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Interpretation and Coherence in Legal Reasoning
The subject of legal reasoning appears to occupy the more practical end of the spectrum of jurisprudential theorising. Surely if anything matters in our attempts to understand law, it matters how judges do and/or should decide cases, and that we have an account which adequately explains and can perhaps be used to guide or justify their activities. The recent history of legal philosophy abounds with many and various attempts to address these issues and others which have been viewed as falling within the ambit of legal reasoning. Is legal reasoning an activity which is exclusive to the adjudicative institutions of legal systems or is any reasoning about the law to be regarded as legal reasoning, no matter where or by whom it is undertaken? Does legal reasoning take on a special character when it is undertaken in courts and by judges? Are there special methods or modes of reasoning which are unique to or at least distinctive of the law, or is legal reasoning just like reasoning in any other sphere of human activity, distinctive only in the subject matter to which it is applied? This last question is particularly relevant to present concerns, as it is one task of this entry to discuss various views concerning whether and to what extent interpretation and coherence have a special role to play in legal reasoning, because of the nature of law itself.
After a brief clarificatory consideration of the ambit of the term, ‘legal reasoning’, the entry deals first with interpretation and then with coherence, and discusses various views concerning these concepts and their relevance for law. Throughout, the discussion focuses upon the role which interpretation and coherence play within legal reasoning, and the reasons why these concepts are regarded by some as being distinctive of reasoning about the law.
- What Do Legal Theorists Mean By ‘Legal Reasoning’?
- 2. The Role of Interpretation in Legal Reasoning:
- 3. The Role of Coherence in Legal Reasoning:
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This may seem like an easy question, for surely legal reasoning is simply reasoning about the law, or about how judges should decide cases. On closer inspection, however, our ease may evaporate, for both of these formulations are ambiguous, at least according to some ways of thinking about the law. Some legal theorists regard the questions, ‘what is the law?’, and ‘how should judges decide cases?’ as distinct questions with distinct answers (see e.g. Hart 1994; Kelsen 1967; Raz 1979 & 1994). That is to say, their accounts of law and their accounts of adjudication are not one and the same, and they contend that in settling disputes which come before them, the remit of judges is wider than merely trying to establish what the law is as regards the issues in the case at hand. In adjudication, such theorists claim, extra-legal considerations can come into play, and judges may have discretion to modify existing law or to fill in gaps where existing law is indeterminate. This being so, for some legal theorists, the first formulation above, that legal reasoning is reasoning about the law, is ambiguous between: (a) reasoning to establish the content of the law as it presently exists, and (b) reasoning from that content to the decision which a court should reach in a case which comes before it.
Moreover, the second formulation of the ambit of legal reasoning given above, i.e. that legal reasoning is about how judges should decide cases, is also ambiguous on some approaches to legal theory. This is because the answer to the question, “how should a court decide a case, reasoning from the existing law applicable to it?” (i.e. legal reasoning in the sense given in (b) above) and the answer to the question, “how should a court decide a case, all things considered?”, may sometimes come apart. A particular instance might be the kind of situation which could arise for a judge in a ‘wicked’ legal system where the law on some issue is so morally odious that, all things considered, the judge should not decide the case according to the law at all, but rather should refuse to apply the law (see Hart 1958; Hart 1994, chapter 9, section 3; Raz 1994, essay 14. This possibility is also noted by Dworkin 1986, chapter 3, 101–108, in discussing whether the Nazis had law).
There are thus three things (at least, there may be others) which legal theorists could mean by legal reasoning: (a) reasoning to establish the existing content of the law on a given issue, (b) reasoning from the existing content of the law to the decision which a court should reach in a case involving that issue which comes before it, and (c) reasoning about the decision which a court should reach in a case, all things considered.
It should be noted that some legal theorists, most notably for present purposes Ronald Dworkin, do not carve up the questions and issues on this topic in the way outlined above. For Dworkin, when judges decide a case according to law, they do no more than ascertain the content of the law and apply it to the facts of the case. In other words, judges never resort to extra-legal considerations in deciding cases according to law: all the considerations which they are entitled to take into account are part of the law. This means that, according to Dworkin, when judges reason about the law in sense (b), what they are doing amounts to no more nor less than reasoning about the law in sense (a), i.e. reasoning to establish the content of the law (see Dworkin 1977 & 1986).
This entry is concerned with legal reasoning in senses (a) and (b), and with sense (b) in particular. It should be noted that the discussion does not directly address the different accounts of the nature and limits of law which are revealed by those varying views mentioned above regarding what it is that judges do when they reason about the law in sense (b). Where such differences have a bearing upon issues pertaining to the role of interpretation and coherence in legal reasoning, they will be mentioned in the text. For further discussion of the nature and limits of law, see various entries under nature of law in this volume.
Recent interest in the role of interpretation in legal reasoning springs from several sources. For some, interpretation is where we should look in order to find the solution, or at least the only possible response, to the problem of linguistic indeterminacy in law which they perceive (in turn, renewed interest in the problems of linguistic indeterminacy in law seems to have stemmed at least in part from the resurgence in the last twenty years in scholarship addressing Wittgenstein's remarks on rule-following in the Philosophical Investigations (see e.g. Holtzman & Leich (eds.) 1981; Kripke 1982; Baker & Hacker, 1984 & 1985), and the migration of these concerns from philosophy of language into philosophy of law (see e.g. Marmor 1992 and the revised edition of that work, Marmor 2005; Stone 1995; Smith 1990). Certain aspects of this trend, most notably that of academic lawyers employing ill-digested Wittgenstein to dubious ends, are criticised by Bix 1993). According to this line of thinking, if words, and legal rules composed of words, have no intrinsic meaning and hence cannot, in and of themselves, constrain legal reasoning, then it must be we—readers or interpreters—who supply such meaning via the process of interpretation (see Fish 1989; Cornell 1992. Stone 1995 criticises this understanding of the role of interpretation in legal reasoning, but notes its adoption by various legal theorists). In the case of other theorists, interest in this topic stems from a wish to investigate the parallels and divergences between interpretation in law and interpretation in literature (Levinson 1982; Dworkin 1985; Fish 1989). The arrival on the jurisprudential scene in the mid-1980s of Ronald Dworkin's powerful new account of law as an interpretive concept, with concomitant implications for the activities of both judges and legal theorists (see Dworkin 1986) also did much to contribute to interest in the role of interpretation in legal reasoning. Moreover, this account seemed to rouse Dworkin's legal positivist adversaries into elaborating more fully upon something which he has always claimed has been seriously underdeveloped in their work (see e.g. Dworkin 1977), namely an account of the nature of adjudication, and of the role of interpretation within it (Marmor 1992 & 2005; Raz 1995; Raz 1996a & 1996b). Recent scholarship in constitutional theory concerning the distinctive challenges posed by the interpretation of constitutions has also helped fuel continuing interest in the topic of interpretation in legal reasoning (see, for example, Bobbit 1991 & 1996; Raz 1998b; Rubenfeld 1998; Kavanagh 2002, 2003 & 2009 part I; Sager 2004; Marmor 2005 ch. 9, Waluchow 2006 and the entry constitutionalism). In some jurisdictions academic and public interest in interpretation in legal reasoning may have been sparked by changes in particular legal arrangements: for example, as a result of the enactment of the Human Rights Acts 1998 in the United Kingdom with its section 3 duty to read and give effect to primary and subordinate legislation in a way which is compatible with European Convention rights, or as a result of the doctrine of consistent interpretation or indirect effect developed by the European Court of Justice, requiring European Union Member States' courts to interpret domestic law so that it is consistent with EU law, so far as it is possible to do so.
As might be expected, as a result of these different (although often intertwining) intellectual backgrounds and sources of interest in interpretation, legal theorists approach this subject with very different questions and concerns to which they give concomitantly different answers. For all this, however, a surprising number of legal theorists agree—at least at an abstract level—about one central characteristic of interpretation, namely that interpretation is a Janus-faced concept, encompassing both a backward-looking conserving component, and a forward-looking creative one. In other words, an interpretation of something is an interpretation of something—it presupposes that there is a something, or an original, there to be interpreted, and to which any valid interpretation must be faithful to some extent, thus differentiating interpretation from pure invention—but it is also an interpretation of something, i.e. an attempt not merely to reproduce but to make something of or bring something out of an original. (See e.g. Fiss 1982; Dworkin 1986; Marmor 1992 & 2005; Endicott 1994; Raz 1996b & 1996c.)
Much jurisprudential writing on interpretation in legal reasoning is concerned with how to strike the right balance between the conserving and creative elements in interpretation, and with the constraints which are and/or should be operative upon judges as they undertake this balancing act. Some theorists claim that such concerns about how one ought to interpret the law indicate that it is part of the way that we think about this practice that we regard rival interpretations as subject to objective evaluation as good or bad, better or worse, correct or incorrect (Dworkin 1986; Raz 1996b and 1996c). On this view, characterisations of interpretation which attempt to impugn the objectivity of such evaluations (e.g. Levinson 1982) are to be understood as revisionist accounts which attempt to persuade us that all is not as it appears to be with our practice of judging interpretations to be good or bad, better or worse, correct or incorrect as we currently understand it (see e.g. Raz 1996b).
It is important to consider how interpretation, as characterised in subsection 2.2 above, fits into the discussion of the ambit of the term legal reasoning in the opening section of this entry. The key to this issue lies in interpretation's dualistic nature, i.e. that it has both a backward-looking conserving aspect and a forward-looking creative one. This dualism would seem to indicate that in interpreting the law, judges both seek to capture and be faithful to the content of the law as it currently exists, and to supplement, modify, or bring out something new in the law, in the course of reasoning from the content of the law to a decision in a particular case. In turn, this would seem to indicate that interpretation, because of its dualistic nature, has a role to play in both legal reasoning in sense (a), i.e. reasoning to establish the existing content of the law on a given issue, and legal reasoning in sense (b), namely reasoning from the existing content of the law to the decision which a court should reach in a case involving that issue which comes before it.
One legal theorist who adopts exactly this approach, and so views interpretation in legal reasoning as ‘straddling the divide’ between identifying existing law, and developing and modifying the law, is Joseph Raz (see Raz 1996a and 1996b). According to Raz, the fact that interpretation has a role to play in both of these activities assists in explaining why we do not find a two-stage or clearly bifurcated approach to legal reasoning in judicial decisions. Judges do not first of all engage in legal reasoning in sense (a), having recourse only to legal materials, and then, having established what the existing law is and determined how far it can take them in resolving the instant case, then move on to a separate stage of legal reasoning in sense (b) which requires them to look to extra-legal materials in order to complete the job, because much of their reasoning is interpretive and interpretation straddles the divide between legal reasoning in senses (a) and (b). This point may assist Raz in defusing some of the criticisms which have been levelled at the legal positivist approach to legal reasoning such as that positivism's account is phenomenologically inaccurate because when we examine cases, we do not find two distinct stages to judicial reasoning, one to establish whether any legal rules bear upon the problem at hand, and one wherein judges effectively legislate to fill in the gaps when the legal rules ‘run out’ (see e.g. Dworkin 1977 & 1986). As Raz himself notes, however (especially in Raz 1996b), this ‘straddling the divide’ approach may in fact seem to undermine the very ideas that there is a tenable distinction between legal reasoning in senses (a) and (b), and that there are gaps in the law. Interpretation appears to blur or even erase the line between the separate law-finding and law-creating roles which many legal positivists ascribe to judges, and the fact that courts always seem to be able to decide cases by interpreting the law may also seem to cast doubt on the idea that the law is incomplete, and hence that judges sometimes have to reach outside of the law in the adjudication process. Interest in the pervasiveness of interpretation in legal reasoning, and in the Janus-faced nature of interpretation may thus form part of the background which has led legal theorists like Dworkin to deny that the distinction between identifying existing law, and developing and changing the law, as understood by certain legal positivists, is a tenable or coherent one. That interpretation appears to operate at every stage in the legal reasoning process may also have influenced Dworkin's denial that there are gaps in the law, and his counter-claim, contra Hart and Raz, that everything which a judge is entitled to rely on in deciding a case is already part of the law (see Dworkin 1986).
Legal theorists disagree about the proper characterisation of many aspects of the schematic account of the interpretive process given in subsections 2.2 and 2.3 above. A few of these disagreements will be surveyed here in order to give a fuller picture of some of the issues and views which are relevant to this topic. Accounts of the role of interpretation in legal reasoning, then, differ regarding the following matters (n.b. several of the following points overlap to some extent):
(1) What exactly is the original or object which is being interpreted in the case of law: the law as a whole?; certain aspects of legal practice?; statutes?; judicial decisions?; authoritative legal decisions?; legal texts? Raz 1996b claims that the primary objects of interpretation are the decisions of legal authorities. He reaches this conclusion as a result of his view that law is an institutionalised normative system wherein the institutions concerned operate by issuing purportedly authoritative directives concerning what ought to be done. According to Raz, then, the central role which authority plays in law means that when we come to interpret the law, what we are primarily seeking to do is to establish the existence and meaning of any purportedly authoritative directives of legal institutions, and it is, therefore, the decisions of those institutions which constitute the originals to be interpreted in the case of law. (See further the discussion of Raz's views in subsection 2.5 below). This stance can be contrasted with that adopted by Ronald Dworkin. The process of ‘constructive interpretation’ (Dworkin 1986, and see also the entry interpretivist theories of law) which plays such a central role in Dworkin's jurisprudential thought involves interpreters, ‘imposing purpose on an object or practice in order to make of it the best possible example of the form or genre to which it is taken to belong.’ (Dworkin 1986, p52). Moreover, in the case of legal interpretation, Dworkin appears to settle for the argumentative social practice of law as the original to be interpreted (Dworkin 1986, p63). This being so, for Dworkin, the object of legal interpretation appears to be broader than that adopted by Raz. For Raz, we interpret in order to establish whether any authoritative legal directives are currently in force and bear upon the legal issue at hand, and so we should look to the decisions establishing those directives in getting the interpretive process off the ground. Dworkinian interpretation, however, seems to have a more abstract and global feel to it, in the sense that it is the social practice of law as a whole (Dworkin 1986, 87–88), including the entire legal history of a given jurisdiction, as well as any data speaking to the point or purpose of legal practice in general, which constitutes the original to be interpreted.
(2) How much emphasis is to be placed on the conserving vs. the creative elements in interpretation? At the conserving extreme, we find accounts such as ‘originalism’ in US constitutional interpretation which claims that in interpreting a particular provision of the Constitution, judges should seek to establish the way in which the provision was originally understood by those who ratified it (see e.g. Bork 1990). As close as possible conformity with those original intentions thus furnishes us with the standard of correctness in constitutional interpretation on this approach. According to Bork 1990, adherence to originalism in US constitutional interpretation is necessary to ensure that the judiciary confines itself to its proper sphere of authority, thus preserving the separation of powers and structure of government in the form in which the founders of the US intended. Ronald Dworkin has recently addressed directly the topic of originalism in US Constitutional Interpretation and has argued that fidelity to the Constitution's text does not exhaust constitutional interpretation, and that the search for constitutional integrity (see further point 6 below, and the section on Coherence in Legal Reasoning) might require interpreters to depart from the best interpretation of the constitutional text considered apart from the history of its enforcement (Dworkin 2006, ch.5). Accounts such as that offered by Levinson (1982) are at the other end of the spectrum: they reject originalism and give far more weight to the role of innovation in legal interpretation. Indeed, Levinson contends that all US constitutional interpretation is necessarily creative, due to radical and pervasive linguistic indeterminacy in the law. If such approaches wish to claim that there are standards by which we can judge interpretations to be better or worse, correct or incorrect, then they must find such standards other than in the conserving aspect of interpretation, as the requirement that one be faithful to the meaning of an original seems to be obliterated on such views. As was noted at the end of subsection 2.2 above, some such views may wish to claim that our practice of accounting interpretations as good or bad, correct or incorrect is incoherent. One other possibility, however, is that the notion of ‘correctness’ can be salvaged by being pegged to the communal reactions of the relevant interpretive community; our interpretations are the right ones when they accord sufficiently with those of our similarly situated fellow interpreters (see e.g. Kripke 1982 and those works discussed in point (3) below). Some commentators have poured scorn on the idea that this sort of approach could yield standards of correctness worthy of the name. See for example Baker & Hacker 1984, who contend that Kripke's position amounts to the view that, ‘an unjustified stab in the dark is unobjectionable as long as it is made in good company.’ (Baker and Hacker 1982, 81–82).
(3) Following on from point (2) above: how big a role does the requirement that judges must be faithful to an original play in constraining legal interpretation, and are there any additional constraints which supplement the constraints generated by the need to be faithful to an original which guide judges as they interpret the law? For example, for Owen Fiss (1982), ‘disciplining rules’ in the form of those standards which are constitutive of the profession of judging supply constraints upon judicial interpretation which supplement the rules of language which already constrain all language users in their attempts to understand texts. According to Fiss, then, judges are constrained both by the need to be faithful to the original legal text which they are interpreting, and by supplementary norms of interpretation which are constitutive of the judicial role (Fiss lists the requirement that judges must always consult history when interpreting the law as an example of a ‘disciplining rule’). Fiss' view is criticised by Stanley Fish (1989), who contends that Fiss' ‘disciplining rules’ would themselves require interpretation in order for judges to know what they mean and require of them, and hence cannot supply constraints upon judicial interpretation. Fish's contention that all potential candidates which might constrain interpretation are themselves susceptible to being interpreted in a variety of ways results in his claiming that texts or originals cannot constrain judges at all in the way in which is commonly supposed, as texts do not have meanings in advance of particular interpretations of them. This seemingly radical indeterminacy is deceptive, however, for although Fish removes the constraints on interpretation provided by legal texts or supplementary norms of the judicial profession, he replaces them with the conditioning and training processes of ‘interpretive communities’, which ensure that, ‘…readers are already and always thinking within the norms, standards, criteria of evidence, purposes and goals of a shared enterprise’, such that, ‘the meanings available to them have been preselected by their professional training.’ (Fish 1989, 133).
(4) Whether or not it is possible to have a general theory of interpretation. Raz 1996a rejects the possibility of two types of general theories of interpretation: ‘operational’ or recipe-like theories which are designed to guide judges to the right decision in a case which comes before them, and theories which, although they may not aim to guide judges to the correct decision, nonetheless claim to provide us with criteria via which to distinguish good interpretations from bad, and so enable us to check the correctness of decisions which have been made. According to Raz, theories of the former kind are impossible because morality (to which recourse must be had as regards the innovative aspect of legal interpretation) is not susceptible to explanation via ‘operational’ theories, i.e., ‘theories which would enable a person whose moral understanding and judgement are suspect to come to the right moral conclusions regarding situations he may face by consulting the theory.’ (Raz 1996a, p21. In this he follows similar claims made by several contemporary moral philosophers, e.g. Williams 1985; Dancy 1993). Moreover, claims Raz, theories which purport to tell us how to differentiate good interpretations from bad are also impossible because, by its very nature, innovation defies generalisation, such that it is futile to attempt to construct a general theory which differentiates good interpretations from bad as regards the forward-looking aspect of interpretation. It should be noted that (as is apparent from the discussions in this entry as a whole), Raz does believe that it is possible to have an account which explains certain aspects of the nature and role of interpretation in legal reasoning; what he doubts is that it is possible to have a certain kind of account of interpretation, namely an account in the form of a theory which purports either to operate as a recipe for concocting good interpretations, or to provide us with a general account of how to evaluate interpretations as good or bad, right or wrong (on this point see also Raz 2009 essay 12 section IX).
Ronald Dworkin, by contrast, does purport to offer judges a general theory of legal interpretation which they can use to guide their interpretive activities, and which, if followed correctly, will lead them to the ‘one right answer’ in the case before them (on Dworkin's ‘one right answer’ thesis, see further point (7) below). For Dworkin, it is the aim of all legal interpretation to ‘constructively interpret’ the social practice of law, by imposing purpose upon it such as, ‘to make of it the best possible example of the form or genre to which it is taken to belong.’ (Dworkin 1986, p52). The more specific theory which he believes that judges should follow in fulfilling this task—‘law as integrity’—‘instructs judges to identify legal rights and duties, so far as possible, on the assumption that they were created by a single author—the community personified’ (see subsections 2.5 and 3.4, and the entry interpretivist theories of law). It should be noted, however, that while Dworkin's general theory of interpretation is designed to assist in guiding judges to the one right answer in a case which comes before them, he claims that it is not recipe-like in the sense of providing judges with a detailed step by step programme for correct judicial decision-making: ‘I have not devised an algorithm for the courtroom. No electronic magician could design from my arguments a computer program that would supply a verdict everyone would accept once the facts of the case and the text of all past statutes and judicial decisions were put at the computer's disposal’ (Dworkin 1986, p. 412).
Dworkin's pro-theory stance has attracted criticism from a variety of quarters. Fish (1989, essays 4, 5 and 16) claims that ‘law as integrity’ is not a theory which judges can use to guide their interpretive activities because it is a strategy which they cannot help but put into practice, and to which they are always and already committed simply in virtue of their membership in the judicial interpretive community. Sunstein 1996 also warns against the kind of ‘high-level theories’ which Dworkin instructs judges to construct and follow in deciding cases. Sunstein is suspicious of the value of such theorising on the grounds that, ‘it takes too much time and may be unnecessary; because it may go wrong insofar as it operates without close reference to actual cases; because it often prevents people from getting along at all; and because general theorizing can seem or be disrespectful insofar as it forces people to contend, unnecessarily, over their deepest and most defining moral commitments.’ (Sunstein 1996, p50). Instead, Sunstein advocates a special role for ‘incompletely theorized agreements’ in judicial decision-making. Such agreements can occur where judges agree on the outcomes of individual cases even though they disagree on which general theory best accounts for those outcomes, or agree on a general principle, but not on what that principle requires in particular cases, or agree on a ‘mid-level’ principle (see Sunstein 1996, p36) but disagree about both the general theory underlying it and particular cases falling under it. Sunstein regards incompletely theorised agreements as vital to legal reasoning, because they allow the diverse individuals who constitute the judiciary to agree on outcomes against the background of certain institutional constraints such as that they have, ‘a weak democratic pedigree and limited fact-finding capacity’ (Sunstein 1996, p6), must make many decisions, make them fairly quickly, show adequate respect, to litigants, and to each other, and avoid error insofar as is possible. Sunstein presents a strong case for the role of incompletely theorised agreements in law in general, pointing out that the institution of such agreements is one of the most important social functions of legal rules, as rules are capable of allowing agreement in the face of disagreement, in the sense that sometimes judges can agree on outcomes to cases governed by a rule whilst disagreeing about the rule's justification (on this important function of legal rules see also Raz 2001).
(5) Whether or not interpretation is always of something which to some extent already has meaning, or whether interpretation is the fundamental determinant of the meaning of linguistic expressions in, for example, legal texts. Marmor 1992, 2005 & Stone 1995 deny that interpretation is the fundamental determinant of the meaning of linguistic expressions and contend that, following a certain reading of Wittgenstein's remarks on rule-following (namely the kind of reading offered by McDowell 1984 and Baker and Hacker 1985), it must be possible for us to grasp the meaning of, for example, a legal rule, in a way which does not require recourse to interpretation. Cornell 1992 & Fish 1989 deny this, and contend that interpretation is all-pervasive, and is the fundamental and inescapable determinant of meaning, ‘all the way down’, in all cases. In the minds of some legal theorists at least, this point has strong links with with the issue of linguistic indeterminacy in law mentioned in subsection 2.1 above (see e.g. Fish 1989; Cornell 1992). Those theorists who contend that interpretation is the fundamental determinant of the meaning of linguistic expressions often claim that such interpretation is necessary because legal rules expressed in language do not have determinate meanings and hence cannot determine their own correct application; in John McDowell's terminology, those rules, by themselves, cannot have ‘normative reach.’ (McDowell 1984 & 1992). This being the case, so this line of thinking goes, interpretation is required in order to bridge the gap between the inert legal rule and the situations to which it applies. For these theorists, the pertinent issue then becomes: how do we know that one interpretation rather than another is in accordance with the rule, if the rule itself cannot determine its own correct application? As Wittgenstein notes in his remarks on rule-following, it seems that: ‘ ‘Whatever I do is, on some interpretation, in accord with the rule’’, such that we can, ‘…give one interpretation after another; as if each one contented us at least for a moment, until we thought of yet another standing behind it.’ (Wittgenstein 1967, §198 and §201 respectively). Some theorists, e.g. Fish 1989, seem to embrace this potential infinite regress of alternative interpretations of rules (see also point (3) above) and attempt to avoid the radical linguistic indeterminacy which it seems to entail by replacing the standards of correctness demarcated by rules with the conditioning and training processes of interpretive communities. For theorists like Marmor (1992 & 2005) and Stone (1995) who deny that interpretation is the fundamental determinant of the meaning of linguistic expressions, the Wittgensteinian challenge is seen as a kind of reductio ad absurdum which indicates that we have gone astray in our understanding of how rules operate. Such theorists seek to avoid linguistic indeterminacy, and reject interpretation as the fundamental determinant of meaning by denying that there is a gap which needs to be bridged between grasping a rule and understanding those actions which it requires. As was noted above, this denial usually proceeds via a non-sceptical reading of Wittgenstein's remarks on rule-following, along the lines of that offered by McDowell 1984 and Baker and Hacker 1985.
(6) Which values judges should attempt to realise in legal interpretation, and how those values are to be balanced against one another. One debate on this issue is that between Dworkin (1986), who champions the role of the value of integrity in interpreting the law, and those who, like Raz (1994a), and Réaume (1989), doubt whether Dworkinian integrity is a value which should be pursued in legal interpretation. The value of coherence in legal reasoning is addressed further in Section 3 of this entry.
(7) Whether interpretation in legal reasoning can lead judges to the ‘one right answer’ as regards the legal issue at hand. For example, Finnis 1987 denies that it is possible for interpretation in legal reasoning to lead judges to one right answer in the sense claimed in Dworkin 1986, because of pervasive incommensurabilities in the criteria by reference to which we are supposed to adjudge one interpretation to be better than another. Finnis argues, contra Dworkin, that while we should seek good answers and avoid bad ones, we should not delude ourselves into dreaming of uniquely correct answers to issues of legal interpretation, for to do so commits us to, ‘utilitarianism's deepest and most flawed assumption: the assumption of the commensurability of basic goods and thus of the states of affairs which instantiate them.’ (Finnis 1987, p. 375). Dworkin (1986 & 1991) remains firmly committed to the one right answer thesis, although it should be noted that in Dworkin 1986 chapter 11 he makes the point that in a sense there can be different ‘right answers’ for different interpreters: ‘For every route that Hercules took from that general conception to a particular verdict, another lawyer or judge who began in the same conception would find a different route and end in a different place, as several of the judges in our sample cases did. He would end differently because he would take leave of Hercules, following his own lights, at some branching point sooner or later in the argument.’ (Dworkin, 1986, p. 412). Raz 2009 contends that interpretive pluralism is a basic feature of the concept of interpretation as we understand it, i.e. that there can be several different and incompatible interpretations of the same object, all of which can be good.
The points of disagreement surveyed above speak to differing views regarding how judges should go about interpreting the law, and how we should understand their activities. Such concerns, however, do not directly address the important question of whether there is something about the nature of law which makes it either desirable or necessary that interpretation should play a role in legal reasoning in the first place. In other words: why is legal reasoning interpretive at all?
Raz 1996c contends that while some conventions of legal interpretation vary according to time and place, there are other features which legal interpretation necessarily exhibits, owing to the nature of law itself. While we can debate about the desirability of conventions of interpretation falling into the former category (e.g. we can consider the value of allowing the work of legal academics, or records of Parliamentary debates to serve as aids to interpretation in a particular jurisdiction), the latter category of features leave us no room for manoeuvre: courts cannot help but have recourse to them in interpreting the law. According to Raz, assigning a limited role to the intentions of legislators in the interpretation of legislation is one such necessary feature of legal interpretation. It is, he claims, simply part of our way of thinking about legislative institutions that their procedures and modes of operation are designed so as to allow legislators to make the law which they intend to make. To assume otherwise, Raz contends, is to render unintelligible any possible justification for entrusting law-making powers to those institutions. This being so, when judges come to interpret the decisions of legislative institutions, they must do so such that the law thus interpreted reflects the intentions of those who made it.
These considerations may also seem to speak mainly to the issue of how we are to go about interpreting aspects of the law. However, the reasons why it is important to pay attention to the intentions of law-making institutions when we interpret the law also furnish us with Raz's answer to the question of why legal reasoning is interpretive at all. We pay attention to the intentions of law-making institutions because it is important to establish which legal rules those institutions have laid down, and what they mean. In turn, it is important to establish the existence and meaning of legal rules laid down by law-making institutions because of law's purportedly authoritative nature. For Raz, legal institutions claim to express binding and authoritative judgements regarding what ought to be done which are designed to allow people to better conform to reason if they follow the decisions of the authority than if they try to follow those other reasons which apply to them directly (see Raz 1994, ch.10). In deciding cases according to law, then, we have a responsibility to try to establish the existence and meaning of any purportedly authoritatively binding legal rules which have a bearing on the situation under consideration, and we do so by interpreting the decisions of law-making institutions in a way which accords with the intentions of those institutions in making the decisions in question. For Raz, then, it is the authoritative nature of law which explains why legal reasoning is interpretive, whereas, for example, moral reasoning is not. Law, unlike morality, stems from social sources (on the role of social sources in understanding law, see Raz 1979 and the entry on legal positivism), from institutions issuing purportedly authoritative directives which claim to express a binding judgement about what ought to be done. Part of our task in reasoning about the law is thus to establish the existence and meaning of those directives, and, in order to do so, we must interpret the decisions of law-making institutions in accordance with the intentions of the law-makers in order to try to establish the content and meaning of the law which they intended to make (see also Raz 1996a and 1996b).
It is interesting to compare Raz's stance on the reasons why legal reasoning is necessarily interpretive with Ronald Dworkin's views on this topic. Rather than being based on the view that in ascertaining the content and meaning of the law, we should look to authoritative social sources, Dworkin's contention that legal reasoning is necessarily interpretive rests on an account of law which expressly repudiates the Razian understanding of law as source-based. According to Dworkin, the view that law is to be identified by reference to authoritative social sources yields a grossly inadequate account of the argumentative nature of legal practice, and of the nature and depth of disagreement within it (see Dworkin 1986 ch.1). He contends that an adequate account of these features of legal practice can only be gained when we understand that law is an interpretive concept, i.e. that it is a social practice wherein a certain interpretive attitude has taken hold. The attitude in question comprises two components: the assumption that the practice does not merely exist, but has a purpose or point, and the further assumption that the rules of the practice are not necessarily what they have always been taken to be, but rather are sensitive to, and can be revised in light of, its point (Dworkin 1986 ch.2; also, the entry on interpretivist theories of law). For Dworkin, then, it is these features of the social practice of law: that members of that practice dispute and disagree about what the best interpretation of the rules of the practice are, in light of its point, which dictate that legal reasoning is necessarily interpretive. Once the interpretive attitude has taken hold amongst the participants in a social practice, the only way to understand it adequately is to do as the participants in that practice do: i.e. join the practice and make the same kind of interpretive claims concerning the point of the practice, and what the rules of it are in light of that point, as they do. For Dworkin, this point holds good for the activities of judges and legal theorists alike: anyone reasoning about the law is required to treat it as an interpretive social practice and offer interpretations of what it requires in light of the purpose or point which they assign to it.
As several commentators have noted (see Kress 1984; Marmor 1992; Raz 1994a), coherence theories, long influential in other areas of philosophy (see, for example, the entries on the coherence theory of truth and coherentist theories of epistemic justification) have more recently found their way into the philosophy of law (for a general survey of coherence theories in law which also considers them in the context of coherence theories of truth, justified belief, ethics and justice, see Kress 1996). While this migration may be attributed in part to the frequent influence of the general philosophical climate upon the intellectual weather systems of jurisprudential theorising, it also makes sense to ask whether there is something about the nature of law which makes it particularly ripe for explanation via coherence accounts. For example, those commentators who view Ronald Dworkin's theory of law as integrity as a coherence account appear to answer this question in the affirmative (see e.g. Kress 1984; Hurley 1989): coherence, in the sense of interpreting the law as speaking with one voice as integrity requires, is a value which is supposed to have special relevance in the legal realm, in terms of the role which it should play in guiding judges seeking to interpret the law correctly. It has also been noted that features of the law such as the doctrine of precedent, arguments from analogy, and the requirement that like cases be treated alike seem particularly apt to be illuminated via some kind of coherence explanation. (See Kress 1984. Raz 1994a notes the temptation here, but contends that there is nothing inherent in arguments from analogy or in the requirement that like cases be treated alike which demands that they be understood in terms of a coherence account of adjudication. On the role of arguments from analogy in legal reasoning more generally, see Weinreb 2005, and also the entry precedent and analogy in legal reasoning.) Moreover, the idea of coherence as a special virtue of interpretation in legal reasoning plays an important role in the work of several major continental legal philosophers (see e.g. Peczenik 1989; Alexy 1989; Aarnio 1987; Alexy & Peczenik 1990).
The following discussion attempts to explore some of these issues concerning whether and why considerations of coherence have an important role to play in understanding law. As this entry seeks to illuminate the role of coherence in legal reasoning, the emphasis here is on coherence accounts of adjudication, and on examining the role which coherence plays in courts' reasoning about how to decide cases according to law. This being so, this part of the entry discusses legal reasoning in the sense outlined in formulation (b) in Section 1 ("What Do Legal Theorists Mean By ‘Legal Reasoning’?"), i.e. reasoning from the content of the existing law on a given issue to the decision which a court should reach in a case involving that issue which comes before it.
Two central questions must be addressed in considering the role of coherence in legal reasoning: what is the nature of the coherence relation which features in coherence accounts of adjudication, and what role does coherence play in explaining or justifying judicial decisions in such accounts?
Amongst those legal theorists taking an interest in the role of coherence in legal reasoning, there is general agreement both that the coherence in question must amount to more than logical consistency amongst propositions (see Kress 1984; MacCormick 1984; Marmor 1992 & 2005; Alexy & Peczenik 1990) and that it is not clear from many coherence accounts exactly what this something more amounts to (see Kress 1984; Peczenik 1989; Marmor 1992). MacCormick 1984 views coherence in terms of unity of principle in a legal system, contending that the coherence of a set of legal norms consists in their being related either in virtue of being the realisation of some common value or values, or in virtue of fulfilling some common principle or principles. Raz 1994a also characterises coherence in law in terms of unity of principle. On his view, the more unified the set of principles underlying those court decisions and legislative acts which make up the law, the more coherent law is.
Other writers have attempted to supply a more formal definition of, for example, a minimally coherent legal system (see Levenbook 1984), or otherwise to flesh out in a more detailed manner the criteria of coherence. Alexy and Peczenik 1990 define coherence in terms of the degree of approximation to a perfect supportive structure exhibited by a set of propositions, and list ten criteria by reference to which coherence thus defined can be evaluated (the criteria are: (1) the number of supportive relations, (2) the length of the supportive chains, (3) the strength of the support, (4) the connections between supportive chains, (5) priority orders between reasons, (6) reciprocal justification, (7) generality, (8) conceptual cross-connections, (9) number of cases a theory covers, and (10) diversity of fields of life to which the theory is applicable). Such an approach raises many questions, such as how these various criteria of coherence are to be weighed and balanced against each other, and whether it is always the case that the weighing operation will result in a complete ranking of given sets of propositions as either more or less coherent than each other, so that when faced with competing such sets, it is always possible to find the most coherent set of propositions according to the ten criteria. Alexy and Peczenik recognise that weighing and balancing the criteria of coherence will be a complex matter, but appear to assume that it will always be possible to establish which is the most coherent of rival sets of propositions.
A further characterisation of the kind of coherence which is to be sought in legal reasoning may be found in Ronald Dworkin's work. Many writers regard Dworkin's account of integrity in adjudication as an example of a coherence account. (See Hurley 1989 & 1990; Marmor 1992 & 2005. Kress 1984, although writing before Dworkin had fully developed his account of law as integrity, also views Dworkin as offering a coherence account of adjudication. Raz 1994a disputes the idea that Dworkin's account of law should be understood as a coherence account.) On this view, judges should try to realise the value of coherence in judicial decisions by interpreting the law as ‘speaking with one voice’, i.e. they should identify legal rights and duties on the basis that they were all created by a single author, the community personified.
The next issues to consider are (1) what is to be made coherent in coherence accounts of legal reasoning, and (2) what role coherence plays in explaining or justifying judicial decisions on such accounts. Regarding the question of what is to be made coherent in coherence accounts of legal reasoning, Raz 1994a contends that coherence accounts, when applied to law, require a ‘base’ or something which is to be made coherent, which differs in character in some crucial respects from the sort of base which features in coherence accounts in other areas of philosophy. Raz points out that while coherence accounts of justified belief take each person's belief set as their ‘base’ or as that which is to be made coherent, coherence accounts of law cannot be person-relative in this way, on pain of failing to offer an account which is in touch with the concrete reality of law in the jurisdiction under consideration. Raz's contention is that the law of a given jurisdiction does not vary with the beliefs of those subject to it, and in his view, that law is objective in this way means that there must be a common base to which coherence accounts in law are addressed. His suggestion in this regard is that coherence accounts in law take court decisions and legislative and regulatory acts as their base, and hold law to be the set of principles that makes the most coherent sense of that base. Raz further distinguishes between coherence accounts of law and coherence accounts of adjudication. The essential difference between them is the stage at which considerations of coherence come into play. In the case of a coherence account of law, the whole of what the law is is determined by applying a coherence test to those court decisions and legislative and regulatory acts of a given jurisdiction. A coherence account of adjudication, however, accepts that the vagaries of politics and the influence of political considerations on legislative and judicial decisions make it unlikely that the settled law of a jurisdiction will exhibit coherence to any great extent. This being so, if we are to apply a coherence account in order to determine how judges ought to decide cases according to law (legal reasoning in sense (b)), then we should assume a coherence-independent test to identify the settled law of a jurisdiction first, and then bring in considerations of coherence at a later stage, and hold that courts ought to adopt that outcome to a case which is favoured by the most coherent set of propositions which, were the settled rules of the system justified, would justify them.
MacCormick 1984 espouses a similar view of the role which coherence can play in adjudication and gives an indication of how we might think of the links between interpretation and coherence in legal reasoning. According to MacCormick, in deciding a case according to law, courts should first of all interpret the existing law in order to establish a coherent view of some branch of the law, and they should do this by showing how that branch of law is justified according to some coherent set of principles or values which underlie it. The court should then use this view of the law in order to justify its decision in a new case which comes before it. On such an approach, then, once courts establish what the settled law is, they should then interpret law in applying it to a new case such that their decision is in accord with the most coherent account which justifies that settled law.
Once a stance has been taken on the nature of the coherence relation in the case of law, many further questions concerning the role which considerations of coherence are to play in legal reasoning come to the fore. One important issue is that of how much emphasis is to be placed on coherence in justifying a judicial decision. Is exhibiting some degree of coherence with the existing law a necessary requirement of any justified judicial decision? Is it both a necessary and sufficient requirement, such that an account of the role of coherence in adjudication supplies us with a complete explanation of how judges should decide cases according to law? Or is coherence rather to be regarded as a desirable feature of judicial decision making, but one which can be overridden by other considerations in certain circumstances?
At this point in the discussion, it is possible to draw out some further possible links between the two concepts with which this entry is concerned, namely interpretation and coherence. If we hold that legal reasoning in sense (b), namely reasoning from the content of the law to the outcome which judges should adopt in a case before them, is wholly (Dworkin 1986) or mainly (Raz 1996a) interpretive, then we can reformulate some of the questions raised above concerning how much emphasis is to be placed upon coherence in adjudication in terms of the extent to which, in interpreting the law, we should interpret it in such a way as to realise the value of coherence in judicial decisions. So, for example, is coherence the sole desideratum which should guide judges in interpreting the law, or is it merely one feature of a successful such interpretation, and, moreover, is it a necessary feature, or one which, although desirable, may be overridden by competing values which judges should also try to realise in interpreting the law?
Levenbook 1984 contends that it is a necessary condition for a judicial decision to be legally justified that it coheres with some part of the established law. She contrasts her understanding of this requirement with that adopted by MacCormick 1978. According to Levenbook, while MacCormick also holds that minimal coherence with some part of the established law is a necessary condition of a judicial decision being justified, he nevertheless contends that, so long as this minimal standard is met, further considerations of coherence which are also relevant to the decision can be defeated on consequentialist grounds. Levenbook's view is that this approach gives coherence too modest a role to play in legal reasoning; once a very minimal requirement of coherence is met, this value is too easily defeasible by other considerations. Levenbook finds this account of adjudication troubling because, in her view, it fails to do justice to judges' responsibility to be faithful to pre-existing law, a responsibility which places the judiciary in a quite different situation from the legislature when it comes to the question of how law ought to be developed. She contends that a judge who, within the limits allowed to him by the law, adopts a decision which is better on moral grounds over one which displays greater congruence with the trend or spirit of the existing law has made a mistake, and has adopted a legally unjustified decision. Levenbook very succinctly focuses the dilemma which judges must confront in deciding how much weight is to be placed on considerations of coherence in judicial decisions: should judges always adopt the outcome to a case which best coheres with the pre-existing law, or can they ever be justified in adopting an outcome which is less coherent but morally preferable? This way of focusing the dilemma which judges may face brings out another important aspect of coherence in legal reasoning, namely that granting a strong role to considerations of coherence is to place considerable emphasis on the backward-looking aspect of adjudication, as such an approach may require judges to place greater value on adhering to what has gone before, rather than on doing what would otherwise, on moral grounds, be the right thing.
Raz (1994a), who contends that coherence in legal reasoning is sometimes desirable, but certainly defeasible, poses essentially the same dilemma, but seems to place the burden of proof on those grasping the other horn of it. That is to say, Raz asks not how could it ever be justified for judges to deviate from the trend of the existing law in order to adopt a less coherent but otherwise morally preferable decision, but rather why should judges ever deviate from what is otherwise the morally best solution to a case before them on grounds of coherence? The burden of proof point is important because Raz's view seems to be that arguments in favour of a strong role for coherence in legal reasoning go through too easily, or are too readily adopted as a default position, perhaps because of the fact that reasoning by analogy is a common feature of many legal systems and seems to lend itself to being characterised in coherence terms, such that the facts speak for themselves in favour of the conclusion that considerations of coherence have a special role to play in legal reasoning. Pointing out that reasoning by analogy is not a necessary fact of life in all legal systems, and that, even where it does feature, it is still necessary to provide an explanation of the rationale of arguments from analogy, and the links between such arguments and coherence accounts of adjudication, Raz seeks to shift the burden of proof onto those who champion coherence. If judges are sometimes to deviate from what would otherwise be, according to law, the morally best outcome to a case before them on grounds of coherence, then, Raz contends, we are in need of a convincing positive argument why this should be so.
One such argument may well be found in a point already mentioned in passing above, i.e. that judges are in a different position from legislators when it comes to deciding how the law ought to be developed. Raz (1979 and 1994a) argues that when faced with the choice of adopting the (according to law) morally best outcome to a case over an outcome which coheres better with the settled law, courts have to bear in mind that if they choose the former route, then some problematic consequences may ensue, such as that they may introduce conflicting rules reflecting conflicting social and economic purposes into the law, and hence create a considerable degree of dissonance with regard to existing legal doctrines in a given area of law. Such consequences need not dog legislative attempts to develop the law in a way which deviates from the doctrinal past, because legislative institutions have the power to sweep away the past in introducing new legislation, and to do so in such a way as to radically reform a whole area of law at one stroke. Courts, by contrast, can only make decisions concerning the issues arising in the case before them, and have considerably less opportunity to engage in radical reform of the law. These factors mean that judicial reform of the law will always be partial in nature, and, as was noted above, such partial reform brings with it the possibility of introducing dissonance and conflict into the law in the meantime. This may provide one reason why sometimes courts should give greater weight to considerations of coherence with pre-existing law in deciding cases which come before them, rather than striking out in a (albeit otherwise morally preferable) direction which coheres less well with settled law.
On Dworkin's account of adjudication—at least when that account is understood as a coherence account (see subsection 3.1 above)—we find a different kind of answer to the question of why coherence has a special role to play in legal reasoning. As was noted in subsection 2.4, for Dworkin, in adjudicating cases, judges should seek to constructively interpret the law, i.e. to impose purpose on it in order to make of it the best possible example of the form or genre to which it is taken to belong (see Dworkin 1986, chs.2 & 3, and the entry on interpretivist theories of law). For Dworkin, the form or genre of law is to provide a convincing justification for the exercise of state coercion (see Dworkin 1986, passim;), and, as he regards both judges and legal theorists as engaging in constructive interpretation (see Dworkin 1986, p90), Dworkin further contends that any adequate jurisprudential account of law must explain how what it takes to be law provides a general justification for the exercise of the coercive power of the state (for discussion of this point, see Dickson 2001, chs. 5 & 6, Dickson 2004 and cf. the entry on interpretivist theories of law). In Law's Empire, Dworkin argues that such a justification can best be provided when the law is viewed as the organised and coherent voice of what he refers to as a ‘community of principle’ i.e. a community whose members accept that their fates are linked by virtue of the fact that their rights and responsibilities are governed by common principles. So for Dworkin, we must interpret law as coherent, in the sense of speaking with one voice, because by so doing, we understand law as the voice of a community of principle, and so as capable of providing a general justification for the exercise of state coercion (see Dworkin 1986).
Some theorists are not so concerned to provide a ‘law-specific’ explanation of why coherence has an important role to play in legal reasoning. For example, although acknowledging that there may be much more to be said about what is distinctive about legal reasoning, Hurley 1990 is largely content to explore the consequences for legal reasoning which ensue from the coherentist account of general practical reasoning which she espouses.
In considering the role of coherence in legal reasoning, a final point to mention is that of how much of the law is to be made coherent according to various jurisprudential accounts granting a role to considerations of coherence. Are we talking of global coherence, such that judges should strive to reach judicial decisions which cohere to some extent with the settled law of an entire legal system, or should the coherence we seek be more local in nature, e.g. coherence with particular branches or areas of law?
Levenbook 1984 is a supporter of local coherence, and criticises those who, like Sartorius (1968 and 1971) and Dworkin (1977, and, although not yet written at the time of Levenbook's article, Dworkin 1986), hold that justified judicial decisions are those which best cohere with the law as a whole. According to Levenbook, champions of global coherence ignore the fact that sometimes a legally justified decision is supported by, in the sense of cohering with, principles which are distinctive of one area or branch of the law, but the principles concerned differ substantially from, and hence do not cohere well with principles from other branches of law. On this line of thinking, the judicial decision which coheres best with the principles underlying some specific field of law may not result in increased coherence of the entire system of law. That global coherence theorists may well be led to reject such a decision, and to hold that an alternative decision which coheres well with the overall system of law, but which increases incoherence locally is the more strongly justified, is, for Levenbook, a good reason to reject their theories: she contends that any plausible account of adjudication must make room for the kind of ‘area-specific coherence’ which she believes is necessary in the case of law. Raz 1994a also champions local over global coherence in adjudication, and his argument mentioned in the previous section concerning the limitations on the reforming role of courts, and the way in which this sometimes militates in favour of coherence playing a role in judicial decision making, is intended to support local coherence only. Peczenik 1994 claims that while the goal of the kind of doctrinal interpretation undertaken by legal scholars (which he refers to as ‘legal dogmatics’) is to establish the unity of an entire legal system, the judicial interpretation undertaken by judges is of a far more local variety, as it is concerned merely with the norms applicable to the case in question, and because a coherent interpretation of those norms may decrease their coherence with other legal norms.
While, as Levenbook 1984 notes, Dworkin's account of integrity in adjudication requires judges to attempt to view the legal system as a whole as exhibiting coherence and speaking with one voice in interpreting the law, Dworkin does also recognise that compartmentalisation into different branches or areas of law is an indisputable feature of legal practice, and he accordingly attempts to integrate it within his vision of adjudicative integrity. He does so via his doctrine of local priority in interpretation, i.e. that if a given principle justifying a judicial decision does not fit at all well with the area of law which the case is classified as falling under, then this counts dramatically against deciding the case in accordance with that principle, no matter how well such an interpretation coheres with other areas of the law (see Dworkin 1986, ch. 7). However, because of the strong pull toward global coherence in law as integrity—expressed in Dworkin's claim that it is necessary to strive to view the legal system as a whole as speaking with one voice, the voice of an authentic political community, in order that law can be seen as justifying state coercion—the current compartmentalisation of the law is not an unrevisable given for judges deciding cases, rather, it, too, is something which is subject to the Dworkinian process of constructive interpretation. This being so, he claims, when the compartmentalisation of the law does not track widely held principles of those subject to the law accounting current classificatory boundaries as important, then the doctrine of local priority is to be given much less force. Indeed, where there is a serious mismatch between the current compartmentalisation and actual views about relevant similarities and differences between areas of law held by those subject to it, it might be possible for judges to discard the doctrine of local priority altogether, and undertake radical reform of some departments of law in order to make them cohere better with others, or even to erase entire the alleged boundaries between certain branches of law in the course of interpreting the law and applying it to new cases.
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constitutionalism | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | legal reasoning: precedent and analogy in | nature of law | nature of law: interpretivist theories | nature of law: legal positivism | truth: coherence theory of