First published Fri May 6, 2005; substantive revision Wed Sep 22, 2010

“Implicature” denotes either (i) the act of meaning, implying, or suggesting one thing by saying something else, or (ii) the object of that act. Implicatures can be part of sentence meaning or dependent on conversational context, and can be conventional (in different senses) or unconventional. Conversational implicatures have become one of the principal subjects of pragmatics. Figures of speech such as metaphor, irony, and understatement provide familiar examples. An important conceptual and methodological issue in semantics is how to distinguish senses and entailments from conventional implicatures. Implicature has been invoked for a variety of purposes, from defending controversial semantic claims in philosophy to explaining lexical gaps in linguistics. H. P. Grice, who coined the term “implicature,” and classified the phenomenon, developed an influential theory to explain and predict conversational implicatures, and describe how they arise and are understood. The Cooperative Principle and associated maxims play a central role. Neo-Gricean theories have modified Grice's principles to some extent, and Relevance theories replace them with a principle of communicative efficiency. The problems for such principle-based theories include overgeneration, lack of determinacy, clashes, and the fact that speakers often have other goals. A separate issue is the degree to which sentence meaning determines what is said.

1. The Phenomenon

H. P. Grice (1913–1988) was the first to systematically study cases in which what a speaker means differs from what the sentence used by the speaker means. Consider the following dialogue.

  1. Alan: Are you going to Paul's party?
    Barb: I have to work.

If this was a typical exchange, Barb meant that she is not going to Paul's party. But the sentence she uttered does not mean that she is not going to Paul's party. Hence Barb did not say that she is not going, she implied it. Grice introduced the technical terms implicate and implicature for the case in which what the speaker said is distinct from what the speaker thereby meant (implied, or suggested).[1] Thus Barb implicated that she is not going; that she is not going was her implicature. Implicating is what Searle (1975: 265–6) called an indirect speech act. Barb performed one speech act (meaning that she is not going) by performing another (saying that she has to work).

By “saying,” Grice meant not the mere utterance of words, but saying that something is the case, an illocutionary speech act like stating but more general. What Barb said is that she has to work, something she could have said by uttering different words. As Grice realized, “say” is used more or less strictly.[2] Thus if Carl says “The largest planet is a gas giant,” we will sometimes count him as saying (and thus not implicating) that Jupiter is a gas giant. We will follow Grice in using “say” more narrowly, requiring that what a speaker says be something that the sentence uttered conventionally means (except when indexicals are used). So we will take Carl to have implicated that Jupiter is a gas giant by saying that the largest planet is.

The difference between saying and implicating affects whether meaning something one does not believe is a lie. If Barb knew she did not have to work, then she was lying in dialogue (1). If she knew she was going to Paul's party, she might be guilty of misleading Alan, but not of lying.

Our sample implicature is said to be conversational. The implicature is not part of the conventional meaning of the sentence uttered, but depends on features of the conversational context. A key feature was the question Alan asked. Had he asked “What are you going to do today?”, Barb could have implicated something completely different—“I am going to work”—by saying the same thing. Grice contrasted a conversational implicature with a conventional implicature, by which he meant one that is part of the meaning of the sentence used.[3]

  1. (a) He is an Englishman; he is, therefore, brave.
    (b) His being an Englishman implies that he is brave.

Grice observed that speakers who use (2a) implicate (2b). They imply, but do not say, that his being an Englishman implies that he is brave. Hence the use of (2a) while disbelieving (2b) would be misleading, but not a lie. Barb's sentence in (1) can be used with its conventional meaning without implicating what she did. But (2a) cannot be used with its conventional meaning without implicating (2b). The meaning of “therefore” carries this implicature.

While Grice used “conventional” to denote an implicature that is part of the linguistic meaning of a sentence, even conversational implicatures can be conventional in the non-technical sense in which it is conventional for women to wear a sari in India but not Mongolia, and conventional in some languages to begin interrogative sentences with an inverted question mark but not in others. Consider:

  1. (a) Some athletes smoke
    (b) Not all athletes smoke.

It would be unconventional (unusual, idiosyncratic, even unprecedented) for people who say “Some athletes smoke” to conversationally implicate that some physically fit people will develop bladder cancer, but conventional (customary, normal, standard practice) for them to implicate that not all athletes smoke. The customary implicature is not conventional in Grice's sense. For “Not all athletes smoke” is not part of the meaning of “Some athletes smoke.” Hence there is no contradiction in saying “Some athletes smoke; indeed, all do.” To avoid confusion, I will describe implicatures that are conventional in Grice's narrow sense as semantic; “conventional” will always have the broader sense in which some conversational implicatures are conventional too. Grice (1975: 37ff) called conventional conversational implicatures generalized implicatures (see also Levinson 2000).

If an implicature is conventional in either sense, we may say that the sentence carries that implicature. Thus even though Barb implicates that she is not going to Paul's party, “I have to work” does not itself implicate this. Conversely, “Some athletes smoke” implicates that not all do even though speakers can use the sentence without implicating this.[4] (Analogy: “plane” means “airplane” even though speakers can use “plane” without meaning “airplane.”)

Conversational implicatures differ from semantic implicatures in being cancelable and reinforceable. Whereas (2a) cannot be used without implicating (2b), the indicated implicature of (3a) can be canceled. The speaker may do this by adding “Indeed, all do,” “and possibly all do,” or “if not all” after uttering (3a). Or the context itself may cancel the implicature, as when it is obvious to all that the speaker is engaging in understatement. Similarly, conjoining one sentence to a second that means what the first merely implicates reinforces the implicature, and does not sound redundant. Consider “Some athletes smoke, but not all do.” This makes explicit what is normally implicit when someone utters (3a). In contrast, conjoining (2b) to (2a) just sounds redundant.

As our examples make clear, it is not possible to understand speakers fully without knowing what they have conversationally implicated as well as what they have said. Semantics, conceived as the study of the meaning of words and sentences, does not exhaust the study of meaning. The study of speaker meaning and implicature is included in pragmatics, which covers the broad range of speech acts that can be performed by using words. The field of applied pragmatics has developed out of the recognition that second language learners cannot become fully proficient without mastering more than grammar and literal meaning (Kasper 2003). The phenomenon of semantic implicature (Gricean conventional implicature) shows further that the study of truth conditions does not exhaust semantics. It is well known that sentences of the form “p but q” have the same truth conditions as “p and q,” while differing markedly in meaning. The meaning of “but” includes the implicature that it may be unexpected or surprising to say that q after having said that p. It should not be inferred that an implicature is never entailed by what is said, although many do (see e.g., Grice 1975: 39; Huang 2007: 56; but contrast Bach 2006). When a speaker gives an affirmative answer to “Did you drive somewhere yesterday?” by saying “I drove to Ithaca,” for example, what is implicated (“I drove somewhere”) is entailed by what is said (“I drove to Ithaca”).

Implicature is important even in truth conditional semantics. For example, logicians customarily take English sentences of the form “p or q” to be true provided “p” or “qor both are true. Thus “It is not the case that cats meow or purr” would be counted as false. But there are also cases in which speakers use “p or q” to mean that “p” or “q” is true but not both. Some maintain that “or” is ambiguous in English, with an inclusive and an exclusive sense. But another possibility is that the exclusive interpretation is a conventional conversational implicature rather than a second sense. One piece of evidence supporting the implicature hypothesis is that the exclusive interpretation seems cancelable. Thus “Bill will visit France or Germany this summer; indeed, he will drive through both countries on his way to Poland” has no interpretation on which it is contradictory. Another is that “Bill hopes he will not visit France or Germany” has no interpretation on which it ascribes to Bill a hope that would be fulfilled if he visits both places. A methodological issue is to describe the evidence that would be needed to decide whether a particular interpretation is a sense or a conventional conversational implicature. A foundational issue to is describe exactly what the difference between the two consists in.

Sentences of the form “The F is G” imply in a distinctive way that there is one and only one F. Russell (1905) proposed that “The F is G” is equivalent to “There is one and only one F and it is G.” Strawson (1950) objected that this made a statement like “The present king of France is bald” clearly false. In an intuitive sense, the statement presupposes rather than asserts that there is a unique king of France. Since this presupposition is false, the statement is out of place, and should be withdrawn. Following Frege (1892), Strawson defined a presupposition as a necessary condition for a statement being either true or false. “The present king of France is bald” has no truth value, according to Strawson, because there is no king of France. Strawson's view thus complicates logical theory by denying bivalence. A third position, advocated by Kartunnen & Peters (1979), is that the uniqueness implication is a semantic implicature like the contrast implicature of “but”.[5] This allows them to maintain that “The F is G” has the Russellian truth conditions, while acknowledging that it is not synonymous with “There is one and only one F and it is G.” They can allow that the non-truth conditional component of meaning makes it as inappropriate for us to say that “The present king of France is bald” is false as it is for us to say that “Hillary Clinton is a woman but smart” is true. To make matters even more complex, the existence and uniqueness implications of negations of “The F is G” have signal properties of conversational implicatures, as Grice (1981) noted. Thus “The present king of France did not visit Washington” ordinarily presupposes that there is a present king of France. But this presupposition is cancelled in “Since there is no such person, the king of France did not visit Washington.”

Implicature continues to be invoked in this way to defend controversial semantic claims. Knowledge. The standard of justification necessary to make a knowledge claim varies markedly from context to context depending on what is at stake and what possibilities are salient. On contextualist theories, sentences of the form “S knows p” are indexical, with different truth conditions in different contexts (Cohen 1986, Lewis 1996, DeRose 2009). An alternative theory is that sentences of this form have an invariant semantics, but are used loosely to implicate that S is close enough to knowing for the purposes of the context (Davis 2007b). Names. The popular Millian theory that the meaning of a name is its referent entails that coreferential names are synonymous, and that names without a referent are meaningless. This seems absurd in light of names like “Superman” and “Clark Kent.” Millians have proposed that the source of these linguistic intuitions is a difference in implicature between the sentences (Salmon 1986; Soames 1989).[6] On one version, “Superman can fly” implicates that a man called “Superman” can fly. Negation. On the regular interpretation of the negation in (4), the sentence is contradictory.

  1. The boy did not eat some of the cookies, he ate them all.

But there is another interpretation, marked by a special intonation and other features, on which the negation in (4) denies the standard “not all” implicature of “The boy ate some of the cookies,” and is thus consistent. Horn (1989: 362–4; 370–5) called these “metalinguistic” negations, since he took them to be objecting to a prior utterance of the sentences negated. The question is how to account for the two different interpretations of negations given that the word “not” does not seem to be ambiguous (Geurts 1998). Horn and Burton-Roberts (1989) propose that the marked interpretation is an implicature, whereas Davis (2010) suggests that it is an idiom that evolved from a conventional conversational implicature.

Grice observed that conversational implicatures are generally connected to what is said rather than the way it is said, so that “it is not possible to find another way of saying the same thing, which simply lacks the implicature in question” (1975: 39). Grice thus used nondetachability as a test of conversational implicature. Nondetachability seems essential to account for the observation that the scalar implicature illustrated by (3) is not only conventional in English, but common to all known languages (Horn 1989). Grice allowed exceptions to the rule, though, “where some special feature of the substituted version is itself relevant to the determination of an implicature” (see Grice's “maxim of Manner” in §2). Metalinguistic implicatures—those that refer to the particular words the speaker used—are clearly detachable.

Implicature has also been used to explain lexical gaps. Horn observed that the lexicon of a natural language has an economical asymmetry.[7] Logical concepts tend not to be lexicalized if they are commonly conveyed by implicature. When “no” appears in “___ S are P,” the result is a sentence meaning “All S are not-P.” There is no English word, however, that in the same context would produce a sentence meaning “Not all S are P.” Horn attributes this to the fact that “Some S are P” conveys “Not all S are P” by implicature, while no English sentence conveys “All S are not-P” by implicature. Similarly, there is an English word meaning “not either” (“neither”), but no term meaning “not both.” Horn connects this with the fact that “p or q” implicates “¬(p&q),” while no sentence form implicates “¬(pq).” Given that Horn's evidence is correlational, it is possible that the causation goes the other way, however, with the implicatures filling the lexical gaps. If there were a word “nome,” meaning “some but not all,” it seems doubtful that “Some S are P” would implicate “Not all S are P.” Hearers could reason that if the speaker had been in a position to say “Nome S are P,” he would have.

2. Gricean Theory

In addition to identifying and classifying the phenomenon of implicature, Grice developed a theory designed to explain and predict conversational implicatures. He also sought to describe how such implicatures are understood. Grice (1975: 26–30) postulated a general Cooperative Principle and four maxims specifying how to be cooperative. It is common knowledge, he asserted, that people generally follow these rules for efficient communication.

Cooperative Principle. Contribute what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation.

Maxim of Quality. Make your contribution true; so do not convey what you believe false or unjustified.

Maxim of Quantity. Be as informative as required.

Maxim of Relation. Be relevant.

Maxim of Manner. Be perspicuous; so avoid obscurity and ambiguity, and strive for brevity and order.

Grice viewed these rules not as arbitrary conventions, but as instances of more general rules governing rational, cooperative behavior. For example, if a man is helping a woman build a house, he will hand her a hammer rather than a tennis racket (relevance), more than one nail when several are needed (quantity), straight nails rather than bent ones (quality), and he will do all this quickly and efficiently (manner).

Implicatures like that in dialogue (1) are thought to arise from the maxim of Relation, and are therefore called relevance implicatures. Barb would have infringed the maxim of Relation, it is claimed, unless her contribution were relevant to the purpose of the conversation. If Barb is being cooperative, then she is trying to answer Alan's question. Given that working is incompatible with partying, Barb must have intended to communicate that she is not going to the party. Implicatures like that in (3) are explained in terms of the maxim of Quantity, and so are called quantity implicatures. Assuming that the accepted purpose of the conversation requires the speaker to say whether or not all athletes smoke, a speaker who said “Some athletes smoke” would be infringing the Quantity maxim if she meant only what she said. So she must have meant more. If she believed that all athletes smoke, she would have said so. Since she did not, she must have meant that some but not all athletes smoke. As a bonus, she achieved brevity, in conformity to the maxim of Manner. A precursor of this explanation can be found in Mill (1872: 517).

Grice thought some implicatures arise by flouting maxims. This happens when what a cooperative speaker says so patently violates a maxim that the hearer must infer that the speaker is implying something different. Irony and metaphor are thought to arise from flouting the maxim of Quality. Thus Candy might answer Alan ironically as follows.

  1. Alan: Are you going to Paul's party?
    Candy: I don't like parties.

If Alan knows full well that Candy is a party animal, he could reason that if she meant what she said, she would be lying, thus violating Quality. So she must have meant something else. If she meant that she does like parties, then she would be in conformity with the maxim. And via Relation, she would have answered Alan's question indirectly.

Generalizing from these examples, Grice provided a theoretical account of what it is to conversationally implicate something that has been widely adopted, sometimes with subtle variations. A representative formulation goes as follows, with S the speaker and H the hearer.

Theoretical Definition: S conversationally implicates p iff S implicates p when:
(i) S is presumed to be observing the Cooperative Principle (cooperative presumption);

(ii) The supposition that S believes p is required to make S's utterance consistent with the Cooperative Principle (determinacy); and

(iii) S believes (or knows), and expects H to believe that S believes, that H is able to determine that (ii) is true (mutual knowledge).[8]

Given this account, Barb's implicature in (1) is conversational provided: Barb was presumed to be contributing what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation; the supposition that she believes she is not going to the party is required to make her utterance consistent with the Cooperative Principle; and she believes, and expects Alan to believe that she believes, that Alan is able to determine that that supposition is required. It would seem more natural for Grice to have put “S implicates p” in place of “S believes p” in (ii). Indeed, this substitution is allowed by further theoretical assumptions that Grice makes.

Grice also held that conversational implicatures could be “calculated” using the Cooperative Principle.

Calculability Assumption: Conversational implicatures must be capable of being worked out.[9]

To work out an implicature is to infer it in a specific way from the Cooperative Principle using particular facts about the meaning of the sentence uttered and the context of utterance.

The presence of a conversational implicature must be capable of being worked out; for even if it can in fact be intuitively grasped, unless the intuition is replaceable by an argument, the implicature (if present at all) will not count as a conversational implicature; it will be a conventional implicature. To work out that a particular conversational implicature is present, the hearer will rely on the following data: (1) the conventional meaning of the words used, together with the identity of any references that may be involved; (2) the Cooperative Principle and its maxims; (3) the context, linguistic or otherwise, of the utterance; (4) other items of background knowledge; and (5) the fact (or supposed fact) that all relevant items falling under the previous headings are available to both participants and both participants know or assume this to be the case. A general pattern for the working-out of a conversational implicature might be given as follows: He has said that q; there is no reason to suppose that he is not observing the maxims, or at least the Cooperative Principle; he could not be doing this unless he thought that p; he knows (and knows that I know that he knows) that I can see that the supposition that he thinks that p is required; he has done nothing to stop me thinking that p; he intends me to think, or is at least willing to allow me to think, that p; and so he has implicated that p.” (Grice 1975: 31; my emphasis)

Grice's Theoretical Definition entails that S's implicating p is conversational only if S's believing that p is required by the Cooperative Principle, and only if S believes that H can determine that S's belief is required. The Calculability Assumption goes further, entailing that H is able to reason from the fact that S's belief is required to the conclusion that S has implicated p. The definition says that an implicature is conversational provided conditions (i)–(iii) are satisfied. It does not entail that H can validly infer that S implicated p from (i)–(iii). The Calculability Assumption does that.

In addition to postulating that the conversationality of an implicature depends on the cooperative presumption, determinacy, and mutual knowledge conditions, and that the implicature can be recognized on the basis of those conditions, Grice claimed that they give rise to or generate the implicatures. The implicatures exist because conditions (i)–(iii) are satisfied.

Generative Assumption: Implicatures that are conversational exist because of the fact that the cooperative presumption, determinacy, and mutual knowledge conditions hold.[10]

Whereas the Calculability Assumption is epistemological, the Generative Assumption is ontological, explaining the constitution of conversational implicatures. On Grice's view, the factors that give rise to conversational implicatures are precisely those that enable hearers to recognize them.

From his assumption that conversational implicatures can be explained and predicted on the basis of facts about the Cooperative Principle, Grice drew a methodological conclusion that has come to be known as “Grice's Razor.”

Grice's Razor: Other things equal, it is preferable to postulate conversational implicatures rather than senses, semantic implicatures, or semantic presuppositions because conversational implicatures can be derived from independently motivated psycho-social principles.[11]

The pithy formulation is “Senses are not to be multiplied beyond necessity,” alluding to Ockham. If a phenomenon can be explained and predicted in terms of such principles, then it is theoretically more economical to do so than to posit senses and the like, which cannot be so explained. Grice's Razor is often invoked to support classifying the exclusive interpretation of “p or q” as an implicature rather than as a second sense. The thought is that given the inclusive sense, it can be predicted using the Cooperative Principle that speakers will commonly use “p or q” to implicate that not both are true. Griceans conclude there is no need to postulate a second sense.

3. Theoretical Difficulties

While Grice viewed his ideas as tentative and exploratory, followers have taken the theory to be well established. Indeed, it has served as a paradigm for research in pragmatics. Seemingly insurmountable difficulties abound, however (see Davis 1998).

A relatively minor objection is that the Calculability and Generative Assumptions do not support Grice's Razor. This methodological principle assumes that conversational implicatures can be inferred from and explained by psycho-social principles. The only psycho-social principles Grice formulates are the Cooperative Principle and associated maxims on descriptive rather than normative or imperative readings. But these are not what explain conversational implicatures if the other parts of Grice's theory is correct. The Generative Assumption says that what explains conversational implicatures is the cooperative presumption, along with determinacy and mutual knowledge. The Calculability Assumption adds that conversational implicatures can be inferred from these three conditions. The cooperative presumption is not the Cooperative Principle, however, but the belief or assumption that a particular speaker is observing the principle. Similarly, the fact that speakers generally contribute what the conversation requires does not tell us that a particular belief is required, and so does not explain the determinacy condition. The Generative Assumption would be falsified, in fact, if “Cooperative Principle” replaced “cooperative presumption.” For speakers contribute what the conversation requires, and thus observe the Cooperative Principle, by implicating things.

A problem for the Generative Assumption is that nothing in the cooperative presumption, determinacy, or mutual knowledge conditions tells us that the speaker implicates p rather than saying p. The same information gets “contributed” either way. (Note that “S implicates p” is outside (i)–(iii) in the Theoretical Definition.) Furthermore, nothing in conditions (i)–(iii) tells us what S intends. But as Grice (1957, 1969) himself emphasized, what a speaker means, implies, or suggests depends on the speaker's intentions. Even if we require that the cooperative presumption be true, and that S intends to contribute what is required by the accepted purpose of the conversation, nothing in the determinacy or mutual knowledge conditions entails that S intends to express or communicate the belief p, or to get H to believe p. Without such intentions, it cannot be true that S implicated p.

What H presumes about S is relevant to whether S communicates with H. For S communicates with H only if H understands S. To understand S is to know what S means, and that requires knowing something about S. But implicatures are not necessarily communicated. Indeed, speakers can engage in implicature without even trying to communicate, as when they deliberately speak in a language their audience cannot understand, or when they have no audience at all.

4. The Differentiation Problem

Many have argued that Gricean theory “overgenerates” implicatures.[12] For nearly every implicature that appears to be correctly predicted by Gricean theory, others appear to be falsely predicted. The schema used to “work out” observed implicatures can usually be used just as well to work out nonexistent implicatures. So the schema as formulated is not a reliable method of inferring implicatures. By a simple application of Mill's Methods, such failures of differentiation would mean that the observed implicatures do not exist because of the Gricean factors. To illustrate the problem here, we will focus on the case that has been most extensively studied, and is most favorable to Grice's theory.

Example (3) is a typical quantity implicature, in which a weaker statement is used to implicate that a stronger statement is false. It is also called a scalar implicature because the weaker and stronger statements form a logical scale. Griceans attempt to explain implicatures like (3) in terms of the maxim of Quantity, according to which one is to be just as informative as required. The idea is that if the speaker were in a position to make the stronger statement, he would have. Since he did not, he must believe that the stronger statement is not true. Here is Levinson's influential formulation.

To show that these regular scalar inferences are indeed implicatures we need now to produce a Gricean argument deriving the inference…. A short version of the argument might go as follows:

The speaker has said A(e2); if S was in a position to state that a stronger item on the scale holds—i.e. to assert A(e1)—then he would be in breach of the first maxim of Quantity if he asserted A(e2). Since I the addressee assume that S is cooperating, and therefore will not violate the maxim of Quantity without warning, I take it that S wishes to convey that he is not in a position to state that the stronger item e1 on the scale holds, and indeed knows that it does not hold

More generally, and somewhat more explicitly:

  1. S has said p
  2. There is an expression q, more informative than p (and thus q entails p), which might be desirable as a contribution to the current purposes of the exchange (and here there is perhaps an implicit reference to the maxim of Relevance)
  3. q is of roughly equal brevity to p; so S did not say p rather than q simply in order to be brief (i.e. to conform to the maxim of Manner)
  4. Since if S knew that q holds but nevertheless uttered p he would be in breach of the injunction to make his contribution as informative as is required, S must mean me, the addressee, to infer that S knows that q is not the case (K¬q), or at least that he does not know that q is the case (¬Kq).

(Levinson 1983: 134–135)

In the typical case represented by (3), S says “Some athletes smoke” (e2, p), and implicates “Not all athletes smoke” (¬e1, ¬q). The stronger statement S does not make (e1, q) is “All athletes smoke.” Countless statements would have been more informative, however, many of which are comparably brief. Indeed, “Some athletes smoke” is the low point on several different scales.

Some athletes smoke Some athletes smoke Some athletes smoke
Several athletes smoke At least 1% of athletes smoke Some athletes smoke occasionally
Many athletes smoke At least 10% of athletes smoke Some athletes smoke often
Most athletes smoke At least 50% of athletes smoke Some athletes smoke regularly
Nearly all athletes smoke At least 50% of athletes smoke Some athletes smoke constantly
All athletes smoke 100% of athletes smoke
Some athletes smoke Some athletes smoke Some athletes smoke
Some athletes and maids smoke Some athletes smoke Marlboros I know some athletes smoke
Some athletes, maids, and cops smoke Some athletes smoke filterless Marlboros Everyone knows some athletes smoke

The reasoning Levinson has sketched provides no basis for discriminating among all the stronger statements the speaker might have made that would have been relevant and comparable in brevity. So if the reasoning predicts that people who say “Some athletes smoke” implicate “Not all athletes smoke,” then it also predicts that they implicate “Less than 1% of athletes smoke,” “No athletes smoke filterless Marlboros,” and other things they do not in fact implicate.[13] Among the infinity of statements stronger than “Some athletes smoke,” “All athletes smoke” is highly unusual in that people typically implicate its denial.

Many other differences in implicature are difficult to explain in terms of Gricean theory. Suppose H asks S “Do any athletes smoke?” If S answered “Some do,” S would typically implicate that not all smoke. A logically equivalent answer, however, would be “Yes.” But if S gave that answer, S would typically not implicate that not all athletes smoke. A “Yes” answer leaves it open whether or not all athletes smoke. Since a speaker who answers a yes-no question “Yes” is being fully cooperative, the Cooperative Principle cannot require the speaker who answers “Some do” to provide any more information than “Yes” provides.

Similarly, Leech (1983: 91) noted that “John met a woman” implicates “John did not meet his wife,” and accounted for this as a quantity implicature, using the sort of reasoning Levinson sketched. But a parallel statement like “John broke a finger” does not implicate “John did not break his own finger.” On the contrary, it means or implicates that John did break his own finger, as Grice (1975: 38) himself noted.

Harnish (1976) observed that “Bill and Tom moved the piano” commonly implicates that Bill and Tom moved the piano together. A Levinsonian explanation in terms of Quantity would attribute this implicature to the fact that the speaker did not make the stronger statement that they moved the piano separately. If this explanation were sound, we could equally well conclude that the speaker implicated that Tom and Bill moved the piano separately, given that the speaker also did not make the stronger statement that they moved the piano together. Levinson (1983: 146ff) himself recognized that the togetherness implicature could not be explained in terms of Quantity, and suggested that a Principle of Informativeness took precedence for some unknown reason. That principle enjoins you to “read as much into an utterance as is consistent with what you know about the world.” But since the reading “Tom and Bill moved the piano separately” satisfies this principle just as well (most pianos are equipped with wheels enabling one person to move them), Levinson's account also fails to differentiate.

Another problem is to explain why we often find “close-but” implicatures rather than quantity implicatures (Davis 1998: §2.1, §3.6). Suppose someone asks “Did the Ethiopians win any gold medals?” The answer “They won some silver medals” would implicate not “They did not win every silver medal” but rather “They did not win any gold medals.” Yet “They won some gold medals” is not stronger than (i.e., does not entail) “They won some silver medals,” while “They won every silver medal” is. The Levinsonian derivation falsely predicts the quantity implicature and fails to predict the close-but implicature.

Finally, stress plays a role in signaling or generating implicatures that Gricen theorists have not addressed (cf. Van Kuppevelt 1996). With no stress, “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” would not ordinarily have a quantity implicature, in contrast to “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music.” “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” and “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” would have quantity implicatures, but different ones. Since stress does not affect the set of stronger statements, the Levinsonian derivation would predict the same quantity implicatures no matter what is stressed. If the maxim of Quantity explains why “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” implicates “Not all Beethoven's music is wonderful,” it should also predict that “Beethoven wrote some wonderful music” with no stress or different stress has the same implicature. Accounting for the differences in implicature described in this section is an outstanding problem for pragmatic theory.

5. The Determinacy Problem

Grice's determinacy condition states that S conversationally implicates p only if S has to believe (and implicate) p if S's utterance is to be consistent with the Cooperative Principle. Determinacy is a key premise in the working-out schema. It is hard to find contexts, though, in which the determinacy condition is satisfied. There are normally many alternative ways for a speaker to be cooperative, and contribute what is required by the purpose of the conversation. Grice takes as given the meanings of the words used, along with the identity of any references.

For Grice, irony involves flouting the maxim of Quality. Thus when Candy (the party animal) answered Alan in (5) by saying “I don't like parties,” he could reason that if she meant what she said, she would be lying, and thus violating Quality. If she meant that she loves parties, then she would be in conformity with the maxim. So that must be what she meant. This reasoning, however, takes Candy's belief that she loves parties as given, and infers what she must have meant to be cooperative. It was not the Cooperative Principle that required her to believe that she loves parties. She would have made a suitable contribution to the conversation if she had meant and believed that she does not like parties. The determinacy requirement is unsatisfied in the case of irony and other figures of speech because the speaker could have been speaking literally, believing what was said. There is also the possibility of using another figure of speech. For example, Candy would have made a suitable contribution to the conversation if she had been engaging in understatement instead of irony, meaning and believing that she hates parties.

The possibility of speaking figuratively also undermines the determinacy requirement when the speaker is actually being literal. In (1), Barb was speaking literally. But she could have been speaking ironically, meaning and believing that she did not have to work, thereby giving an affirmative answer to Alan's questions. In general, whether S observes Quality, and therefore the Cooperative Principle, depends on how what S believes relates to what S implicates. These are independent variables. But Grice's theory claims that what S implicates is that which the Cooperative Principle requires S to believe, making implicature the dependent variable. Independent of what S means and implicates, the Cooperative Principle does not tell us what S believes.

Metaphors are often difficult to interpret. Suppose a woman says “Iraq was Bush's Vietnam,” referring to George W. Bush and the second Gulf War. Did she mean that the U.S. will lose in Iraq the way it lost in Vietnam? That the reasons for going to war in Iraq were as misguided as those that got the U.S. into Vietnam? Or did she perhaps mean that even if the U.S. does not emerge with a clear victory, the Iraq war was still worth fighting? According to Gricean theory, what the woman implicated is that which she has to believe to conform to the Cooperative Principle. But in many conversations, she could mean and believe any of these things and still be making a useful contribution. So no one of the beliefs is required. Grice (1975: 39–40) said that “the conversational implicatum in such cases will be a disjunction of such specific explanations; and if the list of these is open, the implicatum will have just the kind of indeterminacy that many implicata do in fact have.”[14] But if our woman is typical, she will not have implicated the disjunction of the possibilities suggested above. Implicating such a disjunction would contribute little to a typical conversation. If the indeterminacy Grice perceives here is the incalculability of the implicatum, then it contradicts the determinacy condition.

Ignorance implicatures are often an alternative to scalar implicatures. Recall that when Levinson was trying to derive quantity implicatures using the working-out schema, he indicated that if “Some athletes smoke” occurs in a context in which it would be desirable to know if all do, then the speaker S must know that not all athletes smoke, or at least not know that all athletes do. Indeed, S may well have implicated either “Not all athletes smoke” or “I do not know whether all smoke.” The fact that these may both be cooperative means that the determinacy condition is unsatisfied. S does not have to believe that not all smoke to conform to the Cooperative Principle. Not believing that all smoke suffices. But then Gricean theory rules that S did not implicate that not all smoke even in contexts in which S did.

Rysiew (2000) made the natural suggestion that the determinacy condition be weakened, replacing “has to believe (and implicate) p” with “is likely to believe (and implicate) p.” As he notes, hearers commonly use abduction to figure out what speakers have implicated. Abduction is a specific form of inductive or non-demonstrative reasoning in which a hypothesis is inferred to be true from the fact that it provides the best explanation of the data. By their nature, non-demonstrative methods are not guaranteed to succeed. This fact of life is no reason to shun abduction or other forms of induction when seeking to discover implicatures. The goal of the Theoretical Definition, however, is to set out necessary and sufficient conditions for an implicature to be conversational, and the Generative Assumption seeks to describe conditions that explain why the implicatures exist. Elaborations of the examples given above will show that an implicature can exist and be conversational even though the available evidence does not make that implicature (or belief) more likely than others.

Saul (2001, 2002) and M. S. Green (2002) have suggested that “implicature” be defined normatively. Alternatively, we might view determinacy as a condition for properly implicating something. Determinacy is more plausible as a norm, but similar considerations show that it is not required even for properly meaning one thing by saying something else (Davis 2007a). For example, a speaker who says “I ate some of the cookies” could properly be implicating either “I ate them all” (engaging in understatement), or “I did not eat them all” (using a quantity implicature), or “I do not know whether I ate them all” (using an ignorance implicature). Yet none of these contributions is required given that all would be appropriate. Accounting for implicatures when there are alternative ways to be cooperative is another outstanding problem for pragmatic theory.

6. Conflicting and Inapplicable Principles

When the Gricean maxims conflict, there is no way to determine what is required for conformity to the Cooperative Principle. In the case of irony, for example, Manner clashes with Quality. When Candy says “I don't like parties,” we cannot interpret her as meaning what she said because on that interpretation she would be violating Quality. But we cannot interpret Candy as meaning the opposite of what she said, because on that interpretation, she would be violating Manner. It is hardly perspicuous to use a sentence to mean the opposite of what the sentence means. Indeed, it is hard to see how any implicatures could be worked out on the basis of the maxims, because it would always be more perspicuous to explicately state something rather than implicate it. While both are included in Manner, perspicuity often clashes with brevity.

We use irony and other figures, of course, in part because we have conversational goals other than the efficient communication of information. We observe not only the Cooperative Principle, but also the Principle of Style.

Principle of Style: Be stylish, so be beautiful, distinctive, entertaining, and interesting.

Clear and simple prose—“just the facts, please”—can be boring, tedious and dull. We liven up our writing with figures of speech and other devices. In the process, we sacrifice perspicuity (violating Manner). We sometimes “embellish” a narration to make it more interesting (violating Quality) and delete boring or ugly details even when they are important (violating Quantity).

The Gricean maxims often clash with the Principle of Politeness, emphasized by Leech (1983).[15]

Principle of Politeness: Be polite, so be tactful, generous, praising, modest, agreeable, and sympathetic.

Speakers frequently withhold information that would be offensive or disappointing to the hearer, violating Quantity. Speakers often exaggerate in order to please or flatter, and utter “white lies” in order to spare the hearer's feelings, violating Quality. People pick “safe topics” (e.g., the weather) to stress agreement and communicate an interest in maintaining good relations—but violating Relation. Euphemisms avoid mentioning the unmentionable, but in the process violate Manner and Quantity.

Given the possibility of clashes among these principles, speakers often conversationally implicate something even though they are presumed to be observing the Principles of Style or Politeness rather than the Cooperative Principle. In case (1), Alan may correctly presume that Barb is simply making an excuse, or even trying to mislead him into thinking that she is not going. Barb may realize that Alan will presume such a thing. That does not prevent her from saying that she has to work and implicating that she will not be at Paul's party.

Even when style or politeness are not issues, the Cooperative Principle may fail to apply because there is no conversation, or because the participants have no mutually accepted purpose. Speakers and writers can use quantity implicatures and a wide range of figures of speech when they are not conversing with anyone. When there is a conversation, the speaker may try to change the subject, engage in idle chit-chat, or fight with his or her interlocutor. An extreme case arises when a witness is cross-examined. The prosecutor's purpose is to extract as much incriminating evidence from the witness as possible. The witness's purpose is to provide as little as possible. Consider a variation on (1) in which Alan is the prosecutor and Barb the defendant charged with murdering someone at Paul's party. Alan asks “Were you at Paul's party?” Barb might well answer “I had to work,” implicating that she was not at the party. She may implicate this even though everyone presumes that she is not being cooperative, instead making a desperate effort to mislead the prosecutor into believing that she was elsewhere. There may even be quantity implicatures, as when Alan asks “Did you talk to your friends at the party?” and Barb answers “Some of them,” implying that she did not talk to all.

7. Neo-Gricean Pragmatics

Some linguists have sought to improve on Grice's formulation of the conversational principles, and provide a solution to the problem of clashes. Horn (2004: §4) replaces Quantity, Relevance, and Manner with two interrelated principles.[16]
Q Principle: Say as much as you can [given R].
R Principle: Say no more than you must [given Q].
The Q principle ‘collects the first Quantity maxim [“say at least what is required”] along with the first two “clarity” submaxims of manner and is systematically exploited (as in the scalar cases discussed above) to generate upper-bounding implicata,’ while the R principle ‘collects the Relation maxim, the second Quantity maxim [“say no more than is required”], and the last two submaxims of Manner, and is exploited to induce strengthening implicata’ (Horn 2004: 13). Since Horn believes that implications like (6a) are derivable from the R-principle, he calls them “R-based implicatures.” The assumption seems to be that there is no reason to make a stronger statement (say more) if the extra information can be contributed by implicature. Implicature (7b) is similarly described as “Q-based.” The assumption is that if the speaker did not make a stronger statement (say more), its denial was implicated.
  1. He broke a finger.
    (a) He broke a finger of his own. (“R-based implicature”)
    (b) ✗He did not break a finger of his own.
  1. He entered a house.
    a) ✗He entered his own house.
    b) He did not enter his own house. (“Q-based implicature”)

Horn has clearly identified two distinct and very general patterns of meaning and interpretation. Horn's two principles, however, provide no reason to expect the two indicated implicatures rather than those we do not observe. How can Q predict (7b) without predicting (6b)? If (6a) is derivable from R, why isn't (7a)? What in R predicts (6a) rather than other strengthenings, such as “He broke someone else's finger”? Speakers who use (6) and (7) in the typical way, and hearers who understand them, do not appear to have such principles in mind in any way.

Horn sometimes describes Q and R as “antinomic forces” (e.g., Horn 2004: 14), which would be appropriate if the bracketed material in the formulations above were omitted. Thus interpreted, Horn's principles would clash as often as Grice's. Without having any independent means of determining which force will “prevail” in any given case, Horn's principles would have no predictive or explanatory value. Horn's official formulations of the two principles avoid clashes by adding the bracketed “given” clauses. Each principle refers to the other. Given the way these formulations “interact definitionally” (Horn 2004: 14), however, they are circular, and do not succeed in specifying principles. Substituting for “Q” and “R,” what the R principle says is “Say no more than you must given that you say as much as you can given that you say no more than you must given … etc. ad infinitum.”[17]

Horn goes on to formulate what he calls the Division of Pragmatic Labor:

Given two expressions covering the same semantic ground, a relatively unmarked form—briefer and/or more lexicalized—tends to be R-associated with a particular unmarked, stereotypical meaning, use, or situation, while the use of the periphrastic or less lexicalized expression, typically more complex or prolix, tends to be Q-restricted to those situations outside the stereotype, for which the unmarked expression could not have been used appropriately. (Horn 2004: 16)

Horn illustrates this division with the contrast between (8) and (9).

  1. He stopped the machine.
    (a) He stopped the machine in the usual way. (“R-based implicature”)
    (b) ✗He did not stop the machine in the usual way.
  1. He got the machine to stop.
    (a) ✗He stopped the machine in the usual way.
    (b) He did not stop the machine in the usual way. (“Q-based implicature”)
Horn appears to be assuming, plausibly, that “stopped” and “got to stop” have the same meaning. If so, then it is especially difficult to see how either implicature could be derived from Q or R, since they refer to what is said, not how it is said. (Recall Grice's nondetachability criterion.) Levinson (2000: 136–7) therefore reinstated a version of Manner.[18]
M Principle: Indicate an abnormal, nonstereotypical situation by using marked expressions that contrast with those you would use to describe the corresponding normal, stereotypical situation.

Levinson takes this to imply that (9) implicates (9c): He stopped the machine in an unusual way, which he describes as an M implicature; it is also an R implicature. Horn's Q-based implicature (9b) is equivalent to (9c) given what is said in (9); and both appear to be genuine implicatures of (9). M provides no reason, however, to predict (6a) or (7b).

When we look at clear cases in which a single word is synonymous with a less lexicalized and longer phrase, we often find no difference in implicature (e.g., mare versus adult female horse). And the word often connotes an unusually good example of the kind (e.g., stallion in common parlance connotes an especially fast or dominant uncastrated adult male horse). Similarly, stopping the pain and getting the pain to stop do not differ in implicature even though there are typical ways of stopping pain, while getting the bus to stop at M Street has a specific implicature that stopping the bus at M Street lacks (that the subject either was not driving the bus or got it to stop in an unusual way). Finally, we find a similar contrast between kill and cause to die even though these two expressions are not synonymous. Horn's formulation of the division of labor as a tendency allows for such exceptions, but they are problems for Levinson's M principle if it is to have predictive or explanatory force.

Levinson's (2000: 76, 114) versions of Q and R have the same circularity as Horn's.[19] Even though this deprives the principles of content altogether, Levinson sought to avoid clashes by stating an order of precedence: Q > M > R. Such an ordering would make sense if the bracketed clauses were omitted. But then it is hard to see why (6) should have an R implicature rather than a Q implicature. Huang (2007: 40) reverses the ordering, saying that “the R-principle generally takes precedence until the use of a contrastive linguistic form induces a Q-implicature to the non-applicability of the pertinent R-implicature….” This makes it hard to explain why (7) has a Q implicature, or how (9) could have both a Q and an R implicature.

Bidirectional Optimality Theory (BOT) provides a new way of replacing Grice's Quantity, Relevance, and Manner (Blutner 2000, 2004).[20] This is a formal framework with many applications. Dekker & van Rooy (2000) show that BOT is an application of game theory, with optimality being a Nash equilibrium. BOT can be applied to the problem of predicting and explaining what is implicated on the basis of what is said via an appropriate Optimality Principle. One can be stated without introducing new technical tools as follows.

Optimality Principle: Given that S says Σ/E in C, S implicates I iff (i) E&I is the strongest possible contribution that is no stronger than required by the purposes of C; (ii) there was no better way to convey E&I than Σ.

“Σ” is the sentence S utters in C, and “E” is what S thereby said. The optimality is bidirectional in that condition (i) defines “comprehension/hearer optimality” and (ii) “production/speaker optimality.” Condition (i) combines Q and R in a way that avoids both clashes and circularity, while (ii) replaces M and Manner, plus possibly Politeness and Style.[21] To illustrate how Optimality works, consider a quantity implicature such as (3). The speaker utters “Some athletes smoke” (Σ) and thereby asserts “At least some athletes smoke” (E). Consider three alternatives: S implicates “Not all athletes smoke” (I1), “All athletes smoke” (I2), or nothing (I). The idea is that I can be ruled out on the grounds that I1 and I2 contribute more. I2 can be ruled out on the grounds that there would have been a better way of conveying E&I2, by uttering “All athletes smoke.” Hence S implicated I1.

One problem with this account of scalar implicature is that without knowing something about S's context C, there is no basis for the claim that E&I does not suffice for the purposes of C. The Optimality Principle might account for particularized but not generalized implicatures. It is also not evident why “Only some athletes smoke” wasn't a better way to convey E&I1, blocking the conclusion that S implicated “Not all athletes smoke.” Why doesn't the increase in clarity/explicitness outweigh the marginal increase in sentence length?

When Optimality is applied to examples (8) and (9), these problems are magnified. In typical contexts, why would someone who used either sentence to assert that a man stopped the machine in some way be required to contribute anything more to the conversation? And without already knowing what these sentences implicate, how can we determine which sentence provides the better way of conveying that the man stopped the machine in a usual or unusual way?[22]

8. Relevance Theory

The most influential alternative to Gricean theory is the “Relevance” Theory developed by Sperber and Wilson.[23]

We have proposed a definition of relevance and suggested what factors might be involved in assessments of degrees of relevance. We have also argued that all Grice's maxims can be replaced by a single principle of relevance—that the speaker tries to be as relevant as possible in the circumstances—which, when suitably elaborated, can handle the full range of data that Grice's maxims were designed to explain. (Wilson & Sperber 1986: 381).

“Relevance” is given a highly technical sense, roughly meaning communicative efficiency. “The relevance of a proposition increases with the number of contextual implications it yields and decreases as the amount of processing needed to obtain them increases” (Wilson & Sperber 1986: 382). Later formulations replace “contextual implication” with the more general notion of a “contextual effect”—roughly, what a proposition adds to the representation of the world that is already given in the context. These remarks suggest that a speaker does a cost-benefit analysis, examining alternative propositions, evaluating the number of contextual effects per unit processing cost for each, and choosing to convey the proposition with the highest ratio. Putting this in the style of Grice's principles yields:

Principle of Maximal Relevance (Communicative Efficiency): Contribute that which has the maximum ratio of contextual effects to processing cost.[24]

Wilson & Sperber (2004: 609) illustrate by imagining a speaker whose choices are confined to the alternatives in (10).

  1. (a) We are serving chicken.
    (b) We are serving meat.
    (c) We are serving chicken or (72 −; 3) is not 46.

They conclude that (10a) would be maximally relevant. For it entails everything (10b) does and more, while being as easy to process. (10c) has the same contextual effects as (10a), but is harder to process.

While Grice's maxims enjoin the speaker to communicate efficiently, they do not require maximization. Conversely, the Principle of Maximal Relevance does not imply Grice's principles. Nothing guarantees that the contribution with the greatest number of contextual effects per unit processing cost is: required by the accepted purpose of the conversation; true or justified, and thus informative; germane to the topic of the conversation (relevant in the ordinary sense); or perspicuous and brief (lengthy formulations are permitted as long as they have enough implications).

Relevance theorists have presented a wealth of valuable data, and pointed out the inability of Gricean theory to account for it adequately. Their theory, however, has similar deficiencies. The Principle of Maximal Relevance clashes with the Principle of Politeness as badly as the Cooperative Principle does. Imagine parents deciding what to say after listening to their daughter struggle through her clarinet recital. “Your performance was horrendous” seems at least as easy to process as “Your performance wasn't perfect.” And the former implies more than the latter in any context. So “Your performance was horrendous” would seem to have the greater ratio of contextual effects to processing cost in any ordinary context. But considerations of their child's feelings, among other things, will lead most parents to prefer the less efficient contribution.[25] Nothing in the Sperber and Wilson theory, furthermore, accounts for why a speaker would say “Some athletes smoke” and implicate “Not all do” rather than vice versa. This choice is a matter of style and emphasis rather than informativeness or effort.

A separate problem is that anything a speaker might say or implicate other than logical truths will have an infinitely large set of contextual effects. And we have no way of measuring processing cost—not even a unit. So “the maximum ratio of contextual effects to processing costs” is generally either undefined or unknowable. Consequently the Principle of Maximal Relevance cannot be used to account for specific particularized implicatures. In example (1), for instance, there is no reason to believe that “I am not going to Paul's party” or any other proposition would have greater contextual effects per unit processing cost than what she literally said. As for generalized implicatures, sentences of the form “Some S are P” are used to implicate “Not all S are P” in a wide variety of contexts. What reason is there to think that “Not all S are P” will have the maximum contextual effects per unit processing cost in every one of these contexts? Many alternatives seem more informative while just as easy to process (§4).

Sperber and Wilson sometimes formulate the Principle of Relevance in terms of optimal relevance rather than maximal. “An ostensive stimulus is optimally relevant to an addressee if and only if it has enough contextual effects to be worth his attention and puts him to no unjustified processing effort in accessing them” (1987: 743).[26] Being qualitative, this may avoid the measurement problem. But calculability and determinacy go with it. Optimal relevance so defined does not pick out a unique contribution to the conversation. Many propositions will be informative enough to be worth processing other than those actually implicated. In example (1) again, “I am not going to anyone's party” would also seem to be worth processing. Wilson & Sperber (2004: 614) argue that there should never be more than one because “A speaker who wants her utterance to be as easy as possible to understand should formulate it … so that the first interpretation to satisfy the hearer's expectation of relevance is the one she intended to convey.” But neither optimal nor maximal relevance requires the speaker to minimize processing cost. Additional effort can always be justified by a proportionate increase in informativeness. We cannot simply look for the most accessible way to convey what is being communicated, for this theory is supposed to predict what is being communicated based solely on considerations of efficiency.

Relevance theory also seems to overgenerate implicatures. Suppose that in a discussion of a new prescription drug benefit, someone comments “It will take some money to fund that program.” The speaker would normally have engaged in understatement, implicating “The program will be very expensive.” Relevance theorists account for this by saying that because the proposition explicitly said is trivial, and thus has few contextual effects, the hearer will “recover” the more informative proposition.[27] But countless propositions are more informative than the one implicated, such as “The program will cost trillions,” and seem as easy to process. If the reasoning were valid, moreover, we should expect all tautological sentences to have non-tautological implicatures; but such implicatures are the exception rather than the rule.

The analysis of example (10) given above, finally, would seem to imply that a speaker who uttered (10b) would assert or implicate (10a), since that is maximally relevant (cf. Carston 1988: 43). In fact, such a strengthening (or R implicature) would be unlikely.

Given the definition of contextual effects, both Maximal and Optimal Relevance seem to imply that speakers cannot implicate anything that is already given in the context. For the ratio of contextual effects to processing costs in that case must be zero. This prediction is not borne out. If A and B are walking in torrential rain, A might say “It is raining really hard,” stating the obvious, and B might respond “There is indeed some rain coming down,” engaging in understatement and implicating exactly what A said

Like Grice, relevance theorists postulate that the speaker is presumed to be observing their key conversational principle. Relevance theorists need to show that speakers commonly have opinions about such maximal or optimal “relevance,” or are tacitly guided by it in some way. A final problem for either formulation is that the body of contextual assumptions or background information, in terms of which contextual effects are defined, is indeterminate. In example (5), Candy answered Alan by saying “I don't like parties,” implicating that she is going to Paul's party. Is the fact that Candy loves parties part of the context, or a potential contribution to the conversation? Relevance theory must provide answers to such questions if it is going to yield specific predictions.

9. Explicature and Impliciture

Grice (1975: 24) introduced the technical term “implicature,” using it to denote either (i) the act of meaning or implying one thing by saying something else, or (ii) the object of that act. Grice (1975: 87ff) used the word “say” quite strictly, requiring what a speaker says to be closely related to what the sentence uttered means on that occasion. Thus if Carl utters “The largest planet is a gas giant” referring to Jupiter, Grice would describe Carl as saying that the largest planet is a gas giant and thereby implicating that Jupiter is. Indexicals provide cases in which what a speaker says is not what the sentence used means. When Barb uttered “I have to work” in (1), she said that she, Barb, has to work; but the sentence she used does not mean “She, Barb, has to work” even on that occasion.

Sperber and Wilson (1986: 182–3) introduced the parallel technical term explicature to mean what is “explicitly communicated.” Carston (1988: 33) identified this with “what is said, in Grice's terms.”[28] In this terminology, Barb's explicature in (1) was “She (Barb) has to work,” and her implicature was “She is not going to Paul's party.” Carston's (1988: 40) paradigm case is less clear.

  1. Alice ran to the edge of the cliff.
    (a) The distraught woman jumped.
    (b) She jumped off the cliff.

After saying or observing that Alice ran to the edge of the cliff, a speaker would typically use (11a) “The distraught woman jumped” to mean that she jumped off the cliff (11b). Given that (11a) does not itself mean this, Grice would describe the speaker as implicating rather than saying that she jumped off the cliff. He would note that if the speaker knew that the woman jumped back from the edge, the speaker could be accused of misleading the hearer but not of lying. A speaker who used (11a) to mean that the woman jumped up to the rescue helicopter said the same thing while meaning something different. Carston (1988: 40) classifies (11b) as an explicature on the grounds that an implicature cannot entail what is said. This assumption has no more basis than the converse claim that an implicature cannot be entailed by what is said (§1). Understatement, including litotes, is a common figure of speech in which what is implicated entails what is said, as when a speaker says “That's not bad” meaning “That's good,” or “The music is a little loud” meaning “It is deafening.” Another reason Carston offers is that (11b) is what the hearer will remember. But what is implicated is often more important than what is said. In dialogue (1), Alan may well forget what excuse Barb gave because he was so disappointed that she would not be at the party. Carston's (1988: 45) most interesting argument is based on embedding. She would claim that if “Alice jumped off the cliff” were merely an implicature of “Alice jumped,” then we should not understand (12a) and (12b) as having the same truth conditions. Yet we would take them to be equivalent, Carston believes. The alleged implicature seems to fall within the scope of the logical operator, something she believes an implicature would not do.

  1. (a) If Alice ran to the edge of the cliff and jumped, she is probably dead.
    (b) If Alice ran to the edge of the cliff and jumped off, she is probably dead.

A speaker who used (11a) to mean (11b) would just as naturally use (12a) to mean (12b), and hearers would understand him accordingly. But Grice can maintain that by saying (12a) (the whole conditional), the speaker implicates (12b). For it is not the case that what the speaker said entails (12b). What the speaker of (12a) said would be false in circumstances in which Alice was unlikely to jump off the cliff. Hearers would focus on what the speaker meant, though, which would be true even in those circumstances. Grice does not need to maintain that conversational implicatures generally embed in compounds. In most instances in which a sentence “p” conversationally implicates “q,” the conditional “If p then r” does not implicate “If p and q then r.” For example, “If Bill got some of the problems wrong, he might have gotten them all wrong” does not implicate ”If Bill got some but not all of the problems wrong, he might have gotten them all wrong.” But in some instances, speakers may be able to use “If p then r” to implicate “If p and q then r.” Thus a speaker S can naturally use “If Jimmy kissed some of the girls while Johnny kissed them all, Johnny kissed more girls” to implicate something true. We may understand S in this case as saying something necessarily true, but what S said is not itself necessarily true.

Another debate between the Relevance theorists and Griceans concerns numerical claims.

  1. I have one child.
    (a) I have at least one child.
    (b) I have exactly one child.

All parties agree that a speaker can use (13) to mean either (13a) or (13b). Grice and Horn further agree with Carston that (13) itself is unambiguous. But whereas Grice and Horn hold that (13) means (13a) rather than (13b), Carston maintains that (13) means neither. Both (13a) and (13b) are “developments” or “expansions” of the logical form of (13) on Carston's view. So Grice and Horn hold that (13) always explicates (13a) while sometimes implicating (13b). Carston holds that (13) is sometimes used to explicate (13a) and sometimes (13b); neither is an implicature. The thesis that sentence meaning leaves open what is said to this extent is called semantic underdetermination. Assessing this debate is especially difficult because of the possibility that (13) actually is ambiguous. Grice's razor is not a good reason to reject this possibility (§2).

Bach (1994: 160) is like Grice in using “say” strictly, meaning “strictly, literally, and explicitly say.” Since the speaker of (11a) did not explicitly say that A jumped off the cliff, Bach would deny Carston's view that (11b) is an explicature. Bach (1994: 125–6, 140–1; 2006: 28–9) agrees with Carston, though, in withholding the term “implicature” when what the speaker means is an “expansion” or “completion” of what is said. Bach introduces the term impliciture (with “i” rather than “a”) to cover such cases. Bach's agreement with Carston and disagreement with Grice about what is implicated is merely verbal, however. For Bach defines “implicature” more narrowly than Grice, restricting it to cases in which what is meant is “completely separate” from what is said.

A thesis associated with Grice is that what S says is determined by “decoding,” while what S implicates is determined by what S says together with an inferential, pragmatic mechanism. An alleged problem for this view, called “Grice's Circle” by Levinson (2000: 173–4, 186–7), is that many of the processes involved in figuring out what is said, such as reference identification and ambiguity resolution, “involve exactly those inferential mechanisms that characterize Gricean pragmatics.” Grice never talked about decoding however, and observed himself that conversational principles are involved in determining what is said (Grice 1957: 222).[29] For example, if an ambiguous term is used, we naturally assume—without specific counterevidence—that the intended meaning was the one relevant to the topic of conversation. In a discussion of snow, “There is a large bank on Main Street” is naturally interpreted as referring to a snow bank. That recognition of explicatures is not simply a matter of “decoding” is proven by the simple fact that we have to infer what language or code S is using, and what speech act S is performing, before we can use our knowledge of the language to (help) determine what S said. A speaker can utter English words without using English. When Jack answered “Sugar” in response to someone who asked in Spanish what he bought for $150 a gram, we may rely on the maxim of Quality to help us determine that Jack is using a drug code. Our knowledge of English will not tell us what he said, if anything.

There is no circle in Grice's view because what is said is the conclusion of one pragmatic inference, and is one of the premises in a further pragmatic inference to what is implicated.[30] The process is serial rather than parallel, although later conclusions may always lead to adjustment of earlier conclusions. Bach (2006: 25) argues that we need not determine what S said before inferring what S implicated (see also Meibauer 2006: 577). He correctly observes that we can often determine what S meant before determining what S said. But by definition, we cannot conclude that S implicated p before establishing that S did not say p. And we cannot conclude that S implicated p by saying q before establishing that S said q.

10. Speaker Implicature and Intention

If theories that seek to derive conversational implicatures from general conversational principles all have outstanding problems, what alternatives are there for explaining conversational implicatures, and describing how they are understood? That depends on whether we are concerned with speaker implicature or sentence implicature.

For a speaker to implicate something is for the speaker to mean something by saying something else. It seems clear that what a speaker means is determined by the speaker's intentions. When Steve utters “Kathryn is a Russian teacher,” whether Steve means that Kathryn is a teacher of Russian nationality or a teacher of the Russian language, and whether he is speaking literally or ironically, depends entirely on what Steve intends to convey. What “convey” means precisely is a matter of considerable debate that we can ignore here.[31]

Given that speaker meaning is a matter of speaker intention, it follows that speaker implicatures can be recognized or predicted by any of the methods we use to infer intentions from behavior, and can be explained by the usual factors we invoke to account for intentions. Suppose that while walking with us in the driving snow, Swede says “It is a good day!” We may wonder whether he was speaking literally, and meaning just what he said; or speaking ironically, and meaning the opposite of what he said; or perhaps engaging in understatement, and meaning that it is a wonderful day. We need to know what thought Swede intended to convey. One thing we can do is ask him. If Swede tells us that he was using irony, that would be good evidence that he intended to convey the belief, and thus implicated, that the weather is terrible. His intonation might be another indication. The fact that Swede is often ironic in similar situations would be supporting evidence. On the other hand, if we know that Swede loves snow, and freely conveys his feelings, that evidence would make it more likely that he intended to convey the belief, and thus implicated, that the weather is wonderful. Finally, if Swede's companion has just suggested that they go in because the weather is lousy, the hypothesis that Swede intended to convey the opposite belief because he wanted to stay out may provide the best explanation of his saying “It's a good day.” In that case, we would infer that he meant what he literally said.

While the existence of conversational implicatures does not depend in any way on the assumption that the speaker is observing conversational principles, they may play a role in the recognition of implicatures. Indeed, the Cooperative Principle and associated maxims, along with the principles of Style and Politeness, seem to play the same indirect role in implicature recognition that known tendencies or goals play in inductive inference generally. Since speakers tend to observe the Cooperative Principle, and hearers know this in a vague and tacit sort of way, hearers tend to assume that particular speakers are cooperating, in the absence of evidence to the contrary. If the hypothesis that S is implicating p fits better with the assumption that S is being cooperative than the hypothesis that S is not, the hearer may conclude that S is implicating p, by abduction. Further support for the hypothesis may be provided by the recollection that S and other speakers have implicated similar things in similar circumstances before. The existence of an applicable implicature convention would be especially powerful evidence. The hypothesis may receive final confirmation after the fact from S's testimony.

When S is being uncooperative, we have to use other generalizations. We are familiar, for example, with the ways in which defendants manipulate language in an effort to avoid self-incrimination. When trying to infer what such a speaker is implicating, we use something other than Grice's working-out schema. In general, we need to distinguish contextual clues to what a speaker intended from contextual determinants. As is the case with mental phenomena generally, the evidence we use to detect implicatures is not what makes them exist.

What a speaker says is also dependent on the speaker's intentions. Whether a speaker using “There is a large bank on Main Street” says that there is a snow bank or a commercial bank on Main Street depends on what the speaker means by “bank” on that occasion. Meaning “bank” involves the intention to convey not a belief or thought, but rather a concept. It is unsurprising, therefore, that conversational principles play much the same role in inferring both what is said and what is implicated (§9).

11. Sentence Implicature and Convention

We noted in §1 that when an implicature is conventional, we may ascribe it to a sentence. “Some athletes smoke” implicates “Not all athletes smoke” but not “It is not the case that at least 13% of all athletes smoke.” That is because speakers conventionally use sentences of the form “Some S are P” to implicate “Not all S are P,” but not to implicate “Less than 13% of all S are P.”[32] Even though this implicature is conversational, all the signs of conventionality are present.[32] There is a regularity in usage and interpretation. English speakers commonly use sentences of the form “Some S are P” to implicate “Not all S are P,” but they rarely if ever use them to implicate “Less than 13% of all S are P.”[33] Speakers are commonly understood accordingly.[34] These regularities are socially useful, serving, among other things, the purpose of communication. They seem to be as self-perpetuating as other conventional practices. People use “Some S are P” to implicate “Not all S are P,” and are so understood, in part because people have regularly done so in the past. And finally, the regularities are arbitrary to some extent. Plenty of other practices could have served the same purpose quite naturally, and would have perpetuated themselves in the same way if only they had gotten started. It could have been conventional for English speakers to use “Some S are P” to implicate the denial of any stronger sentence, such as “At least 13% of S are P” or others listed above in the athlete example (§4). Conversational implicature conventions are not as arbitrary as lexical conventions, though. In all known cases, there is some antecedent relation between what the sentence means and the implicature that makes it natural to use one to convey the other. But there are always alternative implicatures that would be natural too. The fact that regularities in implicature obtain cross-linguistically is compatible with their being arbitrary and conventional. The practice of using “?” as a question mark is completely arbitrary and conventional even though it is used in nearly all written languages. The same goes for the use of arabic numerals for numbers. In a wide variety of spoken languages, rising intonation is used to mark questions, and variants of “Hello!” are used to answer the telephone.

Quantity implicatures are examples of conventional conversational implicatures. When Grice talked about conventional implicatures, he was referring to semantic implicatures, like example (2). These implicatures exist because of the conventions that give individual words their meanings. Sentence (2a) implicates (2b) because it is conventional for English speakers to use “therefore” with a certain meaning. In the case of “Some athletes smoke,” there are not only the lexical conventions that give the words “some,” “athletes,” and “smoke” their meanings, and the syntactic conventions that give sentences of the form “Some S are P” their meaning. There is also a second-order convention whereby speakers use a sentence to mean “Some S are P” and thereby to imply “Not all S are P.” Conversational implicatures are always indirect: we imply one thing by saying another. In some cases, this indirectness is conventional. A language is defined by first-order lexical and syntactic conventions, not by second-order conversational implicature conventions. In this respect, conversational implicature conventions are like naming conventions, word formation rules, speech act rituals (e.g., saying “This is N” when answering a telephone), and indirect speech act conventions (e.g., asking “Is it possible for me to get a ride?” to request a ride).[35]

Quantity implicatures are distinctive in that the convention attaches a specific implicature to a particular sentence form. Other examples are tautology implicatures (e.g., “An N is an N” implicates “One N is as good as another”), conjunction implicatures (e.g., “p and q” implicates “p before q” or “q because p”), and disjunction implicatures (“p or q” implicates “But not both” or “I don't know which”). Quantity implicatures are also distinctive in that the same convention appears in all observed languages (Horn 1989). Tautology implicatures, in contrast, display the linguistic relativity typical of semantic conventions. Thus the literal French translation of “An N is an N” is used without implicature, the way English speakers use “No N is a non-N,” while the Polish translation is used to implicate “There is something uniquely good about an N” (Wierzbicka 1987: 102).

Many important conversational implicature conventions associate implicatures with sentences of any form. The most familiar examples are the figures of speech. It is conventional to use a sentence to mean the opposite (irony), or something stronger (litotes), or something similar (metaphor). There is also a convention whereby a sentence is used to implicate requested information by making a statement closely related to it by implication, which gives rise to relevance implicatures like (1). Since these conventions do not attach implicatures to particular sentence forms, they do not give rise to sentence implicatures.

It is plausible that conversational implicature conventions arose in much the same way idioms do.[36] “Kicked the bucket” started life when speakers used it as a metaphor to implicate that someone died. The metaphor caught on and became conventional. Although it has not to my knowledge been historically attested, it is plausible that the use of “Some S are P” (or its translation in some earlier language) to implicate “Not all S are P” similarly started life as a nonce implicature that caught on and spread. The difference is that with idioms, the metaphor “died,” and what previously was implied came to be meant directly, creating a non-compositional meaning for the expression. Consequently, idiomatic meanings have been “detached,” whereas conventional conversational implicatures are “nondetachable.” Why some implicatures are common to more languages than others is an open question on any view. The study of the origin of conversational implicature conventions falls in the domain of historical linguistics.

An impressive and growing body of research has attempted to discern general regularities in the multitude of conversational implicature conventions associated with a language. One set of studies, conducted by Wierzbicka (2003), seeks to understand how implicature conventions reflect broader “cultural scripts.” Another seeks to describe what happens to the implicatures of a sentence when it is embedded in compound sentences (Gazdar 1979; Levinson 2000: §2.5.1; Sauerland & Stateva 2007)—the question raised by example (12).

The most influential body of research on implicature conventions describes “Horn scales,” named after Laurence Horn (1972, 1989).[37] Horn observed that the quantifiers all, most, many, some form a scale with the following properties. Instances of “___ S are P” with one term entail instances with any term to the right, but not to the left; the terms are thus ordered by logical strength. Moreover, the result of substituting one term implicates the denial of the result of substituting any term to the left, but not to the right. In the context “It is not the case that ___ S are P,” the logical and pragmatic relations are reversed. Other Horn scales are necessarily, actually, possibly, certainly, probably, possibly; and must, should, may. Levinson (2000: 156) looked for a generalization that would cover these cases but not scales like Between 100% and 90%, at least 10%, some which have the same logical relations as Horn scales but not the pragmatic relations. One is that the items on a Horn scale are widely and frequently used monolexemes (Levinson 2000: 156). This does not exclude all exceptions. For example, “several” is monolexemic and both frequently and widely used. It is weaker than “many” but stronger than “some.” Yet “Some S are P” does not implicate “It is not the case that several S are P.” Can Levinson's generalization be refined, or is “several” just an exception? If the generalizations are explanatory rather than merely descriptive—that is, if they tell us why we have some implicature conventions but not others—then they can presumably be refined. A priori, though, there is no more reason to expect that our conversational implicature conventions are completely systematic than there is to expect that lexical conventions are. All languages are “irregular” to some extent. For example, the regular pattern for adjectives in English is that of tall, taller, tallest. But there are exceptions, such as good, better, best. No one expects that anything other than a historical explanation exists for these facts.

The claim that conversational principles generate sentence implicatures is problematic, as we have seen. Conversational implicature conventions would not exist if implicatures were generated by the principles because the regularities would then be non-arbitrary. But conversational principles do specify common interests that conversational implicature conventions serve: communication of information, politeness, style, and efficiency. Since conventional practices sustain themselves by serving socially useful purposes, the fact that speakers strive to be cooperative, polite, stylish, and efficient sustains implicature conventions. We also noted earlier that conversational principles can serve as generalizations used in the process of inferring implicatures, and we can add that flouting a principle often serves as a signal that an implicature convention is in play.

The literature on implicature is enormous and growing. This entry, regrettably, had to ignore many valuable contributions.


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assertion | convention | descriptions | disjunction | implicature: optimality theoretic and game theoretic approaches | intention | meaning, theories of | metaphor | negation | pragmatics | presupposition | speech acts

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