphysical views suggest that there is no unique right answer to the question of what it takes for us to persist. The best-known example is the ontology of temporal parts mentioned in section 5. It says that for every period of time when you exist, short or long, there is a temporal part of you that exists only then. This gives us many likely candidates for being you. Suppose you are a material thing, and that we know what determines your spatial boundaries. That should tell us what counts as your current temporal part or “stage”—the temporal part of you located now and at no other time. That stage is a part of a vast number of temporally extended objects (Hudson 2001: ch. 4). For instance, it is a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological continuity, in the sense defined in Section 4, among its stages. That is, one of the beings thinking your current thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically continuous with each of the others and not with anything else. The view that we persist by virtue of psychological continuity suggests that that is what you are.

Your current stage is also a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological connectedness (Section 4 again). That is, one of the beings now thinking your thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically connected with each of the others and not to anything else. This may not be the same as the first being, as some stages may be psychologically continuous with your current stage but not psychologically connected with it. The view that psychological connectedness is necessary and sufficient for us to persist suggests that we are beings of the second sort (Lewis 1976). Your current stage is also a part of a human animal, which persists by virtue of brute physical continuity. And it is a part of many bizarre and gerrymandered objects, such as Hirsch's “contacti persons” (Hirsch 1982, ch. 10). Some even say that you are your current stage itself (Sider 2001, 188–208).

The temporal-parts ontology implies that each of us shares our current thoughts with countless beings that diverge from one another in the past or future. This makes it hard to say which things we are. And because many of these beings persist through time under different conditions, it is equally hard to say what our identity over time consists in. How could we ever know? Of course, we are the beings we refer to when we say ‘I’, or more generally the beings that our personal pronouns and proper names refer to; but it is unlikely, on this view, that those words succeed in referring to just one sort of thing. Each utterance of a personal pronoun will probably refer ambiguously to many different candidates: to various sorts of psychologically interrelated aggregates, to an animal, and perhaps to others as well. That would make it indeterminate which things, even which kind of things, we are. And insofar as the different candidates have different persistence conditions, it would be indeterminate what our identity over time consists in. Some versions of the metaphysic of constitution (Baker 2000) have similar implications.

These wider questions—about the nature of mental properties and the existence of temporal parts, among others—cannot be settled by thinking about personal identity alone. Which view of personal identity we find attractive is likely to depend on general metaphysical considerations. There may not be much point in asking about our identity over time without first addressing these underlying issues.

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

Some material in this entry appeared previously in E. Olson, ‘Personal Identity’, in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by S. Stich and T. Warfield, Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.

Copyright © 2010 by
Eric T. Olson <e.olson@shef.ac.uk>

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