Life

First published Fri Aug 15, 2003; substantive revision Mon Nov 7, 2011

Life is often defined in basic biology textbooks in terms of a list of distinctive properties that distinguish living systems from non-living. Although there is some overlap, these lists are often different, depending upon the interests of the authors. Each attempt at a definition are inextricably linked to a theory from which it derives its meaning (Benner 2010). Some biologists and philosophers even reject the whole idea of there being a need for a definition, since life for them is an irreducible fact about the natural world. Others see life simply as that which biologists study. There have been three main philosophical approaches to the problem of defining life that remain relevant today: Aristotle's view of life as animation, a fundamental, irreducible property of nature; Descartes's view of life as mechanism; and Kant's view of life as organization, to which we need to add Darwin's concept of variation and evolution through natural selection (Gayon 2010; Morange 2008). In addition we may add the idea of defining life as an emergent property of particular kinds of complex systems (Weber 2010).

The focus of this entry is primarily the attempts to define life during the twentieth century with the rise of biochemistry and molecular biology. But this was the century that saw the rise of artificial intelligence, artificial life, and complex systems theory and so the concern includes these perspectives. Animate beings share a range of properties and phenomena that are not seen together in inanimate matter, although examples of matter exhibiting one or the other of these can be found. Living entities metabolize, grow, die, reproduce, respond, move, have complex organized functional structures, heritable variability, and have lineages which can evolve over generational time, producing new and emergent functional structures that provide increased adaptive fitness in changing environments. Reproduction involves not only the replication of the nucleic acids that carry the genetic information but the epigenetic building of the organism through a sequence of developmental steps. Such reproduction through development occurs within a larger life-cycle of the organism, which includes its senescence and death. Something that is alive has organized, complex structures that carry out these functions as well as sensing and responding to interior states and to the external environment and engaging in movement within that environment. It must be remembered that evolutionary phenomena are an inextricable aspect of living systems; any attempt to define life in the absence of this diachronic perspective will be futile. It will be argued below that living systems may be defined as open systems maintained in steady-states, far-from-equilibrium, due to matter-energy flows in which informed (genetically) autocatalytic cycles extract energy, build complex internal structures, allowing growth even as they create greater entropy in their environments, and capable, over multigenerational time. of evolution.


1. Prelude: Mechanist/Vitalist Debate

The last words written by Shelley in his unfinished poem The Triumph of Life were “Then, what is life? I cried.” Clearly Shelley meant this in the everyday sense rather than the technical usage of what distinguishes animate from inanimate. C.U.M Smith (1976) in his The Problem of Life sets out to answer Shelley's question by addressing the problem not only of how matter could be alive but also be conscious. Although conscious, living matter was a problem for Democritean philosophers, it was not for other pre-Socratics nor for Aristotle for whom living beings where paradigmatic. “The phenomenon which seemed to [Aristotle] most basic in the apparent flux of the world was the unity and persistence of the individual living being” (Smith 1976, p. 72). Indeed, Aristotle's biology and the philosophy he developed from it was sophisticated and enduring (Lennox 2001). Thus for Aristotle there was no problem of life, although there was a problem for an atomist view of nature that seemed inconsistent with biological phenomena (Rosen 1991). Descartes radically reconceptualized the problem by his dualism of matter and mind; life was a problem for which an explanation was to be sought in the mechanistic interactions of matter, and there was the question of how mind was related to the matter in living beings. As chemistry developed as a discipline in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries the goal of most advanced thinkers was to develop explanatory theories of living things in terms of chemical matter and mechanisms. Such attempts at what must be admitted to be premature reduction were resisted by critics, including some vitalists, whose positions covered a wide range from romantic anti-materialists, through chemists seeking a new type of Newtonian force (“vital force”) in nature, to materialists who had an intuition of the importance of the organized whole (Fruton 1972, 1999).

The debate between the “mechanists” and the “vitalists” about the relationship of matter and life as well as matter and mind, spilled over into the twentieth century, especially during the time that biochemists were defining their field as a separate discipline from chemistry or physiology. Four books published around 1930 capture the flavor of the debate (Woodger 1929; Haldane 1929, 1931; Hogben 1930). J.S. Haldane, a physiologist, resisted reduction of biological phenomena to mechanistic explanations, as he saw the structure of biological organisms and their action being disanalogous to what was seen in physical systems. The laws of chemistry and physics just were not robust enough to account for biology. “It is life we are studying in biology, and not phenomena which can be represented by causal conceptions of physics and chemistry” Haldane 1931, p. 28). He rejects, however, the search for a vital force since it would reduce the complexity of biological phenomena to a single principle. Rather, the phenomena of biology can only be understood in a holistic perspective that is faithful to the complexity observed in biological phenomena. Lancelot Hogben, in his book The Nature of Living Matter, which was dedicated to Bertrand Russell, argues for a reductionist epistemology and ontology. For Hogben, as for Haldane, consciousness is seen as an integral part of the problem of life, “an inquiry into the nature of life and the nature of consciousness presupposes the necessity of formulating the problem in the right way” (Hogben 1930, pp. 31–32). Indeed, “no problem of philosophy is more fundamental than the nature of life” (Hogben 1930, p. 80). But for Hogben the nature, indeed glory, of science is that its answers are always incomplete and it does not seek the finality that he saw as the goal of philosophy. He saw no need to abandon the reductionist methodology that biochemistry was developing and argued that Whitehead's assumption that science would reveal a universe consistent with human ethical predilections should be reversed and that philosophy would have to conform with the findings of science. Woodger saw the issues in the mechanist-vitalist debate as more complex than either side admitted. The resolution would come from a recognition of the primary importance of biological organization and of levels of biological organization, “by a cell therefore I shall understand a certain type of biological organization, not a concrete entity” (Woodger 1929, p. 296, emphasis in original). Woodger urged abandoning the use of the word ‘life’ in scientific discourse on the grounds that ‘living organism’ was what had to be explained. He saw the question of how life arose as being outside science.

2. The Biochemical Conception of Life

Perhaps the venue where the issue of the nature of life was most urgently addressed was the Department of Biochemistry at the University of Cambridge. During the first half of the twentieth century, under the guidance of its first Sir William Dunn Professor of Biochemistry, Sir Frederick Gowland Hopkins, the department set much of the conceptual framework, methodology, as well as educating many of the leaders in the field (Needham & Baldwin 1949; Weatherall and Kamminga 1992; Kamminga & Weatherall 1996; Weatherall & Kamminga 1996; Kamminga 1997; de Chadarevian 2002). Hopkins's vision of the emerging field of biochemistry was that it was a discipline in its own right (not an adjunct to medicine or agriculture nor applied chemistry) that needed to explore all biological phenomena on the chemical level. More importantly, Hopkins had a belief that although living things did not disobey any physical or chemical laws they instantiated them in ways that required understanding of biological phenomena, constraints, and functional organization. In his influential address to the British Association for the Advancement of Science given in 1913, Hopkins rejected both the reductionism of organic chemists who sought to deduce in vitro what had to happen in vivo and the crypto-vitalism of many physiologists who viewed the protoplasm of living cells as itself alive and irreducible to chemical analysis (Hopkins 1913 [1949]). What Hopkins offered instead was a view of the cell as a chemical machine, obeying the laws of thermodynamics and physical chemistry generally, but having organized molecular structures and functions. The chemistry underlying metabolism was catalyzed and regulated by enzymes, protein catalysts, and involved, because of biological necessity, small changes in structure and energy of well-defined chemical intermediates. The living cell is “not a mass of matter composed of a congregation of like molecules, but a highly differentialed system: the cell, in the modern phraseology of physical chemistry, is a system of co-existing phases of different constitutions” (Hopkins 1913 [1949] p. 151). Understanding how the organization was achieved was just as important as knowing how the chemical reactions occurred. For Hopkins life is “a property of the cell as a whole, because it depends upon the organization of processes” (Hopkins 1913 [1949] p. 152). Indeed, Hopkins was impressed with the philosophy of Whitehead with its part/whole relationships and emphasis on processes rather than entities (Hopkins 1927 [1949]; Kamminga & Weatherall 1996) and it formed an explicit foundation for the research program he developed at Cambridge and became an implicit assumption in the research programs developed by many of the students who trained there (Prebble & Weber 2003). A member of the department, Joseph Needham became actively engaged in carrying Hopkins's vision to the broader intellectual community writing on the philosophical basis of biochemistry (Needham 1925). He followed Hopkins too in asserting that the crucial question no longer was the relationship of living and non-living substance but also of mind and body, with biochemistry conceding to philosophy and the then incipient neurosciences, the latter question, so that it could focus on learning about living matter. Another member of the biochemistry department, N.W. Pirie, tackled the question of defining life and concluded that it could not be adequately defined by a list of qualities nor even processes since life “cannot be defined in terms of one variable” (Pirie 1937, p. 21–22). There was a challenge for Hopkins's program to figure out how rather simple physical and chemical laws could produce the complexity of living systems.

During the 1930s an informal group, known as the Biotheoretical Gathering met in Cambridge and included several members of the biochemistry department (Joseph & Dorothy Needham, and Conrad Waddington) as well as a number of other Cambridge scientists (such as crystallographers J.D. Bernal and Dorothy Crowford Hodgkins) and philosophers (J.H. Woodger and Karl Popper). This group was consciously exploring the philosophical approach of Whitehead with the goal of building a trans-disciplinary theoretical and philosophical biology which helped lay the foundation for the conceptual triumph of molecular biology after World War II (Abir-Am 1987; de Chadarevian 2002). The research program of Hopkins was well established by this period and especially through the Needhams it was linked with the work of the Biotheoretical Gathering, influencing J.B.S. Haldane, who made major contributions to enzymology and to forging the modern evolutionary synthesis or neo-Darwinism. Haldane, along with Bernal, would play a major, early role in moving the concern from beyond the nature of life to its origin as a subject for scientific study. Haldane suspected, along with Pirie, that a fully satisfactory definition of life was impossible, but he asserted that the material definition was a reasonable goal for science. He saw life as “a pattern of chemical processes. This pattern has special properties. It begets a similar pattern, as a flame does, but it regulates itself as a flame does not.” (Haldane 1947, p. 56). Use of the flame metaphor for cellular metabolic activity implied a nonequilibrium process in an open system capable of reproduction but also, by the limit of the metaphor, self regulation. In this Haldane reflected the shifting concern to working out how matter and physical laws could lead to biological phenomena.

By the time of World War II it was meaningful to address the question of “what is life?” in molecular terms and fundamental physical laws. It was clear that there were several distinct ways in which matter in living systems behaved in ways different from non-living systems. For example, how could genetic information be instantiated at a molecular level given that ensembles of atoms or molecules behaved statistically? Or, how could biological systems generate and maintain their internal order in the face of the imperative of the second law of thermodynamics that all natural systems proceed with increasing entropy?

3. Schrödinger's What is Life?

In 1943 Erwin Schrödinger gave a series of lectures at the Dublin Institute for Advanced Studies, which were published as What is Life? in 1944 (Schrödinger 1944). This little book had a major impact on the development of twentieth century biology, especially upon Francis Crick and James Watson and other founders of molecular biology (Judson 1979; Murphy & O'Neill 1995). Schrödinger did not break new ground, as has been pointed out by Perutz (1987), but rather gathered together several strands of research and stated his questions in a stark and provocative manner. Building upon the demonstration by Max Delbrueck that the size of the ‘target’ of mutations caused by X-rays had the dimensions of a molecule of a thousand or so atoms, Schrödinger wondered how it could be that there could be sustained order in the molecules responsible for heredity when it was well known that statistical ensembles of molecules quickly became disordered (with increased entropy as predicted by the second law of thermodynamics). The problem of heredity then was reformulated at the molecular level as to how order could give rise to order? The other main topic that concerned Schrödinger was the thermodynamics of living things in general, that is, how could they generate order from disorder through their metabolism? It was through answering these two specific questions from the perspective of a physicist that Schrödinger sought to answer the big question, what is life?

It was the answer to the first question that captured the attention of the founders of the new biology. Schrödinger argued that the molecular material had to be an ‘aperiodic’ solid that had embedded in its structure a ‘miniature code.’ That is, the pattern of constituent atoms comprising the molecule of heredity would not have a simple periodic repetitive order of the same constituents or subunits, but rather would have a higher-level order due to the pattern of its molecular subunits; it was this higher-level but aperiodic order that would contain the coded information of heredity. The elucidation of the structure of DNA and the explosion of our understanding of molecular genetics has eclipsed the other, but to Schrödinger equal, arm of the argument, namely that the most important aspect of metabolism is that it represents the cell's way of dealing with all the entropy that it cannot help but produce as it builds its internal order, what Schrödinger termed ‘negentropy.’ He noted that the cell must maintain itself in a state away from equilibrium since thermodynamic equilibrium is the very definition of death. By creating internal order and organization within a living system (cells, organisms or ecosystems) the metabolic activities must produce greater disorder in the environment, such that the second law is not violated. He tied the two notions, of order from order and order from disorder, together by claiming, “an organism's astonishing gift of concentrating a ‘stream of order’ on itself and thus escaping the decay into atomic chaos — of ‘drinking orderliness’ from a suitable environment — seems to be connected with the presence of ‘aperiodic solids’, the chromosome molecules, which doubtless represent the highest degree of well-ordered atomic association we know of — much higher than the ordinary periodic crystal — in virtue of the individual role every atom and every radical is playing here” (Schrödinger 1944, 77). Although Schrödinger was giving a physicist's answer to Shelley's question, he did not confine himself only to the question of what distinguished the living from the non-living and in the epilogue reflects on free will and consciousness. As with so many previous attempts to address the nature of life, the issue of consciousness was seen by Schrödinger too as connected to that of life itself.

4. Schrödinger's Dual “Legacy”

The impact of Schrödinger's slim volume on a generation of physicists and chemists who were lured to biology and who founded molecular biology is well chronicled (Judson 1979; Kay 2000). Knowledge about the protein and nucleic acid basis of living systems continues to be obtained at an accelerating rate, with the sequencing of the human genome as a major landmark along this path of discovery. The “self-replicating” DNA has become a major metaphor for understanding all of life. The world is divided into replicators, which are seen to be fundamental and to control development and be the fundamental level of action for natural selection, and interactors, the molecules and structures coded by the replicators (Dawkins 1976, 1989). Indeed, Dawkins relegates organisms to the status of epiphenomenal gene-vehicles, or survival machines. A reaction has set in to what is perceived as an over-emphasis on nucleic acid replication (see for example Keller 1995, 2002; Moss 2003). In particular developmental systems theorists have argued for a causal pluralism in developmental and evolutionary biology (see essays and references in Oyama, Griffiths, & Gray 2001). However, the rapid progress in gene sequencing is producing fundamental insights into the relationship of genes and morphology and has added important dimensions to our understanding of evolutionary phenomena (see for example Graur & Li 2000; Carroll, Grenier, & Weatehrbee 2001).

What is less known is the over half-a-century of work inspired, in part, by the other pillar of Schrödinger's argument, namely how organisms gain order from disorder through the thermodynamics of open systems far from equilibrium (Schneider & Kay 1995). Prominent among early students of such nonequilibrium thermodynamics was Ilya Prigogine (1947). Prigogine influenced J. D. Bernal in his 1947 lectures on the physical basis of life to start to understand both how organisms produced their internal order while affected their environment by not only their activities but through created disorder in it (Bernal 1951). Harold Morowitz explicitly addressed the issue of energy flow and the production of biological organization, subsequently generalized in various ways (Morowitz 1968; Peacocke 1983; Brooks and Wiley 1986: Wicken 1987; Schneider 1993; Swenson 2000; Morowitz 2002). Internal order can be produced by gradients of energy (matter/energy) flows through living systems. Structures so produced help not only draw more energy through the system, lengthen its retention time in the system, but also dissipate degraded energy, or entropy, to the environment, thus paying Schrödinger's “entropy debt.” Living systems then are seen an instance of a more general phenomena of dissipative structures. “With the help of this energy and matter exchange with the environment, the system maintains its inner non-equilibrium, and the non-equilibrium in turn maintains the exchange process…. A dissipative structure continuously renews itself and maintains a particular dynamic regime, a globally stable space-time structure” (Jantsch 1980). However, thermodynamics can deal only with the possibility that something can occur spontaneously; whether self-organizing phenomena occur depend upon the actual specific conditions (initial and boundary) as well as the relationships among components (Williams & Frausto da Silva 1999).

Seeing the cell as a thermodynamic ‘dissipative structure’ was not to be considered as reducing the cell to physics, as Bernal pointed out, rather a richer physics of what Warren Weaver called “organized complexity” (in contrast to simple order or “disorganized complexity”) was being deployed (Weaver 1948). The development of this “new” physics of open systems and the dissipative structures that arise in them was the fulfillment of the development that Schrödinger foresaw (Rosen 2000). Dissipative structures in physical and chemical systems are phenomena that are explained by nonequilibrium thermodynamics (Prigogine & Stengers 1984). The emergent, self-organizing spatio-temporal patterns observed in the Belousov-Zhabotinski reaction are also seen in biological systems (such as in slime mold aggregation or electrical patterns in heart activity) (Tyson 1976; Sole and Goodwin 2000). Indeed, related self-organizational phenomena pervade biology (Camazine et al. 2001). Such phenomena are seen not only in cells and organisms, but in ecosystems, which reinforces the notion that a broader systems perspective is needed as part of the new physics (Ulanowicz 1997). Important to such phenomena are the dynamics of non-linear interactions (where responses of a system can be much larger than the stimulus) and autocatalytic cycles (reaction sequences that are closed on themselves and in which a larger quantity of one or more starting materials is made through the processes). Given that the catalysts in biological systems are coded in the genes of the DNA, one place to start defining life is to view living systems as informed, autocatalytic cyclic entities that develop and evolve under the dual dictates of the second law of thermodynamics and of natural selection (Depew & Weber 1995; Weber & Depew 1996). Such an approach non-reductively connects the phenomena of living systems with basic laws of physics and chemistry (Harold 2001). Others intuit that an even richer physics is needed to adequately capture the self-organizing phenomena observed in biology and speculate that a “fourth law” of thermodynamics about such phenomena may ultimately be needed (Kauffman 1993, 1995, 2000). In any event, increasingly the tools developed for the “sciences of complexity” and being deployed to develop better models of living systems (Depew & Weber 1995; Kauffman 2000). Robert Rosen has reminded us that complexity is not life itself but what he terms “the habitat of life” and that we need to make our focus on the relational. “Organization inherently involves functions and their interrelations” (Rosen 1991, 280). Whether the existing sciences of complexity are sufficient or a newer conceptual framework is needed remains to be seen (Harold 2001). Living beings exhibit complex, functional organization and an ability to become more adapted to their environments over generational time, which phenomena represent the challenge to physically-based explanations based upon mechanistic (reductionistic) assumptions. By appealing to complex systems dynamics there is the possibility of physically-based theories that can robustly address phenomena of emergence without having recourse to the type of “vitalism” that was countenanced by some in the earlier part of the twentieth century.

5. Origin (Emergence) of Life

One of the biggest and most important of emergent phenomena is that of the origin or emergence of life. Franklin Harold ranks the mystery of life's origin as the most consequential facing science today (Harold 2001, 235). Michael Ruse claims that it is essential to incorporate origin of life resarch into Darwinism since it is a necessary condition for a scientifically and philosophically adequate definition of life (Ruse 2008, 101). Robert Rosen argued that the reason that the question “what is life?” is so hard to answer is that we really want to know much more than what it is, we want to know why it is, “we are really asking, in physical terms, why a specific material system is an organism and not something else” (Rosen 1991, 15). To answer this why question we need to understand how life might have arisen. While not attracting the attention nor levels of funding of molecular biology, there was a continuous research program during much of the twentieth century on the origin of life (for historical summaries see Fry 2000; Lahav 1999).

During the 1920s Alexander Oparin and J.B.S. Haldane independently proposed the first modern hypotheses as to how life might have originated on earth (Oparin 1929; Haldane 1929/1967). Key assumptions were that the geophysical conditions on the primitive earth were quite different from the present, most importantly there would have been no molecular oxygen in the atmosphere (oxygen arising very much later in time with the appearance of photosynthetic organisms that used light energy to split water) and that in this chemically reducing atmosphere an increasingly complex “soup” or organic molecules would arise from which the precursors of living systems could arise (for a recent discussion about the early atmosphere see Miyakawa et al. 2002). In effect this type of approach can be termed a metabolism-first view.

After the demonstration that some amino acids could be produced by the action of an electrical discharge through a mixture of gases thought to be present in the primitive atmosphere (Miller 1953), another possible starting point for the sequence to living things was considered, namely proteins, the polymers of amino acids formed under conditions of high temperature (Fox & Harada 1958). This protein-first view suggested that the chemistry that lead to life could have occurred in a sequestered environment (globs of proteins) that might also have some weak catalytic activity that would have facilitated the production of the other molecular components needed (Fox 1988).

With the understanding of the structure of DNA focus shifted to the abiotic routes to nucleic acids, which could serve then serve as templates for their own replication. Although Dawkins assumed a nucleic acid, formed by chance, would be the start of life since it would “self replicate” (Dawkins 1976), many approaches to getting to nucleic acids involve a role for minerals to help form scaffolds that serve as sorts of ordering templates and even as catalysts for nucleic acid formation (Cairns-Smith 1982; see summary in Lahav 1999). The discovery that RNA is capable of some catalytic activity has led to the postulate of not only a nucleic acids first but more generally of an ‘RNA world’ (Gilbert 1986). Variants of this approach represent the dominant mode of thinking about the early phases of the emergence of life (Maynard Smith and Szathmary 1995). Given that some type of metabolism would be needed to sustain RNA replication, a number of approaches blend replication-first with metabolism-first (Dyson 1982, 1999; de Duve 1995; Eigen 1992).

An alternative view, congenial to a thermodynamic and systems approach to the emergence of life, takes the above move a step further and emphasizes the need the presence of the main factors that distinguish cells from non-cells: metabolism via autocatalytic cycles of catalytic polymers, replication, and a physical enclosure within a chemical barrier like that provided by the cell membrane. This might be termed a proto-cell-first approach (Morowitz 1992; Weber 1998; Williams & Frausto da Silva 2002, 2003). Chemical constraints and the self-organizing tendencies of complex chemical systems in such a view would have been critical in determining the properties of the first living beings. (Kauffman 1993, 1995, 2000; Williams & Frausto da Silva 1999, 2002, 2003; Weber 2007, 2009). With the emergence of the first entities that could be termed living would come the emergence of biological selection or natural selection in which contingency plays a much greater part.

Darwin famously bracketed the question of the origin of life from questions of descent with modification through natural selection. Indeed, Darwinian theories of evolution can take living systems as a given and then explore how novelties arise through a combination of chance and necessity. However, an understanding of how life might have emerged would provide a bridge between our view of the properties of living systems and the evolutionary phenomena they exhibit. Such an understanding ultimately is needed to anchor living systems in matter and the laws of nature (Harold 2001, 235). This remains a challenge to be met in order for science to provide a more full answer to Shelley's question.

6. Artificial Life

Advances in computer technology in recent years have permitted exploration of life “in silico” as it were. While computer simulations are utilized by many theoretical biologists, those who explore ‘Artificial Life’ or ‘A-Life’ seek to do more than model known living systems. There goal is to place life as it is known on earth in a larger conceptual context of any possible forms of life (Langton 1989, 1995). Work in A-Life shifts our focus on the processes in living things rather than the material constituents of their structures per se (Emmeche 1994). In some ways this is a revival of the process thinking of the Cambridge biochemists of the 1930s, but involves a level of abstraction about the material structures that instantiate these processes that they would not have shared. However, such studies emphasize the organizational relationship between components rather than the components themselves, an important focus in the emerging age of “proteomics” in which, in the post human genome era, the complex, functional interactions of the large array of cellular proteins is being studied (Kumar & Snyder 2002).

A-Life studies can help us to sharpen our ideas about what distinguishes living from non-living and contribute to our definition of life. Such work can help delineate the degree of importance of the typical list of attributes of living entities, such as reproduction, metabolism, functional organization, growth, responsiveness to the environment, movement, and short- and long-term adaptations. A-Life work can also allow exploration about which features of life are due to the constraints of being enmattered in a particular manner and subject to physical and chemical laws, as well as exploring a variety of factors that might affect evolutionary scenarios (Etxeberria 2002). For example, the relative potential roles of selection and self-organization in the emergence of novel traits in evolutionary time might be evaluated by A-Life research. It is too soon yet to know how important the contribution of the A-Life program will be, but it is likely to become more prominent in the discourse on the origin and nature of life.

7. Conclusions

Our increased understanding of the physical-chemical basis of living systems has increased enormously over the past century and it is possible to give a plausible definition of life in these terms. “Living organisms are autopoietic systems: self-constructing, self-maintaining, energy-transducing autocatalytic entities” in which information needed to construct the next generation of organisms is stabilized in nucleic acids that replicate within the context of whole cells and work with other developmental resources during the life-cycles of organisms, but they are also “systems capable of evolving by variation and natural selection: self-reproducing entities, whose forms and functions are adapted to their environment and reflect the composition and history of an ecosystem” (Harold 2001, 232). Such a perspective represents a fulfillment of the basic dual insights of Schrödinger near mid-century. Much remains to be elucidated about the relationships among the complex molecular systems of living entities, how they are constrained by the system as a whole as well as by physical laws. Indeed, it is still an open question for some as to whether we have yet a sufficiently rich understanding of the laws of nature or whether we need to seek deep laws that lead to order and organization (Kauffman 2000). At the start of the new century there is a sense of the importance of putting Schrödinger's program into a ‘systems’ context ( see for example Rosen 1991, 2000; Kauffman 1993, 1995, 2000; Depew and Weber 1995; Weber & Depew 1996, 2001; Ulanowicz 1997, 2001; Williams and Frausto da Silva 1999; 2002, 2003; Harold 2001; Morowitz 2002; Bunge 2003; Macdonald and Macdonald 2010). Significant challenges remain, such as fully integrating our new view of organisms and their action with evolutionary theory, and to understand plausible routes for the emergence of life. The fulfillment of such a program will give us a good sense of what life is on earth. Work in A-Life and empirical work seeking evidence of extra-terrestrial life may help the formulation of a more universal concept of life.

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