Karl Leonhard Reinhold

First published Wed Apr 30, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jan 16, 2014

Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757–1823), Austrian philosopher and first occupant of the chair on Critical Philosophy established at the University of Jena in 1787, first achieved fame as a proponent of popular Enlightenment and as an early and effective popularizer of the Kantian philosophy. During his period at the University of Jena (1787–94), Reinhold proclaimed the need for a more “scientific” and systematic presentation of the Critical philosophy, one based upon a single, self-evident first principle. In an effort to satisfy this need, he expounded his own “Elementary Philosophy” in a series of influential works between 1789 and 1791. Though Reinhold's Elementary Philosophy was much criticized, his call for a more coherent and systematic exposition of transcendental idealism exercised a profound influence upon the subsequent development of post-Kantian idealism and spurred others (such as J. G. Fichte) to seek a philosophical first principle even more “fundamental” than Reinhold's own “Principle of Consciousness.” After moving to the University of Kiel, Reinhold became an adherent, first of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre and then of C. G. Bardili's “rational realism,” before finally proposing a novel “linguistic” approach to philosophical problems.

1. Reinhold's Life and Work

Karl Leonhard Reinhold was born in Vienna October 26, 1757 (though many older sources erroneously give 1758 as his year of his birth). He studied at the Jesuit Seminary in Vienna for a year, until the order was suppressed in 1773, at which time he entered the Barnabite seminary. Following his ordination, he became a Barnabite monk and served for several years as a parish priest and teacher of philosophy. Reinhold's first publications were book reviews and short essays in popular newspapers, in which he showed himself to be a zealous advocate of Josephite reforms and an enthusiastic exponent of radical Enlightenment and religious toleration.

In 1783 Reinhold moved to Leipzig and converted to Protestantism. He also became a Freemason and a member of the Illuminati, and he remained an active Freemason until the end of his life. Possessed of a restless, inquiring spirit, Reinhold's early intellectual trajectory led him from orthodox Catholicism, to reformed Catholicism, to materialism and atheism, and then to Leibnizianism and to Humean skepticism. Yet he always remained true to the ideal of “Enlightenment,” at least as he understood that ideal, and he never ceased to insist that philosophy ought to make a practical difference in the world. For all of his forays into the most technical and arcane philosophical debates and issues, he never wavered in his insistence that true “popularity” must remain the goal of philosophy, and that the ultimate test of any system is its capacity for convincing everyone of its truth. Enlightenment, for Reinhold, was no abstract pursuit of truth, but a program of religious, moral, social, and political reform. Coupled with this commitment to popularity, was a pedagogic zeal to do everything in his power to spread the message of popular Enlightenment—whether in its materialist, its neo-Leibnizian, its skeptical, its Kantian, its Fichtean, its Bardilian, or its distinctively “Reinholdian” form—as widely and as effectively as possible.

In 1784, after studying philosophy for a semester in Leipzig, Reinhold moved to Weimar, where he became a confidant (and son-in-law) of C. M. Wieland and a regular contributor to Wieland's widely read Der Teutsche Merkur. It was in this journal that his famous series of “Letters on the Kantian Philosophy” began to appear in 1786. It is with these “Letters,” which were subsequently published in revised and expanded form in two volumes, that Reinhold's name enters the history of philosophy. What Reinhold found in Kant is clearly expressed in the first of his many private letters to the latter: namely, a way to resolve the debilitating conflict between faith and reason, “superstition” and “disbelief,” “heart” and “head.” And this is precisely the aspect of the new, Critical philosophy that is emphasized in his Letters on the Kantian Philosophy: not Kant's radical new account of space and time, nor his audacious effort to provide a transcendental deduction of the pure categories of the understanding, but rather the conclusions and implications of the “transcendental dialectic.”

Kantianism was recommended by Reinhold, above all, for its allegedly salubrious and enlightened practical consequences, particular with respect to religion and morality. It was not for nothing that Reinhold described this new philosophy to readers of Die Teutscher Merkur as “the gospel of pure reason.” Rational belief in God, in the immortality of the soul, in the reality of free will: such are the articles of this new “gospel”—a gospel promulgated, everyone agreed, far more effectively and popularly by Reinhold than by Kant himself. Even Kant professed to be charmed by Reinhold's effort and gratified by his success.

On the strength of his newfound fame as author of the Letters, Reinhold was invited to be the inaugural occupant of the first professorial chair devoted exclusively to the new Kantian philosophy, and thus he began lecturing at the University of Jena in 1787. First at Jena, and then later at the University of Kiel, Reinhold proved to be an immensely popular and influential teacher, much beloved by his students. (Of the approximately 860 students enrolled in Jena in the Spring Semester of 1794, 600 were enrolled in Reinhold's three lecture courses.) Indeed, Reinhold was largely responsible for making Jena the center of German philosophy, which it remained for the next several decades.

In his published Letters on the Kantian Philosophy Reinhold had excused himself from the task of presenting and examining the theoretical foundations of Kant's Critical philosophy, in order to concentrate instead upon the practical consequences of the same. But once he arrived at Jena he set himself to the former task, the surprising result of which was not so much the popularization of another aspect of Kant's thought as a first, historically momentous effort to revise and recast the theoretical foundations of the new transcendental idealism in a new, allegedly more coherent and systematic form. The fruit of this revisionist effort was Reinhold's own “Elementary Philosophy” (see below), which, though only a passing phase in Reinhold's own development as a philosopher, remains his most substantial and effective contribution to the historical development of German Idealism.

Reinhold's Elementary Philosophy is most fully expounded in three works he published in rapid succession during his tenure at the University of Jena: Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögens [Attempt a New Theory of the Human Power of Representation] (1789), Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Erster Band [Contributions toward Correcting the Previous Misunderstandings of Philosophers, Vol. I] (1790), and Ueber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens [On the Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge] (1791).

Reinhold's radical revision and implicit critique of orthodox Kantianism exercised an immediate and immense influence upon his contemporaries, and particularly upon the philosopher who followed him at Jena in 1794, namely Johann Gottlieb Fichte. But though Fichte was thoroughly convinced by Reinhold's arguments for the incompleteness of Kant's own presentation of the Critical philosophy and by his demand for an immediately certain “first principle” of the same, he was not satisfied with Reinhold's own efforts to satisfy these demands and, in the Aenesidemus review and elsewhere, made public his own criticisms of the Elementary Philosophy and of Reinhold's “Principle of Consciousness.” For a few years following Fichte's arrival in Jena and Reinhold's transfer to Kiel, the two men engaged in a wide-ranging and stimulating philosophical correspondence, though they never met.

The final upshot of Reinhold's Auseinandersetzung with Fichte was the former's recantation of his own Elementary Philosophy and transference of his allegiance to the standpoint of Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre. This conversion was made public in early 1798, in a lengthy review essay in the Allgemeine Literatur-Zeitung of Fichte's recent writings, and it was elaborated the following year in Reinhold's Ueber die Paradoxien der neuesten Philosophie [Concerning the Paradoxes of the most recent Philosophy], in which he explicitly acknowledged the inadequacy of his own Principle of Consciousness as the foundation of philosophy as a whole and endorsed Fichte's proposal for a more “active” first principle (the Tathandlung, or “fact-act” of the I's self-positing), which would be capable of fully integrating theoretical with practical reason, as well as uniting theoretical and practical philosophy.

As his contribution to the Atheism Controversy of 1798/99, which led to Fichte's departure from Jena, Reinhold published a pamphlet in Fichte's defense. However, it was not long before he grew dissatisfied with what he perceived to be the “one-sidedness” of Fichte's philosophy—and indeed, of transcendental idealism as a whole—and publicly sought some “third way,” which could reconcile the opposing positions of Fichte and Jacobi (whose contribution to the Atheism Controversy was an influential “Open letter,” criticizing philosophy in general and Fichte's transcendental idealism in particular as “nihilism.”) This effort on Reinhold's part to mediate the differences between the transcendental idealist “philosopher of freedom” (Fichte) and the common-sense “non-philosopher of faith” (Jacobi) pleased neither party, and signaled the quick and abrupt end of Reinhold's short-lived “Fichte phase.”

After resolutely turning his back on the new post-Kantian idealist philosophy that he himself had done so much to instigate, Reinhold now presented himself to the public, in the six issues of his own Beyträge zur leichtern Uebersicht des Zustandes der Philosophie beym Anfange des 19. Jahrhunderts [Contributions to an Easier Overview of the State of Philosophy at the Beginning of the Nineteenth Century] (1801–1803), as a partisan of the “logical realism” of C. G. Bardili, which was an effort to base philosophy upon pure logic and upon an appeal to what Bardili called “thinking qua thinking.” It was this effort on Reinhold's part, in the first issue of the Beyträge, “to reduce philosophy to logic” that drew the sarcastic ire of Hegel in his notorious appendix to his Differenz des Fichte'schen und Schelling'schen Systems der Philosophie [Difference between the Fichtean and Schellingian System of Philosophy] (1801)

Soon enough, however, Reinhold became dissatisfied with Bardili's position as well, and began publicly to criticize the same “from the standpoint of language” and to reject all efforts to ground philosophy in pure formal logic. Reinhold's final project as a philosopher can be described as a pioneering effort to take seriously the implications of ordinary language for philosophy itself and to insist upon the intimate relationship between speaking and thinking. These writings of Reinhold's final years went nearly unnoticed during his own lifetime and have generally remained unknown until the present day; yet they would appear to merit the attention of contemporary philosophers and scholars, inasmuch as they anticipate in certain ways the “linguistic turn” of so much subsequent philosophy

After a lifetime of philosophical inquiry, during which he influenced countless readers and students, while himself moving restlessly from one theoretical standpoint to another, Reinhold died in Kiel in 1823.

2. The “Elementary Philosophy”

No sooner did he begin lecturing on the first Critique than Reinhold began to have serious doubts about the completeness of Kant's philosophy, the soundness of its theoretical foundations, and the adequacy of Kant's own arguments and deductions. With remarkable alacrity and considerable ingenuity, he took it upon himself to remedy these perceived defects in Kant's own presentation and to construct his own, allegedly more systematic, well-grounded, and “universally acceptable” version of the new Critical philosophy.

Though Reinhold sometimes referred to his new system simply as “philosophy without a nickname,” it soon became known by another name that he used for it, namely: “Elementary Philosophy” or “Philosophy of the Elements” [Elementarphilosophie]. After introducing his new philosophical ideas in his own lectures, Reinhold began laying them before the public in a series of essays in popular and professional journals, essays which were then revised and expanded as chapters of the three books which together constitute his “official” exposition of the Elementary Philosophy: Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögens (1789), Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Erster Band (1790), and Ueber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens (1791).

Reinhold introduced his presentation of the Elementary Philosophy with the following “metaphilosophical” questions: How is philosophy possible as a strict science, and what is the distinguishing feature of such a science? Following Kant, as well as the entire rationalist tradition, Reinhold maintained that the essence of science lies in universality and necessity. But these are properties of thought, not of sensation or intuition. Only through thinking and judging can we recognize universality and necessity, a recognition that is, in turn, formulated and expressed in concepts and propositions. The business of philosophy is therefore to establish “universally valid” [allgemeingültig] propositions in a manner that allows their necessity and universality to be universally recognized as binding upon everyone [allgemeingeltend]. This last requirement reveals the intimate link between Reinhold's earlier efforts at “popularizing” the Kantian philosophy and his subsequent efforts to expand and to ground this same system. One of the constant hallmarks of Reinhold's philosophical efforts was his conviction that a genuinely scientific philosophy must be capable of being understood and recognized as true by everyone.

What makes philosophy “scientific,” according to Reinhold, is not simply that it consists of propositions arrived at by thinking, but rather, the logical connection between the propositions in question—that is, their systematic form. Over and over again, in one forum after another, Reinhold trumpeted the same declaration: scientific philosophy is systematic philosophy. Accordingly, he embarked upon an influential analysis of systematic form as such, in order to gain insight into how Kantianism could be made rigorously systematic and therefore genuinely “scientific.”

The fundamental hallmarks of systematic form, according to Reinhold, are consistency and completeness, but it was the former of these that attracted most of Reinhold's attention. The only way to be sure that any two propositions are truly consistent with one another—and hence, the only way to determine whether a number of philosophical propositions actually constitute a “system”—is to show that they can all be traced back to the same first principle or foundation [Grundsatz]. And the only way to show that they can indeed be “traced back” to such a first principle is by actually “deriving” them therefrom. (Despite his efforts to clarify this point, Reinhold's conception of philosophical “derivation”—which is apparently not to be understood as simple logical deduction—nevertheless remains extraordinarily murky.)

It follows that a philosophical system must begin with a single first principle, which “determines” all the other propositions of the system. (Here again, there is a certain obscurity in Reinhold's claim, inasmuch as he insisted that the first principle “determines” only the “form” and not the “content” of all the other, subordinate propositions, yet he also described the relationship between the first principle and the subordinate principles as a “syllogism,” in which the latter are “derived” from the former.) Only if propositions are logically related to one another in this manner can they constitute a “system.” A system with two or more “first principles” is not a system at all, but several different systems. As for the completeness problem, Reinhold's implicit solution seems to have been to seek an a priori first principle that could be known in advance to encompass the entire domain of experience, and hence of philosophy.

What, however, can one say about the truth (or, as Reinhold was more likely to say, the “validity” [Gültigkeit]) of the proposed first principle itself? If the validity of a philosophical proposition is determined by its systematic, logical connection to other propositions, then what determines the truth of the first principle, from which the system as a whole is generated or derived? The answer, Reinhold thought, is obvious: the first principle and systematic starting point of philosophy must be self-evident. It must be immediately certain.

Despite reservations concerning the capacity of the first principle to determine the content, as opposed to the form, of the propositions derived from it, Reinhold unequivocally maintained that the first principle of all philosophy had to be a material (or synthetic) as well as a formal (or analytic) principle. Otherwise, “scientific philosophy” would be identical to formal logic and would have no content of its own, which Reinhold (at this point anyway) staunchly denied. Moreover, according to Reinhold, the establishment of such a universally valid and immediately certain first principle is not merely a pressing requirement of theoretical reason, but also a matter of the utmost practical urgency, inasmuch as in the absence of such a foundational first principle “philosophy itself is impossible as a science, in which case the basis for our ethical duties and rights — as well as those duties and rights themselves—must remain forever undecided” (Beyträge I, p. 367).

Granted, then, that a system of philosophy must begin with a single, immediately certain, synthetic first proposition or “grounding principle”: where might one turn in order to discover and to recognize the first principle in question, a proposition that alone can serve as the foundation or “ground” of all other philosophical propositions and cannot itself be established by any argument? The answer is, we must turn within—to the consideration of consciousness itself. This, Reinhold maintained, is precisely what Kant (not to mention Descartes) had done, albeit he did not succeed in presenting the fruits of his inquiries in an adequately scientific and systematic form.

What then is the “first principle” of the Elementary Philosophy? It is the “Principle of Consciousness,” namely, the proposition that “in consciousness, the subject distinguishes the representation from the subject and the object and relates the representation to both” (Beyträge I, p. 167). In this proposition, the term “representation” [Vorstellung] designates whatever we are directly conscious of whenever we are conscious of anything whatsoever; the term “subject” designates the one who “is conscious” of whatever one is conscious of (the “conscious subject” or “subject of consciousness”); and the term “object” designates that “of which” the representation is a representation (the intentional object of consciousness, that to which the representation “refers”).

Though “self-evident” and “universally valid,” the proposition asserting this tripartite character of consciousness is, according to Reinhold, not analytic but synthetic. The Principle of Consciousness is not a tautology, yet anyone who reflects upon what is asserted by this principle will immediately recognize its truth and universal validity, inasmuch as it expresses what Reinhold called a “universally recognized fact of consciousness.”

Self-evidence alone, however, is not enough. One of the chief merits of the Principle of Consciousness, according to Reinhold, is that from it one can then derive the starting point of Kant's own philosophy, which appears to begin with a sheer, ungrounded assumption of the distinction between intuiting and thinking, the difference between theoretical and practical reason, etc. From this point, Reinhold assures us, one can then proceed to the derivation of a complete system of philosophy as a whole, as envisioned but never actually accomplished by Kant himself. (One must recall that Reinhold's work on Elementary Philosophy preceded Kant's third Critique.)

With the Principle of Consciousness Reinhold believed he had uncovered that “common root” of thought and sensibility, which Kant had declared to be unknowable. By commencing his analysis at the level of “representations as such,” Reinhold was convinced that he had, so to speak, hit philosophical rock bottom, inasmuch as all consciousness is self-evidently “representational” in character. (Fichte, however, in his Aenesidemus review and his early writings on the Wissenschaftslehre, would subsequently challenge precisely this claim.) Thus, Reinhold's “Theory of Representation” (which is the first section of the Elementary Philosophy) purports to provide Kant's Critical philosophy with the very foundation it so sorely lacks. And the Principle of Consciousness is, in turn, the foundational or first principle of this new Theory of Representation — and hence the first principle of philosophy as a whole.

By far the most original and influential portion of the Elementary Philosophy is its first part, the Theory of Representation, which is devoted entirely to an analysis of our fundamental spiritual power — the power of representation itself [Vorstellungsvermögen]—in an effort to determine “everything that can be known a priori concerning the representations of sensibility, understanding, and reason.” This foundational portion of the Elementary Philosophy thus purports to provide a thorough and complete analysis of the necessary features of representation qua representation, an analysis that claims to show “that space, time, the twelve categories, and the three forms of the ideas are originally nothing but properties of mere representations” (Fundament, pp. 72–73). This same analysis of our power of representation also claims to establish the distinction between the form and content of representations, the necessity of both receptivity and spontaneity on the part of the power of representation, the necessary multiplicity of sensations, and the unknowability of things in themselves.

If Reinhold displays considerable originality and ingenuity in deriving the above mentioned results from his first principle (the Principle of Consciousness), the same cannot be said of the subsequent section of the Elementary Philosophy, the “Theory of the Power of Cognition,” which follows Kant's own exposition much more closely than the Theory of the Power of Representation and becomes increasingly schematic—and less convincing—as it advances. (Reinhold's sole attempt at complete exposition of his “Theory of the Power of Cognition” is roughly sketched in Book 3 of the Versuch, whereas the “Theory of the Power of Representation” is treated in elaborate detail in all three of his book-length presentations of the Elementary Philosophy.)

One may recall that Reinhold's intention was to provide a new foundation not merely for the “theoretical philosophy” expounded by Kant in the first Critique, but for the Critical philosophy as a whole, including Kant's practical philosophy. In fact, however, Reinhold provided his readers with only the barest hints of how his Elementary Philosophy might embrace Kant's account of will and of practical reason. Significantly, this occurs in the final, 19 page section of his “Theory of the Power of Cognition,” entitled “Theory of the Power of Desire,” in which Reinhold limits himself to what he himself describes as the mere “outline” of a strategy for demonstrating the unity of theoretical and practical reason: if willing is the condition for the possibility of actual, as opposed to merely possible representation and cognition, then the “power of desire” conditions the powers of cognition and representation.

Unfortunately, Reinhold never fleshed out this fascinating outline, never provided any arguments for the same, and never indicated how this provocative claim concerning the relation of willing to knowing could be reconciled with the “immediate certainties” of his starting point. And this was precisely what provoked his most brilliant and critical reader, J. G. Fichte to attempt his own version of an Elementary Philosophy—a version that would begin with the unity of the theoretical and the practical and that would, with the act of “positing” or Setzen, claim to have discovered a starting point even more “basic” than that of mere “representation.” (It is significant that Fichte's unpublished notebook of 1793/94, in which he first sketched what would subsequently be known as the Wissenschaftslehre or “Theory of Scientific Knowledge,” was titled “Private Meditations on Elementary Philosophy/Practical Philosophy.”)

It would be difficult to exaggerate the influence of Reinhold's inquiries into systematicity and first principles upon an entire generation of philosophers. Though some recent research on Reinhold and the “Jena circle” of the late 1780s has stressed the degree to which Reinhold himself soon came to have doubts about the project of “philosophy from a single principle” (see the work of Dieter Henrich and his students, such as Marcello Stamm), this project was nevertheless enthusiastically embraced by Fichte and the young Schelling, and inspired others, notably Hegel, to re-examine (and to question) the alleged connection between systematic form and self-evident first principles. Reinhold's subsequent reservations about his own Elementary Philosophy notwithstanding, the Elementary Philosophy remains one of the clearest examples of a thoroughgoing “foundationalist” project in the history of European philosophy.

3. Reception of Reinhold's Philosophy

During Reinhold's own lifetime, or at least during certain phases of the same, he was among the more influential philosophers in Germany — first as an immensely successful popularizer of the Kantian revolution and then, with his effort to construct an Elementary Philosophy, as one of the founders of “post-Kantian idealism.” This, however, nearly exhausts his positive influence upon his contemporaries.

Following the heyday of German idealism, Reinhold's name has generally been relegated to the history of philosophy, within which he is assigned the role of serving as a small, but not insignificant rung on the alleged ladder “from Kant to Hegel,” and this is precisely how he is still treated in most general histories of philosophy (as well as in this entry). In this context, Reinhold is usually credited with (or blamed for) putting the issues of systematic form and “philosophical foundations” at the center of philosophical concern. Even those, such as Fichte, who roundly criticized the details of his Elementary Philosophy professed sincere admiration for Reinhold's “systematic spirit.” And many of those who rejected his contention that the Principle of Consciousness could serve as the first principle of a philosophy as a whole, nevertheless praised him as the philosopher who first recognized the need for some such principle and first sought to provide Kantianism with a solid “foundation.” In both of these respects, Reinhold served as an important catalyst or stimulus for further philosophical developments.

Given this situation, it his hardly surprising that—with a few minor exceptions—the only works of Reinhold familiar even to most scholars, as well as the only writings by him to be reissued after his lifetime, were the Letters on the Kantian Philosophy and the three, above-mentioned volumes in which he expounded his Elementary Philosophy. This, however, is unfortunate, inasmuch as these texts represent only a small fraction of Reinhold's literary output and do not include some of his most original ideas, projects, and literary productions, such as his final writings on philosophy and language and his pioneering, lifelong efforts to get philosophers to take seriously the history of their own discipline and to understand the “history of philosophy” philosophically.

This situation has recently begun to change, however. A critical edition of Reinhold's voluminous and important philosophical correspondence was inaugurated in 1983 (though only one of the projected ten volumes has appeared to date), and plans are currently afoot for an edition—the first ever—of Reinhold's complete works. Newly edited editions of some of Reinhold's major works have also begun to appear, most notably the two volumes of his Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, edited by Alessandro Lazzari and issued in the “Philosophische Bibliothek” series published by Felix Meiner.

For many years, the serious secondary literary on Reinhold was very sparse and was dominated by Alfred Klimmt's monograph (see below). Recent years, however, have seen a spate of new articles and monographs devoted to Reinhold, the most significant of which are the works by Wolfgang Schrader and the recent, groundbreaking book by Martin Bondeli. Also worth mentioning is Alexander von Schönborn's annotated bibliography of Reinhold's writings, a fine example of scholarly detective work and an essential tool for further research. In conjunction with and as part of the renaissance of Fichte studies over the past four decades, there have been numerous efforts to reexamine the relationship between Reinhold and Fichte, and, in particular, to reassess the precise debt of the Wissenschaftslehre to the Elementary Philosophy. Accordingly, the scholarly literature on Fichte includes numerous studies of this aspect of Reinhold's achievement.

Even more recently and for the first time ever, Reinhold's ideas have begun to be expounded, criticized, and debated among Anglophone scholars and philosophers, including Karl Ameriks, Frederick C. Beiser, Daniel Breazeale, Paul Franks, and Alexander von Schönborn. A recent annual meeting of the Eastern Division of the American Philosophical Association featured a session devoted almost entirely to a debate (between Ameriks and Breazeale) over Reinhold's actual contribution to post-Kantian philosophy and the merits of his position. Such a debate would have been unimaginable even a few decades ago.

Appreciation and discussion of Reinhold among Anglophone readers is, however, not likely to spread very widely until more of Reinhold's writings have become available in English. Until very recently the English reader had to make do with incomplete translations of two works by Reinhold: one, by George di Giovanni, of excerpts from the Fundament and another, by Sabine Rohr, of portions of the Verhandlung über die Grundbegriffe und Grundsätze der Moralität aus dem Gesichtspunke des gemeinen und gesunden Verstandes. In 2005 a fine translation of the first series of Reinhold's “Letters on the Kantian Philosophy,” translated by James Hebbeler and edited by Karl Ameriks, was published as the series of “Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy.” However, the rest of Reinhold's philosophical writings still await English translation.

In 1998 Reinhold's philosophy was the subject of an international academic conference—the first such conference ever to be devoted to Reinhold—in Bad Homburg, Germany. The second international Reinhold conference was held in Luzern, Switzerland in 2002; the third, in Rome, Italy in 2004; the fourth in Montreal, Canada in 2007, and the fifth in Siegen, Germany. (The proceedings of all five of these conferences have now been published.) The level of scholarship and philosophical acumen on display at these two events was very high and augurs well for the future. Indeed, one could argue that the future of Reinhold Studies is brighter today than at any time since Reinhold's death.

Bibliography

Reinhold's Works in German and English in Chronological Order

(Note that almost all of Reinhold's books consist of revised versions of material that originally appeared in the form of journal articles. For a complete listing of all of Reinhold's writings, see the bibliography by Alexander von Schönborn.) Recently, a new “commentated edition” of Reinhold's Complete Works has begun to be pbulished by the Basel publisher, Schwabe Verlag, under the gernal editorship of Martin Bondeli: Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Gesammetle Schriften. Kommentierte Ausgabe.

  • Schriften zur Religionskritik und Aufklärung, 1782–1784, ed. Zwi Batscha (Bremen: Jacobi-Verlag, 1977).
  • Briefe über die Kantische Philosophie[Erster Band] (1790). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Band 2/1, 2007. (Both volumes reprinted in a single volume, ed. Raymund Schmidt [Leipzig: Reclam, 1921]. English translation of the first eight letters in the versions originally published in Der Teutsche Merkur, supplemented by “the major additions in the 1790 edition,” in Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, trans. James Hebbeler, ed. Karl Ameriks. [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005].)
  • Versuch einer neuen Theorie des menschlichen Vorstellungsvermögens (1789; 2nd ed. 1795). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 1, 2013. (New, two-volume ed., edited and with an introduction by Ernst-Otto Onnash [Hamburg: Meiner/Philosophische Bibliotek nos. 500 a and 599b, 2010 and 2012].)(Photomechanical reprint ed. Darmstadt: Wissenschaftliche Buchgesellschaft, 1963.) Translation Essay on a new Theory of the Human Capacity for Representation, trans. Tim Mehigan and Barry Empson (Berlin: de Gruyter, 2013).
  • Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Erster Band (1790). (New, two-volume edition, edited and with an introduction by Faustino Fabbianell. [Hamburg: Meiner/Philosophische Bibliothek 554a and 554b, 2003 and 2004]. A photomechancial reprint of Sect. V of this work, “Ueber die Möglichkeit der Philosophie als strenge Wissenschaft,” is included in the volume containing the photomechanical reprint edition ofUeber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens, ed. Wolfgang H. Schrader [Hamburg: Meiner, 1978].)
  • Ueber das Fundament des philosophischen Wissens (1791). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Band 4, 2011. (Photomechanical reprint edition, ed. Wolfgang H. Schrader [Hamburg: Meiner, 1978]. Partial translation, The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge, trans. George di Giovonni. In Between Kant and Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post-Kantian Idealism, ed. George di Giovanni and H. S. Harris [Albany: SUNY Press, 1985], pp. 52–106.)
  • Briefe über die Kantische Philosophie, Zweyter Band (1792). Reinhold, Gesammelte Schriften, Bd. 2/2, 2008.(Both volumes of the Briefe were later reprinted in a single volume, ed. Raymund Schmidt [Leipzig: Reclam, 1921].)
  • Beyträge zur Berichtigung bisheriger Missverständnisse der Philosophen, Zweyter Band (1794). (New edition, edited and with an introduction by Faustino Fabbianell. [Hamburg: Meiner/Philosophische Bibliothek 554b, 2004.])
  • Auswahl vermischter Schriften [Erster Theil] (1796).
  • Auswahl vermischter Schriften, Zweyter Theil (1797).
  • Review of Fichte's, Ueber den Begriff der Wissenschaftslehre, Grundlage der gesammten Wissenschaftslehre, Grundrisse des Eigenthümlichen der Wissenschaftslehre in Rücksicht auf das theoretische Vermögen, and Philosophisches Journal einer Gesellschaft Teutscher Gelehrten, Band 5, Heft 1–6. (1798). (Rpt. in J. G. Fichte in zeitgenössischen Rezensionen, Band 2, ed. Erich Fuchs, Wilhelm G. Jacobs, and Walter Schieche, pp. 286–321 [Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1995].)
  • Verhandlung über die Grundbegriffe und Grundsätze der Moralität aus dem Gesichtspunke des gemeinen und gesunden Verstandes (1798). (Partial translation in Sabine Roehr, A Primer on German Enlightenment: With a Translation of Karl Leonhard Reinhold's “The Fundamental Concepts and Principles of Ethics” [Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 1995], pp. 157–251.)
  • Ueber die Paradoxien der neuesten Philosophie (1799).
  • Sendschreiben an J. C. Lavater und J. G. Fichte über den Glauben an Gott (1799).
  • Beyträge zur leichtern Uebersicht des Zustandes der Philosophie beym Anfange des 19. Jahrhunderts, Heft 1–3 (1801), Heft 4 (1802), Heft 5–6 (1803). (This journal was founded and edited by Reinhold, who also contributed most of the editorial content.)
  • C. G. Bardilis und C. L. Reinholds Briefwechsel über das Wesen der Philosophie und das Unwesen der Speculation (1804).
  • Prologomena zur Analysis in der Philosophie (1804).
  • Etwas über den Widerspruch (1804).
  • C. L. Reinhold's Anleitung zur Kenntniß und Beurtheilung der Philosophie in ihren sämmtlichen Lehregebäuden (1805; 2nd ed. 1824).
  • Versuch einer Auflösung der von der philosophischen Classe der königl. Akademie der Wissenschaften in Berlin für 1805 aufgestellten Aufgabe: “Die Natur der Analysis und der analytischen Methode in der Philosophie genau anzugeben, und zu untersuchen: ob und was es für Mittel gebe, ihren Gebrauch sicher, leichter und nützlicher zu machen” (1805).
  • Versuch einer Critik der Logik aus dem Gesichtspunkte der Sprache (1806).
  • Die Anfangsgründe der Erkenntniß der Wahrheit in einer Fibel für noch unbefriedigte Forscher nach dieser Erkenntiß (1808).
  • Rüge einer merkürdigen Sprachverwirrung unter den Weltweisen (1809).
  • Grundlegung einer Synonymik für den allgemeinen Sprachgebrauch in den philosophischen Wissenschaften (1812).
  • Das menschliche Erkenntnißvermögen, aus dem Gesichtspunkte des durch die Wortsprache vermittelten Zusammenhang zwischen der Sinnlichkeit und dem Denkvermögen (1816).
  • Ueber den Begriff und die Erkenntniß der Wahrheit (1817).
  • Die alte Frage: Was ist die Wahrheit? bey den erneuerten Streitigkeiten über die göttliche Offenbarung und die menschliche Vernunft, in nähere Erwägung gezogen (1820).
  • Karl Leonhard Reinhold Korrespondenzausgabe der österreichischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, Vol. I, ed. Reinhard Lauth, Eberhard Heller, and Karl Hiller (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1983). Nine more volumes of this edition are projected.

Selected Secondary Literature About Reinhold

  • Adam, Herbert, 1930. Carl Leonhard Reinholds philosophischer Systemwechsel, Heidelberg: Carl Winter.
  • Ahlers, Rolf, 2003. “Fichte, Jacobi und Reinhold über Speculation und Leben,” Fichte-Studien, 21: 1–25.
  • Ameriks, Karl, 2000. Kant and the Fate of Autonomy: Problems in the Appropriation of the Critical Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press. (On Reinhold, see Pt. II, pp. 81–159.)
  • Beiser, Frederick C., 1987. The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte, Cambridge: Harvard University Press. (On Reinhold, see Ch. 8, pp. 226–65.)
  • Bondeli, Martin, 1995. Das Anfangsproblem bei Karl Leonhard Reinhold. Eine systematische und entwicklungsgeschichtliche Untersuchung zur Philosophie Reinholds in der Zeit von 1789 bis 1803, Frankfurt: Klostermann.
  • Bondeli, Martin, 2001. “Freiheit im Anschluss an Kant. Zur Kant-Reinhold-Kontroverse und ihren Folgen.” In Akten des IX Internationalen Kant-Kongresses, V. Gerhardt, R.-P. Horstmann, and R. Schumacher (eds.), Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Bondeli, Martin, 1994. “Geschmack und Vergnügen in Reinholds Aufklärungskonzept und philosophischem Programm während der Phase der Elementarphilosophie.” In Evolution des Geistes: Jena um 1800, F. Strack (ed.), Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta, pp. 328-49.
  • Bondeli, Martin, 1995. “Hegel und Reinhold,” Hegel-Studien, 30: 45-87.
  • Bondeli, Martin, 1998. “Hegel und Reinholds Rationaler Rationalismus.” In Hegels Jenaer Naturphilosophie, Munich: Fink Verlag.
  • Bondeli, Martin, 1997. “Hegels Identitätsphilosophie in Auseinandersetzung mit Reinholds Rationalem Realismus.” In Hegels Jenaer Naturphilosophie, K. Vieweg (ed.), Paderborn/München: W. Fink, pp. 163–74.
  • Bondeli, Martin and W. H. Schrader (eds.), 2003. Die Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds. (Beiträge der Internationalen Reinhold-Tagung von Bad Homburg, März 1998), Amsterdam: Rodopi.
  • Bondeli, Martin and Alessandro Lazzari (eds.), 2003. Philosophie ohne Beinamen. System, Freiheit und Geschichte im Denken C.L. Reinholds, Basel: Schwabe-Verlag, 2003. (Proceedings of the second international Reinhold conference, held in Lucerne in 2002.)
  • Bondili, Martin, 1997. “Reinhold im Lichte Kants und Hegels. Zu G.W. Fuchs: C.L. Reinhold – Illuminat und Philosoph; P. Valenza: Reinhold e Hegel,” Hegel-Studien, 31: 159-66.
  • Bondili, Martin, 1998. “Von Herder zu Kant, zwischen Kant und Herder, mit Herder gegen Kant – Karl Leonhard Reinhold.” In Herder und die Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus, M. Heinz (ed.), Amsterdam, Atlanta: Rodopi, pp. 203–34.
  • Bondili, Martin, 1997. “Zu Fichtes Kritik an Reinholds ‘empirischem’ Satz des Bewußtseins,” Fichte-Studien, 9: 199-213.
  • Breazeale, Daniel, 1982. “Between Kant and Fichte: Karl Leonhard Reinhold's ‘Elementary Philosophy,’” Review of Metaphysics, 35: 785–821.
  • Breazeale, Daniel, 1998. “Putting Doubt in its Place: Karl Leonhard Reinhold on the Relationship between Philosophical Skepticism and Transcendental Idealism.” In The Skeptical Tradition around 1800, J. van der Zande and R. H. Popkin (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 119–32.
  • Cloeren, Hermann-Joseph, 1972. “Philosophie als Sprachkritik bei K. L. Reinhold. Interpretative Bemerkungen zu seiner Spätphilosophie,” Kant-Studien, 63: 225-36.
  • Fabienelli, Faustino (ed.), 2003. Die zeitgenössischen Rezensionen der Elementarphilosophie K. L. Reinhold, Hildesheim: Olms.
  • Fichte, Johann Gottlieb, 1794. “Recenzion des Aenesidemus.” (“Review of Aenesidemus,” trans. Daniel Breazeale. In Fichte: Early Philosophical Writings, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1988, pp. 59–77.)
  • Frank, Manfred, 1997. “Unendliche Annäherung”: Die Anfänge der philosophischen Frühromantik, Frankfurt am Main: Suhrkamp. (On Reinhold, see Pt. II, pp. 112–662.)
  • Franks, Paul, 2000. “All or Nothing: Systematicity and Nihilism in Jacobi, Reinhold, and Maimon.” In The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Karl Ameriks (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 95–116.
  • Fuchs, Gerhard W., 1994. Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Illuminat und Philosoph: eine Studie über den Zusammenhang seines Engagements als Freimaurer und Illuminat mit seinem Leben und philosophischen Wirken, Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang.
  • di Giovanni, George (ed.), 2010. Karl Leonhard Reinhold and the Englightenment, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Hegel, G.W.F., 1801. Differenz des Fichte'schen und Schelling'schen Systems der Philosophie. (The Difference Between Fichte's und Schelling's System of Philosophy, ed. and H. S. Harris and Walter Cerf (trans.), Albany: SUNY Press, 1977.)
  • Henrich, Dieter, 1991. Konstellationen. Probleme und Debatten am Ursprung der idealistischen Philosophie, Stuttgart: Cotta.
  • Horstmann, Rolf-Peter, 1972. “Maimon's Criticism of Reinhold's Satz des Bewusstseins.” In Proceedings of the Third International Kant Congress, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 350–8.
  • Kersting, Wolfgang and Dirk Westerkamp (eds.), 2008. Am Rande des Idealismus: Studien zur Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Paderborn: Mentis.
  • Kim, Yun Ku, 1996. Religion, Moral und Aufklärung: Reinholds philosophischer Werdegang, Frankfurt: Peter Lang.
  • Klemmt, Alfred, 1958. Karl Leonhard Reinholds Elementarphilosophie. Eine Studie über den Ursprung des spekulativen deutschen Idealismus, Hamburg: Meiner.
  • Lauth, Reinhold (ed.), 1974. Philosophie aus einem Prinzip. Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Bonn: Bouvier. (A collection of essays by seven different scholars.)
  • Lazzari, Alessandro, 2004. “Das Eine, was der Menscheit Noth ist” Einheit und Freiheit in der Philosophie Karl Leonhard Reinholds (1789–1792), Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Fommann-Holzboog.
  • Leopoldsberger, Jürgen, 1968/69. “Anfang und Methode als die Grundprobleme der systematischen Philosophie. Reinhold, Fichte, Hegel,” Salzburger Jahrbuch für Philosophie, 12/13: 7–48.
  • Lukjanow, Arkadij V., 2003. “Die Beziehung zwischen Geist und System bei Fichte und Reinhold,” Fichte-Studien, 21: 111–16.
  • Marx, Karianne J., 2011. The Usefulness of the Kantian Philosophy: How Karl Leonhard Reinhold's Commitment to Englightenment Infuenced his Reception of Kant, Berlin: de Gruyter.
  • Perconti, Pietro, 1999. Kantian Linguistics. Theories of Mental Representation and the Linguistic Transformation of Kantism. Münster: Nodus. (For Reinhold, see Chs. 2 and 5.)
  • Pinkard, Terry, 2002. German Philosophy 1760–1869; The Legacy of Idealism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (For Reinhold, see Ch. 4, pp. 96–104.)
  • Pupi, Angelo, 1966. La formazione della filosofia di K. L. Reinhold 1784–1794, Milan: Societˆ Editrice Vita e Pensioro.
  • Reinhold, Ernst (ed.), 1825. Karl Leonhard Reinhold's Leben und litterarisches Wirken, nebst einer auswahl von Briefen Kant's, Fichte's, Jacobi's und andrer philosophierender Zeitgenossen a ihn, Jena: Frommann.
  • Röttgers, Kurt, 1974. “Die Kritik der reinen Vernunft und K. L. Reinhold. Fallstudie zur Theoriepragmatik in Schulbildungsprozessen.” In Akten des 4. Internationalen Kant-Kongresses, Vol. II, Part 2, Berlin: de Gruyter, pp. 789–804.
  • Schrader, Wolfgang H., 1979. “Philosophie als System — Reinhold und Fichte.” In Erneuerung der Transzendentalphilosophie im Anschluß an Kant und Fichte, Klaus Hammacher and Albert Mues (eds.), Stuttgart-Bad Cannstaatt, pp. 331–42.
  • Schrader, Wolfgang H., 1993. “C. L. Reinholds ‘Systemwechsel’ von der Wissenschaftslehre zum rationalen Realismus Bardilis in der Auseinandersetzung mit J. G. Fichte.” In Transzendentalphilosophie und Spekulation, (Band 2: Der Streit um die Gestalt einer Ersten Philosophie (1797–1807)), Walter Jaeschke (ed.), Hamburg: Meiner, pp. 85–104.
  • Schrader, Wolfgang H., 1990. “‘Wir denken über keinen einzigen Begriff gleich.’ Die Auseinandersetzung zwischen Reinhold und Maimon.” In Zur Architektonik der Vernunft, Lothar Berthold (ed.), Berlin: Akademie Verlag, pp. 525–52.
  • Schönborn, Alexander von, 1997. “Fichte und Reinhold über die Begrenzung der Philosophie,” Fichte-Studien, 9: 241-55.
  • Schönborn, Alexander von, 1991. Karl Leonard Reinhold. Eine annotierte Bibliographie, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog.
  • Schönborn, Alexander von, 1999. “Karl Leonhard Reinhold: ‘... Endeavoring to keep up the pace mit unserem Zeitalter.’” In The Emergence of German Idealism, Michael Baur and Daniel O. Dahlstrom (eds.), Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, pp. 33–62.
  • Selling, Magnus, 1938. Studien zur Geschichte der Transcendentalphilosophie. I. Karl Leonhard Reinholds Elementarphilosophie in ihrem philosophiegeschichtlichen Zusammenhang, Lund: Olsen, 1938.
  • Stamm, Marcello, 1995. “Das Program des methodologischen Monismus; Subjekttheoretische und methologische Aspekte der Elementarphilosophie K. L. Reinholds,” Neue Hefte für Philosophie, 35: 18–31.
  • Stolz, Violetta, Marion Heinz, and Martin Bondeli (eds.), 2012. Wille, Willkür, Freiheit: Reinhold's Freiheitskonzeption im Kontext der Philosophie des 18. Jahrhunderts, Berlin: de Gruter.
  • Stolzenberg, Jürgen, 2003. “‘Geschichte des Selbstbewußtseins.’ Reinhold–Fichte–Schelling,” Internationales Jahrbuch des Deutschen Idealismus/International Yearbook of German Idealism (Konzepte der Rationalität/Concepts of Rationality), Karl Ameriks and Jürgen Stolzenberg (eds.) Berlin: de Gruyter, pp. 93–113.
  • Teichner, Wilhelm, 1976. Rekonstruktion oder Reproduktion des Grundes. Die Begründung der Philosophie als Wissenschaft durch Kant und Reinhold , Bonn: Bouvier.
  • Valenza, Paolo, 1994. Reinhold e Hegel, Padua: Cedam.
  • Zynda, M. von, 1910. Kant – Reinhold – Fichte. Studien zur Geschichte der Transzendentalphilosophie, Kantstudien-Ergänzungshefte, Berlin. (Reprinted Ruggell/Liechtenstein: Topos, 1980.)

Journal

  • K. L. Reinhold. Alle Soglie Dell'Idealismo, Special (487 pp.) triple issue of Archivio di Filosofia/Archives of Philosophy, LXXIII (2005), Nos. 1–3. (Contains the proceedings of the third international Reinhold conference, held in Rome in 2004.)

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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