Notes to Implicature

1. Grice 1961: §3; 1975: 24; Harnish 1976: 328-9; Levinson 1983: 97; Leech 1983: 9; Neale 1992: 519, 528; Horn 2003: 382; 2004: 4; Huang 2007: 27; Davis 2007a. Contrast Saul (2001: 632-3; 2002), who argues for a more normative definition. Contrast also Bach (1994: 126; 2006: 27–8), who defines “implicature” more narrowly and contrasts it with “impliciture” (see §9 below).

2. See Grice 1975: 87ff; Harnish 1976: 332ff; Bach 1994; Levinson 2000: 170ff.

3. Grice 1975: 25; Karttunen & Peters 1979; Levinson 1983: 127; Leech 1983: 11; Neale 1992: 523–9; Horn 2003: 383; 2004: 4; Huang 2007: §2.3. Some have argued that all implicatures are conversational (e.g., Bach 1999).

4. In the literature on implicature, what an utterance implicates is generally equated with what the speaker implicates rather than what the sentence implicates. It should also be noted that some authors restrict the term “implicature” to speaker implicature (e.g., Horn 2004: 3–4; Bach 2006).

5. See also Boër & Lycan 1973; Harnish 1976: 341–2; Sadock 1978: 373; Atlas 1979: 274; Levinson 1983: 131; Neale 1992: 540–1.

6. For critique and further references, see Davis 2005: §11.4.

7. Horn 1972: ch. 4; 1989: §4.5; Levinson 1983: 164; Hirschberg 1991: 47.

8. See Grice 1975: 30–31; 1978: 41; 1981: 185; Harnish 1976: 333; R. Lakoff 1977: 99; Brown & Levinson 1978: 63; Bach & Harnish 1979: xvii, 6; Atlas 1979: 272; Wilson & Sperber 1981: 160; Levinson 1983: 113; 2000: 15; G. M. Green 1989: 93-97; Hirschberg 1991: 16–24; Berg 1991; Blakemore 1992: 126, 137; Neale 1992: 527; M. S. Green 1995: 98; For antecedents to Grice, see Hungerland 1960. M. S. Green 2002 observes an important difference between the given formulation and Grice’s.

9. See Böer & Lycan 1973: 498–505; Searle 1975: 267; Morgan 1978: 246, 250, 252; R. Lakoff 1977: 99; Sadock 1978: 368; 1981: 258, 261-262; Gazdar 1979: 41–42; Bach & Harnish 1979: 169, 171; Atlas 1979: 273, 276; 1989: 139–140; Grice 1975: 31; 1981: 187; Nunberg 1981: 201, 207-208; Horn 1984: 13; 1989: 383; 1992: 260–262; Levinson 1983: 100, 113–4, 117; 2000: 15; Leech 1983: 11, 17, 24–5, 30–1, 44, 153, 172; Neale 1992: 527; M. S. Green 1995: esp. §3; Meibauer 2006: 569; Huang 2007: 34.

10. See Grice 1975: 28, 38; 1989: 370; Stalnaker 1974: 476; Searle 1975: 266; Harnish 1976: 330, 332; Sadock 1978: 366; McCawley 1978: 245; Bach & Harnish 1979: 167, 169, 171; Gazdar 1979: 51; Levinson 1983: 99-100; Leech 1983: 9, 91–2; Lycan 1984: 75–6; Martinich 1984: 510; Thomason 1990: 330, 350, 352, 355–7; Horn 2004: 8; Huang 2007: 29, 57.

11. Grice 1978: 47–8. See also Ziff 1960: 44; Cohen 1971: 56; Stalnaker 1974: 475; Kempson 1975: 142; Searle 1975: 269; McCawley 1978: 257–8; Sadock 1981: 258; Atlas & Levinson 1981: 56; Sperber & Wilson (1981: 317; Wilson & Sperber 1981: 155; Levinson 1983: 97–100, 132; 2000: 15; Leech 1983: 48, 88; Bach 1987: 69, 77–9; Blakemore 1987: 21; Horn 1989: 213–4, 365, 383; 2004: 20; Neale 1992: 535–41; Huang 2007: 7, 37.

12. Kroch 1972; Kempson 1975: 152–6; Harnish 1976: 332, 334, 352; Gazdar 1979: 57ff; Horn 1989: 15, 18–9, 332–5; Sadock 1978: 369; Levinson 1983: 122; 2000: 80; Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 37, 93; 1987: 699; Brown & Levinson 1987: 11; Thomason 1990: 353–6; Davis 1998: Ch. 2.

13. Of course, in suitably special contexts these things could be implicated.

14. Cf. Kempson 1975: 144, 159; Leech 1983: 23; Martinich 1984: 511; Sperber & Wilson 1987: 705–6. Contrast Davis 1998: §3.4 and Saul 2001: 234–5.

15. See also R. Lakoff 1977; Brown & Levinson 1978; 1987; Horn 1989: 360; Matsumoto 1995: §2.4. Contrast Huang 2007: 37, fn. 12. Grice (1975: 28) acknowledges the Principle of Politeness, and suggests that it generates implicatures that are both nonsemantic and nonconversational.

16. See also Horn 1984: 194–7; 1989: 196, 387–92; Meibauer 2006: 563; Huang 2006; 2007: 37–9. Horn himself, unlike Meibauer and Huang, makes Q relative to Quality as well as R. This has the consequence that people violate Q when they lie, mislead by implicature, or use figures of speech. Horn used “say” rather than “contribute,” which entails that speakers violate Q when implicating something rather than saying it.

17. A separate problem is that Horn’s R does not seem to cover standard relevance implicatures like (1). Another is that (6a) is arguably a sense rather than an implicature. One piece of evidence for the sense hypothesis is that speakers who use “He did not break a finger” would typically mean “He did not break a finger of his own,” which is neither an R nor a Q implicature.

18. See also Atlas & Levinson 1981; Meibauer 2006: 572; Huang 2006; 2007: 50–1.

19. Levinson calls them “Q” and “I” (for Informativeness). See also Meibauer 2006: 570–3; Huang 2006; 2007: §2.2.2.

20. See also Zeevat 2000; Dekker & van Rooy 2000; Krifka 2002.

21. Blutner seems to follow Horn in thinking of (ii) (which concerns how something is contributed) as corresponding to Q (which concerns what is contributed).

22. Blutner himself limits the alternatives to a set Gen that specifies what sentence–content pairings are permitted, which also requires knowing what sentences implicate. “Obviously, this solution is completely ad hoc” (Blutner 2000: 203).

23. See Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 1986b; 1987; 1995; Kempson 1986; Carston 1987; 1988; 2002; 2004; Recanati 1987; and Blakemore 1987; 1992; Wilson & Sperber 2004; Yus 2006. For a precursor, see Kasher 1976. For wide-ranging criticism of the theory, along with replies from Sperber and Wilson, see Behavioral and Brain Studies, 10, 1987, 697–754. See also Levinson's 1989 judicious and synoptic review.

24. See Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 46–51, 118–71; 1986b; 1987: 702–4. On another common formulation, speakers should maximize contextual effects and minimize cost (Kempson 1986: 90; Blakemore 1992: 34; Carston 2002: 45, 379; Wilson & Sperber 2004: 613). But this formulation simply conjoins two principles that can and usually do conflict. (Contrast Kasher 1976: 204, who crucially adds “ceteris paribus.”) In yet other formulations, Sperber and Wilson define the Principle of Relevance as the thesis that there is a presumption that the speaker is communicating something maximally (or optimally) relevant (see e.g., Sperber & Wilson 1987: 704; 1995: 260ff; 2004: 612); on this take, the principle is more akin to Grice's cooperative presumption than to his Cooperative Principle.

25. See Jary (1998) for an attempt to account for politeness in terms of relevance.

26. Cf. Blakemore 1992: 36, 125. Wilson & Sperber (2004: 612) later add that an optimally relevant stimulus must be the most relevant one the speaker is willing to contribute, a requirement that will often clash with the audience oriented requirement.

27. See Carston 1987: 714 and Blakemore 1992: 60, 77–83.

28. Cf. Kempson 1986; Blakemore 1992: Ch. 4; Levinson 2000: 190–5; Carston 2004: 8; Yus 2006: 514ff.

29. See also Carston 1988: 37; Neale 1992: 530, 555; Bach 2006: 24–6. Contrast Blakemore 1992: 57ff; Carston 2004; Yus 2006.

30. Cf. Meibauer 2006: 575; contrast Carston 2002: §2.3.4; 2004: 8.

31. Grice (1957) initiated the discussion, formulating the leading theory. See Davis (2003: Chs. 1-3) for an alternative and a critical review of the extensive literature. See Saul (2001, 2002), M. S. Green (2002), and Davis (2007a) for a debate about whether implicature has a normative component that speaker meaning lacks.

32. See Lewis 1969, 1975, Davis 2003: Ch. 8, and van Rooy 2004 for analyses of convention and further references. Cf. Searle 1975: 274: G. M. Green 1975; 1987: 107; Morgan 1978; Horn 1989: 29, 344, 347–9; Wierzbicka 1987; Bach 1995; Davis 1998: Chs. 5 and 6; and Levinson 2000: 23–4.

33. Conventional regularities are seldom perfect. Even though it is conventional to use “bank” to mean “river bank,” speakers more often use it to mean something else. The fact that people sometimes use “Some S are P” without the usual implicature is similarly compatible with its being conventional.

34. Compare and contrast Levinson 2000: 16–21 and Horn 2004: 4–5, who maintain that a generalized conversational implicature is a “default interpretation.” This holds only if the sentence does not have more than one conventional implicature. Consider “p and q,” which implicates “q because p” on some occasions, and “p before q” on others. The same problem undermines Saul's (2001: 638) suggestion that implicatures can be worked out because information about implicature conventions is part of the background information used as a premise in the working-out schema.

35. These examples all show that “conventional” should not be equated with “coded.” Contrast Huang 2007: 34, 56–7.

36. Cf. Sadock 1974: 97–8; Grice 1975: 39, 43, 58; Cole 1975: §viii; Morgan 1978: 250; Brown & Levinson 1978: 221, 265–7; Cowie, Mackin, & McCaig 1983: xii; Cruse 1986: 44; Anttila 1989: 38, 137–46; Hopper & Traugott 1993: 75–93; Cowie 1994: 3168; Geurts 1998: 296.

37. See also Hirschberg 1991; Matsumoto 1995; Levinson 2000: 79–80; Sauerland 2004.

Copyright © 2010 by
Wayne Davis <davisw@georgetown.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free