States of Affairs

First published Tue Mar 27, 2012

Philosophers connect sentences with various items, such as thoughts, facts and states of affairs. Thoughts are either true or false in an absolute sense, never both or neither. A sentence such as ‘Socrates is wise’ is true (or false) in virtue of expressing the true (or false) thought that Socrates is wise. Thoughts are also the contents of propositional attitudes like belief and desire. For example, John's belief that Vulcan is a planet is a relation between him and the thought that Vulcan is a planet. Since there is no such planet, the thought that Vulcan is a planet cannot be composed of Vulcan and the property of being a planet. It is composed, among other things, of a way of thinking that purports to latch on to a planet. This so-called mode of presentation may be expressed by a definite description like ‘the planet between the Sun and Mercury’.

Some philosophers take it to be obvious that if something is true, there must be something that makes it true, a truth-maker. Facts are truth-makers. Like sentences and thoughts, facts are taken to be complex objects. But they are not composed of words or modes of presentations; facts are composed out of particulars and properties (see, for instance, Armstrong 1986, 85).

The sentence ‘Socrates is wise’ is not only said to express the thought that Socrates is wise, but also to describe the state of affairs of Socrates' being wise. There are similarities between states of affairs and thoughts. Thoughts are true or false; states of affairs obtain or not. There are also similarities between facts and states of affairs. Both facts and states of affairs are supposed to be logical complexes that contain (in a sense to be explained further) objects and properties.

Does one need states of affairs in addition to facts and thoughts? In order to answer this question we need to know what states of affairs are and how they contrasts and compare with thoughts and facts. I will therefore begin by outlining our intuitive conception of states of affairs.

1. Introducing States of Affairs

1.1 Referring to States of Affairs

‘State of affairs’ is a term that has been appropriated for philosophical purposes. In natural language we refer states of affairs in a variety of ways. Here are some:

(1)
A: There are two possible scenarios, either that Peter comes alone or that he brings Mary with him.
B: Which of the two scenarios will be the case does not matter. We need more wine in any case.
(2)
A: Martin might have straight hair.
B: Yes, that is a way he might be. (See Humberstone 1981, 314)
(3)
A: Will John move to Liverpool?
B: Yes, the probable outcome of the negotiations is that John moves to Liverpool.
C: Yes, John's moving to Liverpool is a probable outcome of the negotiations.

We seem to refer to and quantify over possible scenarios; ways things might be or outcomes and say true things about them. This is a prima facie reason to believe that there are such things and to investigate them further. As we will see ‘the possible scenario that Peter comes alone’, ‘the way Martin might be’, ‘the outcome that John moves to Liverpool’ and ‘John's moving to Liverpool’ are all designators of states of affairs. Most of our designators for states of affairs are derived from assertoric sentences. Take 3B and 3C. Both sentences contain nominalizations derived from the sentence ‘John moves to Liverpool’. (For the following points see Bennett 1988, 5–10.) 3B contains the that-clause ‘that John moved to Liverpool’ and 3C the imperfect gerundial nominal ‘John's moving to Liverpool’ that still contains grammatical reminders of the verb of the source sentence. The latter is intuitively closer to the sentence ‘John moves to Liverpool’ than to a singular term like ‘John's move to Liverpool’. If the sentence from which we derive such a nominalization is false, the nominalization refers to a state of affairs, something that can obtain or not. Sentences such as 3A and 3B gives us pointers to the nature of states of affairs that I will follow in the next section.

1.2 Outcomes as Models for States of Affairs

3A and 3B refer to outcomes. Outcomes are connected to probabilities: they are more or less probable (see Reinach 1911, 339–40; Künne 1987, 185ff and Forbes 1989, 131 follow Reinach). We can use this connection to develop our understanding of states of affairs further. Consider a school exercise in probability (see Kripke 1980, 16). Take two ordinary dice, D1 and D2, with six sides each. For each die, there are six possible outcomes of a throw. D1 and D2 are thrown and, on landing, display two numbers. Hence, there are thirty-six possible outcomes of throwing the dice. Let us now calculate the probability that the outcome of throwing the two dice is 11. There are only two outcomes of throwing the two dice in which they show together 11: either (i) D1 shows 5 and D2 6 or (ii) D1 shows 6 and D2 5. The probability of the outcome of D1's and D2's jointly showing 11 is the ratio between all possible outcomes of D1's and D2's jointly showing 11 and the totality of possible outcomes of throwing the two dice: 2/36 = 1/18.

The exercise suggests an initial conception of states of affairs:

(SoA1)
States of affairs are the bearers of probabilities: a state of affairs is probable or improbable; it has a degree of probability.

In calculating the probability of an outcome we assumed that there is a space of possible outcomes. These outcomes are possible states of the dice; ways the two dice might fall. Some of the outcomes that make up the space exist without obtaining:

(SoA2)
States of affairs can exist without obtaining (see Reinach 1911, 340; Plantinga 1974, 44 and Pollock 1984, 52).

The possibilities are possible ways an object might be. Showing 5 is a possible way for the die D1 to be, however we describe the die or ascribe the property. This suggests (SoA3):

(SoA3)
States of affairs directly involve particulars and properties.

What does it mean to ‘directly involve’ particulars and properties? ‘Involvement’ is often spelled out further as ‘contains as parts (constituents)’. Pollock is a representative example:

[States of affairs] are ‘about’ objects but not in terms of some mode of representation. States of affairs, in some sense, contain objects as direct constituents. (Pollock 1982, 53)

Hence, the state of affairs of Mont Blanc's being more than 4000 meters high contains (in some sense) Mont Blanc, the mountain with all its snowfields (see for example, Russell 1904, 169). I will devote section 4 to the question in which sense, if any, states of affairs have constituents.

The possibilities for the die are grounded in the nature of the die itself. Such possibilities are called metaphysical possibilities. States of affairs are the metaphysical possibilities under consideration:

(SoA4)
States of affairs are the bearers of metaphysical possibility and necessity (see Künne 1987, 185ff and Forbes 1989, 131).

In the following sections I will explore these main features of states of affairs further.

1.3 Logical Atomism

We have now an initial understanding of what a state of affairs is. Now we can go on to ask further questions about them. What kinds of states of affairs are there? Are there only simple states of affairs that involve only particulars and properties (relations)? Or are there complex states of affairs involving other states of affairs? This question has been discussed on the basis of the assumption that assertoric sentences describe states of affairs. Does every such sentence describe exactly one state of affairs?

Logical Atomists answered this question negatively (see entry on logical atomism). Wittgenstein (1921, 4.26) argued that only elementary propositions describe states of affairs. An elementary proposition in Wittgenstein's sense is a concatenation of simple proper names that refer to simple objects. Such a proposition is a picture of a state of affairs. The names in the elementary proposition are arranged in a way that can be mapped onto an arrangement of the object named. This arrangement of objects is the state of affairs pictured by the elementary proposition. Molecular propositions are concatenations of elementary propositions. Molecular propositions don't picture states of affairs; molecular propositions agree/disagree with the possible state of affairs pictured by the elementary propositions that are their constituents. For illustration take a simple example. If ‘p’ and ‘q’ are elementary propositions, the molecular proposition ‘p & q’ is true if, and only, if ‘p’ pictures an obtaining state of affairs and ‘q’ does the same. An assertion of ‘p & q’ states that these truth-possibilities of the elementary propositions are fulfilled, but it does not describe a conjunctive state of affairs. Wittgenstein's Logical Atomism is an extreme position: only elementary propositions describe a state of affairs.

Russell (1918) held an intermediate position for facts. There is no fact described by conjunctions and existential statements over and above the facts that make the atomic conjuncts true and the facts that are described by the atomic statement from which the existential statement can be inferred. But true general sentences (‘All men are mortal’) and negative sentences (‘John is not married’) describe general facts and negative facts.

At the other extreme of the spectrum are views that take each complex sentence to describe a complex state of affairs (see Pollock 1984, 55). In order to decide between these views we need to know more about the theoretical roles state of affairs are supposed to play. In the following sections I will focus on states of affairs that involve only particulars and properties (relations) to outline these theoretical roles.

2. Thoughts and States of Affairs

2.1 Individuation and Existence Conditions

Thoughts can be the contents of propositional attitudes. When one says ‘There are three things that everyone who works on elementary physics believes', one quantifies over things that everyone working in elementary physics believes; thoughts (see Chisholm 1970, 19). Thoughts are also truth-value bearers. (‘There are three truths that everyone who works in elementary physics believes’.) How are thoughts related to states of affairs? For instance, how is the thought that Socrates is wise related to the state of affairs of Socrates' being wise?

Prima facie, thoughts are one thing, states of affairs another. Thoughts and states of affairs differ in their individuation and existence conditions.

Individuation-conditions: Thoughts are supposed to be the contents of propositional attitudes like belief and desire. Let ‘j’ be shorthand for a propositional attitude verb (‘desire’, ‘believe’ etc). If one can j that p without eo ipso j-ing that q (and vice versa), the contents that p and that q are different. Now I can believe, for instance, that Hesperus shines without believing that Phosphorus shines. Hence, if thoughts are the contents of propositional attitudes, the thought that Hesperus shines is different from the thought that Phosphorus shines. If the thought that Hesperus shines is different from the thought that Phosphorus shines, thoughts cannot be logical complexes whose constituents are particulars and properties. They are therefore taken to be logical complexes that are built up out of modes of presentations of these things. Since there are different modes of presentations of the same particular (property), there can be different thoughts that concern or are about the same particulars and properties. In contrast, Hesperus's shining and Phosphorus's shining are the same state of affairs, namely the logical complex that contains only the planet Venus and the property of shining.

Existence-conditions: A thought is a logical complex whose constituents are modes of presentations that purport to represent objects. Standard accounts of modes of presentation allow for the existence of modes of presentations that are empty. Hence, the existence of a thought does not depend on the existence of the objects it purports to represent. For example, the thought that Pegasus is a horse exists, although there is no such horse (for defense and elaboration see Sainsbury 2005, 86–9). This is different for states of affairs. If a state of affairs is a logical complex that contains objects and properties as constituents, it cannot exist if its constituents don't exist. Hence, states of affairs that contain contingently existing particulars are themselves contingent existents. (Plantinga 1983 discusses problems that arise for this view, David 2009 responds to Plantinga's argument.)

2.2 States of Affairs as the Fundamental Bearers of Metaphysical Modalities

Does one need states of affairs as well as thoughts? According to Chisholm (1970, 20f, see also Plantinga 1974, 45–6), the state of affairs of Socrates' being wise is nothing but the proposition that Socrates is wise. However, Chisholm's propositions are not thoughts. For he conceived of propositions only as bearers of truth and falsity (Chisholm 1970, 19). If thoughts were, like Chisholm's propositions, only truth-value bearers, and every thought described exactly one states of affairs and vice versa, one would indeed not need states of affairs are well as thoughts. But if we attend to further theoretical roles of states of affairs and thoughts, the proposed identification starts to look implausible.

Forbes (1989, 130–131) argued that states of affairs are needed as the fundamental bearers of modal properties like being possible, necessary etc. Thoughts cannot fulfill that role. Hence, one needs states of affairs even if one has already posited thoughts. Consider the sentence pairs:

(1a) Hesperus shines.(1b) Phosphorus shines.
(2a) Hesperus is Hesperus.(2b) Hesperus is Phosphorus.

According to the criterion for thought difference, the members of each sentence pair express different thoughts. Yet there is a striking similarity between them: the thoughts expressed by 1a and 1b are both contingently true; the thoughts expressed by 2a and 2b are both necessarily true. Moreover, the thoughts expressed by 1a and 1b (or 2a and 2b) cannot differ in their modal profile. These similarities cry out for an explanation. If we take a thought to stand for a state of affairs, we can give a natural explanation of the similarities. A thought stands for the state of affairs that contains those particulars and properties that are represented by the modes of presentation contained in the thought and that are combined in a way that is analogous to the way the modes of presentations are combined in the thought. For example, the thought that Hesperus shines stands for the state of affairs of Hesperus's shining. According to our assumption, the thought that Hesperus is shining (that Hesperus is Hesperus) and the thought that Phosphorus is shining (that Phosphorus is Phosphorus) stand for the same state of affairs. States of affairs are in turn the bearers of metaphysical possibility and necessity. It is possible for Hesperus—however this planet might be described or conceived of—to shine and it in fact shines. Therefore Hesperus's shining contingently obtains. The variety of modality under concern here is, as in sect. 1.1, metaphysical necessity and contingency. Metaphysical necessity pertains to the nature of objects and properties and is independent of how we conceive or describe them.

The thought that Hesperus shines and the thought that Phosphorus shines are both contingently true because they stand for a state of affairs that contingently obtains. These thoughts have the same modal properties because they stand for the same state of affairs. Generalizing this we arrive at the thesis that a sentence is contingently true if, and only if, it stands for a state of affairs that contingently obtains. A sentence is necessarily true if, and only if, it stands for a state of affairs that necessarily obtains.

We can now answer our initial question: Yes, we need states of affairs as well as thoughts. States of affairs and thoughts have distinct individuation and existence conditions and play different theoretical roles.

This conclusion does not rule out that states of affairs can be derived from thoughts. Consider all thoughts that represent the same particulars and predicate the same properties of them. Let us call these thoughts referentially equivalent. Vendler proposed that a fact is ‘an abstract entity which indiscriminately contains a set of referentially equivalent true propositions’ (Vendler 1967, 711; my emphasis). If we drop the restriction to true propositions and simplify Vendler's idea, we can propose that a state of affairs is a set of referentially equivalent thoughts, whether they are true or not. The state of affairs of Hesperus's shining is the set of all thoughts that are about Hesperus and predicate the property of shining to it.

However, such an approach to states of affairs makes them explanatory uninteresting. If we want to explain why 1a and 1b (or 2a and 2b) have the same modal profile, appealing to states of affairs in Vendler's sense does not allow us to make progress. For instance, saying that 1a and 1b have the same modal profile because the belong to the set of thoughts that are about Hesperus and predicate the property of shining to it is at best a partial explanation. For it raises such questions as ‘What has belonging to this set to do with possibility?’ and ‘ Can sets be possible?’ In contrast, the assumption that there are states of affairs (and not just sets of a particular kind) and that they have properties like being possible or being probable is explanatory progress.

2.3 States of Affairs and Possible Worlds

In 2.2 we used the modal properties of states of affairs to distinguish them from thoughts. Some philosophers have proposed to use the connection between states of affairs and modality constructively to explain what a possible world is. A possible world is, intuitively, a way the world might have been (see Lewis 1986, 1–2). The exercise in probability calculation from 1.1 can be used to connect states of affairs and possible worlds. States of affairs are possible outcomes. Kripke called possible outcomes ‘miniature possible worlds’. This suggests an idea what a possible world is: it is a maximal state of affairs. A maximal state of affairs is a way everything might be or have been:

x is a possible world if, and only if, x is a possible state of affairs & for any possible state of affairs y, x either includes or precludes y (see Plantinga 1974, 44–6).

A possible state of affairs x includes another state of affairs y if, and only if, it is not possible that x obtains and y fails to obtain; x excludes y if, and only if, it is not possible that both x and y obtain. In this picture, the actual world is the possible world that obtains. The term ‘actual world’ has to be taken with care. If a possible world is a maximal state of affairs, the actual world is the ways things were, are or will be. It is a complete history of a world.

Van Inwagen distinguished between Abstractionist and Concretist conceptions of possible worlds (see van Inwagen 1986, 185–6; see also Stalnaker 1986, 121). According to Abstractionists, possible worlds are abstract objects of some sort. Maximal possible states of affairs are one sort of abstract objects that can serve as possible worlds. According to a Concretist conception of possible worlds such as David Lewis's, a possible world is the maximal mereological sum of possible individuals that are spatio-temporally related. Different possible worlds are spatio-temporally isolated (see Lewis 1986, 69–70). The actual world is the world in which we are located.

While the Concretist conception promises a definitional reduction of modal concepts, the Abstractionist presupposes modal concepts. For example, a possible world is a maximal possible state of affairs. The identification of possible worlds with maximal possible state of affairs can therefore not be justified by its ability to explain modal concepts away. The identification of possible worlds with maximal possible states of affairs is also in need of further development and defence.

First, a state of affairs is transient if, and only if, it obtains at one time and not another. For example, the state of affairs of Socrates's not drinking hemlock obtains at some times, but not at others. Transient states of affairs are only possible, actual etc. relative to a time. For example, before 399 BC it was possible that Socrates does not drink hemlock, but this is no longer possible after 399 BC. Pollock (1984, 56–7) added therefore as a further condition to the account of possible worlds that a possible world must be a nontransient state of affairs. A state of affairs is nontransient if, and only, if it is such that necessarily if it obtains at one time it obtains at all times. For example, the state of affairs of Socrates's being hungry on the 15th of April 400 BC at 16.15 is nontransient.

Second, a further problem is connected to the individuation of states of affairs. In the literature one can find two proposals for individuation of states of affairs. (I will discuss both in more detail in section 4.) The first takes the idea that states of affairs are logical complexes seriously. Just like other complexes they can (at least in part) be individuated in terms of their constituents. S1 and S2 can therefore only be the same state of affairs if they have the same constituents. This conception allows for states of affairs that necessarily co-obtain, but differ. For example, necessarily, the state of affairs that triangle A is equilateral obtains if the state of affairs that triangle A is equiangular and vice versa. The second proposal makes no use of the complexity of states of affairs in their individuation and holds that necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs are the same.

If one accepts the first proposal for the individuation of states of affairs, there are for every possible world many maximal nontransient states of affairs. (For the following see Zalta 1993, 393–4.) If the state of affairs P is a possible world, so is P & (Q ∨ ¬Q) for an arbitrarily chosen possible state of affairs Q. P and P & (Q ∨ ¬Q) are necessarily equivalent, but, according to our individuation method, different states of affairs. Hence, there are many different maximal states of affairs that correspond to the same possible world and, in particular, to the actual world.

Zalta (1993) tackles this problem on the basis of his axiomatic theory of abstract objects. According to him, abstract objects like numbers exemplify but also encode properties. For example, 1 encodes the properties that are essential to its identity; to its being the object it is. In contrast, 1 exemplifies, but does not encode, the property of being the number of inhabited planets of the solar system. In this system, situations are those abstract objects that encode state-of-affairs properties such as being such that John's being to the left of Harry. If a situation is the case, the state-of-affairs properties it encodes obtain; the situation makes the encoded state-of-affairs property factual. A situation S is a possible world if, and only if, it is possible that S makes all and only the obtaining states-of-affairs properties factual. On the basis of the axioms of his system Zalta can then show that there is a unique actual world.

If one is unwilling to make a distinction between encoding and exemplifying, but one wants to maintain the identification of possible worlds with maximal possible state of affairs, one either has to accept that necessarily equivalent states of affairs are the same or one must identify possible worlds with sets of necessarily equivalent possible state of affairs. The second option seems to result in a set-theoretic modeling or replacement of possible worlds, not in a conception of possible worlds (see Zalta 1993, 394). I will assess the first option to identify necessarily equivalent state of affairs in section 4.3.

2.4 States of Affairs and Propositional Attitudes

Thoughts can't fulfill the role of states of affairs as the fundamental bearers of modal properties. Can states of affairs be the contents of propositional attitudes? Prima facie, the answer is No. We have already seen that states of affairs are too coarse-grained to be the contents of propositional attitudes. I can believe that Hesperus is a planet, without believing that Phosphorus is a planet (and vice versa). Hence, the contents of the attitudes differ. But the state of affairs of Hesperus's being a planet is just the state of affairs of Phosphorus's being a planet. Propositional attitudes are, at best, mediated relations to states of affairs. For example, a belief represents a state of affairs if, and only if, the believer assents to a thought that describes a state of affairs.

Barcan Marcus has challenged this view. She argued that belief is ‘a relation between a subject or agent and a state of affairs that is not necessarily actual but that has actual objects as its constituents’ (Barcan Marcus 1990, 240). Her object-centered account of belief identifies belief with a differential disposition to a state of affairs:

x believes that S just in case, under certain agent-centered circumstances including x's desires and needs as well as external circumstances, x is disposed to act as if S, that actual or nonactual state of affairs, obtains. (Barcan Marcus 1990, 241)

Believing that so-and-so does not require concept possession. For example, believing that the sun is shining is a differential disposition to the sun's shining, however described or presented.

The object-centered account of belief contrasts with mode-of-presentation-centered or language-centered accounts. The object-centered theory allows us to take belief-ascriptions to non-linguistic creatures to be literally true. However, it runs into problems when it comes to assertoric utterances of sentences containing empty singular terms. According to the object-centred view, these don't express beliefs (see Barcan Marcus 1990, 247). While the state of affairs of a's being F can exist, although a is not F; it cannot exist, if either a or being F doesn't exist. Now take the belief that Napoleon was French. I satisfy all intuitive criteria for the possession of this belief. Imagine that we find out that, after all, there was never such a person as Napoleon. It was all a very elaborate hoax. Then there is no state of affairs composed of Napoleon and being French. Hence, although all intuitive criteria may have told us that I believed that Napoleon was French, we now find out that I never had that belief. This is counter-intuitive and artificial.

To sum up: Thoughts and states of affairs are different things. Thoughts cannot be reduced to states of affairs and the reduction of states of affairs to sets of referentially equivalent thoughts is unwarranted. We need both thoughts and states of affairs in order to fulfil different roles.

3. Facts and States of Affairs

3.1 Facts as Truth-Makers and Regress-Stoppers

In the current literature the term ‘state of affairs’ is often used to refer to facts. (One of Armstrong's books is titled A World of States of Affairs, but the book is solely concerned with facts.) What are facts and how may they be distinguished from states of affairs?

The Truthmaker-Argument is the main argument for the introduction of facts (see Armstrong 1997, 115ff). It also yields an understanding of the main features of facts. The argument can be summed up as follows:

(P1)
Every truth must have a truth-maker.
(P2)
The best candidates to occupy the truth-maker role are facts.
(C)
There are facts.

Armstrong takes (P1) to articulate the following intuitive asymmetry: It is true that Socrates is wise because Socrates is wise; but Socrates is not wise because it is true that Socrates is wise (see Armstrong 2004, 4). In Armstrong's terminology a truth-bearer is true in virtue of (made true by) the existence of another entity, a truth-maker. A truth-maker ensures or guarantees the truth of a truth-bearer. Some authors take this guarantee to be a form of necessitation: x makes it true that p if, and only if, necessarily, if x exists, it is true that p.

This brings us to the second premise of the Truthmaker-Argument. Why are facts the best candidates for the truth-maker role? Let us work through some alternatives. Take the thought that Socrates is wise. The existence of which object necessitates its truth? Socrates can exist without being wise. Hence, Socrates is not the truth-maker we are looking for.

The last point suggests that only a complex entity that ‘contains’ Socrates as well as the property of being wise is a candidate for the truth-maker role. The mereological sum of Socrates and being wise, that is, the whole that is composed exactly of the parts of Socrates and wisdom, satisfies this condition, yet it cannot fulfil the truth-maker role. If Socrates and wisdom exist, their mereological sum exists. Hence, the sum exists whether it is true that Socrates is wise or not. For similar reasons the set that contains only Socrates and being wise cannot be the truth-maker of the thought that Socrates is wise. Armstrong concludes that only the existence of the fact of Socrates' being wise that ‘ties’ Socrates and being wise makes it true that Socrates is wise (see Armstrong 1997, 118).

Armstrong's conception of truthmaking is controversial (see, for instance, Restall 1996). I will set its problems here aside and focus on clarifying the relation between facts and states of affairs. Facts ‘tie’ particulars and universals. This brings them close to states of affairs that also involve particulars and universals. What distinguishes them is that the existence of a fact is supposed to guarantee the truth of a truth-bearer. The existence of the fact of a's being F can only guarantee the truth of the thought that a is F if one cannot distinguish facts into those that obtain and those that do not obtain. This is sometimes expressed by saying that while states of affairs obtain or not and thoughts are true or false, facts simply are (see Ducasse 1940, 709–10). Saying of the fact that Socrates is wise that it obtains is redundant, while it is not redundant to say so of the state of affairs that Socrates is wise.

Facts are also introduced in order to stop a regress of instantiation. Take the particular a and the property of being F and assume that they can exist independently of each other. Given this assumption, there must be a relation that ‘ties’ them together to a's being F. If the required ‘tie’ is a genuine relation, a regress, usually called Bradley's regress, ensues: we need to introduce another relation that ties the first relation to a and being F, and so on. Facts are supposed to prevent Bradley's regress (see Armstrong 1997, 115 and 118, Hossack 2007, 33). How? Relations that tie particulars and properties together are ‘explained away’ in terms of facts that contain particulars and properties: if a instantiates F-ness, it does so because the fact that a is F exists. The existence of this fact guarantees that a is F. Facts are just instantiations of universals by particulars (see Armstrong 1997, 119). Hence, we arrive again at the result that the obtaining/non-obtaining distinction does not apply to facts.

In contrast to facts the obtaining/non-obtaining distinction discriminates states of affairs into those that obtain and those that do not obtain (see section 1). For this reason states of affairs cannot be truthmakers: their existence does not necessitate the truth of a truth-bearer. The state of affairs of Socrates' being foolish exists in some possible worlds in which Socrates is foolish, but it also exists in possible worlds in which Socrates is not foolish. Valicella reinforces this point:

[Facts] are not to be confused with abstract states of affairs which either obtain or do not obtain depending on how the world is. The latter are themselves in need of something in the world that explains why they obtain. (Valicella 2000, 237)

3.2 Are Facts just obtaining States of Affairs?

States of affairs contain particulars and properties; facts tie them. This similarity encourages the question whether a fact is nothing but a state of affairs that obtains (see Horwich 1990, 113 who takes true Russellian propositions to be facts). On this view the reason why it is redundant to say that a fact obtains is that a fact is just an obtaining state of affairs. However, the identification of facts with obtaining states of affairs creates problems for the theory of truthmaking. Assume that the fact that Socrates is wise is just the obtaining state of affairs of Socrates' being wise. The fact is supposed to make it true that Socrates is wise. But if the fact is just the obtaining state of affairs of Socrates' being wise, we need in turn something that explains why the state of affairs obtains. For it seems correct to say ‘The state of affairs of Socrates' being wise obtains because Socrates is wise’, but not ‘Socrates is wise because the state of affairs of Socrates' being wise obtains’. Hence, obtaining states of affairs cannot play the same role as facts. They cannot be truthmakers. The question ‘Why is it true that Socrates is wise?’ cannot be conclusively answered by saying ‘Because Socrates' being wise obtains’. This answer is in need of a further explanation of the same type as the one we were originally after.

3.3 Are States of Affairs just Recombinations of Fact Constituents?

A non-obtaining state of affairs cannot be a fact. But can every state of affairs be a recombination of particulars and properties that are combined in some facts? Combinatorialists answer Yes (see, for example, Skyrms 1981; Armstrong 1989, 45ff; Bigelow 1988; Forbes 1989, 137). This idea has two main varieties:

Fictionalism: Like ideal gases or frictionless surfaces, possible states of affairs are (useful) fictions; only facts exists. Assume that a is not F. There exists no possible state of affairs of a's being F. But there is the fiction of possible states of affairs according to which there is the state of affairs of a's being F if, and only if, a and being F are contained in some facts (see Armstrong 1989, 46 and 49ff and the entry on modal fictionalism for a detailed overview).

Representationalism: there are no possible states of affairs, only representations of possible states of affairs (see Lewis 1986a, 146 who ascribes this view to Skyrms). These representations are set-theoretic constructs that contain as their members particulars and universals that occur in some facts. For example, if a's being F and b's being G are both facts, but the sentence ‘a is G’ is false, there is no state of affairs of a's being G, but there is an ordered-pair that contains a and being G as its members.

Representationalism raises the question: what distinguishes a (possible) state of affairs from a mere representation of it? Why is the state of affairs of a's being G not simply the ordered pair of a and being G? I will come back to this question in section 5.

4. The Composition of a State of Affairs

4.1 Do States of Affairs have Constituents?

We have so far seen that reflections on probability and possibility give us reasons to believe in states of affairs. But it seems to many philosophers that states of affairs are problematic things. One problem stems from the view that states of affairs are logical complexes. It seems intuitively plausible that the state of affairs of Aristotle's being a philosopher involves Aristotle and being a philosopher. Now saying that a state of affairs ‘involves’ particulars and properties only labels the problem under consideration. Some philosophers go on to spell out ‘involvement’ as containment: A state of affairs is a logical complex that contains properties and particulars as parts. This is one aspect in which states of affairs and thoughts are distinct: states of affairs contain objects and properties, while thoughts contain modes of presentation of these things. But in which sense of ‘contain’ do states of affairs contain particulars and properties?

Let us first sharpen our understanding of the part-of relation. Any relation worthy of the name ‘(proper) part-of’ must be reflexive (everything is part of itself), transitive (if x is a part of y and z a part of x, z is a part of y) and antisymmetrical (if x is part of y and y part of x, x is identical to y) (see the article on Mereology, sect. 2 and 3). A further plausible principle for the part-of relation is the supplementation principle: if x is part of y, there is an object z that is part of y and that does overlap, that is, have a part in common, with x. The supplementation principle implies the intuitively plausible view that nothing can have a single proper part. The supplementation principle together with the uncontroversial axioms for the (proper) part-of relation also implies the more controversial thesis that complex objects with the same parts are identical (see Mereology, 3.2).

The transitivity of part-of immediately gives rise to problems. For instance, Frege asked Wittgenstein about states of affairs:

I would like to have an example which illustrates that Vesuvius is a part of a state of affairs. Then it appears that the parts of Vesuvius must also be a part of this fact; the fact will therefore also consist of hardened lava. That does not seem right to me. (Frege 1919, 20; my translation)

If Vesuvius is part of the obtaining state of affairs of Vesuvius's being a volcano, the state of affairs must by the transitivity of part-of contain the parts of hardened lava that are parts of Vesuvius. But if the state of affairs contains the hardened lava as parts, it must have a weight and an extension etc. However, the state of affairs of Vesuvius's being a volcano is not a thing that has weight etc.

There are further problems for the logical-complex view of states of affairs. If the state of affairs of a's being F has only a and being F as its parts (in any plausible sense of ‘part’), it can only exist at a time at which a and being F exist. (The sum of all my body parts exists only at the time when all my body parts exist.) Hence, the state of affairs of a's ceasing to exist before b's starting to exist cannot be a complex containing a and b. For there is no time when its constituents both exist (see Künne 2003, 122).

The principles for the (proper) part-of relation imply that complexes with the same parts are identical. But take the state of affairs that Romeo loves Juliet. If it has Rome, Love and Juliet as its parts, it is the same as the state of affairs that Juliet loves Romeo. But intuitively, the state of affairs of Juliet's loving Romeo is different from the state of affairs of Romeo's loving Juliet. On the standard mereological conception of part, particulars and universals are not parts of states of affairs.

4.2 Non-Mereological Composition to the Rescue?

The last point cuts both ways. Why not say that different complex objects can have the same parts? Armstrong (1997, 118) answered this question positively and argued that facts are a case of non-mereological composition. Lewis has denied that there is room for non-mereological composition (see Lewis 1992, 213; for discussion McDaniel 2009). However, independently of considerations about states of affairs we allow for different wholes that share all their parts. For instance, the sentences ‘John loves Mary’ and ‘Mary loves John’ both consist of the same words ‘John’, ‘Mary’ and ‘loves’, yet they are clearly different sentences.

But our intuitive notion does not allow for wholes without remainder: if something x is part of a whole W, there is a remainder of W that is not identical with x. The remainder principle is implied by the supplementation principle of mereology, but not the other way around (see Mereology sect. 3.2). Hence, we can draw on the remainder principle without endorsing the stronger supplementation principle. Now there seem to be states of affairs that ‘contain’ only one property (Bynoe 2011 argues the following point in detail). The Bradley Regress discussed in sect. 3.1 seems to show that the state of affairs of Socrates' being wise consists only of Socrates and being wise. There is no relation that ties them to a state of affairs. Otherwise the question would arise what relates this relation to Socrates and being wise. Now some properties instantiate themselves: identity is self-identical. Hence, the state of affairs of identity's self-identity obtains. But this state of affairs contains only the property of identity. There seems to be no plausible sense of ‘part’ in which such states of affairs have parts.

4.3 Are States of Affairs Simple?

Some philosophers have proposed to individuate states of affairs in terms of necessary equivalence:

(Same1)
If S1 and S2 are states of affairs, S1 = S2 if, and only if,
necessarily: S1 obtains if, and only if, S2 obtains. (see Chisholm 1976, 118; for discussion see Pollock 1984, 54)

(Same1) leaves open whether states of affairs have constituents or not, while it still allows us to distinguish and refer to them. Given the problems we have encountered in the previous section that seems to be a reason to favour (Same1). Consider for illustration an example. If in ‘a is F’ and ‘b is G’ ‘a’ and ‘b’ refer to the same object, and ‘is F’ and ‘is G’ ascribe the same property, the sentences cannot come apart in truth-value. It is not possible for ‘a is F’ to be true while ‘b is G’ is false (and vice versa). In this situation it is plausible to say that both sentences describe the same state of affairs. But we don't need to say that the state of affairs is built up out of the referents of the words in the sentences. The referents of the sentence parts determine when the state of affairs obtains and the conditions when the state of affairs obtains in turn determine when states of affairs are logically equivalent. (SoA1) allows us to say Hesperus's being a planet and Phosphorus's being a planet are the same state of affairs. However, now many more states of affairs turn out to be the same, for example, Hesperus's being self-identical and Socrates' being self-identical. In short, all states of affairs that necessarily obtain are the same.

The so-called ‘Slingshot Argument’, outlined in the supplement to the entry on facts, takes this problem further (see Neale 2001 for a detailed discussion of the Slingshot Argument or Arguments). One can easily adapt it for states of affairs. The Slingshot Argument derives from the assumption that necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs are identical, together with further prima facie plausible premises, the conclusion that there is only one fact. If facts are individuated in terms of how they are composed out of particulars and universals, necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs can be distinguished. For example, Hesperus's being self-identical and Socrates' being self-identical are distinct states of affairs because they have different constituents. As a result, the Slingshot Argument does not get off the ground. This consequence is an additional reason to hold that states of affairs contain objects and properties (see Johnston 2006, 680).

We are back then to the problem of how to make sense of the relation between a state of affairs and the properties and particulars it ‘involves’. If the state of affairs of a's being F does not contain a and F as parts, how is it related to them? If the state of affairs of a's being F does not contain a and F as parts, how is it distinct from the thought that a is F? In order to answer these questions we need to find a relation between the state of affairs of a's being F and a and being F that (i) does not make a and being F parts of the state of affairs, (ii) allows one distinguish between necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs, and (iii) distinguishes the state of affairs of a's being F from other objects that, intuitively speaking, involve a and being F.

4.4 Are States of Affairs ontologically dependent?

Fine (1982, 51–2) has suggested an answer that invokes the independently motivated idea that the identity of some objects is explained in terms of the identity of other objects (see also Fine 1995 and Bynoe 2011, 99–100). Consider Fine's example of the singleton of 1. The singleton of 1 is the set whose sole member is 1. The singleton of 1 is ontologically dependent on 1 because its identity depends on the identity of 1. We explain what the singleton is by appealing to 1. The converse does not hold. Now the identity of a state of affairs is similarly explained in terms of the identity of other things, namely those which are usually, but misleadingly, said to be its parts or constituents. In Fine's terminology a state of affairs ontologically depends on those particulars and properties to which we refer in explaining its identity. It is generated from particulars and properties by predicating the latter of the former. The state of affairs of a's being F is just the predication of being F to a.

This conception of states of affairs is suggested by features of designators of states of affairs. The singleton of 1 has a canonical designator, ‘{1}’, that displays its ontological fundament, 1, and the set-building operation signified by the operator ‘{ }’. Similarly, states of affairs have canonical designators, the imperfect gerundial nominals like ‘a's being F’, that display the things on which the state of affairs ontologically depends. When one understands such canonical designators one knows upon which objects and properties the designated state of affairs ontologically depends.

If states of affairs are ontologically dependent on particulars and properties, we can satisfy the desiderata (i) to (iii):

(i)
An object can ontologically depend on other objects without being a complex that contains these objects as parts. The axis of the earth ontologically depends on the Earth, but it does not contain the Earth as a constituent. The assumption that the state of affairs of a's being F ontologically depends on a and F can therefore solve the problems that arise for the assumption that it contains a and F. Take for example Frege's intuitive argument against the view that states of affairs contain physical objects like Vesuvius. The state of affairs of Vesuvius's being a volcano ontologically depends on Vesuvius, but it does not contain it as a part. Hence, it does not contain the lava parts that are the parts of Vesuvius. There is no need to ascribe weight etc. to the state of affairs.
Ontological dependence helps us to get around the temporal problems raised by the logical complex view of states of affairs. While a complex cannot exist at a time at which some of its parts don't exist, an object can ontologically depend on objects that no longer exist. (I ontologically depend on a particular event, the fertilization of a particular egg by a particular sperm, although this event is long past.)
(ii)
Fine's proposal suggests that states of affairs are individuated in terms of the objects and relations in virtue of which they exist:
(Same2)
If S1 and S2 are states of affairs, S1 = S2 if, and only if,
S1 and S2 exist in virtue of the same properties predicated of the same particulars.
The notion of predication gives rise to several questions and I will come back to it in the next section. The Finean criterion of identity for states of affairs distinguishes between the necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs of Hesperus's being self-identical and Socrates' being self-identical because they ontologically depend on different things. Hence, they come out as different. In turn, Hesperus's being a planet and Phosphorus's being a planet come out, as it is desirable, as the same state of affairs.
(iii)
If the state of affairs of Hesperus's being a planet ontologically depends on Hesperus, it can only exist if Hesperus exists at some time. In contrast, a thought can exist whether or not the objects it purports to be about ever existed or will exist. The thought that Pegasus is a horse exists, whether there is such a horse or not.

5. The Unity of a State of Affairs

5.1 The Unity-Problem

If one conceives of a state of affairs as logical complex that contains particulars and properties one needs to answer the unity-question ‘What unifies these particulars and properties into one state of affairs?’ Frege put this question to Wittgenstein in the following way:

Is every connection of objects a state of affairs? Is it not also of importance by what means the connection is produced? What is the thing that binds? Can this perhaps be gravitation, as with the system of planets? Is this a state of affairs? (Frege 1919, 20; my translation)

The system of planets consists of the sun and the planets bound to it by gravity. What distinguishes this complex physical object from the state of affairs of the sun's binding the planets by gravity? If the latter contains the sun and the planet and the binding-by gravity relation, the distinction between the states of affairs and solar system must lie in what unites their elements.

The same question arises on a conception that takes states of affairs to be ontologically dependent entities. Take the states of affairs of Aristotle's being wise. It ontologically depends on Aristotle and being wise. So do the ordered pair <Aristotle, being wise> and the mereological sum of Aristotle and being wise. What distinguishes them? If we follow Fine, the answer will invoke an operation or relation that ‘generates’ the entities in question. What is this operation?

Russell argued that there is no plausible answer to the unity-question for states of affairs (he called them ‘propositions’). He explains his main worry about states of affairs as follows:

Our disbelief in their [propositions] reality may be reinforced by asking ourselves what kind of entity a false proposition could be. Let us take some very simple false proposition, say “A precedes B,” when in fact A comes after B. It seems as though nothing were involved here beyond A and B and “preceding” and the general form of dual complexes. But since A does not precede B, these objects are not put together in the way indicated in the proposition. It seems, therefore, that nothing which is actually composed of these objects is the proposition; and it is not credible that anything further enters the proposition. (Russell 1913, 109–10; for a detailed discussion of this argument see Wetzel 1998)

What unifies A, B and the relation of Preceding to the fact that A precedes B? A's actually preceding B. What unifies A, B and the relation of Preceding to the state of affairs of A's preceding B? If A does not precede B, the unity of the state of affairs cannot consist in A being actually related by precession to B.

So far Russell has only shown that the unity of a state of affairs of A's standing in R to B does not consist in A's standing in R to B. In addition, he has imposed a constraint on answers to the unity-question. He says that it is not credible that there is a unifying element that is not a constituent of the state of affairs. Russell himself couldn't find an answer to the unity-question which met his constraint. Hence, he tried to make do without propositions:

Time was when I thought there were propositions, but it does not seem to me very plausible to say that in addition to facts there are also these curious shadowy things going about such as “That today is Wednesday” when in fact it is Tuesday. (Russell 1918, 223)

5.2 External Unification

While Russell does not refute the view that there are states of affairs, he asks philosophers who believe in them a difficult question. To see the force of the constraint he imposes on answers to the unity-question consider a proposal that violates it. External theories develop the following general idea (I take the ‘external/internal’ terminology from Valicella 2000):

The state of affairs of a's being F exists if, and only if,
There is something distinct from a, being F and a's being F & it unifies a and being F to a's being F.

Roughly speaking, the external unifier can bring the constituents of states of affairs together even if they don't constitute a fact. A psychological version of the External Theory is proposed in Valicella 2000. According to him, the external ground of unity is the judging consciousness that brings about the unity of the state of affairs (Valicella 2000, 252).

Russell, in turn, argued that a mental act cannot unify some things to form a state of affairs:

Suppose we wish to understand “A and B are similar”. It is essential that our thought should, as is said, “unite” or “synthesize” the two terms and the relation; but we cannot actually “unite” them, since either A and B are similar, in which case they are already united, or they are dissimilar, in which case no amount of thinking can force them to be united. (Russell 1913, 116)

Any mental activity seems unable to create unity where none obtains already. If I think of a and being F, why should a new complex object consisting of them come into existence? Russell himself goes on to suppose that the mind is able to unite A, B and similarity with a logical form. How the mind can have that ability goes unexplained.

The linguistic version of the External Theory takes states of affairs to be descripta of sentences that owe their unity to the sentences that describe them:

The state of affairs of a's being F exists if, and only if, there is a sentence of a language L (or an extension of L) that concatenates a singular term referring to a and a general term referring to F. (see Taylor 1985, 29ff, King 2009, 263)

The linguistic version gives up on the view that states of affairs are language independent (see King 2009, 259 who concedes this). There is nothing in our intuitive notion of states of affairs that justifies the assumption that states of affairs depend for their unity on the existence of a language in which they are described. For example, there will be a space of probable outcomes of an event whether there are descriptions of them or not.

The criticism of the External Theory makes Russell's constraint on an answer to the unity-question plausible. States of affairs are conceived of as a sui generis kind of entity that do not owe their unity and hence its identity to anything else.

5.2 Internal Unification

This brings us to Internal Theories that explain the unity of a state of affairs merely by appealing to its constituents.

The state of affairs of a's being F exists if, and only if,
a or being F or both unify the state of affairs.

Ramsey describes (but does not endorse) the core of this view when he says:

[I]n every atomic fact there must be one constituent which is in its own nature incomplete or connective and, as it were, holds the other constituents together. (Ramsey 1925, 408)

For Wittgenstein in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus there is no designated connector in a state of affairs. All constituents are connected with all others:

In states of affairs objects hang in one another like links in a chain. (Wittgenstein 1921, 2.03)

So far we have only been given a necessary condition for the existence of a state of affairs. Among the things that enter into a state of affairs there must be at least one that need(s) to be incomplete or connective. Wittgenstein will require incompleteness or connectivity of all things that enter a state of affairs.

The notion of incompleteness at work here is difficult to explain. But one way to develop it is to propose that the incomplete and connecting elements are functions. For example, the property being F is conceived of as a function that takes a particular a as argument and maps it to the state of affairs of a's being F (see Oliver 1992, 91). The problems of the functional model of states of affairs are manifest in the development of Frege's work. Frege 1879 held that sentences stand for what he called ‘judgeable contents’, complexes composed of functions and objects. For Frege predication is the application of a function to an object. Judgeable contents seem to be nothing other than states of affairs. However, the idea that states of affairs are complex does not sit happily with Frege's further idea that the judgeable content of a's being F is the value of the function F for a as argument.

Different functions can have the same value for different arguments. For example, 3 is the value of the function Square root of x for 9 and the value of the function x+1 for 2. Which of these arguments and functions is contained in the value 3? Since there is no principle that singles out one argument and function as constituting the value, we should abandon either the functional model of incompleteness or the idea that states of affairs have constituents. Later Frege took the second option:

The references of the parts of a sentence are not parts of the reference of the sentence. (Frege 1910–14, 87)

Since different functions can have the same value for different arguments, Frege arrived at the view that a sentence that is either true or false refers to its truth-value, the True or the False. Every true (false) sentence has the same referent: the True (the False). States of affairs have no place in the Fregean theory of reference. The ‘case study’ of Frege shows that the functional model of incompleteness undermines the very idea that states of affairs are complexes (for a reply to this argument see Gaskin 2008, 100).

The strategy to explain the unity of a state of affairs by using the notion of incompleteness either only labels the problem or, if incomplete elements are taken to be functions, threatens the very idea of states of affairs. Can one dispense with the notion of incompleteness in an answer to the unity-question? In section 4 a further view of the unity of states of affairs emerged:

The state of affairs of a's being F exists if, and only if, being F is predicated of a (see Fine 1982, 53; Johnston 2006, 683f).

This thesis seems to follow from a stronger one:

The state of affairs of a's being F exists in virtue of the predication of being F to a.

Now saying that something is predicated of something else sounds as if the existence of a state of affairs depends on performing an act. But this is a misunderstanding. Johnston explains:

[P]redicability guarantees predication. Whenever F-ness is predicable of a, there will be something that is the predication of F-ness to a. (Johnston 2006, 684)

All the interesting work is done by the notion of predicability:

The state of affairs of a's being F exists if, and only if, being F is predicable of a.

When a property (relation) is predicable of some objects will be determined by a number of principles (or axioms) (Johnston 2006, 685). For example, particulars are not predicable of other particulars, n-place properties are only predicable of n particulars. It is part of the nature of the objects and properties on which a state of affairs ontologically depends that the properties are predicable of the objects. This brings to a key thought of Wittgenstein's theory of states of affairs:

2.0123
If I know an object I also know all its possible occurrences in states of affairs. (Every one of these possibilities must be part of the nature of the object.)
2.0214
If all objects are given, then at the same time all possible states of affairs are also given.

The nature of particulars and properties determines whether the second are predicable of the first or not. If the property being F is predicable of the object a, the state of affairs of a's being F exists. Hence, states of affairs exist in virtue of the nature objects and properties. No unifying relation or operation in addition to a and being F is required. What distinguishes states of affairs from other entities which ontologically depend on the same properties and particulars is that states of affairs exist because the properties are predicable of the particulars.

This account assumes that if being F is predicable of a, there is a state of affairs that ontologically depends on them. This assumption is controversial. Whenever there is the possibility to collect things into a set via a consistent comprehension principle, we take there to be a set of those things that satisfy the comprehension principle. But we don't want to say that whenever x is perceivable, it is perceived etc. What makes fitting like the first and unlike the second case?

6. Conclusion

Does one need state of affairs in addition to facts and thoughts? Yes, there seem to be good reasons to posit state of affairs as a sui generis category of object. If states of affairs shall be useful (i) they must exist even if they do not obtain and (ii) must involve objects and properties (relations) directly. (i) is the basic feature that distinguished states of affairs from facts; (ii) is the basic feature that distinguished them from thoughts. Therefore a theory of states of affairs must answer the question how a state of affairs can be directly about objects and properties (relations) and combine them, if the objects don't exemplify the properties (stand in the relations). Although there are promising proposals to answer it, this question is still open.

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Other Internet Resources

Acknowledgments

I want to thank Will Bynoe, Chris Hughes, Fabrice Correia, Keith Hossack, Nick Jones, Jessica Leech, Dolf Rami and two anonymous referees for discussion and comments. I am especially grateful to the second referee for constructive feedback.

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Mark Textor <mark.textor@kcl.ac.uk>

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