Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Properties

First published Sat Jan 5, 2002; substantive revision Sun Dec 23, 2012

We have some of our properties purely in virtue of the way we are. (Our mass is an example.) We have other properties in virtue of the way we interact with the world. (Our weight is an example.) The former are the intrinsic properties, the latter are the extrinsic properties. This seems to be an intuitive enough distinction to grasp, and hence the intuitive distinction has made its way into many discussions in ethics, philosophy of mind, metaphysics and even epistemology. Unfortunately, when we look more closely at the intuitive distinction, we find reason to suspect that it conflates a few related distinctions, and that each of these distinctions is somewhat resistant to analysis.

1. Introduction

The standard way to introduce the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties is by the use of a few platitudes. David Lewis provides the following list:

A sentence or statement or proposition that ascribes intrinsic properties to something is entirely about that thing; whereas an ascription of extrinsic properties to something is not entirely about that thing, though it may well be about some larger whole which includes that thing as part. A thing has its intrinsic properties in virtue of the way that thing itself, and nothing else, is. Not so for extrinsic properties, though a thing may well have these in virtue of the way some larger whole is … If something has an intrinsic property, then so does any perfect duplicate of that thing; whereas duplicates situated in different surroundings will differ in their extrinsic properties. (Lewis 1983a: 111–2)

The other way to introduce the subject matter is by providing examples of paradigmatic intrinsic and extrinsic properties. One half of this task is easy: everyone agrees that being an uncle is extrinsic, as is being six metres from a rhodadendron. The problem with using this method to introduce the distinction is that there is much less agreement about which properties are intrinsic. Lewis has in several places (1983a, 1986a, 1988) insisted that shape properties are intrinsic, but one could hold that an object's shape depends on the curvature of the space in which it is embedded, and this might not even be intrinsic to that space (Nerlich 1979), let alone the object (see also Bricker 1993 and Skow 2007). Lewis also mentions charge and internal structure as being examples of intrinsic properties. (For ease of exposition, we will assume below that shape properties are intrinsic. We will also assume that properties like being made of tin, and having a mass of 500kg are intrinsic.)

1.1 Philosophical Importance

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties plays an essential role in stating several interesting philosophical problems. Historically, the most prominent of these has to do with notions of intrinsic value. G. E. Moore (1903: §18) noted that we can make a distinction between things that are good in themselves, or possess intrinsic value, and those that are good as a means to other things. To this day there is still much debate over whether this distinction can be sustained (Feldman 1998, Kagan 1998), and if it can which kinds of things possess intrinsic value (Krebs 1999). In particular, one of the central topics in contemporary environmental ethics is the question of which kinds of things (intelligent beings, conscious beings, living things, species, etc) might have intrinsic value. While this is the oldest (and still most common) use of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in philosophy, it has not played much role in the discussions of the distinction in metaphysics, to which we now turn.

As P. T. Geach (1969) noted, the fact that some object a is not F before an event occurs but is F after that event occurs does not mean that the event constitutes, in any deep sense, a change in a. To use a well-worn example, at the time of Socrates's death Xanthippe became a widow; that is, she was not a widow before the event of her husband's death, but she was a widow when it ended. Still, though that event constituted (or perhaps was constituted by) a change in Socrates, it did not in itself constitute a change in Xanthippe. Geach noted that we can distinguish between real changes, such as what occurs in Socrates when he dies, from mere changes in which predicates one satisfies, such as occurs in Xanthippe when Socrates dies. The latter he termed ‘mere Cambridge’ change. There is something of a consensus that an object undergoes real change in an event iff there is some intrinsic property they satisfied before the event but not afterwards.

David Lewis (1986a, 1988) built on this point of Geach's to mount an attack on endurantism, the theory that objects persist by being wholly located at different times, and that there can be strict identity between an object existing at one time and one existing at another time. Lewis argues that this is inconsistent with the idea that objects undergo real change. If the very same object can be both F (at one time) and not F (at another), this means that F-ness must be a relation to a time, but this means that it is not an intrinsic property. So any property that an object can change must be extrinsic, so nothing undergoes real change. Lewis says that this argument supports the rival theory of perdurantism, which says that objects persist by having different temporal parts at different times. While this argument is controversial (see Haslanger (1989), Johnston (1987) and Lowe (1988) for some responses), it does show how considerations about intrinsicality can resonate within quite different areas of metaphysics.

The other major area where the concept of intrinsicality has been put to work is in stating various supervenience theses. Frank Jackson (1998) defines physicalism in terms of duplication and physical duplication, which are in turn defined in terms of intrinsic properties. This definition builds upon a similar definition offered by Lewis (1983b). Similarly, Jaegwon Kim (1982) defines a mind/body supervenience thesis in terms of intrinsic properties. As Theodore Sider (1993) notes, the simplest way to define the individualist theory of mental content that Tyler Burge (1979) attacks is as the claim that the content of a thinker's propositional attitudes supervenes on the intrinsic properties of the thinker. And many internalist theories in epistemology are based around the intuition that whether a thinker is justified in believing some proposition supervenes on the intrinsic properties of the thinker.

Most of the philosophical applications are independent of the precise analysis of intrinsicality, but work on this analysis has helped clarify debates in two ways. First, the distinction between the three notions of intrinsicality, discussed in section 2 below, helps clarify a number of these debates. More concretely, Theodore Sider's (2003) observation that most of the properties in folk theory are ‘maximal’ and hence not intrinsic provides a strong argument against various theories that appeal to the intuitive intrinsicality of some everyday property.

Though these are the most prominent uses of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in philosophy, they by no means exhaust its uses. Many applications of the distinction are cited by I. L. Humberstone (1996), including the following. George Schlesinger (1990) uses the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties to state a non-trivial version of Mill's principle of the uniformity of nature, though Schlesinger gives his distinction a different name. Wlodzimierz Rabinowicz (1979) uses the distinction to formulate principles of universalizability for moral principles and natural laws. And E. J. Khamara (1988) uses a distinction between relational and non-relational properties to state a non-trivial version of the principle of Identity of Indiscernibles.

1.2 Global and Local

In addition to the ‘global’ concept of a property being intrinsic, there is a ‘local’ concept of something having a property in an intrinsic fashion (see Humberstone 1996, p. 206). For each of Lewis's platitudes concerning the concept of an intrinsic property quoted above, there is a corresponding platitude for the concept of a thing having a property in an intrinsic fashion. These are:

  1. x has F in an intrinsic fashion iff a sentence ascribing F to x is entirely about that thing
  2. x has F in an intrinsic fashion iff x has F in virtue of how x itself, and nothing else, is
  3. x has F in an intrinsic fashion iff every duplicate of x has F

It follows from at least the third of these platitudes that something can have an extrinsic property in an intrinsic fashion. For example, since every duplicate of a piece of tin has the property of being made of tin, every duplicate of a piece of tin also has the extrinsic property of being either made of tin or married. As a result, it follows from the third platitude that each piece of tin has the property of being either made of tin or married in an intrinsic fashion, despite this property being extrinsic.

Two plausible principles linking the local and global concepts of intrinsicality are (GTL) and (LTG) (see Humberstone 1996, p. 228).

(GTL) If F is an intrinsic property, then it is necessary that every x that has F has F in an intrinsic fashion

(LTG) If it is necessary that every x that has F has F in an intrinsic fashion, then F is an intrinsic property

In addition to the two-place predicate ‘has … in an intrinsic fashion’, we can introduce a modifier ‘intrinsically’, where, adopting one of the platitudes above, x is intrinsically F iff x is F in virtue of how x is, as opposed to how x is related to things outside of it (cf. Humberstone 1996, p. 228). This modifier takes predicates as arguments rather than names of properties, or variables ranging over properties. Nominalists, who don't believe in properties, might attempt to use this modifier to capture the intuitive distinctions associated with intrinsicality without committing themselves to properties. For example, a nominalist might claim that a table is intrinsically rectangular, while claiming to consistently hold that there is no property of being rectangular. (For simplicity, we will assume in the following that nominalism is false and that there are abundantly many properties and relations, some of which are intrinsic and some of which are extrinsic.)

There might be further reasons to employ either the two place predicate ‘has … in an intrinsic fashion’, or the modifier ‘intrinsically’, rather than the one-place predicate ‘is intrinsic’. For example, one might think that at least one of the former two notions is more fundamental that the latter notion, or that the latter notion is misguided in some way that at least one of the former notions isn't. (See, for example, Figdor 2008.)

1.3 Relations

While this article focuses on the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic one-place properties, it is important to recognize that the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic also applies to multiple place relations. As in the case of one-place properties, the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic multiple place relations can be introduced by platitudes and examples. One platitude is the following:

An n-place intrinsic relation is an n-place relation that n things stand in in virtue of how they are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to things outside of them and how things outside of them are; whereas, this is not the case for extrinsic n-place relations.

Examples of extrinsic two-place relations include being as popular as, and having the same cousin as. Possible examples of intrinsic two-place relations include being 1 m away from and being made of the same type of metal as. (The claim that distance relations like being 1 m away from are intrinsic will be denied by philosophers who deny that shape properties are intrinsic.)

As well as the global notion of an n-place relation being intrinsic, there is the local notion of n things standing in a relation in an intrinsic fashion. A platitude concerning this local notion is:

n things stand in a relation R in an intrinsic fashion iff the n things stand in R in virtue of how they are and how they are related to each other, as opposed to how they are related to things outside of them and how things outside of them are.

2. Notions of Intrinsicality

Many different distinctions have been called the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. As J. Michael Dunn (1990) notes, some authors have used ‘intrinsic’ and ‘extrinsic’ to mean ‘essential’ and ‘accidental’. Dunn is surely right in saying that this is a misuse of the terms. A more interesting distinction is noted by Brian Ellis (1991; discussed in Humberstone 1996: 206). (See also Figdor 2008 for a discussion of a related notion of intrinsicality.) Ellis suggests we should distinguish between properties that objects have independently of any outside forces acting on them (what we will call the Ellis-intrinsic properties), and those that they have in virtue of those outside forces (the Ellis-extrinsic properties). For many objects (such as, say, a stretched rubber band) their shape will be dependent on the outside forces acting on them, so their shape will be Ellis-extrinsic. If one is committed to the idea that shapes are intrinsic, one should think this means that the distinction between the Ellis-intrinsic and Ellis-extrinsic properties is not the same as the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. Such a judgement may seem a little hasty, but in any case we will turn now to distinctions that have received more attention in the philosophical literature.

2.1 Relational vs. Non-Relational Properties

Many writers, especially in the literature on intrinsic value, use ‘relational’ for the opposite of intrinsic. This seems to be a mistake since many properties seem to be both be relational and intrinsic. For example, most people have the property having longer legs than arms, and indeed seem to have this property in an intrinsic fashion, even though the property consists in a certain relation being satisfied. Maybe the property is not intrinsic if whether or not something is an arm or a leg is extrinsic, so perhaps this isn't a conclusive example, but it seems troubling. And, in any case, there are other examples that can't be responded to in this way. For example, the property of having a proper part is surely intrinsic, but it also appears to be a relational property.

As Humberstone 1996 notes, some might respond by suggesting that a relational property is one such that if an object has it, then it bears some relation to a non-part of it. But this won't do either. Not being within a mile of a rhodadendron is clearly relational, but does not consist in bearing a relation to any non-part, as we can see by the fact that a non-rhodadendron all alone in a world can satisfy it.

2.2 Duplication Preserving vs. Duplication Non-Preserving Properties

We now turn to the notion of intrinsicality characterised by the platitudes listed in section 1. Or perhaps better, we now turn to the notions of intrinsicality characterised by these platitudes, since these platitudes arguably characterise different notions of intrinsicality. In this subsection, we will discuss the notion characterised by the platitude involving duplication. In the next two subsections, we will discuss the notions characterised by the other two platitudes.

One of the platitudes Lewis lists when isolating the concept of intrinsicality is that duplicates never differ with respect to their intrinsic properties. Lewis holds a further principle that may not be obvious from the above quote: that any property with respect to which duplicates never differ is intrinsic. Adding this further principle to the platitude gives us (1).

(1)
F is intrinsic iff F never differs between duplicates.

(1), however, has the following problem. Assume that no man has a mass of 500 kg (although it is possible for a man to have a mass of 500 kg). Since nothing has the property of being a popular man who is 500 kg, given this assumption, no two duplicates differ in whether they have this property. (1) therefore falsely classifies being a popular man who is 500 kg as intrinsic.

David Lewis doesn't face this problem due to his concretist theory of possible worlds. Lewis holds that, in addition to the world we live in, there are many other concrete worlds of the same kind as the world we live in. Moreover, he holds that contained in some of these worlds are 500 kg duplicate men, some of whom are popular, and some of whom are not. Given Lewis's concretist theory of possible worlds, then, being a popular man who is 500 kg is classified as extrinsic by (1).

Philosophers who instead endorse standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds, however, can't accept (1). According to standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds, possible worlds do not contain concrete entities such as 500 kg men as parts. According to standard abstractionists, then, there are no 500 kg men, there are only possible worlds that represent that there are 500 kg men. Philosophers who endorse standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds, however, can replace (1) with (2) (see Moore 1922 and Francescotti 1999). (Or at least, they can replace (1) with (2) given they hold that there are things that exist according to non-actual possible worlds that don't exist according to the actual world. Abstractionists who deny this will have to further modify (2).)

(2)
F is intrinsic iff, for any x and y, and for any possible worlds u and v such that x at u is a duplicate of y at v, x has F at u iff y has F at v

Given a standard abstractionist theory of possible worlds, there is a possible world u that represents there being a popular 500 kg man x, and there is another possible world v that represents there being an unpopular 500 kg man y, where x at u has the same intrinsic properties as y at v, and hence x at u is a duplicate of y at v. Given this, (2) classifies being a popular man who is 500 kg as intrinsic.

Putting aside for the moment the question of whether (2) correctly characterises intrinsicality, let us call the notion it does characterise duplication preservation. (Humberstone (1996) calls properties that are duplication preserving ‘qualitative properties’, but we will use ‘qualitative properties’ to mean something else below.)

(2), understood as a characterisation of duplication preservation has two important consequences. First, it has the consequence that identity properties, such as being Obama, aren't duplication preserving. The reason for this is that, since Obama could have had a duplicate distinct from himself, there is a possible world at which Obama has a duplicate who is not Obama, and hence there is a possible world at which something having the property of being Obama has a duplicate which lacks this property. A more general consequence can be stated using the distinction between qualitative and non-qualitative properties, where a qualitative property is intuitively a property that doesn't concern any particular entities, while a non-qualitative property is a property that does concern one or more particular entities. Examples of qualitative properties include the property of being cubical and the property of being next to a tin, while examples of non-qualitative properties include the property of being Obama and the property of being next to Clinton. It plausibly follows from (2) understood as a characterisation of duplication preservation that any non-qualitative property that is possibly instantiated is not a duplication preserving property.

Say that a property is indiscriminately necessary iff it is necessarily had by everything. The second consequence of (2), understood as a characterisation of duplication preservation, is that any two properties that are indiscriminately necessary are duplication preserving. Consider, for example, the indiscriminately necessary property of being such that there is a number (where we are assuming that numbers necessarily exist). Since all things at all possible worlds have this property, it is a duplication preserving property.

2.3 Interior vs. Exterior Properties

The second platitude listed in the quote by Lewis in section 1 was “A thing has its intrinsic properties in virtue of the way that thing itself, and nothing else, is”. This can be turned into a credible biconditional characterising a notion of intrinsicality by rendering it as (3), where x is wholly distinct from y iff x has no part in common with y.

(3)
Being F is an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, anything that is F is F in virtue of the way it itself, and nothing wholly distinct from it, is.

Call the properties that are classified as intrinsic by (3) interior properties, and call the properties that are classified as extrinsic by (3) exterior properties. (3) arguably lacks the two consequences of (2) described in section 2.2: that all non-qualitative properties are extrinsic, and that all indiscriminately necessary properties are intrinsic. This provides reason to think that interiority is distinct from duplication preservation.

First, while (2) classifies being Obama as extrinsic, (3) plausibly classifies it as intrinsic, since it is plausible that something is Obama in virtue of how that thing itself is. (See Moore 1922 and Dunn 1990.) So while being Obama is not duplication preserving, it is plausibly an interior property.

Second, while (2) classifies all indiscriminately necessary properties as intrinsic, it is the least prima facie plausible that (3) classifies some of these properties as extrinsic. For example, it is at least prima facie plausible that Obama does not have the property of being such that there is a number in virtue of how he is, but rather has it partly in virtue of how things wholly distinct from him are. This last claim, however, is controversial. Sider (1993a), for example, has in effect argued that we should reject the intuition that properties like being such that there is a number are exterior and instead endorse (N).

(N)
If F is an indiscriminately necessary property then F is an interior property

Eddon (2011), on the other hand, has in effect argued that the intuitions against (N) should be respected and (N) should be rejected.

While (N) is a matter of dispute, it is widely agreed that identity properties like being Obama are interior, in the sense that it is widely agreed that identity properties satisfy (3) and trivial variants of it. (Yablo (1999) is an exception by in effect holding that some identity properties are exterior properties. But even he holds that some identity properties are interior properties.) If this widespread view is correct, then interiority is distinct from duplication preservation.

It is important to note that given (N) the duplication preservation properties are plausibly a proper subset of the interior properties. In particular, given (N), it is plausible that a property is a duplicate preserving property iff it is a qualitative interior property.

2.3 Local vs. Non-Local Properties

It can be argued that the third platitude listed by Lewis characterises yet a further distinct notion of intrinsicality. This platitude, once rendered precise, can be stated as (4).

(4)
F is an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, for any x, an ascription of F to x is entirely about how that thing and its parts are, and not at all about how things wholly distinct from it are

(4) plausibly classifies being Obama as extrinsic since the ascription of being Obama to Clinton, namely the state of affairs of Obama being identical to Clinton, is not wholly about Clinton, but is also about Obama. (4) also appears to classify being such that there is a number as extrinsic, since the ascription of this property to Clinton, namely the state of affairs that Clinton is such that there is a number, is not wholly about how Clinton is, but is also about how things wholly distinct from Clinton are. (Like the claim that (3) classifies being such there is a number as extrinsic, however, this claim can be denied.)

Call the properties classified as intrinsic by (4) local properties, and call the properties classified by (4) as extrinsic non-local properties. If the above is correct, then being Obama and being such that there is a number are both non-local properties. If this is correct, then locality is distinct from both duplication preservation and interiority.

If the three platitudes concerning intrinsic properties quoted in section 1 characterise different notions, the three platitudes described in section 1.2 concerning having a property in an intrinsic fashion also characterise different notions. In order to distinguish these notions, we may employ these platitudes to define having a property in a duplication preserving fashion, having a property in an interior fashion, and having a property in a local fashion.

There might also be further notions of an intrinsic property and of something have a property in an intrinsic fashion. For example, it might be argued that there are a mulitiplicity of readings of ‘in virtue’ and that these give rise to multiple notions of interiority. For simplicity we will assume that there is only a single relevant reading of ‘ in virtue’, and only a single notion of interiority.

2.4 Which is the real distinction?

If we grasp the three distinctions discussed above, we might well ask which of them is the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction? It is possible that this question has no determinate answer. Humberstone discusses the notions of duplication preservation and interiority (although he calls the duplication preserving properties qualitative properties) and suggests that we have two interesting distinctions here, each of which can do some philosophical work, and there is not much interest in the issue of which of them is called the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. If we do decide to investigate this seriously, we should perhaps be prepared to be disappointed — there is no guarantee that there will be a fact of the matter which distinction the words ‘intrinsic’ and ‘extrinsic’ latch onto.

Should we just give up on identifying the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction; then, on pain of having some indeterminacy in our philosophical theories, we must reformulate the theories that are framed using this distinction, specifying which distinction should take the role of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction in each case. Sider, in the course of defending the philosophical interest of the duplication preserving/duplication non-preserving distinction, makes a start on doing this. He notes that in the debates about supervenience, the distinction that is usually relevant is the duplication preserving/duplication non-preserving one. If we let being (identical to) X be an intrinsic property, then most of the supervenience theses discussed will be trivially true, because it will be impossible to have things that share all their intrinsic properties, but differ with respect to the contents of their beliefs, or the justificatory status of their beliefs, or their phenomenal states, or whatever. But these theses are not trivially true; so if we are to formulate the distinctions this way, we had better not let identity properties be intrinsic in these contexts.

This, of course, does not show that the duplication preserving/duplication non-preserving distinction is the only one that can do philosophical work. Indeed, when trying to grasp what real change amounts to, it seems to be the interior/exterior distinction that is relevant. Say that a has b as a part, and consider the event whereby b is replaced in a by c, which happens to be a duplicate of b. This event seems to constitute a real change in a, not merely a Cambridge change, but it does not constitute a change in qualitative properties, and hence does not constitute a change in duplication preserving properties.

Against the above egalitarian approach to the various notions of intrinsicality, one might argue that there is a privileged distinction that deserves to be called the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. One argument for this is that, when philosophers explain what they mean by ‘intrinsic property’, they employ the ‘in virtue of’ platitude, or a trivial variant of this platitude, much more often than they employ any of the other platitudes. As far as we know, Lewis, for example, uses the ‘in virtue of’ platitude whenever he explains what he means by ‘intrinsic’, but only uses the other platitudes once (see Lewis 1983a, 1983b, 1986a). This can be taken to suggest that the real distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic is that between interiority and exteriority.

3. Attempts at Analysis

We will look at several attempts to analyse the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. Some of these attempts are best seen as attempts to analyse the distinction between duplication preserving and duplication non-preserving properties, while others are best seen as attempts to analyse the distinction between interior and exterior properties, or between local and non-local properties. (For a more detailed discussion of a number of the attempted analyses below, see Hoffmann-Kolss 2010a, Marshall 2012, and Marshall forthcoming.)

3.1 Broadly Logical Theories

It would be good if we could analyse intrinsicality using only broadly logical notions, where broadly logical notions are exhausted by the narrowily logical notions of conjunction, negation and existential quantification, the modal notion of metaphysical possibility, the mereological notion of parthood, and the notions associated with property and set theory, namely the notions expressed by ‘state of affairs’, ‘property’, ‘relation’, ‘possible world’, ‘instantiates’, ‘is a member of’ and ‘set’. (The locution ‘state of affairs’ is used differently by different philosophers. Here it is being used to refer to the zero-place analogues of one-place properties and multiple place relations. Just as a property is a way of a thing is or fails to be, a state of affairs, under our usage, is a way things are or fail to be.)

It is at least initially appealing to think that, if an object has a property in an intrinsic fashion, then it has it independently of the way the rest of the world is. The rest of the world could disappear, and the object might still have that property. Hence a lonely object, an object that doesn't coexist with any contingent objects wholly distinct from it, could have the property. Many extrinsic properties, on the other hand, cannot be possessed by lonely objects – no lonely object is six metres from a rhododendron, for example. This suggests an analysis of intrinsicality: F is an intrinsic property iff it is possible for a lonely object to be F. This analysis is usually attributed to Kim (1982) (e.g. in  Lewis 1983a and Sider 1993), though Humberstone (1996) dissents from this interpretation. If this analysis is successful then it would constitute a broadly logical analysis, since the expressions on the right hand side of the account can each be defined using only broadly logical vocabulary.

The major problem with this analysis is that the ‘if’ direction of the biconditional is clearly false. As Lewis (1983) pointed out, it is possible for a lonely object to have the property of being lonely, but the property of being lonely is not intrinsic.

One might try to deal with this problem by adding extra modal conditions to the above analysis. Say that a property F is independent of accompaniment iff the following four conditions (taken from Langton and Lewis 1998) are met:

  1. Possibly, there exists a lonely F
  2. Possibly, there exists a lonely non-F
  3. Possibly, there exists an accompanied (i.e. not lonely) F
  4. Possibly, there exists an accompanied non-F

At first glance, if F is intrinsic, then whether or not an object has F should not depend on whether it is lonely. If this is right, then all four of these conditions should be satisfied. We might therefore try to give the following broadly logical logical analysis: F is intrinsic iff F is independent of accompaniment.

As Langton and Lewis (1998) point out, however, this beefed up analysis still fails (see also Lewis 1983a). Given intrinsic properties, such as being a cube, are independent of accompaniment, the extrinsic property of being either a lonely cube or an accompanied non-cube is also independent of accompaniment. Hence, provided the beefed up analysis correctly classifies being a cube as intrinsic, it will falsely classify being either a lonely cube or an accompanied non-cube as intrinsic.

In the face of this failure, we might still hope that a yet more complicated broadly logical analysis might succeed. Marshall (2009), however, has given proof that, given standard views about what is possible, and given no special assumptions about properties are made (such as, for example, the assumption that all extrinsic properties have proper parts while all intrinsic properties don't have proper parts) no such analysis can be given. If we want to avoid making any special assumptions about properties, then, we will need to analyse intrinsicality using notions other than broadly logical ones.

3.2 Combinatorial Theories

Combinatorial approaches to analysing intrinsicality retain the idea that what distinguishes intrinsic properties from many extrinsic properties is their distinctive modal profile. Combinatorial approaches depart from broadly logical approaches by appealing to further notions that are not broadly logical in order to weed out those extrinsic properties, like being either a lonely cube or an accompanied non-cube, which have the same distinctive modal profile as intrinsic properties.

The most well known combinatorial analysis is that of Langton and Lewis (1998). Their theory resembles, in some respects, the theory sketched in an appendix to Dean Zimmerman's paper “Immanent Causation” (Zimmerman 1997). The two theories were developed entirely independently. We will focus on Langton and Lewis's version here, because it is more substantially developed, and more widely discussed in the literature. Their theory is best seen as offering an account of the distinction between duplication preserving and duplication non-preserving properties, although, as discussed in Marshall 2012, it is possible to transform it into an account of interior properties.

Langton and Lewis's account involves the following four steps. First, Langton and Lewis identify a class of privileged natural (or non-disjunctive) properties. Lewis (1983b) had argued that we need to recognise a distinction between natural and non-natural properties to make sense of many debates in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of mind, and suggested a few ways we might draw the distinction. We might take the natural properties to be those that correspond to real universals, or those that appear in the canonical formulations of best physics or regimented common sense, or even take the distinction to be primitive. Langton and Lewis say that it should not matter how we draw the distinction for present purposes, as long as we have it, and properties like being lonely and round or accompanied and cubical are not natural.

Secondly, they say:

[T]he disjunctive properties [are] those properties that can be expressed by a disjunction of (conjunctions of) natural properties; but that are not themselves natural properties. (Or, if naturalness admits of degrees, they are much less natural than the disjuncts in terms of which they can be expressed.) (Langton and Lewis 1998: 61, author's emphasis)

Thirdly, they say a property is basic intrinsic iff it is non-disjunctive and independent of accompaniment. Finally, they say that (i) two objects are duplicates iff they share the same basic intrinsic properties; and (ii) F is an intrinsic property iff two duplicates never differ with respect to it.

The last step of their account is in a form that requires Lewis's concretist theory of possible worlds. The last step in a form suitable for a typical abstractionist theory of possible worlds is instead:

  1. x at u is a duplicate of y at v iff, for any basic intrinsic property P, x has P at u iff y has P at v; and
  2. F is intrinsic iff, for any x and y, and for any possible worlds u and v such that x at u is a duplicate of y at v, x has F at u iff y has F at v

Note that (ii) is just the abstractionist version of the duplication platitude for intrinsicality given by (2) in section 2.2.

Three objections have been pressed against this view. Stephen Yablo (1999) objected to the role of natural properties in the analysis, which he argued introduced irrelevant material, and implied that the theory was at best de facto, but not de jure, correct. Dan Marshall and Josh Parsons (2001) claimed that according to this definition, the property being such that a cube exists is non-disjunctive, but is independent of accompaniment, so it would be basic intrinsic, despite being extrinsic. (Langton and Lewis 2001 is a response to this objection.) Theodore Sider (2001) claimed that the theory could not handle maximal properties: properties of objects that are not shared by their large proper parts. Sider claims that being a rock is such a property: large parts of rocks are not rocks. So being a rock is extrinsic, since a duplicate of a large part of a rock might be a rock if it is separated from the rest of the rock. But, argued Sider, on some interpretations of ‘natural property’ it is natural, and hence basic intrinsic.

Brian Weatherson's (2001) theory was designed to meet these three objections. In his theory, combinatorial principles of possibility are not used to derive characteristics of individual intrinsic properties, as Kim and Langton and Lewis do, but characteristics of the whole set of intrinsic properties. He argues that this set, call it SI, will have the following properties:

  • If F ∈ SI and G ∈ SI, then F and G ∈ SI and F or G ∈ SI and not F ∈ SI
  • If F ∈ SI then Having n parts that are F ∈ SI and Being entirely composed of exactly n things that are F ∈ SI
  • If F ∈ SI and G ∈ SI and there is a possible world with n+1 pairwise distinct things, and something in some world is F and something in some world is G, then there is a world with exactly n+1 pairwise distinct things such that one is F and the other n are G.
  • If F ∈ SI and G ∈ SI and it is possible that regions with shapes d1 and d2 stand in relation A, and it is possible that an F wholly occupy a region with shape d1 and a G wholly occupy a region with shape d2, then there is a world where regions with shapes d1 and d2 stand in A, and an F wholly occupies the region with shape d1 and a G wholly occupies the region with shape d2.

The first two principles are closure principles on the set. The third principle says that any two intrinsic properties that can be instantiated can be instantiated together any number of times. And the fourth says that if objects having two intrinsic properties can be in two regions, and those two regions can be in a particular spatial relation, then the regions can be in that relation while filled by objects having those properties. The third principle suffices to show that being such that a cube exists could not be in SI, and the fourth to show that being a rock could not be.

Weatherson's theory still requires an appeal to a concept of naturalness. Without such an appeal, then if F and G are intrinsic properties that atoms could have, nothing in his theory rules out the property being simple, lonely and F or being G from being intrinsic. There are a few ways for the appeal to go at this point, see Weatherson (2001) and Lewis (2001) for a few suggestions. The following moves, taken directly from Langton and Lewis, will probably work if any will. Say that the basic intrinsic properties are those non-disjunctive properties such that their membership in SI is consistent with the above four principles. Two objects are duplicates if they do not differ with respect to basic intrinsic properties. A property is intrinsic iff it never differs between duplicates.

Unfortunately, Weatherson's theory still faces apparent counterexamples, similar to those faced by Langton and Lewis's account. While Weatherson's account might successfully classify being such that there is a cube as intrinsic, it arguably fails to correctly classify other similar quantificational properties. One example discussed by Hawthorne 2001 is the property of standing in relation R to something, where R is a perfectly natural relation a thing can stand in to itself and to things wholly distinct from it. Another example discussed by Marshall (2012), which relies on less controversial claims about what types of perfectly natural relations there are, is the property of having a part that is 1 m away from something. Both these properties are arguably non-disjunctive. Given the set of intrinsic properties satisfy the above conditions for SI, both these properties plausibly satisfy them as well, and hence are plausibly falsely classified as intrinsic by Weatherson's account.

Another combinatorial account has been proposed by Gene Witmer, William Butchard and Kelly Trogdon (2005), hereafter WBT for short. They agree with Langton and Lewis that the core idea of an analysis of intrinsicality should be independence from accompaniment. But they argue that Lewis's notion of naturalness is too mysterious to deliver a useful analysis. Instead they propose to use the idea that an individual has some properties in virtue of having other properties. They first claim that an object x has a property F in an intrinsic fashion iff i) F is independent of accompaniment, and ii) if x has F at least partly in virtue of having some other property G, then G is independent of accompaniment. WBT then claim that F is intrinsic iff, necessarily, anything that has F has F in an intrinsic fashion.

Unlike both Langton and Lewis's account and Weatherson's account, the WBT analysis classifies identity properties, like the property of being Obama, as intrinsic. Something having the property of being Obama, for example, plausibly doesn't have this property in virtue of having some other property. Given the property of being Obama is independent of accompaniment, the WBT account therefore plausibly classifies it as intrinsic. This suggests that the WBT analysis is best seen as an account of the distinction between interior and exterior properties (although see Witmer, Butchard and Trogdon 2005:349 for a different diagnosis).

As WBT mention, their theory needs some relatively fine judgments about what properties are instantiated in virtue of which other properties in order to handle some hard cases, especially Sider's examples involving maximal properties. They also acknowledge that their account classifies all indiscriminately necessary properties as extrinsic, since indiscriminately necessary properties fail to be independent of accompaniment. However, some indiscriminately necessary properties, such as the property of being self-identical, are intuitively intrinsic.

Trogdon (2009), one of the authors of the WBT account, has argued that the account is also incompatible with priority monism, the view championed by Schaffer (2007) that the universe as a whole is more fundamental than its parts (and everything else). In reponse, Trogdon has proposed a modified version of the WBT account which he claims is compatible with both priority monism and priority pluralism, the view that the universe's atomic parts are fundamental. (See Skiles 2009 for criticism of Trogdon's account, and Trogdon 2010 for a response.)

A further problem that applies to all the above combinatorial theories is that they are incompatible with certain metaphysical views that posit necessary connections between wholly distinct entities. On a popular view of sets, for example, each thing x is wholly distinct from its singleton set {x}, and is such that, necessarily, it exists iff its singleton {x} exists. Given this view, however, no contingently existing things can be lonely, and hence no intrinsic property that can only be had by contingently existing things can be independent of accompaniment. Given being made of tin is such a property, it follows that each of the above combinatorial accounts falsely classifies being made of tin as extrinsic, given the above view of sets. (See Cameron 2008, 2009 for more discussion.)

An account which is not officially a combinatorial account, but which uses principles similar to those used in the accounts described above, has been proposed by Denby 2010. (This account is a modified version of an earlier account given in Denby 2006 which takes into account objections made by Hoffman-Kolss 2010b.) Instead of appealing to naturalness, disjunctiveness, or the notion of one fact obtaining in virtue of another, Denby's account employs the notion of an object instantiating a property under a relation. Denby, however, gives very little explanation of what this technical notion is meant to mean, and it is therefore not clear what to make of Denby's account.

3.3 Natural Property Theories

In On the Plurality of Worlds, David Lewis presents a quite different analysis of intrinsic properties. As with the combinatorial theory that he and Rae Langton defend, it heavily exploits the idea that some properties are more natural than others. In fact, it rests even more weight on it. Here is Lewis's statement of the theory:

[I]t can plausibly be said that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic. Then we can say that two things are duplicates iff (1) they have exactly the same perfectly natural properties, and (2) their parts can be put into correspondence in such a way that corresponding parts have exactly the same perfectly natural properties, and stand in the same perfectly natural relations…Then we can go on to say that an intrinsic property is one that can never differ between duplicates. (Lewis 1986a: 61–2)

Lewis's theory stated so as to be compatible with standard abstractionist theories of possible worlds is:

F is intrinsic iff, for any x and y, and for any possible worlds u and v such that x at u is a duplicate of y at v, x has F at u iff y has F at v,

where x at u is a duplicate of y at v iff the parts of x at u can be put into a one-to-one correspondence with the parts of y at v in such a way that the corresponding parts have exactly the same perfectly natural properties and stand in the same perfectly natural relations to each other at their respective worlds.

Like Langton and Lewis's account, this is best seen as an attempt at analysing duplication preservation, although see Marshall 2012 for a way of turning it into an account of interiority. The account rests heavily on the ‘plausible’ claim that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic, and, implicitly, that the perfectly natural properties are sufficient to characterise the world completely. The last assumption is needed because the theory rules out the possibility that there are two objects that share all their perfectly natural properties, but differ with respect to some intrinsic property or other. One consequence of these assumptions is that a world is fully characterised by the intrinsic properties of its inhabitants and the perfectly natural relations between those inhabitants.

The first assumption that all perfectly natural properties are intrinsic has been rejected by Weatherson (2006). Weatherson claims that it is metaphysically possible for the instantiated perfectly natural properties to be vector properties. He then argues that, since vector properties are extrinsic, it follows that at least some perfectly natural properties fail to be intrinsic, namely the perfectly natural properties instantiated at such worlds. The claim that vector properties need to be extrinsic, however, is contentious, and has been argued against by Busse (2009). A general argument that all perfectly natural properties must be intrinsic has been given by Marshall (2012).

The second assumption, that the perfectly natural properties are sufficient to characterise each possible world, has been rejected by Sider (1995) and Schaffer (2004). Both claim that it is metaphysically possible for there to be endless sequences of more and more natural properties, without any set of perfectly natural properties out of which all the other properties can be defined. In response to this problem, Sider (1993b) has proposed a modification of Lewis's account which he claims is consistent with there being such endless sequences of more and more natural properties. Sider (2011) has recently argued in favour of the second assumption by appealing to a Humean theory of metaphysical possibility.

In their paper of 1998, Langton and Lewis claim the only advantage of their theory over Lewis's old theory is that it makes fewer assumptions about the nature of natural properties. They also note that Lewis still believes those assumptions, but they think it is worthwhile to have a theory that gets by without them.

3.4 Contractions

Peter Vallentyne (1997) develops a theory based around the idea that x's intrinsic properties are those properties it would have if it were alone in the world. He defines a contraction of a world as “a world ‘obtainable’ from the original one solely by ‘removing’ objects from it.” (211) As a special case of this, an x-t contraction, where x is an object and t a time, is “a world ‘obtainable’ from the original one by, to the greatest extent possible, ‘removing’ all objects wholly distinct from x, all spatial locations not occupied by x, and all times (temporal states of the world) except t, from the world.” (211) Vallentyne allows that there might not be unique x-t contraction; sometimes we can remove one of two objects, but not both, from the world while leaving x, so there will be one x-t contraction which has one of these in it, and another that has the other.

Vallentyne claims that F is intrinsic iff, for any x, t, u and w, x has F at t at u iff x has F at t at v, where u is an x-t contraction of w, x has F at t at u iff x has F at t at w. In short, a property is intrinsic to an object iff removing the rest of the world doesn't change whether the object has the property. Vallentyne's analysis classifies identity properties, like being Obama, as intrinsic. It is therefore best seen as an account of interiority. The account also classifies all indiscriminately necessary properties as intrinsic. It is therefore committed to the principle (N) discussed in section 2.3.

Vallentyne notes that this definition will not be very enlightening unless we understand the idea of a contraction. This seems related to the objection Langton and Lewis (1998) urge against Vallentyne. They say that Vallentyne's account reduces to the claim that a property is intrinsic iff possession of it never differs between an object and its lonely duplicates, a claim they think is true but too trivial to count as an analysis. Their position is that we cannot understand contractions without understanding duplication, but if we understand duplication then intrinsicality can be easily defined, so Vallentyne's theory is no advance.

Stephen Yablo (1999) argues that this criticism is too quick. Vallentyne should best be understood as working within a very different metaphysical framework to Lewis. For Lewis, no (ordinary) object exists at more than one world, so Vallentyne's contractions, being separate worlds, must contain separate objects. Hence x-t contractions can be nothing other than lonely duplicates, and the theory is trivial. Yablo suggests that the theory becomes substantive relative to a metaphysical background in which the very same object can appear in different worlds. (In chapter 4 of Plurality Lewis has a few arguments against this idea, and Yablo has interesting responses to these arguments. A thorough investigation of this debate would take us too far from the topic.) If this is the case then we can get a grip on contractions without thinking about duplications — the x-t contraction of a world is the world that contains x itself, and as few other things as possible.

Josh Parsons (2007) argues against this approach. He says that there is no good way to understand sentences like ‘In w, Prince Philip is not a husband’, where w is the world consisting of just Prince Philip. More generally, we cannot make sense of what extrinsic properties x has in the x-t contraction.

3.5 Non-relationality

Robert Franscecotti (1999) has outlined an analysis that takes the concept of intrinsicality as non-relationality to be primary. Francescotti takes a property to be extrinsic if an object possesses it in virtue of its relations to other objects. So being a duplicate of Jack and being such that the number 17 exists are extrinsic, while being identical to Jack and being a vertebrate (i.e. having a vertebral column) are intrinsic. Francescotti notes that not all relational properties are extrinsic. Having a vertebral column, for instance, seems to be relational in that it consists of a relation to a vertebral column, but it is also an intrinsic property. So he focuses on relations to distinct objects.

Francescotti does not give an entirely precise statement of his account. On one way of spelling it out, however, the account is as follows. First, a property F is defined to be a d-relational property of x iff: x has F, and either

  1. There is a relation R, and an item y, such that (i) the state of affairs of x having F is the state of affairs of x bearing R to y, and (ii) y is not part of x; or
  2. There is a relation R, and a set of items C, such that (i) the state of affairs of x having F is the state of affairs of there being some member of C to which x bears R, and (ii) at least one member of C to which x bears R is not part of x; or
  3. There is a relation R, and a set of items C, such that (i) the state of affairs of x having F is the state of affairs of x bearing R to every member of C, and (ii) it is possible that there is a member of C that is not part of x; or
  4. The state of affairs of x having F can be expressed by a truth-functional compound, at least one of whose constituents expresses a state of affairs satisfying (a), (b) or (c).

Secondly, an internal property of x is defined to be a property had by x that is not a d-relational property of x. Thirdly, F is defined to be an intrinsic property of x iff there are internal properties I1,…,In such that the state of affairs of x having F is identical to the state of affairs of x having I1,…,In. Finally, F is claimed to be an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, for any x, if x has F, then F is an intrinsic property of x.

There are a number of problems with this formulation of Francescotti's account. One problem is that it appears not to classify the property of being accompanied as d-relational, and hence appears not to classify it as extrinsic. (Recall that something is accompanied iff it coexists with something wholly distinct from itself that contingently exists.) This property would be classified as a d-relational property of Obama, for example, if there were some set C and a relation R such that the state of affairs of Obama being accompanied is identical to the state of affairs of there being a member y of C to which x bears the relation R (where at least one member of C to which x bears R to is not part of x). However, there appears to be no such set. (For example, suppose C is the set of all contingently existing things wholly distinct from Obama. Then the state of affairs of Obama being accompanied would need to be identical to the state of affairs of there being a contingently existing member of C that Obama coexists with and is wholly distinct from. However, since Obama could have been accompanied without any of the contingently existing things Obama is actually accompanied by existing, the former state of affairs could have been true without the latter being true, and hence these states of affairs aren't identical.)

This problem can be rectified by replacing sets with properties in Francescotti's account, replacing (b) and (c) with (b*) and (c*):

(b*)
There is a relation R, and a property P, such that (i) the state of affairs of x having F is the state of affairs of there being something that has P to which x bears R, and (ii) at least one thing having P to which x bears R is not part of x.
(c*)
There is a relation R, and a property P, such that (i) the state of affairs of x having F is the state of affairs of x bearing R to every thing having P, and (ii) it is possible that there is something having P that is not part of x.

A deeper problem with Francescotti's account is that it is incompatible with a number of accounts of properties. (In the following we will use ‘property’ broadly to include states of affairs, which may be thought of as zero-place properties, and relations, which may be thought of as multiple place properties, as well as one-place properties.) Consider, for example, the course grain theory of properties according to which all necessarily coextensive properties are identical. (Two states of affairs are necessarily coextensive iff they are necessarily equivalent.) Given this theory of properties, any intrinsic property F of a thing x will be a d-relational property of x, since the state of affairs of x having F will be identical to the property of either being F and lonely, or else being F and accompanied, and hence will be expressible by a truth-functional compound at least one of whose constituents express a state of affairs satisfying (b*). Hence, given the course grain theory of properties, Francescotti's account falsely classifies every intrinsic property is being extrinsic.

Francescotti's account is also incompatible with standard fine grain theories of properties. Consider, for example, a Russellian theory of properties, according to which properties are structured entities build up out of objects, course grain properties, and course grain operators, combined with the view that the structure of properties matches the syntactic structure of the predicates expressing those properties. (Course grain properties are such that any necessarily coextensive course grain properties are identical. Sentences are zero-place predicates.) Given this fine grain account, ‘Obama is accompanied’ and ‘there is a contingently existing x such that Obama is wholly distinct from, and coexisting with, x’ express different states of affairs, since these sentences have different syntactic structures. As a result, given this fine grain theory, the property of being accompanied is plausibly not d-relational, and hence is plausibly falsely classified as intrinsic by Francescotti's account.

The fact that Francescott's account is incompatible with these theories of properties might not be a decisive objection against the account since these theories might be rejected. In particular, there might be strong reasons to reject these theories based on considerations stemming from intrinsicality itself. For example, the course grain theory is incompatible with the intuition that certain necessarily coextensive properties, such as being self-identical and being such that there is a number, differ in their intrinsicality, since, according to the course grain theory, such properties are identical. This intuition about intrinsicality might therefore be used to reject the course grain theory. If an account of intrinsicality respects this intuition, and as result is incompatible with the course grain theory of properties, this might therefore not be a mark against the account. In addition to not being compatible with the above theories of properties, however, it is not obvious that Francescotti's account is compatible with any credible theory of properties. In order to properly evaluate Francescotti's account, therefore, proponents of the account need to specify what theories of properties it is compatible with, and why we should believe that at least one of these theories is true. This task has not yet been carried out.

3.6 Grounding

Gideon Rosen (2010) has recently proposed an elegant analysis of intrinsicality in terms of grounding, where the state of affairs that A is grounded by the state of affairs that B iff it is the case that A in virtue of it being the case that B. The relevant notion of grounding is meant to be an explanatory one. It is supposed to be a metaphysical analogue of causation: just as causation is what connects the explanans of an explanation with its explanandum in causal explanation, grounding is meant to be what connects the explanans of an explanation with its explanandum in metaphysical explanation. An example of metaphysical explanation would be an explanation of why a certain type of act is wrong in terms more fundamental moral facts. (The WBT analysis discussed in section 3.2 also employs the notion of grounding, but Rosen's analysis is a more “pure” grounding account since it does not appeal to combinatorial principles such as independence of accompaniment.)

Rosen's account presupposes Russellianism about facts, according to which facts are structured out of things, properties and operators in the same kind of way sentences are built up out of names, predicates and operator expressions. Given this background, Rosen's analysis can be stated as follows:

F is an intrinsic property iff, necessarily, for any x (i): if the ascription of F to x is grounded by a fact containing a constituent y, then y is part of x; and (ii) if the negation of the ascription of F to x is grounded by a fact containing y, then y is part of x

Given the negation of the ascription of being Obama to Clinton is grounded by the negation of the ascription of identity to Obama and Clinton (a claim plausibly required by Rosen's analysis) the analysis classifies being Obama as extrinsic since Obama is not part of Clinton. The analysis also classifies intuitively extrinsic indiscriminately necessary properties, such as the property of being such that there is a number, as extrinsic. Being such that there is a number is classified as extrinsic by the account since, for example, it's ascription to Obama is grounded by the fact that 2 is a number, which has a constituent, namely the number 2, which is not part of Obama. These consequences of the account suggest that it is best thought of as an account of the distinction between local and non-local properties.

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Acknowledgments

As of the revision of October 29, 2012, Dan Marshall has taken over responsibility for maintaining and keeping this entry current.

Copyright © 2012 by
Brian Weatherson
Dan Marshall <danm@hku.hk>

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