Legal Punishment

First published Tue Jan 2, 2001; substantive revision Mon May 13, 2013

The question of whether, and how, legal punishment can be justified is central to both legal and political philosophy: what could justify a state in using the apparatus of the law to inflict burdensome sanctions on its citizens? Radically different answers to this question are offered by consequentialist and by retributivist theorists—and by those who seek to combine consequentialist with retributivist considerations in ‘mixed’ theories of punishment; an important strand in recent theorising has been the idea of punishment as a communicative enterprise. Meanwhile, abolitionist theorists argue that we should aim to replace legal punishment rather than to justify it.


1. Legal Punishment and its Justification

The central question asked by philosophers of punishment is: What can justify punishment? More precisely, since they do not usually talk much about punishment in such contexts as the family or the workplace (but see Zaibert 2006; Bennett 2008: Part II), their question is: What can justify formal, legal punishment imposed by the state on those convicted of committing criminal offences? We will also focus on legal punishment here: not because the other species of punishment do not raise important normative questions (they do), nor because such questions can be answered in terms of an initial justification of legal punishment as being the paradigm case (since it's not clear that they can be), but because legal punishment, apart from being more dramatically coercive and burdensome than other species of punishment usually are, raises distinctive issues about the role of the state and its relationship to its citizens, and about the role of the criminal law. Future references to ‘punishment’ should therefore be read, unless otherwise specified, as references to legal or criminal punishment.

What then are we to justify in justifying punishment? The search for a precise definition of punishment that exercised some philosophers (for discussion and references see Scheid 1980; Boonin 2008: 3–28; Zimmerman 2011: ch. 1) is likely to prove futile: but we can say that legal punishment involves the imposition of something that is intended to be both burdensome and reprobative, on a supposed offender for a supposed crime, by a person or body who claims the authority to do so. Two points are worth particular notice here.

First, what distinguishes punishments from taxes or mere ‘penalties’ (see Feinberg 1970) is their reprobative or condemnatory character. Taxes might be imposed to discourage certain kinds of conduct; penalties might likewise be imposed to deter the penalised conduct (or to recoup some of the costs that it causes): but even if a primary purpose of punishment is deterrence (see ss. 3–4 below), its imposition (the conviction and formal sentence that the offender receives in court, the administration of the punishment itself) also expresses the censure or condemnation that the offender's crime is taken to warrant.

Second, punishment involves material impositions or exactions that are in themselves typically unwelcome: they deprive people of things that they value (liberty, money, time); they require people to do things that they would not normally want to do or do voluntarily (to spend time on unpaid community labour, to report to a probation officer regularly, to undertake demanding programmes of various kinds). What distinguishes punishment from other kinds of coercive imposition is that punishment is precisely intended to …: but to what? Some would say that punishment is intended to inflict pain or suffering: but that suggests that what matters is pain or suffering as such (and invites the familiar criticism that we and the state should not be in the business of trying to inflict pain or suffering on people; see Christie 1981 on ‘pain-delivery’), which some penal theorists would reject as a distortion. Others would say that punishment is intended to cause harm to the offender — adding, if they are careful (see Hanna forthcoming: s. 2) that what is intended is ‘prima facie harm’ rather than ‘all-things-considered harm’, to allow for the possibility that punishment might be, or might be intended to be, on balance beneficial to the offender. But some theorists would deny even this, since they would deny that punishment must be intended to be ‘intrinsically bad’ for the person punished. It is safer to say that punishment must be intended to be burdensome, and that is how punishment will be understood in what follows.

How then can the practice of criminal punishment, which infringes the freedom of those subjected to it, which not only burdens them but aims to burden them, be justified?

We should not assume, however, that there is only one question of justification, which can receive just one answer. As Hart famously pointed out (Hart 1968: 1–27), we must distinguish at least three justificatory issues. First, what is the ‘general justifying aim’ of a system of punishment: what justifies the creation and maintenance of such a system—what good can it achieve, what duty can it fulfil, what moral demand can it satisfy? Second, who may properly be punished: what principles or aims should determine the allocations of punishments to individuals? Third, how should the appropriate amount of punishment be determined: how should sentencers go about deciding what sentence to impose? (One dimension of this third question concerns the amount or severity of punishment; another, which is insufficiently discussed by philosophers, concerns the concrete modes of punishment that should be available, in general or for particular crimes.) It might of course turn out that answers to all these questions will flow from a single theoretical foundation—for instance from a unitary consequentialist principle specifying the good that punishment should achieve, or from some version of the retributivist principle that the sole proper aim of punishment is to impose on the guilty the punitive burdens they deserve. But, in this as in other matters of normative political theory, matters might not be as easy and simple as that: we might find that quite different and conflicting values are relevant to different issues about punishment; and that any complete normative account of punishment will have to find a place for these values—and to help us find some no doubt uncomfortable compromises between them when they conflict.

Even this way of putting the matter oversimplifies it, by implying that we can hope to find a ‘complete normative account of punishment’: an account, that is, of how punishment can be justified. That is certainly an implicit assumption of much philosophical and legal discussion: punishment can—of course—be justified, and the theorists' task is to establish and explicate that justification. But it is an illegitimate assumption: normative theorists must be open to the possibility, startling and disturbing as it might be, that this pervasive human practice cannot be justified. Nor is this merely the kind of fantastical scepticism that moral philosophers are sometimes prone to imagine (‘suppose someone denied that killing for pleasure was wrong’): there is a significant strand of ‘abolitionist’ penal theorising (to which insufficient attention is paid in the philosophical literature) which argues precisely that legal punishment cannot be justified and should be abolished. The abolitionist claim is not merely that our existing penal practices are not justified: viewed in the light of many normative penal theories (one might almost say, of any plausible normative penal theory) our existing penal practices, especially those involving imprisonment (given the actual nature of our prisons) or execution, are not merely imperfect, but so radically inconsistent with the values that should inform a practice of punishment that they cannot claim to be justified. For those who think that punishment can in principle be justified, this means simply (and hardly surprisingly) that our penal practices need radical reform if they are to become justified: but the abolitionist critique goes much deeper than that, to argue that legal punishment cannot be justified even in principle.

We will attend to some abolitionist arguments in what follows. Even if those arguments can be met, even if legal punishment can be justified, at least in principle, the abolitionist challenge is one that must be met, rather than ignored; and it will help to remind us of the ways in which any practice of legal punishment is bound to be morally problematic.

2. Punishment, Crime and the State

Legal punishment presupposes crime as that for which punishment is imposed, and a criminal law as that which defines crimes as crimes; a system of criminal law presupposes a state, which has the political authority to make and enforce the law and to impose punishments. A normative account of legal punishment and its justification must thus at least presuppose, and should perhaps make explicit, a normative account of the criminal law (why should we have a criminal law at all?) and of the proper powers and functions of the state (by what authority or right does the state make and declare law, and impose punishments on those who break it?).

How far it matters, in this context, to make explicit a political theory of the state depends on how far different plausible political theories will generate very different accounts of how punishment can be justified and should be used. We cannot pursue this question here (for two sharply contrasting views on it, see Philips 1986, Davis 1989; for more recent contributions showing the importance of political theory, see Pettit 1997; Matravers 2000; Dolovich 2004; Garvey 2004; Dagger 2007; Brettschneider 2007; Markel 2012), save to note one central point. For any political theory (most obviously any version of liberalism or republicanism) that takes seriously the idea of citizenship as full membership of the polity, the problem of punishment takes a particularly acute form, since we have now to ask how punishment can be consistent with citizenship (how citizens can legitimately punish each other): if we are not to say that those who commit crimes thereby forfeit their status as citizens (see s. 4 below), we must—if we are to justify punishment at all—show how the imposition of punishment can be consistent with, or even expressive of, the respect that citizens owe to each other. Some recent versions of retributivism claim, as we will see, to offer a more satisfactory answer to this question than can any consequentialist theory. (Punishments are also, of course, imposed on non-citizens who commit crimes within a state's territory: on the primacy of citizenship in understanding criminal law and its authority, and on the status of non-citizens, see Duff forthcoming.)

Before we tackle such theories of punishment, however, we should look briefly at the concept of crime, since that is one focus of the abolitionist critique of punishment.

On a simple positivist view of law, crimes are kinds of conduct that are prohibited, on pain of threatened sanctions, by the law; and for positivists like Bentham, who combine positivism with a normative consequentialism, the questions of whether we should maintain a criminal law at all, and of what kinds of conduct should be criminalised, are to be answered by trying to determine whether and when this method of controlling human conduct is likely to produce a net increase in good. Such a perspective seems inadequate, however: inadequate both to the claims of the criminal law, which presents its demands as something other or more than those of a gunman writ large—as something other or more than ‘Behave thus, or else!’; and to the normative issues at stake when we ask what kinds of conduct should be criminalised. For the criminal law portrays crime not merely as conduct which has been prohibited, but as a species of wrongdoing: whether our inquiry is analytical (into the concept of crime) or normative (as to what kinds of conduct, if any, should be criminal), we must therefore focus on that notion of wrongdoing.

Crimes are, at least, socially proscribed wrongs—kinds of conduct which are condemned as wrong by some purportedly authoritative social norm. That is to say that they are wrongs which are not merely ‘private’ affairs, which properly concern only those directly involved in them: the community as a whole—in this case the political community speaking through the law—claims the right to declare them to be wrongs. But crimes are ‘public’ wrongs in a sense that goes beyond this. Tort law, for instance, law deals in part with wrongs which are non-private in that they are legally and socially declared as wrongs—with the wrong constituted by libel, for instance: but they are still treated as ‘private’ wrongs in the sense that it is up to the person who was wronged to seek legal redress (see Theories of Tort Law, esp. s. 3). She must decide to bring, or not to bring, a civil case against the person who wronged her; and although she can appeal to the law to protect her rights, the case is still between her and the defendant. By contrast, a criminal case is between the whole political community—the state or the people—and the defendant: the wrong is ‘public’ in the sense that it is one for which the wrongdoer must answer not just to the individual victim, but to the whole polity through its criminal courts.

It is notoriously difficult to give a clear and plausible account of the distinction between civil and criminal law, between ‘private’ and ‘public’ legal wrongs, whether our interest is in the analytical question of what the distinction amounts to, or in the normative question of which kinds of wrong should fall into which category (see Murphy & Coleman 1984, ch. 3; a symposium in Boston University Law Review vol. 76 (1996): 1–373; Lamond 2007). It might be tempting to say that crimes are ‘public’ wrongs in the sense that they injure the whole community: they threaten social order, for instance, or cause ‘social volatility’ (Becker 1974); or they involve taking unfair advantage over those who obey the law (Murphy 1973); or they undermine the trust on which social life depends (Dimock 1997). But such accounts distract our attention from the wrongs done to the individual victims that most crimes have, when it is those wrongs that should be our central concern: we should condemn the rapist or murderer, we should see the wrong he has done as our concern, because of what he has done to his victim. Another suggestion is that ‘public’ wrongs are those which flout the community's essential or most basic values, in which all members of the community should see themselves as sharing: the wrong is done to ‘us’, not merely to its individual victim, in the sense that we identify ourselves with the victim as a fellow citizen (see Marshall & Duff 1998; Duff 2007, ch. 6; and see further Theories of Crime s.6).

Some abolitionists, however, argue that we should seek to eliminate the concept of crime from our social vocabulary: we should talk and think not of ‘crimes’, but of ‘conflicts’ or ‘troubles’ (Christie 1977; Hulsman 1986). One motivation for this might be the thought that ‘crime’ entails punishment as the appropriate response: but that is not so, since we could imagine a system of criminal law without punishment. To define something as a ‘crime’ does indeed imply that some kind of public response is appropriate, since it is to define it as a kind of wrong that properly concerns the whole community; and it implies that that response should be a condemnatory one, since to identify wrongs as wrongs is to mark them out as apt for condemnation: but that public, condemnatory response could consist in nothing more than, for instance, some version of a criminal trial which calls the alleged wrongdoer to answer for her alleged wrongdoing, and condemns her for it, through a criminal conviction, if she is proved guilty. One can of course count a criminal conviction as a kind of punishment: but it does not entail the kind of materially burdensome punishment, imposed after conviction, with which penal theorists are primarily concerned.

Another possible motivation for the abolitionist objection to the concept of crime is a kind of moral relativism which objects to the ‘imposition’ of values on those who might not share them (Bianchi 1994: 71–97): but since abolitionists are very ready to tell us, insistently, how we ought to respond to conflicts or troubles, and how a state ought or ought not to treat its citizens, such an appeal to relativism reflects serious confusion (see Williams 1976: 34–39). More plausibly, the abolitionist claim could be that rather than take wrongdoing as our focus, we should focus on the harm that has been done, and on how it can be repaired; we will return to this suggestion in s.7 below.

Another abolitionist concern is that by defining and treating conduct as ‘criminal’, the law ‘steals’ the conflicts which crime involves from those to whom they properly belong (Christie 1977): instead of allowing, and helping, those who find themselves in conflict to resolve their trouble, the law takes the matter over and translates it into the professionalised context of the criminal justice system, in which neither ‘victim’ nor ‘offender’ is allowed any appropriate or productive role. Now it is a familiar and disturbing truth that our existing criminal processes—both in their structure and in their actual operations—tend to preclude any effective participation by either victims or offenders, although an adequate response to the criminal wrong that was done should surely involve them both. One response is to argue, as some abolitionists do, that our response to crime should consist not in punishment, but in a process of mediation or ‘restoration’ between victim and offender (see further s 7 below); but another is to insist that we should retain a distinctive criminal process of trials, and punishments, in which the polity as a whole, acting on behalf of the victim as well as on its own behalf, calls the criminal wrongdoer to account—but that victims and offenders should be given a more active role in that process (see further Duff et al 2007, esp. chs. 3–5, 7). Such an insistence on the need for a public criminal process reflects two aspects of the concept of crime: first, it is sometimes important to recognise that a situation involves not just people in ‘conflict’, but a victim who has been wronged and an offender who has done the wrong; second, some such wrongs are ‘public’ wrongs in the sense sketched above—wrongs that properly concern not just those directly affected, but all members of the political community. Faced, for instance, by feuding neighbours who persistently accuse each other of more or less trivial wrongs, it might indeed be appropriate to suggest that they should forget about condemning each other and look for a way of resolving their conflict. But faced by a rapist and the person he raped, or by a violent husband and the wife he has been beating up, it would a betrayal both of the victim and of the values to which we are supposedly committed to portray the situation merely as a ‘conflict’ which the parties should seek to resolve: whatever else or more we can do, we must recognise and declare that here is a victim who has been seriously wronged; and we must be collectively ready to censure the offender's action as a wrong (for a useful discussion of the significance of criminal law in the context of domestic violence, see Dempsey 2009).

However, to argue that we should retain the concept of crime, that we should maintain a criminal law which defines and condemns a category of ‘public’ wrongs, is not yet to say that we should maintain a penal system which punishes those who commit such wrongs; as I have noted, while a system of criminal law might require something like a system of criminal trials which will authoritatively identify and condemn criminal wrongdoers, it does not of its nature require the imposition of further sanctions on such wrongdoers. So we must turn at last to the question of what could justify such a system of punishment.

3. Pure Consequentialism and Punishment

Many people, including those who do not take a consequentialist view of other matters, think that any adequate justification of punishment must be basically consequentialist. For we have here a practice which inflicts, indeed seeks to inflict, significant hardship or burdens: how else could we hope to justify it than by showing that it brings consequential benefits sufficiently large to outweigh, and thus to justify, those burdens? We need not be Benthamite utilitarians to be moved by Bentham's famous remark that “all punishment in itself is evil. ... [I]f it ought at all to be admitted, it ought only to be admitted in as far as it promises to exclude some greater evil” (Bentham 1789: ch. XIII.2). However, when we try to flesh out that simple consequentialist thought into something closer to a full normative account of punishment, problems begin to appear.

A consequentialist must justify punishment (if she is to justify it at all) as a cost-effective means to certain independently identifiable goods. Whatever account she gives of the final good or goods at which all action ultimately aims, the most plausible immediate good that a system of punishment can bring is the prevention of crime: a rational consequentialist system of law will define as criminal only conduct that is in some way harmful; in preventing crime we will thus be preventing the harms that crime causes; and punishment can prevent crime by incapacitating, or deterring, or reforming potential offenders. (There are of course other goods that a system of punishment can bring. It can reassure those who fear crime that the state is taking steps to protect them—though this is a good that, in a well-informed society, will be achieved only insofar as the more immediate preventive goods are achieved. It can also bring satisfaction to those who want to see wrongdoers suffer—though to show that to be a genuine good, rather than merely a means of averting vigilantism and private revenge, we would need to show that it involves something more than mere vengeance, which would be to make sense of some version of retributivism.)

It is a contingent question whether punishment can be an efficient method of preventing crime in any of these ways, and some objections to punishment rest on the empirical claim that it cannot be—that there are other and more efficient methods of crime-prevention, for instance those involving a therapeutic approach to offenders (see Wootton 1963; Menninger 1968). Our focus here, however, must be on the moral objections to consequentialist accounts of punishment—on objections to the effect that crime-preventive efficiency does not suffice to justify a system of punishment.

The most familiar objections to consequentialist penal theories are objections to purely consequentialist theories which hold that only the consequences are relevant to question of justification (for two simple examples of such theories, see Wilson 1983; Walker 1991). For, critics argue, quite apart from the difficult question of whether punishment is or could be a cost-effective way of securing its intended benefits, consequentialists would have to regard manifestly unjust punishments (the punishment of those known to be innocent, for instance, or excessively harsh punishment of the guilty) to be in principle justified if they would efficiently serve the aim of crime prevention: but such punishments would be wrong, just because they would be unjust (see e.g., Hart 1968, chs. 1–2; Ten 1987; Primoratz 1999, chs. 2–3; Boonin 2008: ch. 2).

There are some equally familiar consequentialist responses to this familiar objection. One is to argue that such ‘unjust’ punishments would be justified if they would really produce the best consequences (see e.g., Smart 1973: 69–72; Bagaric & Amarasekara 2000)—to which the critic will reply that we cannot thus put aside the moral significance of injustice. Another is to argue that in the real world it is extremely unlikely that such punishments would ever be for the best, and even less likely that the agents involved could be trusted reliably to pick out those rare cases in which they would be: thus we, and especially our penal officials, will do best if we think and act as if such punishments are intrinsically wrong and unjustifiable (see e.g., Rawls 1955; Hare 1981, chs. 3, 9.7)—to which the critic will respond that this still makes the wrongness of punishing a known innocent contingent on its effects, and fails to recognise the intrinsic wrong that such punishment does (see e.g., Duff 1986: 151–64; Primoratz 1999, chs. 3.3, 6.5). Another response is to argue that a richer or subtler account of the ends that the criminal law should serve will generate suitable protection against unjust punishments (see Braithwaite & Pettit 1990, especially 71–6, on ‘dominion’ as the end of criminal law): but the objection remains that any purely consequentialist account will make the protection of the innocent against injustice contingent on its instrumental contribution to the system's aims (on Braithwaite & Pettit, see von Hirsch & Ashworth 1992; Duff 1996: 20–25; Pettit 1997).

4. LimitedConsequentialism and Punishment

The most familiar response to such objections is to replace pure consequentialism by a limited or qualified consequentialism: to insist that the positive ‘general justifying aim’ (Hart 1968: 8–11) of a system of punishment must lie in its beneficial effects, but to argue that our pursuit of that aim must be constrained by non-consequentialist principles that preclude the kinds of injustice alleged to flow from a purely consequentualist account. A simple version of this approach identifies certain side-constraints to which our pursuit of the consequential benefits of punishment must be subject: constraints that forbid, for instance, the deliberate punishment of the innocent, or the excessively harsh punishment of the guilty. (See most famously Hart 1968, and Scheid 1997 for a sophisticated Hartian theory; on Hart see Lacey 1988: 46–56; Morison 1988; Primoratz 1999, ch. 6.6.)

One question about such accounts concerns the grounding of these side-constraints. If they are derived from a ‘negative’ retributivism which insists that punishment is justified only if it is deserved (see Dolinko 1991: 539–43), they face the problem of explaining this retributivist notion of desert (see s. 5 below): but it is not clear whether they can be justified without such an appeal to retributivist desert (see Hart 1968: 44–48; Feinberg 1988: 144–55; Walker 1991, ch. 11). Even if such side-constraints can be securely grounded, however, consequentialist theories of punishment face further objections, focused on the moral character of punishment within those constraints. For the side-constrained consequentialist, so long as punishment is deserved it may and should be used to serve consequentialist ends—most obviously the end of crime prevention: but, the critic now objects, to use punishment thus is to use those who are punished ‘merely as means’ to those further ends, which is to deny them the respect, the moral standing, that is their due as responsible agents (see Murphy 1973: 218). Objections to purely consequentialist theories often focused on the rights of the innocent: the objections to side-constrained consequentialism, which clearly protects the rights of innocent, focus on the rights or moral standing of the guilty.

The Kantian prohibition on treating each other ‘merely as means’ is admittedly unclear in its implications (for a useful discussion of how we should understand ‘the means principle’, see Tadros 2011: ch. 6); and it can be argued that if punishment is reserved for those who voluntarily break the law, it does not treat them merely as means (see Walker 1980: 80–85; Hoskins 2011). But a version of it does seem to have force against purely reformative punishments that aim simply so to modify offenders' dispositions that they will in future willingly obey the law; against purely incapacitative punishments that aim simply to prevent offenders from committing further crimes; and against purely deterrent punishments that aim simply to give potential offenders prudential reason to obey the law. For, the Kantian can argue, if we are to treat another ‘as an end’, with the respect due to her as a rational and responsible agent, we must seek to modify her conduct only by offering her good and relevant reasons to modify it for herself. These modes of consequentialist punishment, however, do not satisfy that demand. A purely reformative system treats those subjected to it not as rational, self-determining agents, but as objects to be re-formed by whatever efficient (and humane) techniques we can find. A purely incapacitative system does not leave those subjected to it free, as responsible agents should be left free, to determine their own future conduct, but seeks to pre-empt their future choices by incapacitating them. And although a purely deterrent system does, unlike the others, offer potential offenders reason to obey the law, it offers them the wrong kind of reason: instead of addressing them as responsible moral agents, in terms of the moral reasons which justify the law's demands on them, it addresses them as merely self-interested beings, in the coercive language of threat; deterrence treats ‘a man like a dog instead of with the freedom and respect due to him as a man’ (Hegel 1821: 246. For these objections see Lewis 1953; H Morris 1968; Duff 1986: 178–86; von Hirsch 1993: 9–14; von Hirsch & Ashworth 1998, chs. 1, 3).

Such objections leave many people unpersuaded. One strategy for dealing with them is to posit a two-step justification of punishment. The first step, which typically appeals to non-consequentialist values, shows how the commission of a crime renders the offender eligible for, or liable to, the kinds of coercive treatment that punishment involves: such treatment, which is normally inconsistent with the respect due to us as rational agents or as citizens, and inconsistent with the Kantian means principle, is rendered permissible by the commission of the offence. The second step is then to offer positive consequentialist reasons for imposing punishment on those who are eligible for it or liable to it: we should punish if and because this can be expected to produce sufficient consequential benefits to outweigh its undoubted costs. (Further non-consequentialist constraints might also be placed on the severity and modes of punishment that can be permitted: constraints either flowing from an account of just what offenders render themselves liable to, or from other values external to the system of punishment.)

Thus, for instance, some argue that those who voluntarily break the law thereby forfeit at least some of the rights that citizens can normally claim: their wrongdoing therefore legitimises kinds of treatment (reformative or incapacitative treatment, for instance, or deterrent punishment) that would normally be wrong as violating citizens' rights (see Goldman 1982; C Morris 1991; Wellman 2012; for criticisms see Lippke 2001a; Boonin 2008: 103–19). We must ask, however, whether we should be so quick to exclude fellow citizens from the rights and status of citizenship, or whether we should not look for an account of punishment (if it is to be justified at all) on which punishment can still be claimed to treat those punished as full citizens. (The common practice of denying imprisoned offenders the right to vote whilst they are in prison, and perhaps even after they leave prison, is symbolically significant in this context: those who would argue that punishment should be consistent with recognised citizenship should also oppose such practices; see Lippke 2001b; Journal of Applied Philosophy 2005.)

Others portray punishment (in particular deterrent punishment) as a species of societal (self-) defence—and it seems clear that to defend oneself against a wrongful attack is not to use the attacker ‘merely as a means’, or to fail to show him the respect that is his due.(For versions of this kind of argument see Alexander 1980; Quinn 1985; Farrell 1985, 1995; Montague 1995; Ellis 2003. For criticism, see Boonin 2008: 192–207. For a particularly intricate development of this line of thought, grounding the justification of punishment in the duties that we incur by commtting wrongs, see Tadros 2011: for critical responses, see Law and Philosophy 2013.) Others offer contractualist or contractarian justifications of punishment, grounded in an account of what rational agents or reasonable citizens would agree to: the punishment of those who commit crimes is then, it is argued, rendered permissible by the fact that the offender himself would, as a rational agent or reasonable citizen, have consented to a system of law that provided for such punishments (see e.g., Brettschneider 2007; Finkelstein 2011; for criticism see Dagger 2011; see also Matravers 2000).

Yet others argue that the the Hegelian objection to a system of deterrent punishments is at least seriously overstated, and that it can be met if punishment is only threatened against, and only imposed on, those who commit crimes. For deterrent punishment does not treat people like ‘dogs’ who must be cowed into obedience by waving a big stick: it offers people prudential reasons to refrain from crime—reasons of a kind that can be expected to appeal to self-interested agents; and such reasons are intended to dissuade from crime those who are not sufficiently moved by the law's moral appeal (see Baker 1992; Hoskins 2011; in partial response see Duff 2001: chs. 1.3, 3.1–3).

All the theories noted in this section could be called ‘retributivist’: for even if they do not appeal to the idea of desert that is central to many retributivist accounts, they ground an essential part of their justifications of punishment on the claim that it is a permissible response to the commission of a crime: the justification of punishment must thus look not only to the future (to the consequential benefits that it is intended to bring), but also to the past—to the justificatory relationship between crime and punishment which renders the offender liable to be punished. They are, however, versions of ‘negative’ retributivism (see Dolinko 1991: 539–43): they do not posit a notion of retribution as the positive justifying aim of punishment; they rather take the commission of the crime to remove what would otherwise be a conclusive reason against punishment, thus clearing the way for the consequentialist reasons that are to provide punishment's positive justification. A ‘negative’ retributivist insists that we must not punish the innocent, or punish the guilty more than their crimes warrant: this does not imply that we ought to punish the guilty; it implies only that we may punish the guilty, if we have other good (presumably consequentialist) reasons to do so. We must now turn to ‘positive’ retributivist accounts, which find punishment's positive justification in its relationship to the past commission of a crime (but see Berman 2011 for an argument that some recent versions of retributivism actually turn it into a consequentialist theory).

5. ‘Positive’ Retributivism and the Meaning of Desert

‘Positive’ retributivism is typically expressed in the language of penal desert. The guilty, those who commit criminal offences, deserve to be punished: which is to say, for the positive retributivist, not merely that we must not punish the innocent, or punish the guilty more than they deserve, but that we should punish the guilty, to the extent that they deserve: penal desert constitutes not just a necessary, but an in principle sufficient reason for punishment (only in principle, however, since there are very good reasons—to do with the costs, both material and moral, of punishment—why we should not even try to punish all the guilty). A striking feature of penal theorising during the last three decades of the twentieth century was a revival of positive retributivism—of the idea that the positive justification of punishment is to be found in its intrinsic character as a deserved response to crime (see H. Morris 1968; N. Morris 1974; Murphy 1973; von Hirsch 1976; two useful collections of contemporary papers on retributivism are White 2011 and Tonry 2012).

Positive retributivism comes in very different forms (Cottingham 1979). All can be understood, however, as attempting to answer the two central questions faced by any retributivist theory of punishment. First, what is the justificatory relationship between crime and punishment that the idea of desert is supposed to capture: why do the guilty ‘deserve to suffer’ (see L. Davis 1972)—and what do they deserve to suffer (see Ardal 1984; Honderich 2005, ch. 2)? Second, even if they deserve to suffer, or to be burdened in some distinctive way, why should it be for the state to inflict that suffering or that burden on them through a system of criminal punishment (Murphy 1985; Husak 1992; Shafer-Landau 1996)?

One retributivist answer to these questions which was popular for a time was that crime involves taking an unfair advantage over the law-abiding, and that punishment removes that unfair advantage. The criminal law benefits all citizens by protecting them from certain kinds of harm: but this benefit depends upon citizens accepting the burden of self-restraint involved in obeying the law. The criminal takes the benefit of the self-restraint of others, but refuses to accept that burden herself: she has gained an unfair advantage, which punishment removes by imposing some additional burden on her. (See H. Morris 1968; Murphy 1973; Sadurski 1985; Sher 1987, ch. 5; Adler 1992, chs. 5–8; Dagger 1993, 2008, 2011: for criticism, see Burgh 1982; Duff 1986, ch. 8; Falls 1987; Dolinko 1991; Anderson 1997; Boonin 2008: 119–143).

This kind of account does indeed answer the two questions noted above. What the criminal deserves to suffer is the loss of her unfair advantage, and she deserves that because it is unfair that she should get away with taking the benefits of the law without accepting the burdens on which those benefits depend; it is the state's job to inflict this suffering on her, because it is the author or guarantor of the criminal law. However, such accounts have internal difficulties: for instance, how are we to determine how great was the unfair advantage gained by a crime; how far are such measurements of unfair advantage likely to correlate with our judgements of the seriousness of crimes? (For a detailed defence of the ‘unfair advantage’ theory as a theory of sentencing, see M. Davis 1992, 1996; for criticism see Scheid 1990, 1995; von Hirsch 1990.) Furthermore, they seem to misrepresent what it is about crime that makes it deserving of punishment: what makes murder, or rape, or theft, or assault a criminal wrong, deserving of punishment, is surely the wrongful harm that it does to the individual victim—not (as on this kind of account) the supposed unfair advantage that the criminal takes over all those who obey the law.

A different retributivist account appeals not to the abstract notion of unfair advantage, but to our (normal, appropriate) emotional responses to crime: to, for instance, the resentment or ‘retributive hatred’, involving a desire to make the wrongdoer suffer, that crime may arouse (see Murphy & Hampton 1988, chs. 1, 3); or to the guilt, involving the judgement that I ought to be punished, that my own wrongdoing would arouse in me (see Moore 1997, ch. 4). Such accounts try to answer the first of the two questions noted above: crime deserves punishment in the sense that it makes appropriate certain emotions (resentment, guilt) which are satisfied by or expressed in punishment. However, they do not yet show why it should be the state's task to satisfy or provide formal expression for such emotions (but see Stephen 1873: 152); and their answers to the first question are also problematic. Criminal wrongdoing should, we can agree, provoke certain kinds of emotion, such as self-directed guilt and other-directed indignation; and such emotions might typically involve a desire to make those at whom they are directed suffer. But just as we can agree that anger is an appropriate response to wrongs done to me, whilst also arguing that we should resist the desire to hit back which anger often, even typically, involves (see Horder 1992:194–7): so we could argue that although guilt, resentment and indignation are appropriate responses to our own and others' wrongdoing, we should resist the desire for suffering that they so often involve. At the least we need to know more than we are told by these accounts about just what wrongdoers deserve to suffer, and why the infliction of suffering should be an appropriate way to express such proper emotions. (For critical discussions of Murphy, see Murphy & Hampton 1988, ch. 2; Duff 1996: 29–31; Murphy 1999. On Moore, see Dolinko 1991: 555–9; Knowles 1993; Murphy 1999. See also Murphy 2003, 2012.)

A third kind of account seeks the meaning and justification of punishment as a deserved response to crime in its expressive or communicative character. (On the expressive dimension of punishment, see generally Feinberg 1970, Primoratz 1989: for critical discussion see Hart 1963: 60–69; Skillen 1980; M. Davis 1996: 169–81.) Consequentialists can of course portray punishment as useful partly in virtue of its expressive character (see Lacey 1988; Braithwaite & Pettit 1990): but a portrayal of punishment as a mode of moral communication has been central to some recent versions of retributivism.

6. Punishment as Communication

The central meaning and purpose of punishment, on such accounts, is to communicate to offenders the censure or condemnation that they deserve for their crimes. Once we recognise, as we should, that punishment can serve this communicative purpose, we can see how such accounts begin to answer the two questions that retributivists face. First, there is an obviously intelligible justificatory relationship between wrongdoing and censure—as a response which is intended to impose a burden (the burden of condemnation by one's fellows) on an offender for his offence: whatever puzzles there might be about other attempts to explain the idea of penal desert, the idea that wrongdoers deserve to suffer censure is surely unpuzzling. Second, it is appropriate for the state to ensure that such censure is formally administered through the criminal justice system: if crimes are public wrongs, breaches of the political community's authoritative code; as such, they merit public censure by the community. Furthermore, whilst internal to censure is the intention, or hope, that the person censured will accept the censure as justified and will thus be motivated to avoid crime in future, this kind of account can avoid the charge (as brought against consequentialist theories) that it seeks to coerce or manipulate offenders into obeying the law. For censure addresses, and respects, the person censured as a rational and responsible agent: it constitutes an appropriate, deserved response to the wrong that she did, and seeks to bring her to modify her future conduct only by reminding her of the good moral reasons that she has for refraining from crime; it is an appropriate way for citizens to treat and respond to each other. (For different kinds of communicative account, see especially von Hirsch 1993, ch.2; Duff 2001, chs. 1.4.4, 3.2; Bennett 2008; Markel 2011, 2012. For critical discussion, see Davis 1991; Boonin 2008: 171–80; Hanna 2008; Matravers 2011).

However, an obvious and crucial question faces any such justification of punishment as a communicative enterprise. Censure can be communicated through a formal conviction in a criminal court; or it could be communicated by some further formal denunciation issued by a judge or some other representative of the legal community, or by a system of purely symbolic punishments which were burdensome only in virtue of their censorial meaning. It can, of course, also be communicated by ‘hard treatment’ punishments of the kinds imposed by our courts—by imprisonment, by compulsory community service, by fines and the like, which are burdensome independently of their censorial meaning (on ‘hard treatment’, see Feinberg 1970): but why should we choose such methods of communication, rather than methods that do not involve hard treatment (see Christie 1981: 98–105)? Is it because they will make the communication more effective (see Falls 1987; Primoratz 1989; Kleinig 1991)? But why is it so important to make the communication effective—and is there not a serious danger that the hard treatment will conceal, rather than highlight, the moral censure it should communicate (see Mathiesen 1990: 58–73)?

One kind of answer to this question brings consequentialism and deterrence back into the picture: we should communicate censure through penal hard treatment because this will give those who are insufficiently impressed by the moral appeal of censure prudential reason to refrain from crime; because, that is, the prospect of such punishment might deter those who are not susceptible to moral persuasion. (See Lipkin 1988, Baker 1992. For a sophisticated revision of this idea, which makes deterrence firmly secondary to censure, see von Hirsch 1993, ch. 2; Narayan 1993: for critical discussion see Bottoms 1998; Duff 2001, ch. 3.3. For another subtle version of this kind of account, see Matravers 2000.) This kind of account differs from the side-constrained consequentialist accounts discussed earlier, since the (retributivist) imposition of deserved censure is now part of the positive justifying aim of punishment; and it can claim, in response to the Hegelian objection to deterrence, that it does not address potential offenders merely ‘like dogs’, since the law's initial appeal to the citizen is in the appropriate moral terms: the prudential, coercive reasons constituted by penal hard treatment as deterrence are relevant only to those who are deaf, or at least insufficiently attentive, to the law's moral appeal. It might be objected that on this account the law, in speaking to those who are not persuaded by its moral appeal, is still abandoning the attempt at moral communication in favour of the language of threats, and thus ceasing to address its citizens as responsible moral agents: to which it might be replied, first, that the law is addressing us, appropriately, as fallible moral agents who know that we need the additional spur of prudential deterrence to persuade us to act as we should; and second, that we cannot clearly separate the (merely) deterrent from the morally communicative dimensions of punishment—that the dissuasive efficacy of legitimate punishment still depends crucially on the moral meaning that the hard treatment is understood to convey.

A different answer to the ‘Why hard treatment?’ question explains penal hard treatment as an essential aspect of the enterprise of moral communication itself. Punishment, on this view, should aim not merely to communicate censure to the offender, but to persuade the offender to recognise and repent the wrong he has done, and so to recognise the need to reform himself and his future conduct, and to make apologetic reparation to those whom he wronged. His punishment then constitutes a kind of secular penance that he is required to undergo for his crime: its hard treatment aspects, the burden it imposes on him, should serve both to assist the process of repentance and reform, by focusing his attention on his crime and its implications, and as a way of making the apologetic reparation that he owes (see Duff 2001, 2011; see also Garvey 1999, 2003; Tudor 2001; Bennett 2008; for a sophisticated discussion see Tasioulas 2006). This kind of account has some relation to accounts that portray punishment as a kind of moral education (see H. Morris 1981; Hampton 1984; for criticism see Deigh 1984; Shafer-Landau 1991). It faces serious objections (see Bickenbach 1988; Ten 1990; von Hirsch 1999; Bagaric & Amarasekara 2000; von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005, ch. 7): in particular that it cannot show penal hard treatment to be a necessary aspect of a communicative enterprise which is still to respect offenders as responsible and rational agents who must be left free to remain unpersuaded; that apologetic reparation must be voluntary if it is to be of any real value; and that a liberal state should not take this kind of intrusive interest in its citizens' moral characters. We cannot discuss these objections here, but must turn to some themes in contemporary abolitionist thought (one of which can be connected to the communicative conception of punishment.

7. ‘Restorative Justice’and Restitution

Abolitionist theorising about punishment takes many different forms, united only by the insistence that we should seek to abolish, rather than merely to reform, our practices of punishment. (Classic abolitionist texts include Christie 1977, 1981; Hulsman 1986, 1991; de Haan 1990; Bianchi 1994; see also Golash 2005.) In this section we will attend to just two types of abolitionist theory.

Many abolitionists look to ‘restorative justice’ as an alternative to punishment. ('Restorative' practices and programmes also play an increasingly significant, although still somewhat marginal, role within the criminal process of trial and punishment; but our concern here is with restorative justice as an alternative to punishment.) The restorative justice movement has been growing in strength: although there are different and conflicting conceptions of what ‘restorative justice’ means or involves, one central theme is that what crime makes necessary is a process of reparation or restoration between offender, victim and other interested parties; and that this is achieved not through a criminal process of trial and punishment, but through mediation or reconciliation programmes that bring together the victim, offender and other interested parties to discuss what was done and how to deal with it (see generally Matthews 1988; Daly & Immarigeon 1998; von Hirsch & Ashworth 1998, ch. 7; Braithwaite 1999; Walgrave 2002; von Hirsch et al 2003; von Hirsch, Ashworth & Shearing 2005; London 2011; Johnstone 2011, 2012).

Now advocates of restorative justice often contrast it with ‘retributive’ justice, and argue that we should look for restoration rather than retribution or punishment, and seek to repair harms caused rather than to inflict punitive suffering for wrongs done. But it could be argued that this is a mistake. For when we ask what it is that requires ‘restoration’ or repair, the answer must refer not only to whatever material harm was caused by the crime, but to the wrong that was done: that was what fractured the relationship between offender and victim (and the broader community), and that is what must be recognised and ‘repaired’ or made up for if a genuine reconciliation is to be achieved. A restorative process that is to be appropriate to crime must therefore be one that seeks an adequate recognition, by the offender and by others, of the wrong done—a recognition that must for the offender, if genuine, be repentant; and that seeks an appropriate apologetic reparation for that wrong from the offender. But those are also the aims of punishment as a species of secular penance, as sketched above. A system of criminal punishment, however improved it might be (see s. 8 below), is of course not well designed to bring about the kind of personal reconciliations and transformations that advocates of restorative justice sometimes seek; but it could be apt to secure the kind of formal, ritualised reconciliation that is the most that a liberal state should try to secure between its citizens. If we focus only on imprisonment, which is still often the preferred mode of punishment in many penal systems, this suggestion will appear laughable; but if we think instead of punishments such as Community Service Orders (now part of what is called Community Payback) or probation, it might seem more plausible.

This argument does not, of course, support that account of punishment against its critics. What it might suggest, however, is that whilst we can learn much from the restorative justice movement, especially about the role that processes of mediation and reparation can play in our responses to crime, its aim should not be the abolition or replacement of punishment: ‘restoration’ is better understood, in this context, as the proper aim of punishment, not as an alternative to it (see further Duff 2001, ch. 3.4–6, but also Zedner 1994).

A similar issue is raised by the other kind of abolitionist theory that we should note here: the argument that we should replace punishment by a system of enforced restitution (see e.g., Barnett 1977; Boonin 2008: ch. 5—which also cites and discusses a number of objections to the theory). For we need to ask what restitution can amount to, what it should involve, if it is to constitute restitution not merely for any harm that might have been caused, but for the wrong that was done; and it is tempting to answer that restitution for a wrong must involve the kind of apologetic moral reparation, expressing a remorseful recognition of the wrong, that communicative punishment (on the view sketched above) aims to become.

More generally, advocates of restorative justice and of restitution are right to highlight the question of what offenders owe to those whom they have wronged—and to their fellow citizens (see also Tadros 2011 for a focus on the duties that offenders incur). Some penal theorists, however, especially those who connect punishment to apology, will reply that what offenders owe precisely includes accepting, undertaking, or undergoing punishment.

8. Further Issues

The previous sections sketched the central contemporary accounts of whether and how legal punishment can be justified—and some of the objections and difficulties that they face. A number of further important questions face any theory of punishment, which can only be noted here.

First, there are questions about sentencing. (On sentencing see generally Robinson 1987; Morris & Tonry 1990; von Hirsch 1993; Tonry 1996; von Hirsch & Ashworth 2005; Ashworth, von Hirsch and Roberts 2009; Frase 2012.) Who should decide what kinds and what levels of sentence should be attached to different offences or kinds of offence: what should be the respective roles of legislatures, of sentencing councils or commissions, of appellate courts, of trial judges, of juries? By what criteria should such decisions be made: how far should they be guided by a retributivist principle of proportionality, requiring punishments to be ‘proportionate’ in their severity to the seriousness of the crime; how far by consequentialist considerations of efficient crime-prevention? What kinds of punishment should be available to sentencers, and how should they decide which mode of punishment is appropriate for the particular offence (see e.g., Lippke 2007; considerations of the meaning of different modes of punishment should be central to this question)?

Second, there are questions about the relation between theory and practice—between the ideal, as portrayed by a normative theory of punishment, and the actualities of existing penal practice. Suppose we have come to believe, as a matter of normative theory, that a system of legal punishment could in principle be justified—that the abolitionist challenge can be met. It is, to put it mildly, unlikely that our normative theory of justified punishment will justify our existing penal institutions and practices: it is far more likely that such a theory will show our existing practices to be radically imperfect—that legal punishment as it is now imposed is far from meaning or achieving what it should mean or achieve if it is to be adequately justified. If our normative theorising is to be anything more than an empty intellectual exercise, if it is to engage with actual practice, we then face the question of what we can or should do about our current practices. The obvious answer is that we should strive so to reform them that they can be in practice justified, and that answer is certainly available to consequentialists, on the plausible assumption that maintaining our present practices, whilst also seeking their reform, is likely to do more good or less harm than abandoning them. But for retributivists who insist that punishment is justified only if it is just, and for communicative theorists who insist that punishment is just and justified only if it communicates an appropriate censure to those who deserve it, the matter is harder: for to maintain our present practices, even while seeking their radical reform, will be to maintain practices which perpetrate serious injustice (see Murphy 1973; Duff 2001, ch. 5).

Third, the relation between the ideal and the actual is especially problematic in the context of punishment partly because it involves the preconditions of just punishment. That is to say, what makes an actual system of punishment unjust(ified) might be not its own operations as such (what punishment is or achieves within that system), but the absence of certain political, legal and moral conditions on which the whole system depends for its legitimacy (see Duff 2001, ch. 5.2). For instance, a just system of criminal law must convict and punish only those who are responsible, in the sense of being answerable for their crimes: only those who have the capacities necessary to answer for their actions, who are bound by this criminal law, and who are answerable to the political community whose law it is and whose courts call them to answer. We can highlight some of the issues that arise here by noting that criminal punishment, at least or especially if it involves the kind of moral communication discussed in s. 6 above, must treat and address those who are punished as citizens—as full members of the polity by whose values they are both bound and protected. One question then is whether and how punishment itself can achieve this: can it reaffirm, or at least be consistent with, a recognition of fellow citizenship (compare Garland 2001, on criminologies ‘of the self’ and ‘of the other’)? Another question, concerning the preconditions of punishment, is whether those who appear before the criminal courts have been treated as citizens by the polity that now seeks to call them to account for their wrongdoing, and what the implications are if they have not. There is much work to be done in spelling out such preconditions of just punishment: but it is at least arguable that they are far from satisfied for many of those who are convicted and punished by our own systems of criminal justice (see Heffernan & Kleinig 2000). To the extent that they are not satisfied, however, those systems lack legitimacy, and the punishments they inflict are unjustified. This conclusion should not surprise us: but it challenges any comfortable assumption that we can support and rely on our existing systems of criminal justice with a clear conscience.

Fourth, theorists of punishment should also attend to various kinds of coercive measure that can be imposed on those who have committed, or are thought likely to commit, crimes: these include, for instance, the kinds of formally non-punitive ‘measure’ (including detention) that can be imposed on offenders in the Netherlands and other European countries (see de Keijer 2012); the provisions that many countries have for continued ‘civil’ detention, after the end of their formal punishment, for offenders judged to be dangerous (see e.g., Ramsay 2012); and the many kinds of restriction that may be imposed on people suspected of involvement in terrorism. Such measures might not be formally classed as punishments (one effect of which is that they often escape the constraints of justice and proportionality to which punishment is subject), and are avowedly imposed for ‘preventive’ rather than ‘punitive’ purposes: but as modes of state coercion, aimed at the prevention of future crimes, they clearly fall within the same normative field as punishment, and are as much in need of critical theorising as are our formally punitive institutions and practices (see Ashworth and Zedner 2011, 2012; Ashworth, Zedner and Tomlin 2013).

Finally, theoretical discussions of criminal punishment and its justification typically focus, as this discussion has focused, on criminal punishment in the context of domestic criminal law. But a theory of punishment must also have something to say about its aims and justification in the context of international criminal law—about how we should understand, and whether and how we can justify, the punishments imposed by such tribunals as the International Criminal Court: for we cannot assume that a normative theory of domestic criminal punishment can simply be read across into the context of international criminal law. That, however, is a topic that we cannot tackle here (see Drumbl 2007).

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