The Meaning of Life
Many major historical figures in philosophy have provided an answer to the question of what, if anything, makes life meaningful, although they typically have not put it in these terms. Consider, for instance, Aristotle on the human function, Aquinas on the beatific vision, and Kant on the highest good. While these concepts have some bearing on happiness and morality, they are straightforwardly construed as accounts of which final ends a person ought to realize in order to have a life that matters. Despite the venerable pedigree, it is only in the last 50 years or so that something approaching a distinct field on the meaning of life has been established in Anglo-American philosophy, and it is only in the last 30 years that debate with real depth has appeared. Concomitant with the demise of positivism and of utilitarianism in the post-war era has been the rise of analytical enquiry into non-hedonistic conceptions of value, including conceptions of meaning in life, grounded on relatively uncontroversial (but not certain or universally shared) judgments of cases, often called “intuitions.” English-speaking philosophers can be expected to continue to find life's meaning of interest as they increasingly realize that it is a distinct topic that admits of rational enquiry to no less a degree than more familiar ethical categories such as well-being, virtuous character, and right action.
This survey critically discusses approaches to meaning in life that are prominent in contemporary Anglo-American philosophical literature. To provide context, sometimes it mentions other texts, e.g., in Continental philosophy or from before the 20th century. However, the central aim is to acquaint the reader with recent analytic work on life's meaning and to pose questions about it that are currently worthy of consideration.
When the topic of the meaning of life comes up, people often pose one of two questions: “So, what is the meaning of life?” and “What are you talking about?” The literature can be divided in terms of which question it seeks to answer. This discussion starts off with works that address the latter, abstract question regarding the sense of talk of “life's meaning,” i.e., that aim to clarify what we are asking when we pose the question of what, if anything, makes life meaningful. Afterward, it considers texts that provide answers to the more substantive question about the nature of meaning as a property. Some accounts of what make life meaningful provide particular ways to do so, e.g., by making certain achievements (James 2005), developing moral character (Thomas 2005), or learning from relationships with family members (Velleman 2005). However, most recent discussions of meaning in life are attempts to capture in a single principle all the variegated conditions that can confer meaning on life. This survey focuses heavily on the articulation and evaluation of these theories of what would make life meaningful. It concludes by examining nihilist views that the conditions necessary for meaning in life do not obtain for any of us, i.e., that all our lives are meaningless.
One part of the field of life's meaning consists of the systematic attempt to clarify what people mean when they ask in virtue of what life has meaning. This section addresses different accounts of the sense of talk of “life's meaning” (and of “significance,” “importance,” and other synonyms). A large majority of those writing on life's meaning deem talk of it centrally to indicate a positive final value that an individual's life can exhibit. That is, comparatively few believe either that a meaningful life is a merely neutral quality, or that what is of key interest is the meaning of the human species or universe as a whole (for discussions focused on the latter, see Edwards 1972; Munitz 1986; Seachris 2009). Most in the field have ultimately wanted to know whether and how the existence of one of us over time has meaning, a certain property that is desirable for its own sake.
Beyond drawing the distinction between the life of an individual and that of a whole, there has been very little discussion of life as the logical bearer of meaning. For instance, is the individual's life best understood biologically, qua human being, or instead as the existence of a person that may or may not be human (Flanagan 1996)? And if an individual is loved from afar, can it logically affect the meaningfulness of her “life” (Brogaard and Smith 2005, 449)?
Returning to topics on which there is consensus, most writing on meaning believe that it comes in degrees such that some periods of life are more meaningful than others and that some lives as a whole are more meaningful than others (perhaps contra Britton 1969, 192). Note that one can coherently hold the view that some people's lives are less meaningful than others, or even meaningless, and still maintain that people have an equal moral status. Consider a consequentialist view according to which each individual counts for one in virtue of having a capacity for a meaningful life (cf. Railton 1984), or a Kantian view that says that people have an intrinsic worth in virtue of their capacity for autonomous choices, where meaning is a function of the exercise of this capacity (Nozick 1974, ch. 3). On both views, morality could counsel an agent to help people with relatively meaningless lives, at least if the condition is not of their choosing.
Another uncontroversial element of the sense of “meaningfulness” is that it connotes a good that is conceptually distinct from happiness or rightness (something emphasized in Wolf 2010). First, to ask whether someone's life is meaningful is not one and the same as asking whether her life is happy or pleasant. A life in an experience or virtual reality machine could conceivably be happy but very few take it to be a prima facie candidate for meaningfulness (Nozick 1974: 42–45). Indeed, many would say that talk of “meaning” by definition excludes the possibility of it coming from time spent in an experience machine (although there have been a small handful who disagree and contend that a meaningful life just is a pleasant life. Goetz 2012, in particular, bites many bullets.) Furthermore, one's life logically could become meaningful precisely by sacrificing one's happiness, e.g., by helping others at the expense of one's self-interest.
Second, asking whether a person's existence is significant is not identical to considering whether she has been morally upright; there seem to be ways to enhance meaning that have nothing to do with morality, at least impartially conceived, for instance, making a scientific discovery.
Of course, one might argue that a life would be meaningless if (or even because) it were unhappy or immoral, particularly given Aristotelian conceptions of these disvalues. However, that is to posit a synthetic, substantive relationship between the concepts, and is far from indicating that speaking of “meaning in life” is analytically a matter of connoting ideas regarding happiness or rightness, which is what I am denying here. My point is that the question of what makes a life meaningful is conceptually distinct from the question of what makes a life happy or moral, even if it turns out that the best answer to the question of meaning appeals to an answer to one of these other evaluative questions.
If talk about meaning in life is not by definition talk about happiness or rightness, then what is it about? There is as yet no consensus in the field. One answer is that a meaningful life is one that by definition has achieved choice-worthy purposes (Nielsen 1964) or involves satisfaction upon having done so (Hepburn 1965; Wohlgennant 1981). However, for such an analysis to clearly demarcate meaningfulness from happiness, it would be useful to modify it to indicate which purposes are germane to the former. On this score, some suggest that conceptual candidates for grounding meaning are purposes that not only have a positive value, but also render a life coherent (Markus 2003), make it intelligible (Thomson 2003, 8–13), or transcend animal nature (Levy 2005).
Now, it might be that a focus on any kind of purpose is too narrow for ruling out the logical possibility that meaning could inhere in certain actions, experiences, states, or relationships that have not been adopted as ends and willed and that perhaps even could not be, e.g., being an immortal offshoot of an unconscious, spiritual force that grounds the physical universe, as in Hinduism. In addition, the above purpose-based analyses exclude as not being about life's meaning some of the most widely read texts that purport to be about it, namely, Jean-Paul Sartre's (1948) existentialist account of meaning being constituted by whatever one chooses, and Richard Taylor's (1970, ch. 18) discussion of Sisyphus being able to acquire meaning in his life merely by having his strongest desires satisfied. These are prima facie accounts of meaning in life, but do not essentially involve the attainment of purposes that foster coherence, intelligibility or transcendence.
The latter problem also faces the alternative suggestion that talk of “life's meaning” is not necessarily about purposes, but is rather just a matter of referring to goods that are qualitatively superior, worthy of love and devotion, and appropriately awed (Taylor 1989, ch. 1). It is implausible to think that these criteria are satisfied by subjectivist appeals to whatever choices one ends up making or to whichever desires happen to be strongest for a given person.
Although relatively few have addressed the question of whether there exists a single, primary sense of “life's meaning,” the inability to find one so far might suggest that none exists. In that case, it could be that the field is united in virtue of addressing certain overlapping but not equivalent ideas that have family resemblances (Metz 2013, ch. 2). Perhaps when we speak of “meaning in life,” we have in mind one or more of these related ideas: certain conditions that are worthy of great pride or admiration, values that warrant devotion and love, qualities that make a life intelligible, or ends apart from base pleasure that are particularly choice-worthy. Another possibility is that talk of “meaning in life” fails to exhibit even this degree of unity, and is instead a grab-bag of heterogenous ideas (Mawson 2010; Oakley 2010).
As the field reflects more on the sense of “life's meaning,” it should not only try to ascertain in what respect it admits of unity, but also try to differentiate the concept of life's meaning from other, closely related ideas. For instance, the concept of a worthwhile life is probably not identical to that of a meaningful one (Baier 1997, ch. 5; Metz 2012). For instance, one would not be conceptually confused to claim that a meaningless life full of animal pleasures would be worth living. Furthermore, it seems that talk of a “meaningless life” does not simply connote the concept of an absurd (Nagel 1970; Feinberg 1980), unreasonable (Baier 1997, ch. 5), futile (Trisel 2002), or wasted (Kamm 2003, 210–14) life.
Fortunately the field does not need an extremely precise analysis of the concept of life's meaning (or definition of the phrase “life's meaning”) in order to make progress on the substantive question of what life's meaning is. Knowing that meaningfulness analytically concerns a variable and gradient final good in a person's life that is conceptually distinct from happiness, rightness, and worthwhileness provides a certain amount of common ground. The rest of this discussion addresses attempts to theoretically capture the nature of this good.
Most English speaking philosophers writing on meaning in life are trying to develop and evaluate theories, i.e., fundamental and general principles that are meant to capture all the particular ways that a life could obtain meaning. These theories are standardly divided on a metaphysical basis, i.e., in terms of which kinds of properties are held to constitute the meaning. Supernaturalist theories are views that meaning in life must be constituted by a certain relationship with a spiritual realm. If God or a soul does not exist, or if they exist but one fails to have the right relationship with them, then supernaturalism—or the Western version of it (on which I focus)—entails that one's life is meaningless. In contrast, naturalist theories are views that meaning can obtain in a world as known solely by science. Here, although meaning could accrue from a divine realm, certain ways of living in a purely physical universe would be sufficient for it. Note that there is logical space for a non-naturalist theory that meaning is a function of abstract properties that are neither spiritual nor physical. However, only scant attention has been paid to this possibility in the Anglo-American literature (Williams 1999; Audi 2005).
Supernaturalist thinkers in the monotheistic tradition are usefully divided into those with God-centered views and soul-centered views. The former take some kind of connection with God (understood to be a spiritual person who is all-knowing, all-good, and all-powerful and who is the ground of the physical universe) to constitute meaning in life, even if one lacks a soul (construed as an immortal, spiritual substance). The latter deem having a soul and putting it into a certain state to be what makes life meaningful, even if God does not exist. Of course, many supernaturalists believe that certain relationships with God and a soul are jointly necessary and sufficient for a significant existence. However, the simpler view is common, and often arguments proffered for the more complex view fail to support it any more than the simpler view.
The most widely held and influential God-based account of meaning in life is that one's existence is more significant, the better one fulfills a purpose God has assigned. The familiar idea is that God has a plan for the universe and that one's life is meaningful to the degree that one helps God realize this plan, perhaps in the particular way God wants one to do so (Affolter 2007). Fulfilling God's purpose by choice is the sole source of meaning, with the existence of an afterlife not necessary for it (Brown 1971; Levine 1987; Cottingham 2003). If a person failed to do what God intends him to do with his life, then, on the current view, his life would be meaningless.
What I call “purpose theorists” differ over what it is about God's purpose that makes it uniquely able to confer meaning on human lives. Some argue that God's purpose could be the sole source of invariant moral rules, where a lack of such would render our lives nonsensical (Craig 1994; Cottingham 2003). However, Euthyphro problems arguably plague this rationale; God's purpose for us must be of a particular sort for our lives to obtain meaning by fulfilling it (as is often pointed out, serving as food for intergalactic travelers won't do), which suggests that there is a standard external to God's purpose that determines what the content of God's purpose ought to be (but see Cottingham 2005, ch. 3). In addition, some critics argue that a universally applicable and binding moral code is not necessary for meaning in life, even if the act of helping others is (Ellin 1995, 327).
Other purpose theorists contend that having been created by God for a reason would be the only way that our lives could avoid being contingent (Craig 1994; cf. Haber 1997). But it is unclear whether God's arbitrary will would avoid contingency, or whether his non-arbitrary will would avoid contingency anymore than a deterministic physical world. Furthermore, the literature is still unclear what contingency is and why it is a deep problem. Still other purpose theorists maintain that our lives would have meaning only insofar as they were intentionally fashioned by a creator, thereby obtaining meaning of the sort that an art-object has (Gordon 1983). Here, though, freely choosing to do any particular thing would not be necessary for meaning, and everyone's life would have an equal degree of meaning, which are both counterintuitive implications (see Trisel 2012 for additional criticisms). Are all these objections sound? Is there a promising reason for thinking that fulfilling God's (as opposed to any human's) purpose is what constitutes meaning in life?
Not only does each of these versions of the purpose theory have specific problems, but they all face this shared objection: if God assigned us a purpose, then God would degrade us and thereby undercut the possibility of us obtaining meaning from fulfilling the purpose (Baier 1957, 118–20; Murphy 1982, 14–15; Singer 1996, 29). This objection goes back at least to Jean-Paul Sartre (1948, 45), and there are many replies to it in the literature that have yet to be assessed (e.g., Hepburn 1965, 271–73; Brown 1971, 20–21; Davis 1986, 155–56; Hanfling 1987, 45–46; Moreland 1987, 129; Walker 1989; Jacquette 2001, 20–21).
Robert Nozick presents a God-centered theory that focuses less on God as purposive and more on God as infinite (Nozick 1981, ch. 6, 1989, chs. 15–16; see also Cooper 2005). The basic idea is that for a finite condition to be meaningful, it must obtain its meaning from another condition that has meaning. So, if one's life is meaningful, it might be so in virtue of being married to a person, who is important. And, being finite, the spouse must obtain his or her importance from elsewhere, perhaps from the sort of work he or she does. And this work must obtain its meaning by being related to something else that is meaningful, and so on. A regress on meaningful finite conditions is present, and the suggestion is that the regress can terminate only in something infinite, a being so all-encompassing that it need not (indeed, cannot) go beyond itself to obtain meaning from anything else. And that is God.
The standard objection to this rationale is that a finite condition could be meaningful without obtaining its meaning from another meaningful condition; perhaps it could be meaningful in itself, or obtain its meaning by being related to something beautiful, autonomous or otherwise valuable for its own sake but not meaningful (Thomson 2003, 25–26, 48).
The purpose- and infinity-based rationales are the two most common instances of God-centered theory in the literature, and the naturalist can point out that they arguably face a common problem: a purely physical world seems able to do the job for which God is purportedly necessary. Nature seems able to ground a universal morality and the sort of final value from which meaning might spring. And other God-based views seem to suffer from this same problem. For two examples, some claim that God must exist in order for there to be a just world, where a world in which the bad do well and the good fare poorly would render our lives senseless (Craig 1994; cf. Cottingham 2003, pt. 3), and others maintain that God's remembering all of us with love is alone what would confer significance on our lives (Hartshorne 1984). However, the naturalist will point out that an impersonal, Karmic-like force of nature conceivably could justly distribute penalties and rewards in the way a retributive personal judge would, and that actually living together in loving relationships would seem to confer much more meaning on life than a loving fond remembrance.
A second problem facing all God-based views is the existence of apparent counterexamples. If we think of the stereotypical lives of Albert Einstein, Mother Teresa, and Pablo Picasso, they seem meaningful even if we suppose there is no all-knowing, all-powerful, and all-good spiritual person who is the ground of the physical world. Even religiously inclined philosophers find this hard to deny (Quinn 2000, 58; Audi 2005), though some of them suggest that a supernatural realm is necessary for a “deep” or “ultimate” meaning (Nozick 1981, 618; Craig 1994, 42). What is the difference between a deep meaning and a shallow one? And why think a spiritual realm is necessary for the former?
At this point, the supernaturalist could usefully step back and reflect on what it might be about God that would make Him uniquely able to confer meaning in life, perhaps as follows from the perfect being theological tradition. For God to be solely responsible for any significance in our lives, God must have certain qualities that cannot be found in the natural world, these qualities must be qualitatively superior to any goods possible in a physical universe, and they must be what ground meaning in it. Here, the supernaturalist could argue that meaning depends on the existence of a perfect being, where perfection requires properties such as atemporality, simplicity, and immutability that are possible only in a spiritual realm (Metz 2013, chs. 6–7; cf. Morris 1992; contra Brown 1971 and Hartshorne 1996). Meaning might come from loving a perfect being or orienting one's life toward it in other ways such as imitating it or even fulfilling its purpose, perhaps a purpose tailor-made for each individual (as per Affolter 2007).
Although this might be a promising strategy for a God-centered theory, it faces a serious dilemma. On the one hand, in order for God to be the sole source of meaning, God must be utterly unlike us; for the more God were like us, the more reason there would be to think we could obtain meaning from ourselves, absent God. On the other hand, the more God is utterly unlike us, the less clear it is how we could obtain meaning by relating to Him. How can one love a being that cannot change? How can one imitate such a being? Could an immutable, atemporal, simple being even have purposes? Could it truly be a person? And why think an utterly perfect being is necessary for meaning? Why would not a very good but imperfect being confer some meaning?
A soul-centered theory is the view that meaning in life comes from relating in a certain way to an immortal, spiritual substance that supervenes on one's body when it is alive and that will forever outlive its death. If one lacks a soul, or if one has a soul but relates to it in the wrong way, then one's life is meaningless. There are two prominent arguments for a soul-based perspective.
The first one is often expressed by laypeople and is suggested by the work of Leo Tolstoy (1884; see also Hanfling 1987, 22–24; Morris 1992, 26; Craig 1994). Tolstoy argues that for life to be meaningful something must be worth doing, that nothing is worth doing if nothing one does will make a permanent difference to the world, and that doing so requires having an immortal, spiritual self. Many of course question whether having an infinite effect is necessary for meaning (e.g., Schmidtz 2001; Audi 2005, 354–55). Others point out that one need not be immortal in order to have an infinite effect (Levine 1987, 462), for God's eternal remembrance of one's mortal existence would be sufficient for that.
The other major rationale for a soul-based theory of life's meaning is that a soul is necessary for perfect justice, which, in turn, is necessary for a meaningful life. Life seems nonsensical when the wicked flourish and the righteous suffer, at least supposing there is no other world in which these injustices will be rectified, whether by God or by Karma. Something like this argument can be found in the Biblical chapter Ecclesiastes, and it continues to be defended (Davis 1987; Craig 1994). However, like the previous rationale, the inferential structure of this one seems weak; even if an afterlife were required for just outcomes, it is not obvious why an eternal afterlife should be thought necessary (Perrett 1986, 220).
Work has been done to try to make the inferences of these two arguments stronger, and the basic strategy has been to appeal to the value of perfection (Metz 2013, ch. 7). Perhaps the Tolstoian reason why one must live forever in order to make the relevant permanent difference is an agent-relative need for one to honor an infinite value, something qualitatively higher than the worth of, say, pleasure. And maybe the reason why immortality is required in order to mete out just deserts is that rewarding the virtuous requires satisfying their highest free and informed desires, one of which would be for eternal flourishing of some kind (Goetz 2012). While far from obviously sound, these arguments at least provide some reason for thinking that immortality is necessary to satisfy the major premise about what is required for meaning.
However, both arguments are still plagued by a problem facing the original versions; even if they show that meaning depends on immortality, they do not yet show that it depends on having a soul. By definition, if one has a soul, then one is immortal, but it is not clearly true that if one is immortal, then one has a soul. Perhaps being able to upload one's consciousness into an infinite succession of different bodies in an everlasting universe would count as an instance of immortality without a soul. Such a possibility would not require an individual to have an immortal spiritual substance (imagine that when in between bodies, the information constitutive of one's consciousness were temporarily stored in a computer). What reason is there to think that one must have a soul in particular for life to be significant?
The most promising reason seems to be one that takes us beyond the simple version of soul-centered theory to the more complex view that both God and a soul constitute meaning. The best justification for thinking that one must have a soul in order for one's life to be significant seems to be that significance comes from uniting with God in a spiritual realm such as Heaven, a view espoused by Thomas Aquinas, Leo Tolstoy (1884), and contemporary religious thinkers (e.g., Craig 1994). Another possibility is that meaning comes from honoring what is divine within oneself, i.e., a soul (Swenson 1949).
As with God-based views, naturalist critics offer counterexamples to the claim that a soul or immortality of any kind is necessary for meaning. Great works, whether they be moral, aesthetic, or intellectual, would seem to confer meaning on one's life regardless of whether one will live forever. Critics maintain that soul-centered theorists are seeking too high a standard for appraising the meaning of people's lives (Baier 1957, 124–29; Baier 1997, chs. 4–5; Trisel 2002; Trisel 2004). Appeals to a soul require perfection, whether it be, as above, a perfect object to honor, a perfectly just reward to enjoy, or a perfect being with which to commune. However, if indeed soul-centered theory ultimately relies on claims about meaning turning on perfection, such a view is attractive at least for being simple, and rival views have yet to specify in a principled and thoroughly defended way where to draw the line at less than perfection (perhaps a start is Metz 2013, ch. 8). What less than ideal amount of value is sufficient for a life to count as meaningful?
Critics of soul-based views maintain not merely that immortality is not necessary for meaning in life, but also that it is sufficient for a meaningless life. One influential argument is that an immortal life, whether spiritual or physical, could not avoid becoming boring, rendering life pointless (Williams 1973; Ellin 1995, 311–12; Belshaw 2005, 82–91; Smuts 2011). The most common reply is that immortality need not get boring (Fischer 1994; Wisnewski 2005; Bortolotti and Nagasawa 2009; Chappell 2009; Quigley and Harris 2009, 75–78). However, it might also be worth questioning whether boredom is truly sufficient for meaninglessness. Suppose, for instance, that one volunteers to be bored so that many others will not be bored; perhaps this would be a meaningful sacrifice to make.
Another argument that being immortal would be sufficient to make our lives insignificant is that persons who cannot die could not exhibit certain virtues (Nussbaum 1989; Kass 2001). For instance, they could not promote justice of any important sort, be benevolent to any significant degree, or exhibit courage of any kind that matters, since life and death issues would not be at stake. Critics reply that even if these virtues would not be possible, there are other virtues that could be. And of course it is not obvious that meaning-conferring justice, benevolence and courage would not be possible if we were immortal, perhaps if we were not always aware that we could not die or if our indestructible souls could still be harmed by virtue of intense pain, frustrated ends, and repetitive lives.
There are other, related arguments maintaining that awareness of immortality would have the effect of removing meaning from life, say, because our lives would lack a sense of preciousness and urgency (Lenman 1995; Kass 2001; James 2009) or because external rather than internal factors would then dictate their course (Wollheim 1984, 266). Note that the target here is belief in an eternal afterlife, and not immortality itself, and so I merely mention these rationales (for additional, revealing criticism, see Bortolotti 2010).
I now address views that even if there is no spiritual realm, meaning in life is possible, at least for many people. Among those who believe that a significant existence can be had in a purely physical world as known by science, there is debate about two things: the extent to which the human mind constitutes meaning and whether there are conditions of meaning that are invariant among human beings.
Subjectivists believe that there are no invariant standards of meaning because meaning is relative to the subject, i.e., depends on an individual's pro-attitudes such as desires, ends, and choices. Roughly, something is meaningful for a person if she believes it to be or seeks it out. Objectivists maintain, in contrast, that there are some invariant standards for meaning because meaning is (at least partly) mind-independent, i.e., is a real property that exists regardless of being the object of anyone's mental states. Here, something is meaningful (to some degree) in virtue of its intrinsic nature, independent of whether it is believed to be meaningful or sought.
There is logical space for an intersubjective theory according to which there are invariant standards of meaning for human beings that are constituted by what they would all agree upon from a certain communal standpoint (Darwall 1983, chs. 11–12). However, this orthogonal approach is not much of a player in the field and so I set it aside in what follows.
According to this view, meaning in life varies from person to person, depending on each one's variable mental states. Common instances are views that one's life is more meaningful, the more one gets what one happens to want strongly, the more one achieves one's highly ranked goals, or the more one does what one believes to be really important (Trisel 2002; Hooker 2008; Alexis 2011). Lately, one influential subjectivist has maintained that the relevant mental state is caring or loving, so that life is meaningful just to the extent that one cares about or loves something (Frankfurt 1982, 2002, 2004).
Subjectivism was dominant for much of the 20th century when pragmatism, positivism, existentialism, noncognitivism, and Humeanism were quite influential (James 1900; Ayer 1947; Sartre 1948; Barnes 1967; Taylor 1970; Hare 1972; Williams 1976; Klemke 1981). However, in the last quarter of the 20th century, “reflective equilibrium” became a widely accepted argumentative procedure, whereby more controversial normative claims are justified by virtue of entailing and explaining less controversial normative claims that do not command universal acceptance. Such a method has been used to defend the existence of objective value, and, as a result, subjectivism about meaning has lost its dominance.
Those who continue to hold subjectivism often are suspicious of attempts to justify beliefs about objective value (e.g., Frankfurt 2002, 250; Trisel 2002, 73, 79, 2004, 378–79). Theorists are primarily moved to accept subjectivism because the alternatives are unpalatable; they are sure that value in general and meaning in particular exists, but do not see how it could be grounded in something independent of the mind, whether it be the natural, the non-natural, or the supernatural. In contrast to these possibilities, it appears straightforward to account for what is meaningful in terms of what people find meaningful or what people want out of life. Wide-ranging meta-ethical debates in epistemology, metaphysics, and the philosophy of language are necessary to address this rationale for subjectivism.
There are two other, more circumscribed arguments for subjectivism. One is that subjectivism is plausible since it is reasonable to think that a meaningful life is an authentic one (Frankfurt 1982). If a person's life is significant insofar as she is true to herself or her deepest nature, then we have some reason to believe that meaning simply is a function of satisfying certain desires held by the individual or realizing certain ends of hers. Another argument is that meaning intuitively comes from losing oneself, i.e., in becoming absorbed in an activity or experience (Frankfurt 1982). Work that concentrates the mind and relationships that are engrossing seem central to meaning and to be so because of the subjective element involved, that is, because of the concentration and engrossment.
However, critics maintain that both of these arguments are vulnerable to a common objection: they neglect the role of objective value both in realizing oneself and in losing oneself (Taylor 1992, esp. ch. 4). One is not really being true to oneself if one intentionally harms others (Dahl 1987, 12), successfully maintains 3,732 hairs on one's head (Taylor 1992, 36), or, well, eats one's own excrement (Wielenberg 2005, 22), and one is also not losing oneself in a meaning-conferring way if one is consumed by these activities. There seem to be certain actions, relationships, states, and experiences that one ought to concentrate on or be engrossed in, if meaning is to accrue.
So says the objectivist, but many subjectivists also feel the pull of the point. Paralleling replies in the literature on well-being, subjectivists often respond by contending that no or very few individuals would desire to do such intuitively trivial things, at least after a certain idealized process of reflection (e.g., Griffin 1981). More promising, perhaps, is the attempt to ground value not in the responses of an individual valuer, but in those of a particular group (Brogaard and Smith 2005; Wong 2008). Would such an intersubjective move avoid the counterexamples? If so, would it do so more plausibly than an objective theory?
Objective naturalists believe that meaning is constituted (at least in part) by something physical independent of the mind about which we can have correct or incorrect beliefs. Obtaining the object of some variable pro-attitude is not sufficient for meaning, on this view. Instead, there are certain inherently worthwhile or finally valuable conditions that confer meaning for anyone, neither merely because they are wanted, chosen, or believed to be meaningful, nor because they somehow are grounded in God.
Morality and creativity are widely held instances of actions that confer meaning on life, while trimming toenails and eating snow (and the other counterexamples to subjectivism above) are not. Objectivism is thought to be the best explanation for these respective kinds of judgments: the former are actions that are meaningful regardless of whether any arbitrary agent (whether it be an individual,her society, or even God) judges them to be meaningful or seeks to engage in them, while the latter actions simply lack significance and cannot obtain it if someone believes them to have it or engages in them. To obtain meaning in one's life, one ought to pursue the former actions and avoid the latter ones. Of course, meta-ethical debates about the nature of value are again relevant here.
A “pure” objectivist thinks that being the object of a person's mental states plays no role in making that person's life meaningful. Relatively few objectivists are pure, so construed. That is, a large majority of them believe that a life is more meaningful not merely because of objective factors, but also in part because of subjective ones such as cognition, affection, and emotion. Most commonly held is the hybrid view captured by Susan Wolf's pithy slogan: “Meaning arises when subjective attraction meets objective attractiveness” (Wolf 1997a, 211; see also Hepburn 1965; Kekes 1986, 2000; Wiggins 1988; Wolf 1997b, 2002, 2010; Dworkin 2000, ch. 6; Raz 2001, ch. 1; Schmidtz 2001; Starkey 2006; Mintoff 2008). This theory implies that no meaning accrues to one's life if one believes in, is satisfied by, or cares about a project that is not worthwhile, or if one takes up a worthwhile project but fails to judge it important, be satisfied by it, care about it or otherwise identify with it. Different versions of this theory will have different accounts of the appropriate mental states and of worthwhileness.
Pure objectivists deny that subjective attraction plays any constitutive role in conferring meaning on life. For instance, utilitarians with respect to meaning (as opposed to morality) are pure objectivists, for they claim that certain actions confer meaning on life regardless of the agent's reactions to them. On this view, the more one benefits others, the more meaningful one's life, regardless of whether one enjoys benefiting them, believes they should be aided, etc. (Singer 1993, ch. 12, 1995, chs. 10–11; Singer 1996, ch. 4). Midway between pure objectivism and the hybrid theory is the view that having certain propositional attitudes toward finally good activities would enhance the meaning of life without being necessary for it (Audi 2005, 344). For instance, might a Mother Teresa who is bored by her substantial charity work have a significant existence because of it, even if she would have an even more significant existence if she were excited by it?
There have been several attempts to theoretically capture what all objectively attractive, inherently worthwhile, or finally valuable conditions have in common insofar as they bear on meaning. Some believe that they can all be captured as actions that are creative (Taylor 1987), while others maintain that they are exhibit rightness or virtue and perhaps also involve reward proportionate to morality (Kant 1791, pt. 2; cf. Pogge 1997). Most objectivists, however, deem these respective aesthetic and ethical theories to be too narrow, even if living a moral life is necessary for a meaningful one (Landau 2011). It seems to most in the field not only that creativity and morality are independent sources of meaning, but also that there are sources in addition to these two. For just a few examples, consider making an intellectual discovery, rearing children with love, playing music, and developing superior athletic ability.
So, in the literature one finds a variety of principles that aim to capture all these and other (apparent) objective grounds of meaning. One can read the perfectionist tradition as proffering objective theories of what a significant existence is, even if their proponents do not frequently use contemporary terminology to express this. Consider Aristotle's account of the good life for a human being as one that fulfills its natural purpose qua rational, Marx's vision of a distinctly human history characterized by less alienation and more autonomy, culture, and community, and Nietzsche's ideal of a being with a superlative degree of power, creativity, and complexity.
More recently, some have maintained that objectively meaningful conditions are just those that involve: transcending the limits of the self to connect with organic unity (Nozick 1981, ch. 6, 1989, chs. 15–16); realizing human excellence in oneself (Bond 1983, chs. 6, 8); maximally promoting non-hedonist goods such as friendship, beauty, and knowledge (Railton 1984); exercising or promoting rational nature in exceptional ways (Hurka 1993; Smith 1997, 179–221; Gewirth 1998, ch. 5); substantially improving the quality of life of people and animals (Singer 1993, ch. 12, 1995, chs. 10–11; Singer 1996, ch. 4); overcoming challenges that one recognizes to be important at one's stage of history (Dworkin 2000, ch. 6); constituting rewarding experiences in the life of the agent or the lives of others the agent affects (Audi 2005); making progress toward ends that in principle can never be completely realized because one's knowledge of them changes as one approaches them (Levy 2005); realizing goals that are transcendent for being long-lasting in duration and broad in scope (Mintoff 2008); or contouring intelligence toward fundamental conditions of human life (Metz 2013).
One major test of these theories is whether they capture all experiences, states, relationships, and actions that intuitively make life meaningful. The more counterexamples of apparently meaningful conditions that a principle entails lack meaning, the less justified the principle. There is as yet no convergence in the field on any one principle or even cluster as accounting for commonsensical judgments about meaning to an adequate, convincing degree. Indeed, some believe the search for such a principle to be pointless (Wolf 1997b, 12–13; Kekes 2000; Schmidtz 2001). Are these pluralists correct, or does the field have a good chance of discovering a single, basic property that grounds all the particular ways to acquire meaning in life?
Another important way to criticize these theories is more comprehensive: for all that has been said so far, the objective theories are aggregative or additive, objectionably reducing life to a “container” of meaningful conditions (Brännmark 2003, 330). As with the growth of “organic unity” views in the context of debates about intrinsic value, it is becoming common to think that life as a whole (or at least long stretches of it) can substantially affect its meaning apart from the amount of meaning in its parts.
For instance, a life that has lots of beneficent and otherwise intuitively meaning-conferring conditions but that is also extremely repetitive (à la the movie Groundhog Day) is less than maximally meaningful (Taylor 1987). Furthermore, a life that not only avoids repetition but also ends with a substantial amount of meaningful parts seems to have more meaning overall than one that has the same amount of meaningful parts but ends with few or none of them (Kamm 2003, 210–14). And a life in which its meaningless parts cause its meaningful parts to come about through a process of personal growth seems meaningful in virtue of this causal pattern or being a “good life-story” (Velleman 1991; Fischer 2005).
Extreme versions of holism are also present in the literature. For example, some maintain that the only bearer of final value is life as a whole, which entails that there are strictly speaking no parts or segments of a life that can be meaningful in themselves (Tabensky 2003; Levinson 2004). For another example, some accept that both parts of a life and a life as a whole can be independent bearers of meaning, but maintain that the latter has something like a lexical priority over the former when it comes to what to pursue or otherwise to prize (Blumenfeld 2009).
What are the ultimate bearers of meaning? What are all the fundamentally different ways (if any) that holism can affect meaning? Are they all a function of narrativity, life-stories, and artistic self-expression (as per Kauppinen 2012), or are there holistic facets of life's meaning that are not a matter of such literary concepts? How much importance should they be accorded by an agent seeking meaning in her life?
So far, I have addressed theoretical accounts that have been naturally understood to be about what confers meaning on life, which obviously assumes that some lives are in fact meaningful. However, there are nihilistic perspectives that question this assumption. According to nihilism (or pessimism), what would make a life meaningful either cannot obtain or as a matter of fact simply never does.
One straightforward rationale for nihilism is the combination of supernaturalism about what makes life meaningful and atheism about whether God exists. If you believe that God or a soul is necessary for meaning in life, and if you believe that neither exists, then you are a nihilist, someone who denies that life has meaning. Albert Camus is famous for expressing this kind of perspective, suggesting that the lack of an afterlife and of a rational, divinely ordered universe undercuts the possibility of meaning (Camus 1955; cf. Ecclesiastes).
Interestingly, the most common rationales for nihilism these days do not appeal to supernaturalism. The idea shared among many contemporary nihilists is that there is something inherent to the human condition that prevents meaning from arising, even granting that God exists. For instance, some nihilists make the Schopenhauerian claim that our lives lack meaning because we are invariably dissatisfied; either we have not yet obtained what we seek, or we have obtained it and are bored (Martin 1993). Critics tend to reply that at least a number of human lives do have the requisite amount of satisfaction required for meaning, supposing that some is (Blackburn 2001, 74–77).
Other nihilists claim that life would be meaningless if there were no invariant moral rules that could be fully justified—the world would be nonsensical if, in (allegedly) Dostoyevskian terms, “everything were permitted”—and that such rules cannot exist for persons who can always reasonably question a given claim (Murphy 1982, ch. 1). While a number of philosophers agree that a universally binding and warranted morality is necessary for meaning in life (Kant 1791; Tännsjö 1988; Jacquette 2001, ch. 1; Cottingham 2003, 2005, ch. 3), some do not (Margolis 1990; Ellin 1995, 325–27). Furthermore, contemporary rationalist and realist work in meta-ethics has led many to believe that such a moral system exists.
In the past 10 years, some interesting new defences of nihilism have arisen that merit careful consideration. According to one rationale, for our lives to matter, we must in a position to add value to the world, which we are not since the value of the world is already infinite (Smith 2003). The key premises for this view are that every bit of space-time (or at least the stars in the physical universe) have some positive value, that these values can be added up, and that space is infinite. If the physical world at present contains an infinite degree of value, nothing we do can make a difference in terms of meaning, for infinity plus any amount of value must be infinity.
One way to question this argument is to suggest that even if one cannot add to the value of the universe, meaning plausibly obtains merely by being the source of value. Consider that one does not merely want one's child to be reared with love, but wants to be the one who rears one's child with love. And this desire remains even knowing that others would have reared one's child with love in one's absence, so that one's actions are not increasing the goodness of the state of the universe relative to what it would have had without them. Similar remarks might apply to cases of meaning more generally (for additional, and technical, discussion of whether an infinite universe entails nihilism, see Almeida 2010; Vohánka and Vohánková n.d.).
Another fresh argument for nihilism is forthcoming from certain defenses of anti-natalism, the view that it is immoral to bring new people into existence because doing so would be a harm to them. There are now a variety of rationales for anti-natalism, but most relevant to debates about whether life is meaningful is probably the following argument from David Benatar (2006, 18–59). According to him, the bads of existing (e.g., pains) are real disadvantages relative to not existing, while the goods of existing (pleasures) are not real advantages relative to not existing, since there is in the latter state no one to be deprived of them. If indeed the state of not existing is no worse than that of experiencing the benefits of existence, then, since existing invariably brings harm in its wake, existing is always a net harm compared to not existing. Although this argument is about goods such as pleasures in the first instance, it seems generalizable to non-experiential goods, including that of meaning in life.
The criticisms of Benatar that promise to cut most deep are those that question his rationale for the above judgments of good and bad. He maintains that these appraisals best explain, e.g., why it would be wrong for one to create someone whom one knows would suffer a torturous existence, and why it would not be wrong for one not to create someone whom one knows would enjoy a wonderful existence. The former would be wrong and the latter would not be wrong, for Benatar, because no pain in non-existence is better than pain in existence, and because no pleasure in non-existence is no worse than pleasure in existence. Critics usually grant the judgments of wrongness, but provide explanations of them that do not invoke Benatar's judgments of good and bad that apparently lead to anti-natalism (e.g., Boonin 2012; Weinberg 2012).
This survey closes by discussing the most well-known rationale for nihilism, namely, Thomas Nagel's (1986) invocation of the external standpoint that purportedly reveals our lives to be unimportant (see also Hanfling 1987, 22–24; Benatar 2006, 60–92; cf. Dworkin 2000, ch. 6). According to Nagel, we are capable of comprehending the world from a variety of standpoints that are either internal or external. The most internal perspective would be a particular human being's desire at a given instant, with a somewhat less internal perspective being one's interests over a life-time, and an even less internal perspective being the interests of one's family or community. In contrast, the most external perspective, an encompassing standpoint utterly independent of one's particularity, would be, to use Henry Sidgwick's phrase, the “point of view of the universe,” that is, the standpoint that considers the interests of all sentient beings at all times and in all places. When one takes up this most external standpoint and views one's finite—and even downright puny—impact on the world, little of one's life appears to matter. What one does in a certain society on Earth over an approximately 75 years just does not amount to much, when considering the billions of years and likely trillions of beings that are a part of space-time.
Very few accept the authority of the (most) external standpoint (Ellin 1995, 316–17; Blackburn 2001, 79–80; Schmidtz 2001) or the implications that Nagel believes it has for the meaning of our lives (Quinn 2000, 65–66; Singer 1993, 333–34; Wolf 1997b, 19–21). However, the field could use much more discussion of this rationale, given its persistence in human thought. It is plausible to think, with Nagel, that part of what it is to be a person is to be able to take up an external standpoint. However, what precisely is a standpoint? Must we invariably adopt one standpoint or the other, or is it possible not to take one up at all? Is there a reliable way to ascertain which standpoint is normatively more authoritative than others? These and the other questions posed in this survey still lack conclusive answers, another respect in which the field of life's meaning is tantalizingly open for substantial contributions.
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- Seachris, J., 2011, “Meaning of Life: The Analytic Perspective”, in Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, J. Fieser and B. Dowden (eds.)
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