# Free Logic

*First published Mon Apr 5, 2010*

Classical logic requires each singular term to denote an object in the domain of quantification—an “existing” object. Free logic does not. Free logic is therefore useful for analyzing discourse containing singular terms that either are empty (have no referent or refer to objects that do not exist) or might be.

Section 1 lays out the basics of free logic, explaining how it differs from classical predicate logic and how it is related to inclusive logic, which permits empty domains or “worlds.” Section 2 shows how free logic may be represented by each of three formal methods: axiom systems, natural deduction rules and tree rules. Varying conventions for calculating the truth values of atomic formulas containing empty singular terms yield three distinct species of free logic: negative, positive and neutral. These are surveyed in Section 3, along with supervaluations, which were developed to augment neutral logics. Section 4 is critical, examining three anomalies that infect most free logics. Section 5 samples applications to theories of description, logics of partial or non-strict functions, logics with Kripke semantics, logics of fiction and logics that are in a certain sense Meinongian. Section 6 takes a glance at free logic's history.

## 1. The Basics

### 1.1 Definition of Free Logic

Free logic is formal logic whose quantifiers are interpreted in the
usual way—that is, objectually over a specified domain
** D**—but whose singular terms may denote
objects outside of

**, or fail to denote at all. Singular terms include proper names (individual constants), definite descriptions, and such functional expressions as ‘2 + 2’. Since classical (i.e., Fregean) predicate logic requires that singular terms denote members of**

*D***, free logic is a “nonclassical” logic. Where**

*D***is, as usual, taken to be the class of existing things, free logic may be characterized as logic the referents of whose singular terms need not exist.**

*D*### 1.2 How Free Logic Differs from Classical Predicate Logic

Karel Lambert (1960) coined the term ‘free logic’ as an
abbreviation for ‘logic free of existence assumptions with
respect to its terms, singular and general’. General terms
are predicates. Lambert was suggesting that just as classical
predicate logic generalized Aristotelian logic by, *inter alia*,
admitting predicates that are satisfied by no existing thing (‘is
a Martian’, ‘is non-self-identical’, ‘travels
faster than light’), so free logic generalizes classical
predicate logic by admitting singular terms that denote no existing
thing (‘Aphrodite’, ‘the greatest integer’,
‘the present king of France’).

Because classical logic's singular terms must denote existing things (when, as usual, ‘∃’ is read as “there exists”), classical logic is unreliable in application to statements containing singular terms whose referents either do not exist or are not known to. Consider, for example, the true statement:

(S) We detect no motion of the earth relative to the ether,

using ‘the ether’ as a singular term for the
light-bearing medium posited by nineteenth century physicists.
The reason why (S) is true is that, as we now know, the ether does not
exist. According to classical logic, however, (S) is false,
because it implies the existence of the ether. Free logic allows
such statements to be true despite the non-referring singular
term. Indeed, it allows even statements of the form ~∃*x*
*x=t* (e.g., “the ether does not exist”) to be true,
though in classical logic, which presumes that *t* refers to an
object in the quantificational domain, they are self-contradictory.

Free logic accommodates *empty* singular terms (those that
denote no member of the quantificational domain
** D**) by rejecting inferences whose validity
depends on the classical presumption that they must denote members of

**. Consider, for example, the rule of universal instantiation (specification): from the premise “Every**

*D**x*(in

**) satisfies**

*D**A*” we may infer “

*t*satisfies

*A*.” This rule, whose formal expression is:

∀xA⊢A(t/x),

is invalid in free logic; for even if every object in
** D** satisfies

*A*, if

*t*does not denote a member of

**,**

*D**A*(

*t/x*) may be false. (Here and elsewhere

*A*(

*t/x*) is the result of replacing all occurrences of

*x*in

*A*by individual constant

*t*; if there are no such occurrences, then

*A*(

*t/x*) is just

*A*.) Existential generalization (the principle that from “

*t*satisfies

*A*” we may infer “there exists (in

**) a thing**

*D**x*that satisfies

*A*”):

A(t/x) ⊢ ∃xA

is likewise invalid; for if *t* does not denote an object in
** D** then the truth of

*A*(

*t/x*) does not guarantee that there exists in

**an object that satisfies**

*D**A*. Though free logic rejects such classical inferences, it accepts no classically invalid inferences; hence it is strictly weaker than classical logic for a language with the same vocabulary.

To distinguish terms that denote members of
** D** from those that do not, free logic often
employs the one-place “existence” predicate,
‘

*E!*’ (sometimes written simply as ‘E’). For any singular term

*t*,

*E!t*is true if

*t*denotes a member of

**, false otherwise. ‘**

*D**E!*’ may be either taken as primitive or (in bivalent free logic with identity) defined as follows:

E!t=_{df}∃x(x=t).

Using ‘*E!*’ we can express classical logic's
blanket presumption that singular terms denote members of
** D** as an explicit premise,

*E!t*, for selected terms

*t*. Thus we can formulate the following weaker analogs of universal instantiation:

∀xA,E!t⊢A(t/x)

and existential generalization:

A(t/x),E!t⊢ ∃xA,

which are valid in free logic.

### 1.3 Relation of Free Logic to Inclusive Logic

Classical predicate logic presumes not only that all singular terms
refer to members of the quantificational domain
** D**, but also that

**is nonempty. Free logic rejects the first of these presumptions.**

*D**Inclusive logic*(sometimes also called

*empty*or

*universally*

*free*logic) rejects them both. Thus while inclusive logic for a language containing singular terms must be free, free logics need not be inclusive.

Many existential assertions—e.g., ∃*x*(*x=x*),
∃*x*(*Px* → *Px*),
∃*x*(*Px* → ∀*yPy*)—are true
in all nonempty domains and hence are valid in both classical logic and
non-inclusive free logic. But since all existentially quantified
formulas are false in the empty domain, none are valid in inclusive
logic. Correlatively, since all universally quantified formulas
are true in the empty domain, none are self-contradictory in inclusive
logic. Even vacuously universally quantified formulas (formulas
of the form ∀*xA*, where *x* is not free in *A*)
are true in the empty domain. Hence the schema:

∀xA→A, wherexis not free inA,

which is valid in both classical logic and non-inclusive free logic, is invalid in inclusive logic. Inclusive logic also invalidates some of the laws of confinement—e.g.,

∀x(P&A) ↔ (P& ∀xA), wherexis not free inP,

that are used for prenexing formulas (giving quantifiers the widest possible scope) or purifying them (giving quantifiers the narrowest possible scope). And in inclusive logic the formula:

∀x(A↔x=t),

widely used in the theory of definite descriptions, is not equivalent, as it otherwise is, to:

∀x(A→x=t) &A(t/x),

since with ** D** empty and

*A*(

*t/x*) false, the first but not the second is true. Where there is need for such regularities, a non-inclusive free logic may be preferable to an inclusive one. Yet because inclusivity frees logic from one more existential presumption, many free logicians favor it.

## 2. Formal Systems

Logics may be represented in various ways. Axiom systems,
natural deduction systems and trees (or, equivalently, tableaux) are
among the most common. This section presents all three for the
bivalent inclusive form of free logic known as Positive Free Logic
(PFL) and mentions some variants. (For the meaning of the term
“positive” in this context see
Section 3.2).
PFL is formulated in a first-order language
** L** without sentence letters or function
symbols, whose primitive logical operators are negation (not)
‘~’, the conditional (if-then) ‘→’, the
universal quantifier (for all) ‘∀’, identity
‘=’ and ‘

*E!*’, the others being defined as usual. We assume for the sake of definiteness that the formulas of

**are closed (contain no unquantified variables) and that they may be vacuously quantified (have the form ∀**

*L**xA*or ∃

*xA*, where

*x*does not occur free in

*A*). An occurrence of a variable is

*quantified*if it lies within the scope of an operator such as ‘∀’ or ‘∃’ that binds that variable; otherwise it is

*free*.

### 2.1 Axiom Systems

PFL may be axiomatized, with modus ponens as the sole inference rule, by adding the following schemas to the tautologies of classical propositional logic:

(A1)

A→ ∀xA(A2) ∀

x(A→B) → (∀xA→ ∀xB)(A3) ∀

xA, ifA(t/x) is an axiom(A4) ∀

xA→ (E!t→A(t/x))(A5) ∀

xE!x.

A note on conventions involving variables: once again,
*A*(*t/x*) is the result of replacing all occurrences of
*x* in *A* by individual constant *t*. If
there are no such occurrences, then *A*(*t/x*) is just
*A*. In (A1) the variable *x* is not free in
*A* (since otherwise *A* would be an open formula and
formulas of ** L** are closed). However,

*x*may be free in

*A*or

*B*in (A2) and in

*A*in (A3) and (A4).

(A4) and (A5) are special axioms for free logic. The others are classical. (A4) modifies the classical principle:

(A4c) ∀xA→A(t/x)

by using ‘*E!*’ to restrict specification. (A4)
stipulates in effect that the quantifiers range over *all*
objects that satisfy ‘*E!*’, (A5) that they range
*only* over objects that satisfy ‘*E!*’. Omitting
(A5) and replacing (A4) with (A4c) yields classical logic. To obtain a
non-inclusive free logic, we may add to (A1)-(A5) the axiom
∃*xE!x*—or any axiom of the form
∃*xT* such that for any term *t*,
*T*(*t/x*) is a tautology.

For languages containing the identity predicate, we also need:

(A6)s=t→ (A→A(t//s))

(where *A*(*t//s*) is the result of replacing one or
more occurrences of *s* in *A* by *t*), and
either

(A7)t=t

if all self-identity statements, including those whose singular term is empty, are to be true or

(A7−) ∀x(x=x)

if not (see Sections
3.1
and
3.2
below). If ‘*E!*’ is defined in
terms of the identity predicate as indicated in
Section 1.2,
then (A4) takes the form:

∀xA→ (∃y(y=t) →A(t/x))

and (A5) is redundant and may be omitted. ‘*E!*’
cannot be defined without the identity predicate (Meyer, Bencivenga and
Lambert, 1982).

Free logic can be formalized without either ‘=’ or
‘*E!*’. (A1)–(A3) remain unchanged, but (A4) and
(A5) are replaced respectively by:

(A4′) ∀

y(∀xA→A(y/x))(A5′) ∀

x∀yA→ ∀y∀xA.

(A4′), like (A4), restricts specification to objects within
** D**, but it uses a quantifier instead of
‘

*E!*’ to do so. The quantifier permutation axiom (A5′) is redundant in the presence of the identity axioms but, as Fine proved in (1983), is independent of the other axioms.

The formulas used in the axiom systems discussed so far are closed,
but some free logics allow open formulas—i.e., formulas that
contain free variables. These logics follow one of two
conventions for variable assignments. Those that assign to each
free variable a member of ** D** are called

*E*; those that do not are called

^{+}-logics*E-logics*. The following specification rule is valid in E

^{+}-logics but not in E-logics:

∀xA⊢A(v/x).

(Here *A*(*v/x*) is the result of replacing every
occurrence of the variable *x* in *A* by a variable
*v* that is free for *x* in *A*.)
Conversely, the following substitution rule is valid in E-logics but
not in E^{+}-logics:

A⊢A(t/x).

But since this article employs closed formulas, the distinction
between E- and E^{+}-logics may here be ignored.

### 2.2 Natural Deduction Rules

PFL can also equivalently be formulated in a natural deduction
system. The introduction and elimination rules for the operators
of propositional logic and identity are as usual. The quantifier
introduction and elimination rules are restricted by use of the
predicate ‘*E!*’, as follows:

∀I:Given a derivation of A(t/x) fromE!t, wheretis new and does not occur inA, dischargeE!tand infer ∀xA.∀E:From ∀ xAandE!tinferA(t/x).∃I:From A(t/x) andE!tinfer ∃xA.∃E:Given ∃ xAand a derivation of a formulaBfromA(t/x) &E!t, wheretis new and does not occur in eitherAorB, dischargeA(t/x) &E!tand infer B from ∃xA.

The variable *x* need not be free in *A*, in which
case *A*(*t/x*) is just *A*.
‘*E!*’ may either be taken as primitive (in which case it
requires no additional rules) or defined in terms of the identity
predicate as in
Section 1.2.
For non-inclusive
logic, we may add a rule that introduces ∃*x**E!x*.

### 2.3 Tree Rules

Jeffrey-style tree rules (Jeffrey 1991) for PFL can be obtained by replacing the classical rules for existentially and universally quantified formulas with the following:

: If ∃Existential RulexAappears unchecked on an open path, check it, and

- if
xis free inA, choose a new individual constanttand list bothE!tandA(t/x) at the bottom of every open path beneath ∃xA, and- if
xis not free inA, writeAat the bottom of every open path beneath ∃xA.

: If ∀Universal RulexAappears on an open path, then

- if
xis free inA, then wheretis an individual constant that occurs in a formula on that path, or a new individual constant if there are none on the path, split the bottom of every open path beneath ∀xAinto two branches, writing ~E!tat the bottom of the first branch andA(t/x) at the bottom of the second, and- if
xis not free inA, writeAat the bottom of every open path beneath ∀xA.

For languages that do not allow vacuous quantification, clause (ii)
can in each case be omitted. Non-inclusive free logic needs an
additional rule that introduces *E!t* for some new individual
constant *t* if a path does not already contain a formula of
this form.

## 3. Semantics

Semantics for free logics differ in how they assign truth-values to
atomic formulas that are *empty-termed*—i.e., contain at
least one empty singular term. There are three general
approaches:

*Negative*semantics require all empty-termed atomic formulas to be false,*Positive*semantics allow some empty-termed atomic formulas not of the form*E!t*to be true, and*Neutral*(or*nonvalent*) semantics require all empty-termed atomic formulas not of the form*E!t*to be truth-valueless.

### 3.1 Negative Semantics

A negative semantics is a bivalent semantics on which all empty-termed atomic formulas (including identity statements) are false. The inclusive version presented here makes only minimal adjustments to classical semantics to allow for non-denoting terms.

Let the language ** L** be defined as in
Section 2.
Then a negative inclusive model for

**is a pair ⟨**

*L***,**

*D***⟩, where**

*I***is a possibly empty set (the domain) and**

*D***is an interpretation function that assigns referents to individual constants and extensions to predicates such that:**

*I*- for each individual constant
*t*of, either*L*(*I**t*) ∈or*D*(*I**t*) is undefined, and - for each
*n*-place predicate*P*of,*L*(*I**P*) ⊆*D*.^{n}

(*D** ^{n}* is the set of

*n*-tuples of members of

**, a 1-tuple of an object**

*D**d*being just

*d*itself.) Given a model ⟨

**,**

*D***⟩, we recursively define a valuation function**

*I***that assigns truth values to formulas as follows:**

*V*

(VPt)_{1}…t_{n}=

- T ⇔
(It),…,_{1}(It) are all defined and ⟨_{n}(It),…,_{1}(It)⟩ ∈_{n}(IP);- F otherwise.
(Vs=t)= T ⇔ (Is) and(It) are both defined and(Is) =(It);

F otherwise.(VE!t)= T ⇔ (It) is defined;

F otherwise.(~VA)= T ⇔ (VA) = F;

F otherwise.(VA→B)= T ⇔ (VA) = F or(VB) = T;

F otherwise.(∀VxA)=

- T ⇔ for all
d∈D,_{}V_{(t}_{,d}_{ )}(A(t/x)) = T (wheretis any individual constant not inAandV_{(t}_{,d}_{ )}is the valuation function on the model ⟨,DI^{*}⟩ such thatI^{*}is just likeexcept thatII^{*}(t) =);_{}d- F otherwise.

(The metalinguistic symbol ‘⇔’ means “if and only if.”) A logic adequate to this semantics may be axiomatized by making three changes to the axioms of PFL. The first is to add the axiom:

(A−)Pt_{1}…t→_{n}E!t, where 1≤_{i}i≤nandPis any primitiven-place predicate, including ‘=’.

This expresses the convention that an atomic formula cannot be true
unless its terms refer. Second, because all empty-termed identity
statements are false on a negative semantics, (A7) is invalid and must
be replaced by (A7−). Third, since (A2), (A3), (A−) and (A7−)
together imply (A5), (A5) may be omitted. The resulting logic is
known as NFL (Negative Free Logic). For languages with function
symbols, negative free logic requires in addition this *axiom of
strictness*:

E!f(t_{1},…,t) →_{n}E!t, where 1≤_{i}i≤n,

which assures that a function has a value only if each of its arguments does. Because of its unusual treatment of identity, negative free logic validates the equivalence:

t=t↔E!t.

Thus in some negative logics, *E!t* is defined simply as
*t=t*. It is noteworthy, too, that each instance of
the principle of *indiscernibility of nonexistents*:

(~E!s& ~E!t) → (A→A(t//s)),

(where *A*(*t//s*) is the result of replacing one or
more occurrences of *s* in *A* by *t*) is provable
in negative free logic.

### 3.2 Positive Semantics

Positive semantics allow some empty-termed atomic formulas not of
the form *E!t* to be true. They are typically bivalent,
though there are variants that allow truth-value gaps or extra truth
values. Only bivalent semantics are considered in this
section.

Positive semantics treat formulas of the form *t*=*t* as
true, whether or not *t* is empty. Hence they validate (A7),
which affirms all self-identity statements, not merely the weaker
(A7−), which affirms only self-identities between nonempty
terms.

Like negative semantics, some positive semantics require each
singular term to denote either a member of ** D**
or nothing at all. But then when a term fails to denote, the
truth value of an atomic formula containing it cannot as usual be a
function of its denotation, and the formula must be evaluated in some
nonstandard way. To avoid such irregularity and yet permit
empty-termed formulas to be true, other positive semantics allow
singular terms to denote, and predicates to be satisfied by, nonmembers
of

**. These nonmembers are collected into a second or**

*D**outer*domain

*D*_{o}, in contrast to which

**is described as the**

*D**inner*domain. The result is a

*dual-domain*semantics.

Positive semantics with dual domains are generally the simplest. The
members of the outer domain
*D*_{o} typically represent
“non-existing” things. Depending on the application,
these may be theoretical or ideal entities, error objects (in computer
science), fictional objects, merely possible (or even impossible)
objects, and so on. Some authors make ** D**
a subset of

*D*_{o}, which is the convention throughout this article; others make the two disjoint. In a bivalent dual-domain semantics each singular term denotes an object in

*D*_{o}though possibly not in

**. Thus**

*D***, though not**

*D*

*D*_{o}, may empty. Predicates are assigned extensions from

*D*_{o}, and the truth-values of atomic formulas (whether empty-termed or not) are computed in the usual Tarskian fashion: an atomic formula is true if and only if the

*n*-tuple of objects denoted by its singular terms, taken in order, is a member of the predicate's extension. Identity statements are no exception. Statements of the form

*s=t*are true if and only if

*s*and

*t*denote the same object. Hence, even if empty-termed, they may be true.

More formally, a dual-domain model for a language
** L** of the sort defined in
Section 2
is a triple
⟨

**,**

*D*

*D*_{o},

**⟩, where**

*I***is a possibly empty inner domain,**

*D*

*D*_{o}is a nonempty outer domain such that

**⊆**

*D*

*D*_{o}, and

**is an interpretation function such that for every individual constant**

*I**t*of

**,**

*L***(**

*I**t*) ∈

*D*_{o}, and for every

*n*-place predicate

*P*of

**,**

*L***(**

*I**P*) ⊆

*D**. Given a model ⟨*

_{o}^{n}**,**

*D*

*D**,*

_{o}**⟩, the valuation function**

*I***assigns truth values to atomic and quantified formulas as follows:**

*V*

(VPt_{1}…t)_{n}= T ⇔ ⟨ (It_{1}),…,(It)⟩ ∈_{n}(IP);

F otherwise(Vs=t)= T ⇔ (Is) =(It);

F otherwise(VE!t)= T ⇔ (It) ∈;D

F otherwise(∀VxA)=

- T ⇔ for all
d∈D,_{}V_{(t}_{,d}_{ )}(A(t/x)) = T (wheretis not inAandV_{(t}_{,d}_{ )}is the valuation function on the model ⟨,DD,_{o}I^{*}⟩ such thatI^{*}is just likeexcept thatII^{*}(t) =);_{}d- F otherwise

The clauses for ‘~’ and ‘ → ’ are the same as in negative free logic. PFL with classical identity — that is, the logic axiomatized by (A1)–(A7) — is sound and complete with respect to this semantics (Leblanc and Thomason 1968).

Dual-domain semantics have been criticized as ontologically extravagant. In response, some authors have advocated single-domain positive semantics, which assign no denotation to empty singular terms. In such semantics empty-termed atomic formulas require unconventional treatment. Typically such semantics determine the truth-values of atomic formulas in two different ways: a Tarksi-style calculation for formulas whose terms all refer, and a separate truth-value assignment for empty-termed atomic formulas. The details, however, tend to get complicated. (See, for example, Antonelli 2000).

### 3.3 Neutral Semantics

Neutral semantics make all empty-termed atomic formulas not of the
form *E!t* truth-valueless. Truth-valueless formulas are
often said to have “truth-value gaps.” Neutral
semantics are of two types: ordinary neutral semantics, which
provide conventions for calculating the truth values of complex
formulas directly from their components, even when there are empty
terms, and supervaluational semantics, which calculate the truth values
of complex formulas by considering all the values that their components
could have if their empty terms had referents. Ordinary neutral
semantics will be considered in this section, supervaluations in
Section 3.4.

The uniform policy of making all empty-termed atomic formulas truth-valueless has the advantages of plausibility and simplicity at the atomic level, but it complicates the evaluation of complex formulas. How are the logical operators to function when some of the values on which they usually operate are absent? Some cases are fairly clear. The negation of a truth-valueless formula, for example, is generally taken to be truth-valueless. But:

- If
*A*is true and*B*truth-valueless, is*A*→*B*false or truth-valueless? - If
*A*is false and*B*truth-valueless, is*A*→*B*true or truth-valueless? - Let
*A*= (*B*&*C*), where*x*is free in*B*,*B*be true of some but not all members of, and*D**C*be closed and truth-valueless. Clearly this open formula is either truth-valueless of every object inor truth-valueless of some and false of others. In either case, is ∃*D**xA*truth-valueless or false?

At one extreme, we might want the operators to generate as many
plausible truth values as possible in order to validate as many
classically valid formulas as we can. At the other, one might
arrange things so that *all* empty-termed formulas are
truth-valueless, which would produce a very weak logic (Lehman
2001). But however we choose, many formulas that are valid in
both classical predicate logic and the usual forms of free
logic—indeed, even in propositional logic—will become
invalid. The law of noncontradiction, for example:

~(A& ~A)

is truth-valueless whenever *A* is (unless we make negations
of truth-valueless statements true) and hence becomes invalid. Of
course this law and many other standard logical principles remain
*weakly valid*—i.e., not false on any model—and it
is possible to construct a logic based on weak validity rather than
ordinary validity. But because any such logic will still be
weaker than classical logic and because its theorems need not even be
true, most logicians reject this strategy. For more on neutral
free logic, see Lehman 1994, 2001, and 2002, pp. 233–237.

### 3.4 Supervaluations

Neutral semantics can be made to validate all the theorems of standard free logics by augmenting them with supervaluations. Supervaluations were first formalized by van Fraassen (1966). The version presented here is a variant of Bencivenga's approach (1981 and 1986).

The fundamental idea is this: when empty terms deprive a formula of truth-value, supervaluational semantics nevertheless accounts it true (or false) if all possible ways of assigning referents to those terms agree in making it true (or false). This strategy restores validity to many principles that would lose it in an ordinary neutral semantics. The following instance of the law of noncontradiction:

~(Pt& ~Pt),

for example, is truth-valueless when *t* is nondenoting
(assuming an ordinary neutral semantics that makes the negation of a
truth-valueless formula truth-valueless). Hence in such a
semantics the law itself is invalid. Yet were we to assign a
referent to *t*, that referent would either be in the extension
of *P* or not. If it were, then *Pt* would be
true. If it were not, then *Pt* would be false. In
either case ~(*Pt* & ~*Pt*) would be
true. Thus, since all possible ways of assigning referents to
*t* agree in making ~(*Pt* & ~*Pt*)
true, we should count ~(*Pt* & ~*Pt*)
itself as true. In this way the law of noncontradiction can be
preserved.

More explicitly, a supervaluation begins with a neutral model
** M** with a single, possibly empty domain.
We then construct the set of

*completions*of

**. These may be regarded as bivalent dual-domain positive models whose inner domain is the domain of**

*M***, but which also have an outer domain**

*M*

*D*_{o}to provide referents for the empty terms. In each completion, singular terms that are

*non*empty in

**retain their referents, and those that are empty in**

*M***denote a member of**

*M*

*D*_{o}—

**. For each**

*D**n*-place predicate

*P*, the extension of

*P*is a subset of

*D**and a superset of*

_{o}^{n}*P*'s extension in

**.**

*M*
From these completions we now construct a supervaluation. A
*supervaluation* of ** M** is a partial
assignment of truth-values to formulas that makes a formula true if all
completions of

**make it true, false if they all make it false, and truth-valueless if they disagree. A formula is valid on a supervaluational semantics if and only if it is true on all supervaluations. This semantics validates all and only the theorems of PFL (Bencivenga 1981, Morscher & Simons 2001, pp. 14–18).**

*M*
Supervaluations employ what Bencivenga (1986) calls a
“counterfactual theory” of truth: a empty-termed
statement *is* true if it *would be* true on any
assignment of referents to its empty terms. This has struck many
critics as simply false. Moreover, the logic itself leaves much
to be desired. For one thing, supervaluational consequence is too
strong. Thus, for example, although the formula
*Pt* → *E!t* is (quite properly) not valid on a
supervaluational semantics, nevertheless since *E!t* is true on
every supervaluation on which *Pt* is true, the sequent
(derivability statement) *Pt* ⊢ *E!t* is
*im*properly semantically valid. Therefore, although PFL
is sound on supervaluational semantics and every semantically valid
formula is a theorem of PFL, not all semantically valid sequents are
provable in PFL. In fact, supervaluational consequence is not
axiomatizable by any extension of free logic. This follows from a
result of Woodruff (1984), who has shown that supervaluational
semantics has many of the undesirable properties of second-order
semantics. Finally, since supervaluations are built from
completions that are in effect positive dual-domain models, we may
wonder whether the detour through supervaluations is worth the trouble,
since positive dual-domain models alone are simpler and more adequate
to PFL.

## 4. Generic Anomalies

While problems noted above are specific to particular forms of free
logic, there are anomalies that infect all, or nearly all, forms.
This section considers three: (1) a cluster of problems related
to the application of primitive predicates to empty terms, (2)
the failure of substitutivity *salva veritate* of co-referential
expressions, and (3) the inability of free logic to express sufficient
conditions for existence.

### 4.1 Problems with Primitive Predicates

In classical logic and in positive free logic any substitution
instance of a valid formula (or form of inference) is itself a valid
formula (or form of inference). But in negative or neutral free
logic this is not the case. A *substitution instance* is
the result of replacing primitive non-logical symbols by possibly more
complex ones of the same semantic type—*n*-place
predicates with open formulas in *n* variables, and individual
constants with singular terms—each occurrence of the same
primitive symbol being replaced by the same possibly complex
symbol. The replacement of an occurrence of a primitive
*n*-place predicate *P* in some formula *B* by an
open formula *A* with free variables
*x*_{1},…,*x _{n}* is performed as
follows: where

*t*

_{1},…,

*t*are the individual constants or variables immediately following

_{n}*P*in that occurrence, replace P

*t*

_{1}…

*t*in

_{n}*B*by

*A*(

*t*/

_{i}*x*)—the result of replacing

_{i}*x*by

_{i}*t*in

_{i}*A*, for each

*i*, 1≤

*i*≤

*n*.

Let *P*, for example, be a primitive one-place
predicate. Then if the semantics is negative,
*Pt* → *E!t* is valid. But now
consider the substitution instance
~*Pt* → *E!t*, in which the open formula
~*Px* is substituted for *P*. This substitution
instance is false when *t* is empty. Hence valid formulas
may have invalid substitution instances. The same holds for
ordinary neutral semantics that make conditionals true whenever their
consequents are true.

In a negative semantics, moreover, the truth value of an
empty-termed statement depends arbitrarily on our choice of primitive
predicates. Consider, for example, a negative free logic
interpreted over a domain of people that takes as primitive the
one-place predicate ‘*A*’, meaning “is an
adult,” and defines “is a minor” by this schema:

Mt=_{df}~At.

For any non-denoting name *t*, *At* is false in this
theory; hence *Mt* is true. If we take ‘is a
minor’ as primitive instead, the truth-values of *At* and
*Mt* are reversed. But why should truth-values depend on
primitiveness in this way?

Positive semantics avoid these anomalies. But, if bivalent, in application they force us to assign truth values to empty-termed formulas in some other way, often without sufficient reason. Consider, for example, these three formulas, all of which contain the empty singular term ‘1/0’ (where ‘/’ is the division sign):

1/0 = 1/0

1/0 > 1/0

1/0 ≤ 1/0

Assuming a bivalent positive semantics, which ones should we make true and which false? Since the semantics is positive, ‘1/0 = 1/0’ is automatically true. One might argue further that since ‘≤’ expresses a relationship weaker than ‘=’ and since ‘1/0 = 1/0’ is true, ‘1/0 ≤ 1/0’ should be true as well. But that is merely to mimic with empty terms an inference pattern that holds for denoting terms. To what extent is such mimicry justified? Suppose we do decide to make ‘1/0 ≤ 1/0’ true; should we therefore make ‘1/0 > 1/0’ false? There are no non-arbitrary criteria for answering such questions. To a large extent, of course, the answers don't matter. There are no facts here; any consistent convention will do. But that's just the problem. Some convention is needed, and establishing one can be a lot of bother for nothing.

### 4.2 Substitutivity Failures

Classical predicate logic has the desirable feature that
co-extensive open formulas may be substituted for one another in any
formula *salva veritate*—i.e., without changing that
formula's truth value. (Open formulas *A* and
*B* in *n* free variables
*x*_{1},…,*x _{n}* are

*coextensive*if and only if ∀

*x*

_{1}…∀

*x*(

_{n}*A*↔

*B*) is true.) This principle fails for nearly all free logics with identity. Consider, for example, the formula

*t=t*, where

*t*is empty, which is an instance of the open formula

*x=x*. Now

*x=x*is coextensive with both (

*x=x*&

*E!x*) and (

*E!x*→

*x=x*), since all three formulas are satisfied by all members of

**. Hence if co-extensive open formulas could be exchanged**

*D**salva veritate*, (

*t=t*&

*E!t*) and (

*E!t*→

*t=t*) would have the same truth value as

*t=t*. But on nearly all free logics this is not the case. Positive free logic and the supervaluations described in Section 3.4 make

*t=t*true and (

*t=t*&

*E!t*) false; negative free logic makes

*t=t*false and (

*E!t*→

*t=t*) true; and any ordinary neutral free logic whose conditionals are true whenever their antecedents are false makes

*t=t*truth-valueless and (

*E!t*→

*t=t*) true. Many find this troubling because, since Frege, it has been widely held that (1) extensions of complex linguistic expressions should be functions of the extensions of their components (so that co-extensive components should be exchangeable without affecting the extension of the whole) and (2) the extension of a formula (or statement) is a truth value.

One possible response is to reject (2). Leeb (2006) develops
for a version of PFL a dual-domain semantics in which the extensions of
formulas are abstract states of affairs. In this semantics,
co-referential open sentences are exchangeable not *salve
veritate*, but (as he puts it) *salve extensione*; that is,
the exchange does not alter the state of affairs designated by the
statement in which it occurs. But Leeb's state-of-affairs
semantics is so complex that it may discourage application.

Those who wish to retain (2) may be consoled by the following
observation: though substitutivity *salve veritate* of
co-extensive open formulas fails for nearly all free logics, a related
but weaker principle, the substitutivity *salve veritate* of
co-*comprehensive* open formulas, is valid for positive free
logics. Open formulas *A* and *B* in *n*
free variables *x*_{1},…,*x _{n}*
are

*co-comprehensive*if every assignment of denotations in the outer domain

*D*_{o}to

*x*

_{1},…,

*x*satisfies

_{n}*A*if and only if it satisfies

*B*. Among the open formulas mentioned in the previous paragraph, for example,

*x=x*and (

*E!x*→

*x=x*) are co-comprehensive in a dual-domain positive free logic, being satisfied by all members of

*D*_{o}, but (

*x=x*&

*E!x*) is not co-comprehensive with them, since it is satisfied only by the members of

**. Unlike co-extensiveness, however, co-comprehensiveness is not expressible in the language of PFL. But it becomes expressible with the introduction of quantifiers over the outer domain—a strategy considered in Section 5.5.**

*D*### 4.3 Inexpressibility of Existence Conditions

‘Whatever thinks exists,’ ‘Any necessary being
exists’, ‘That which is immediately known
exists’: such statements of sufficient conditions for
existence are prominent in metaphysical debates. But, somewhat
surprisingly, they are not expressible in free logic. Their apparent
form is ∀*x*(*A* → *E!x*). But because
the universal quantifier ranges just over ** D**,
which is also the extension of E!, this form is valid in free
logic—as it is in classical logic with

*E!x*expressed as ∃

*y y=x*. No statement of this form—not even ‘all impossible things exist’—can be false. Hence on free logic all such statements are equally devoid of content. Argument evaluation suffers as a result. Consider, for example, the obviously valid inference:

I think. Whatever thinks exists. ∴ I exist.

Its natural formalization in free logic is *Ti*,
∀*x*(*Tx* → *E!x*)
⊢ *E!i*. But this form is invalid. To obtain the
conclusion, we must first deduce
*Ti* → *E!i* by specification from the second premise
and then use modus ponens with the first. But since the logic is
free, specification requires the question-begging premise
*E!i*. A remedy is not to be found in free logic alone,
but once again quantification over the outer domain of a dual-domain
semantics may help (see
Section 5.5).

## 5. Some Applications

This section considers applications of free logic in theories of definite descriptions, languages that allow partial or non-strict functions, logics with Kripke semantics, logics of fiction and logics that are in a certain sense “Meinongian.” Free logic has also found application elsewhere—most prominently in theories of predication, programming languages, set theory, logics of presupposition (with neutral semantics), and definedness logics. For more on these and other applications, see Lambert 1991 and 2001b; Lehman 2002, pp. 250–253; and Nolt 2006, pp. 1039–1053.

### 5.1 Theories of Definite Descriptions

The earliest and most extensive applications of free logic have been
to the theory of definite descriptions. A definite description is
a phrase that may be expressed in the form “the *x* such
that *A*,” where *A* is an open formula with only
*x* free. Formally, this is written using a special
logical operator, the definite description operator ‘ι’, as
ι*xA*. *Contra* Russell, free logic treats definite
descriptions not as merely apparent singular terms in formulas whose
logical form is obtainable only by elaborate contextual definitions,
but as genuine singular terms. Thus, like an individual constant,
ι*xA* may be attached to predicates and (under appropriate
conditions) substituted for variables. For any object *d*
in the domain ** D**, ι

*xA*denotes

*d*if and only if among all objects in

*D***,

*d*and only

*d*satisfies

*A*. If in

**there is more than one object satisfying**

*D**A*, or none, ι

*xA*is empty. The description operator therefore obeys Lambert's Law:

(LL) ∀y(y=ιxA↔ ∀x(A↔x=y)),xfree inA.

Adding (LL) to the free logic defined by (A1)–(A6) and (A7−) gives the minimal free definite description theory MFD. MFD is the core of virtually all free description theories, which therefore differ only in the additional principles they endorse.

There is plenty of room for variation, for MFD fails to specify truth conditions for atomic formulas (including identities) when they contain empty descriptions, and there are many ways to do it. Making all atomic formulas containing empty descriptions false yields a negative free description theory axiomatizable by adding (LL) to NFL (Burge 1974, Lambert 2001h). The result is essentially Bertrand Russell's theory of definite descriptions, but with the description operator taken as primitive rather than contextually defined.

The simplest *positive* free description theory makes all
identities between empty terms true. Known as FD2, it may be
axiomatized by adding (LL) and:

(~E!s& ~E!t) →s=t

to PFL. FD2 is akin to Gottlob Frege's theory of definite descriptions; but whereas Frege chose a single arbitrary existing object to serve as the conventional referent for empty singular terms, FD2 makes this object non-existent. FD2 is readily modeled in a dual-domain positive semantics with just one object in the outer domain.

On FD2 all empty descriptions are intersubstitutable *salve
veritate*. But this result is subject to counterexamples in
ordinary language. This statement:

The golden mountain is a possible object,

for instance, is true, while this one:

The set of all non-self-membered sets is a possible object,

is false—though each applies the same predicate phrase ‘is a possible object’ to an empty description. Thus we may prefer a more flexible positive free description theory on which identities between empty terms may be false. The literature presents a surprising diversity of these (Lambert 2001a, 2003c, 2003d, 2003h; Bencivenga 2002, pp. 188–193; Lehman 2002, pp. 237–250).

### 5.2 Logics with Partial or Non-Strict Functions

Some logics employ primitive *n-place function
symbols*—symbols that combine with *n* singular terms
to form a complex singular term. Thus, for example, the plus sign
‘+’ is a two-place function symbol that, when placed
between, say, ‘2’ and ‘3’, forms a complex
singular term, ‘2 + 3’ that denotes the number five.
Similarly, ‘^{2}’ is a one-place function symbol
that, when placed after term denoting a number, forms a complex
singular term that denotes that number's square. Semantically, the
extension of a function symbol is a function whose arguments are
members of the quantificational domain
** D**, and the resulting complex term denotes the
result of applying that function to the referents of the

*n*component singular terms, taken in the order listed. Since classical logic requires every singular term (including those formed by function symbols) to refer to to an object in

**, for each such function symbol**

*D**f*, it requires that:

∀x_{1}…∀x∃_{n}y(y=f(x_{1}, …,x))._{n}

Hence classical logic prohibits primitive function symbols whose extensions are partial functions—functions whose value is for some arguments undefined. Such, for example, is the binary division sign ‘/’, since when placed between two numerals the second of which is ‘0’, it forms an empty singular term. Similarly, the limit function symbol ‘lim’ yields an empty singular term when applied to the name of a non-coverging sequence. Classical logic can accomodate function symbols for partial functions via elaborate contextual definitions. But then (as with Russellian definite descriptions) the form in which these function symbols are usually written is not their logical form. Free logic provides a more elegant solution. Because it allows empty singular terms, symbols for partial functions may simply be taken as primitive.

In applications of free logic involving partial functions, the
existence predicate ‘*E!*’ is often replaced by the postfix
definedness predicate ‘↓’. For any singular term
*t*, *t*↓ is true if and only if *t* has some
definite value in ** D**. Thus, for example,
the formula ‘(1/0)↓’ is false. While some
writers (e.g., Feferman (1995)) distinguish ‘↓’ from
‘

*E!*’, the literature as a whole does not, and ‘↓’ is often merely a syntactic variant of ‘

*E!*’.

In addition to partial functions, *positive* free logics can
also readily handle *non-strict* functions. A non-strict
function is a function that may yield a value even if not all of its
arguments are defined. The binary function *f* such that
*f*(*x*,*y*) = *x*, for instance, can yield
a value even if the *y*-term is empty. So, for example,
the formula *f*(1, 1/0) = 1 can be regarded as true.
Logics for non-strict functions must be positive because in a negative
or neutral logic empty-termed atomic formulas, such as *f*(1,
1/0) = 1, cannot be true. Free logics involving non-strict
functions find application in some programming languages (Gumb 2001,
Gumb and Lambert 1991). Such logics may employ a dual-domain
semantics in which the referents of empty functional expressions such
as ‘1/0’ are regarded as *error
objects*—objects that correspond in the running of a program
to error messages. Thus, for example, an instruction to calculate
*f*(1, 1/0) might return the value 1, but an instruction to
calculate *f*(1/0, 1) would return an error message.

### 5.3 Logics with Kripke Semantics

Kripke semantics for quantified
modal logics,
tense logics,
deontic logics,
intuitionistic logics,
and so on, are often free. This is because they index
truth to certain objects that we shall call “worlds,” and
usually some things that we have names for do not exist in some of
these worlds. Worlds may be conceived in various ways: they
may, for example, be understood as possible universes in alethic modal
logic, times or moments in tense logic, permissible conditions in
deontic logic, or epistemically possible states of knowledge in
intuitionistic logic. Associated with each world *w* is a
domain *D** _{w}*, of objects
(intuitively, the set of objects that exist at

*w*). An object may exist in (or “at”) more than one world but need not exist in all. Thus, for example, Kripke semantics for tense logic represents the fact that Bertrand Russell existed at one time but exists no longer by Russell's being a member of the domains of certain “worlds”—that is, times (specifically, portions of the last two centuries)—but not others (the present, for example, or all future times). Two natural assumptions are made here: that the same object may exist in more than one world (this is the assumption of

*transworld identity*), and that some singular terms—proper names, in particular—refer to not only to an object at a given world, but to that same object at every world. Such terms are called

*rigid*

*designators*. Any logic that combines rigid designators with quantifiers over the domains of worlds in which their referents do not exist must be free.

Kripke semantics gives predicates different extensions in different worlds. Thus, for example, the extension of the predicate ‘is a philosopher’ was empty in all worlds (times) before the dawn of civilization and more recently has varied. For rigidly designating terms, this raises the question of how to evaluate atomic formulas at worlds in which their referents do not exist. Is the predicate ‘is a philosopher’ satisfied, for example, by Russell in worlds (times) in which he does not exist—times such as the present? The general answers given to such questions determine whether a Kripke semantics is positive, negative or neutral.

For negative or neutral semantics, the extension at *w* of an
*n*-place predicate *P* is a subset of
*D** _{w}^{n}*. An
atomic formula can be true at

*w*only if all its singular terms have referents in

*D**; if not, it is false (in negative semantics) or truth-valueless (in neutral semantics). In a positive semantics, atomic formulas that are empty-termed at*

_{w}*w*may nevertheless be true at

*w*. Predicates are usually interpreted over the union

**of domains of all the worlds, which functions as a kind of outer domain for each world, so that the extension of an**

*U**n*-place predicate

*P*at a world

*w*is a subset of

*U**. Some applications, however, require predicates to be true of—and singular terms to be capable of denoting—objects that exist in no world. If so, we may collect these objects into an outer domain that is a superset of*

^{n}**. (They might be fictional objects, timeless Platonic objects, impossible objects, or the like.)**

*U*
Quantified formulas, like all formulas, are true or false only
relative to a world. Thus ∃*xA*, for example, is true at a
world *w* if and only if some object in
*D** _{w}* satisfies

*A*. Except in intuitionistic logic, where it has a specialized interpretation, the universal quantifier is interpreted similarly: ∀

*xA*is true at

*w*if and only if all objects in

*D**satisfy*

_{w}*A*. Kripke semantics often specify that for each

*w*,

*D**is nonempty, so that the resulting free logic is non-inclusive—but we shall not do so.*

_{w}
Any of various free modal or tense logics can be formalized by
adding to a language ** L** of the sort defined
in
Section 2
the sentential operator
‘□’. If

*A*is a formula, so is □

*A*. In alethic modal logic, this operator is read “it is necessarily the case that.” More generally, it means “it is true in all accessible worlds that,” where accessibililty from a given world is a different relation for different modalities: possibility for alethic logics, permissibility for deontic logics, various temporal relations for tense logics, and so on. A typical bivalent Kripke model

**for such a language consists of a set of worlds, a binary accessibility relation**

*M***defined on that set; an assignment to each world**

*R**w*of a domain

*D**; an “outer” domain*

_{w}

*D*_{o}of objects (which typically is either

**or a superset thereof); and a two-place interpretation function**

*U***that assigns denotations at worlds to individual constants and extensions at worlds to predicates. For each individual constant**

*I**t*and world

*w*,

**(**

*I**t*,

*w*)∈

*D**. In such a model, a singular term is a rigid designator if and only if for all worlds*

_{o}*w*

_{1}and

*w*

_{2},

**(**

*I**t*,

*w*

_{1}) =

**(**

*I**t*,

*w*

_{2}). For every

*n*-place predicate

*P*,

**(**

*I**P*,

*w*) ⊆

*D**if the semantics is negative or neutral; if it is positive,*

_{w}^{n}**(**

*I**P*,

*w*) ⊆

*D**. Truth values at the worlds of a model*

_{o}^{n}**are assigned by a two-place valuation function**

*M***(where**

*V***(**

*V**A*,

*w*) is read “the truth value

**assigns to formula**

*V**A*at world

*w*”) as follows:

(VPt_{1}…t,_{n}w)= T ⇔ ⟨ (It_{1},w),…,(It,_{n}w)⟩ ∈(IP,w);

F otherwise.(Vs=t,w)= T ⇔ (Is,w) =(It,w);

F otherwise.(VE!t,w)= T ⇔ (It,w) ∈D;_{w}

F otherwise.(~VA,w)= T ⇔ (VA,w) = F;

F otherwise.(VA→B,w)= T ⇔ (VA,w) = F or(VB,w) = T;

F otherwise.(□VA,w)= T ⇔ for all usuch thatwRu,(VA,u) = T;

F otherwise.(∀VxA,w)=

- T ⇔ for any
d∈D,_{w}V_{(t,d)}(A(t/x),w) = T (wheretis not inAandV_{(t,d)}is the valuation function for the model just likeexcept that its interpretation functionMI^{*}is such that for each worldw,I^{*}(t,w) =d);- F otherwise.

Under the stipulations that admissible models make all individual
constants rigid designators and that
** I**(

*P*,

*w*) ⊆

*D**, the standard free logic PFL, together with the modal axioms and rules appropriate to whatever structure we assign to*

_{o}^{n}**, is sound and complete on this semantics.**

*R*
Modal semantics thus defined call for free logic whenever worlds are
allowed to have differing domains—that is whenever we may have
worlds *u* and *w* such that
*D** _{u}* ≠

*D**. For in that case there must be an object*

_{w}*d*that exists in one of these domains (let it be

*D**), but not the other, so that any singular term*

_{w}*t*that rigidly designates

*d*must be empty at world

*u*. Hence ~∃

*x*(

*x=t*) (which is self-contradictory in classical logic) must be true at world

*u*. Such a semantics also requires free logic when

*D*_{o}contains objects not in

**, for in that case rigid designators of these objects are empty in all worlds. Finally, this semantics calls for**

*U**inclusive*logic if any world has an empty domain. Thus, given this semantics, the only way to make the resulting logic unfree is to require that domains be

*fixed*—i.e., that all worlds have the same domain

**, that**

*D***be non-empty, and that**

*D*

*D*_{o}=

**.**

*D*Just this trio of requirements was in effect proposed by Saul Kripke in his ground-breaking (1963) paper on modal logic as one of two strategies for retaining classical quantification. (The other, more draconian, strategy was to allow differing domains but ban individual constants and treat open formulas as if they were universally quantified.) But such fixed-domain semantics validate the implausible formula:

∀x□∃y(y=x),

which asserts that everything exists necessarily and the equally implausible Barcan formula:

∀x□A→ □∀xA

(named for Ruth Barcan, later Ruth Barcan Marcus, who discussed it as early as the late 1940s). To see its implausibility, consider this instance: ‘If everything is necessarily a product of the big bang, then necessarily everything is a product of the big bang’. It may well be true that everything (in the actual world) is necessarily a product of the big bang—i.e., that nothing in this world would have existed without it. But it does not seem necessary that everything is a product of the big bang, for other universes are possible in which things that do not exist in the actual world have other ultimate origins. Because of the restrictiveness and implausibility of fixed-domain semantics, many modal logicians loosen Kripke's strictures and adopt free logics.

We may also drop the assumption that singular terms are rigid
designators and thus allow *nonrigid designators*. On the
semantics considered here, these are singular terms *t* such
that for some worlds *w*_{1}
and *w*_{2},
** I**(

*t*,

*w*

_{1}) ≠

**(**

*I**t*,

*w*

_{2}). Definite descriptions, understood attributively, are the best examples. Thus the description “the oldest person” designates different people at different times (worlds)—and no one at times before people existed (“worlds”

*w*at which

**(**

*I**t*,

*w*) is undefined).

Nonrigid designators, if empty at some worlds, require free logics
even with fixed domains. (Thus classical logic with nonrigid
designators is possible only if we require for each singular term
*t* that at each world *w*, *t* denotes some
object in *D** _{w}*.) On
some semantics for nonrigid designators, the quantifier rule must
differ from that given above, and other adjustments must be made.
For details, see Garson 1991, Cocchiarella 1991, Schweitzer 2001 and
Simons 2001.

Intuitionistic logic, too, has
a Kripke semantics, though special valuation clauses are needed for
‘~’, ‘→’ and ‘∀’ in
order to accommodate the special meanings these operators have for
intuitionists, and ‘□’ is generally not used. The
usual first-order intuitionistic logic, the Heyting predicate calculus
(HPC)—also called the intuitionistic predicate
calculus—has the theorem ∃*x*(*x=t*) and
hence is not free. But intuitionists admit the existence only of
objects that can in some sense be constructed, while classical
mathematicians posit a wider range of objects. Therefore users of HPC
cannot legitimately name all the objects that classical mathematicians
can. Worse, they cannot legitimately name objects whose
constructibility has yet to be determined. Yet some Kripke-style
semantics for HPC do allow use of names for such objects
(semantically, names of objects that “exist” at worlds
accessible from the actual world but not at the actual world
itself). Some such semantics, though intended for HPC, have turned
out, unexpectedly, not to be adequate for HPC. An obvious fix,
advocated by Posy (1982), is to adopt a free intuitionistic logic. For
more on this issue, see Nolt 2007.

### 5.4 Logics of Fiction

Because fictions use names that do not refer to literally existing
things, free logic has sometimes been employed in their analysis.
So long as we engage in the pretense of a story, however, there is no
special need for it. It is true, for example, in Tolkien's
*The Lord of the Rings* that Gollum hates the sun, from which we
can legitimately infer that *in the story* there exists
something that hates the sun. Thus quantifiers may behave
classically so long as we consider only what occurs and what exists
“in the story.” (The general logic of fiction,
however, is often regarded as *non*classical, for two
reasons: (1) a story may be inconsistent and hence require a
paraconsistent logic, and (2)
the objects a story describes are typically (maybe always) incomplete;
that is, the story does not determine for each such object *o*
and every property *P* whether or not
*o* has *P*.)

The picture changes, however, when we distinguish what is true in
the story from what is literally true. For this purpose logics of
fiction often deploy a sentence operator that may be read “in the
story.” Here we shall use
‘**S*** _{x}*’ to mean “in
the story

*x*,” where ‘

*x*’ is to be replaced by the name of a specific story. Anything within the scope of this operator is asserted to be true in the named story; what is outside its scope is to be understood literally. (For a summary of theories of what it means to be true in a story, see Woods 2006.)

With this operator the statement ‘In the story, *The Lord of
the Rings*, Gollum hates the sun’ may be formalized as
follows:

S_{The Lord of the Rings}(Gollum hates the sun).

The statement that in *The Lord of the Rings* something hates
the sun is:

S_{The Lord of the Rings}∃x(xhates the sun).

This second statement follows from the first, even though Gollum
does not literally exist. But it does not follow that there
exists something such that it, in *The Lord of the Rings*, hates
the sun:

∃xS_{The Lord of the Rings}(xhates the sun),

and indeed that statement is not true, for, literally, Gollum does not exist. Since the sun, however, exists both literally and in the story, the statement:

∃xS_{The Lord of the Rings}(Gollum hatesx)

is true and follows by free existential generalization from
‘**S**_{The Lord of the
Rings}(Gollum hates the sun)’ together with the true
premise ‘*E!*the sun’. Thus free logic may play a role
in reasoning that mixes fictional and literal discourse.

Terms for fictional entities also occur in statements that are entirely literal, making no mention of what is true “in the story.” Consider, for example, the statement:

(G) Gollum is more famous than Gödel.

Assuming that (G) is both atomic and true and that ‘Gollum’ is an empty singular term, this statement calls for a free positive logic. The logic must be free because it employs an empty singular term, and it must be positive, because only on a positive semantics can empty-termed atomic statements be true. Regarding the name ‘Gollum’, however, there seems to be a choice; this term can be understood either as having no referent or as having a referent that does not exist.

If ‘Gollum’ has no referent, then (G) might be handled
by a *single-domain* positive semantics. But that
semantics would have to treat atomic formulas non-standardly; it could
not, as usual, stipulate that (G) is true just in case the pair
⟨Gollum, Gödel⟩ is a member of the extension of the
predicate ‘is more famous than’; for if there is no Gollum,
there is no such pair. On such a semantics ‘Gollum is more
famous than Gödel’ would not imply that something is more
famous than Gödel.

If, on the other hand, terms such as ‘Gollum’ refer to
non-existent objects, then we may collect those objects in the outer
domain of a dual-domain positive free logic. Now atomic formulas
may have their standard truth conditions: (G) is true just in
case ⟨Gollum, Gödel⟩ is a member of the extension of
‘is more famous than’. Moreover, if we allow
quantifiers over that outer domain, then ‘Something is more
famous than Gödel’ (where the quantifier ranges over the
outer domain) does follow from ‘Gollum is more famous than
Gödel’, though ‘There *literally exists*
something more famous than Gödel’ (where the quantifier
ranges over the inner domain) does not. Meinongian logics of
fiction employ this strategy.

### 5.5 Meinongian Logics

Alexius Meinong is best known for his view that some objects that do not exist nevertheless have being. His name has been associated with various developments in logic. Some free logicians use it to describe any dual-domain semantics. For others, Meinongian logic is something much more elaborate: a rich theory of all the sorts of objects we can think about—possible or impossible, abstract or concrete, literal or fictional, complete or incomplete. In this section the term is used to describe logics stronger than the first type but possibly weaker than the second: positive free logics with an extra set of quantifiers that range over the outer domain of a dual-domain semantics.

Whether such logics can legitimately be considered free is
controversial. On older conceptions, free logic forbids any
quantification over non-existing things (see Paśniczek 2001 and
Lambert's reply in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 246–8). But
by anybody's definition, Meinongian logics in the sense intended
here at least *contain* free logics when the inner domain is
interpreted as the set of existing things. Moreover, on the
strictly semantic definition used in this article
(Section 1.1),
which is also that of Lehman 2002,
whether the members of ** D** exist is irrelevant
to the question of whether a logic is free. For a defense of this
definition, see Nolt 2006, pp. 1054–1057.

Historically, quantification over domains containing objects that do
not exist has been widely dismissed as ontologically
irresponsible. Quine (1948) famously maintained that existence is
just what an existential quantifier expresses. Yet nothing forces
us to interpret “existential” quantification over every
domain as expressing existence—or being of any sort.
Semantically, an existential quantifier on a variable *x* is
just a logical operator that takes open formulas on *x* into
truth values; the value is T if and only if the open formula is
satisfied by at least one object in the quantifier's
domain. That the objects in the domain have or lack any
particular ontological status is a philosophical interpretation of the
formal semantics. Alex Orenstein (1990) argues that
“existential” is a misnomer and that we should in general
call such quantifiers “particular.” That suggestion
is followed in the remainder of this section.

Quantifiers ranging over the outer domain of a dual-domain semantics
are called *outer quantifiers*, and those ranging over the inner
domain *inner quantifiers*. If the inner particular
quantifier is interpreted to mean “there exists” and the
members of the outer domain are possibilia, then the outer particular
quantifier may mean something like “there is possible a thing
such that” or “for at least one possible
thing.” We shall use the generalized product symbol
‘Π’ for the outer universal quantifier and the generalized
sum symbol ‘Σ’ for its particular dual. This notation
enables us to formalize, for example, the notoriously puzzling but
obviously true statement ‘Some things don't exist’
(Routley 1966) as:

Σx~E!x.

Since in a dual-domain semantics all singular terms denote members
of the outer domain, the logic of outer quantifiers is not free but
classical. With ‘*E!*’ as primitive, the free inner
quantifiers can be defined in terms of the classical outer ones as
follows:

∀

xA=_{df}Πx(E!x→A)∃

xA=_{df}Σx(E!x&A).

The outer quantifiers, however, cannot be defined in terms of the inner.

Logics with both inner and outer quantifiers have various applications. They enable us, for example, to formalize substantive sufficient conditions for existence and hence adequately express the argument of Section 4.3, as follows:

Ti, Πx(Tx→E!x) ⊢E!i.

This form is valid. The co-comprehensiveness of open formulas
*A* and *B* in *n* free variables
*x*_{1},…,*x _{n}* (see
Section 4.2),
can likewise be formalized as:

Πx_{1}…Πx(_{n}A↔B).

Richard Grandy's (1972) theory of definite descriptions holds that
ι*xA*=ι*xB* is true if and only if *A*
and *B* are co-comprehensive and thus is readily expressible in a
Meinongian logic. Free logics with outer quantifiers have also
been employed in logics that are Meinongian in the richer sense of
providing a theory of objects (including, in some cases, fictional
objects) that is inspired by Meinong's work (Routley 1966 and
1980, Parsons 1980, Jacquette 1996, Paśniczek 2001, Priest 2005
and 2008, pp. 295–7).

## 6. History

Inclusive logic was conceived and formalized before free logic
*per se* was. Thus, since inclusive logic with singular
terms is *de facto* free, the inventors of inclusive logics
were, perhaps unwittingly, the inventors of free logic. Bertrand
Russell suggested the idea of an inclusive logic in (1919, p. 201,
n.). Andrezej Mostowski (1951) seems to have been among the first
to formalize such a logic (but see Morscher and Simons 2001, p. 27,
note 3). Theodore Hailperin (1953), Czeslaw Lejewski (1954) and
W. V. O. Quine (1954) made important early contributions. It was
Quine who first dubbed such logics “inclusive.”

Henry S. Leonard (1956) was the first to develop a free logic
*per se*, though he used a defective definition of
‘*E!*’. Karel Lambert began his prolific series of
contributions to the field in (1958), critiquing Leonard's definition,
and then coining the term “free logic” in (1960). The
early systems of free logic were positive. Negative free logic was
developed by Rolf Schock in a series of papers during the 1960s,
culminating in (1968). Timothy Smiley suggested the idea of a neutral
free logic in (1960), but the first thoroughgoing treatment appeared
in Lehman 1994. Supervaluations were described in Mehlberg 1958,
pp. 256–260, as a device for handling, not neutral free logic, but
vagueness. But their formalization and application to free logic began
with van Fraassen 1966, in which the term “supervaluation”
was introduced. Dual-domain semantics were discussed in lectures by
Lambert, Nuel Belnap and others as early as the late 1950s, but it
appears that Church 1965 and Cocchiarella 1966 were the first
published accounts.

## Bibliography

- Antonelli, Gian Aldo, 2000, “Proto-Semantics for Positive
Free Logic,”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 29 (3): 277–294. - Bencivenga, Ermanno, 1981, “Free Semantics” in
*Boston Studies in the Philosophy of Science*, 47: 38–41; revised version reprinted in Lambert 1991, pp. 98–110. - –––, 1986, “Free Logics,” in D.
Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.),
*Handbook of Philosophical Logic*, vol. III:*Alternatives to Classical Logic*, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 373–426 - –––, 2002, “Free Logics,” in D.
Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.),
*Handbook of Philosophical Logic*, 2^{nd}edition, vol. 5, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 147–196. (This is a republication of Bencivenga 1986.) - Burge, Tyler, 1974, “Truth and Singular Terms,”
*Noûs*, 8: 309–25; reprinted in Lambert 1991, pp. 189–204. - Church, Alonzo, 1965, review of Lambert 1963 in
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 30: 103–104. - Cocchiarella, Nino B., “A Logic of Actual and Possible
Objects” (abstract),
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 31: 688–689. - –––, 1991, “Quantification, Time and Necessity,” in Lambert 1991, pp. 242–256.
- Feferman, Solomon, 1995, “Definedness,”
*Erkenntnis*, 43 (3): 295–320. - Fine, Kit, 1983, “The Permutation Principle in
Quantificational Logic,”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 12: 33–7. - Garson, James W., 1991, “Applications of Free Logic to Quantified Intensional Logic,” in Lambert 1991, pp. 111–142.
- Grandy, Richard E., 1972, “A Definition of Truth for Theories
with Intensional Definite Description Operators,”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 1: 137–55; reprinted in Lambert 1991, pp. 171–188. - Gumb, Raymond D., 2001, “Free Logic in Program Specification and Verification,” in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 157–93.
- Gumb, Raymond D., and Karel Lambert, 1991, “Definitions
in Nonstrict Positive Free Logic,”
*Modern Logic*, 7: 25–55 and 435–440 (errata). - Hailperin, Theodore, 1953, “Quantification Theory and Empty
Individual Domains,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 18: 197–200. - Hintikka, Jaakko, 1959, “Towards a Theory of Definite
Descriptions,”
*Analysis*, 19: 79–85. - Jacquette, Dale, 1996,
*Meinogian Logic: The Semantics of Existence and Nonexistence*, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter. - –––, (ed.), 2006,
*Philosophy of Logic*(Series: Volume 5 of the*Handbook of the Philosophy of Science*), Amsterdam: Elsevier. - Jeffrey, Richard, 1991,
*Formal Logic: Its Scope and Limits*, 3^{rd}edition, New York: McGraw-Hill. - Kripke, Saul 1963, “Semantical Considerations on Modal
Logic,”
*Acta Philosophical Fennica*, 16: 83–94. - Lambert, Karel, 1958, “Notes on E!,”
*Philosophical Studies*, 9: 60–63. - –––, 1960, “The Definition of E! in Free
Logic,” in
*Abstracts: The International Congress for Logic, Methodology and Philosophy of Science*, Stanford: Stanford University Press. - –––, 1963, “Existential Import
Revisited,”
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 4: 288–292. - –––, (ed.), 1991,
*Philosophical Applications of Free Logic*, New York: Oxford University Press. - –––, 2001a, “Free Logic and Definite Descriptions,” in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 37–47.
- –––, 2001b, “Free Logics,” in Lou
Goble (ed.),
*The Blackwell Guide to Philosophical Logic*, Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, pp. 258–279. - –––, 2003a,
*Free Logic: Selected Essays*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - –––, 2003b, “Existential Import, E! and ‘The’” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 16–32.
- –––, 2003c, “Foundations of the Hierarchy of Positive Free Definite Description Theories” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 69–91.
- –––, 2003d, “The Hilbert-Bernays Theory of Definite Descriptions” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 44–68.
- –––, 2003e, “Nonextensionality” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 107–121.
- –––, 2003f, “The Philosophical Foundations of Free Logic” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 122–175.
- –––, 2003g, “Predication and Extensionality” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 92–106.
- –––, 2003h, “Russell's Version of the Theory of Definite Descriptions” in Lambert 2003a, pp. 1–15.
- Leblanc, Hughes, 1971, “Truth Value Semantics for a Logic of
Existence,”
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 12: 153–68. - Leblanc, Hughes and Richmond H. Thomason, 1968, “Completeness
Theorems for Some Presupposition-Free Logics,”
*Fundamenta Mathematicae*, 62: 125–64; reprinted in Leblanc's*Existence, Truth and Provability*, Albany: State University of New York Press, 1982, pp. 22–57. - Leeb, Hans-Peter, 2006, “State-of-Affairs Semantics for
Positive Free Logic,”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 35 (2): 183–208. - Lehman, Scott, 1994, “Strict Fregean Free Logic,”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 23 (3): 307–336. - –––, 2001, “No Input, No Output Logic,” in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 147–54.
- –––, 2002, “More Free Logic,” in D.
Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.),
*Handbook of Philosophical Logic*, 2^{nd}edition, vol. 5, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 197–259. - Lejewski, Czeslaw, 1954, “Logic and Existence,”
*British Journal for the Philosophy of Science*, 5 (18): 104–19; reprinted in Dale Jacquette (ed.),*Philosophy of Logic: An Anthology*, Oxford: Blackwell, 2002, pp. 147–55. - Leonard, H. S., 1956, “The Logic of Existence,”
*Philosophical Studies*, 7: 49–64. - Mehlberg, Henryk, 1958,
*The Reach of Science*, Toronto: University of Toronto Press. - Meyer, Robert K., Ermanno Bencivenga and Karel Lambert, 1982,
“The Ineliminability of E! in Free Quantification Theory without
Identity,”
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 11: 229–231. - Meyer, Robert K. and Karel Lambert, 1968, “Universally Free
Logic and Standard Quantification Theory,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 33: 8–26. - Morscher, Edgar and Alexander Hieke (eds.), 2001,
*New Essays in Free Logic: In Honour of Karel Lambert*(Applied Logic Series, vol., 23), Dordrecht: Kluwer. - Morscher, Edgar and Peter Simons, 2001, “Free Logic: A Fifty-Year Past and an Open Future,” in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 1–34.
- Mostowski, Andrezej, 1951, “On the Rules of Proof in the Pure
Functional Calculus of the First Order,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 16: 107–111. - Nolt, John, 2006, “Free Logics,” in Jacquette 2006, pp. 1023–1060.
- –––, 2007, “Reference and Perspective in
Intuitionistic Logic,”
*Journal of Logic, Language and Information*, 16 (1): 91–115. - Orenstein, Alex, 1990, “Is Existence What Existential
Quantification Expresses?” in Robert B. Barrett and Roger F.
Gibson (eds.),
*Perspectives on Quine*, Cambridge: Blackwell, 1990, pp. 245–270. - Parsons, Terence, 1980,
*Nonexistent Objects*, New Haven: Yale University Press. - Paśniczek, Jacek, 1998,
*The Logic of Intentional Objects*:*A Meinongian Version of Classical Logic*, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - –––, 2001, “Can Meinongian Logic Be Free?” in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 227–36.
- Posy, Carl J., 1982, “A Free IPC is a Natural Logic:
Strong Completeness for Some Intuitionistic Free Logics,”
*Topoi*, 1: 30–43; reprinted in Lambert 1991, pp. 49–81. - Priest, Graham, 2005,
*Towards Non-Being*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - –––, 2008,
*An Introduction to Non-Classical Logic: From If to Is*, 2^{nd}edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Quine, W. V. O., 1948, “On What There Is,”
*Review of Metaphysics*, 48: 21–38; reprinted as Chapter 1 of Quine 1963). - –––, 1954, “Quantification and the Empty
Domain,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 19: 177–179. - –––, 1963,
*From a Logical Point of View*, 2^{nd}edition, New York: Harper & Row. - Routley, Richard, 1966, “Some Things Do Not Exist,”
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 7: 251–276. - –––, 1980,
*Exploring Meinong's Jungle and Beyond*, Canberra: Australian National Unversity. - Russell, Bertrand, 1919,
*Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy*, New York: Simon & Schuster. - Schock, Rolf, 1968,
*Logics without Existence Assumptions*, Stockholm: Almqvist & Wiskell. - Schweitzer, Paul, 2001, “Free Logic and Quantification in Syntactic Modal Contexts,” in Morscher and Hieke 2001, pp. 69–85.
- Simons, Peter, 2001, “Calculi of Names: Free and Modal,” in Morscher, Edgar and Alexander Hieke 2001, pp. 49–65.
- Smiley, Timothy, 1960, “Sense without Denotation,”
*Analysis*, 20: 125–135. - van Fraassen, Bas C., 1966, “Singular Terms, Truth Value Gaps
and Free Logic,”
*Journal of Philosophy*, 63: 481–95; reprinted in Lambert 1991, pp. 82–97. - Woods, John, 2006, “Fictions and their Logic,” in Jacquette 2006, pp. 1061–1126.
- Woodruff, Peter W., 1984, “On Supervaluations in Free
Logic,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 49: 943–950.

### Acknowledgement

The author thanks Ian Orr for help in researching this article.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

## Related Entries

descriptions | logic: classical | logic: intuitionistic | logic: modal | logic: temporal | nonexistent objects | possible objects