# Deontic Logic

*First published Tue Feb 7, 2006; substantive revision Wed Apr 21, 2010*

Deontic
logic^{[1]}
is that branch of symbolic logic that has been the most concerned
with the contribution that the following notions make to what follows
from what:

permissible (permitted) must impermissible (forbidden, prohibited) supererogatory (beyond the call of duty) obligatory (duty, required) indifferent / significant omissible (non-obligatory) the least one can do optional better than / best / good / bad ought claim / liberty / power / immunity

To be sure, some of these notions have received more attention in deontic logic than others. However, virtually everyone working in this area would see systems designed to model the logical contributions of these notions as part of deontic logic proper.

As a branch of symbolic logic, deontic logic is of
*theoretical* interest for some of the same reasons that modal
logic is of theoretical interest. However, despite the fact that we
need to be cautious about making too easy a link between deontic logic
and practicality, many of the notions listed *are* typically
employed in attempting to regulate and coordinate our lives together
(but also to evaluate states of affairs). For these reasons, deontic
logics often directly involve topics of considerable practical
significance such as morality, law, social and business organizations
(their norms, as well as their normative constitution), and security
systems. To that extent, studying the logic of notions with such
*practical* significance adds some practical significance to
deontic logic itself.

Further remarks on this topic may be found in Challenges in Defining Deontic Logic

(To keep this entry a readable length, supplementary documents such as the one linked in above are used liberally to explore many secondary issues or to explore primary issues in more detail. Footnotes are for more minor asides, notational explanations, short proofs, but also for paragraph-length entries on the literature associated with a topic.)

- 1. Informal Preliminaries and Background
- 2. Standard Deontic Logic
- 3. The Andersonian-Kangerian Reduction
- 4. Challenges to Standard Deontic Logics
- 4.1 A Puzzle Centering around the Very Idea of a Deontic Logic
- 4.2 A Problem Centering Around NEC
- 4.3 Puzzles Centering Around RM
- 4.4 Puzzles Centering Around NC, OD and Analogues
- 4.5 Puzzles Centering Around Deontic Conditionals
- 4.6 Problems Surrounding (Normative) Expressive Inadequacies of SDL
- 4.7 Agency in Deontic Contexts
- 4.8 Challenges regarding Obligation, Change and Time

- 5. Conclusion
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Informal Preliminaries and Background

Deontic logic has been strongly influenced by ideas
in modal logic.
Analogies with alethic modal notions and deontic notions were noticed
as far back as the fourteenth century, where we might say that the
rudiments of modern deontic logic began (Knuuttila 1981). Although
informal interest in what can be arguably called aspects of deontic
logic continued, the trend toward studying logic using the
*symbolic* *and exact* techniques of mathematics became
dominant in the twentieth century, and logic became largely,
*symbolic* logic. Work in twentieth century symbolic modal
logic provided the explicit impetus for von Wright (von Wright 1951),
the central early figure in the emergence of deontic logic as a
full-fledged branch of *symbolic* logic in the twentieth
century. So we will begin by gently noting a few folk-logical features
of alethic modal notions, and give an impressionistic sense of how
natural it was for early developments of deontic logic to mimic those
of modal logic. We will then turn to a more direct exploration of
deontic logic as a branch of symbolic logic. However, the emphasis will be
on conceptual and foundational issues, not technical ones.

However, before turning to von Wright, and the launching of deontic
logic as an on-going active academic area of study, we need to note
that there was a significant earlier episode, Mally 1926, that did not
have quite the influence on symbolic deontic logic that it might have,
due at least in part, to serious technical problems. Despite these
problems with the system he found (notably the collapse of what ought
to be into what is the case), Mally was an impressive pioneer of
deontic logic. He was apparently uninfluenced by, and thus did not
benefit from, early developments of alethic modal logic. This is quite
opposed to the later trend in the 1950s when deontic logic reemerged,
this time as a full-fledged discipline, deeply influenced by earlier
developments in alethic modal logic. Mally was the first to found
deontic logic on the syntax of propositional calculus explicitly, a
strategy that others quickly returned to after a deviation from this
strategy in the very first work of von Wright. Mally was the first to
employ deontic constants in deontic logic (reminiscent of Kanger and
Anderson's later use of deontic constants, but without their
“reduction”; more below). He was also the first to attempt
to provide an integrated account of non-conditional and conditional
ought statements, one that provided an *analysis* of
conditional ‘ought’s via a monadic deontic operator
coupled with a material conditional (reminiscent of similar failed
attempts in von Wright 1951 to analyze the dyadic notion of
commitment), and allowed for a form of factual detachment (more
below). All in all, this seems to be a remarkable achievement in
retrospect. For more information on Mally's system, including a
diagnosis of the source of his main technical problem, and a sketch of
one way he might have avoided it, see the entry
on Mally's deontic logic.

### 1.1 Some Informal Rudiments of Alethic Modal Logic

Alethic modal logic is roughly the logic of necessary truth and related notions. Consider five basic alethic modal statuses, expressed as sentential operators—constructions that, when applied to a sentence, yield a sentence (as does “it is not the case that”):

it is necessary (necessarily true) that (□)

it is possible that (◊)

it is impossible that

it is non-necessary that

it is contingent that^{[2]}

Although all of the above operators are generally deemed definable in terms of any one of the first four, the necessity operator is typically taken as basic and the rest defined accordingly:

It is possible thatp(◊p) =_{df}~□~p

It is impossible thatp=_{df}□~p

It is non-necessary thatp=_{df}~□p

It is contingent thatp=_{df}~□p& ~□~p

It is routinely assumed that the following threefold partition of propositions holds:

The three rectangular cells are jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive: every proposition is either necessary, contingent, or impossible, but no proposition is more than one of these. The possible propositions are those that are either necessary or contingent, and the non-necessary propositions are those that are either impossible or contingent.

Another piece of folk logic for these notions is the following modal
square of
opposition:^{[3]}

Furthermore it is generally assumed that the following hold:

If □pthenp(if it is necessary thatp, thenpis true).If

pthen ◊p(ifpis true, thenpis possible).

These reflect the idea that we are interested here in alethic (and thus truth-implicating) necessity and its siblings.

We now turn to some of the analogies involved in what is a corresponding bit of deontic folk logic: “The Traditional Scheme” (McNamara 1996a). This is a minor elaboration of what can be found in von Wright 1953 and in both editions of Prior 1962 [1955].

### 1.2 The Traditional Scheme and the Modal Analogies

The five normative statuses of the Traditional Scheme
are:^{[4]}

it is obligatory that (OB)

it is permissible that (PE)

it is impermissible that (IM)

it is omissible that (OM)

it is optional that (OP)

The first three are familiar, but the fourth is widely ignored, and
the fifth has regularly been conflated with “it is a matter of
*indifference* that p” (by being defined in terms of one
of the first three), which is not really part of the traditional
scheme (more below). Typically, one of the first two is taken as
basic, and the others defined in terms of it, but any of the first
four can play the same sort of purported defining role. The most
prevalent approach is to take the first as basic, and define the rest
as follows:

PEp↔ ~OB~p

IMp↔OB~p

OMp↔ ~OBp

OPp↔ (~OBp& ~OB~p).^{[5]}

These assert that something is permissible iff (if and only if) its
negation is not obligatory, impermissible iff its negation is
obligatory, omissible iff it is not obligatory, and optional iff
neither it nor its negation is obligatory. Call this “The
Traditional *Definitional* Scheme (TDS)”. If one began
with **OB** alone and considered the formulas on the
right of the equivalences above, one could easily be led to consider
them as at least candidate defining conditions for those on the
left. Although not uncontestable, they are natural, and this scheme is
still widely employed. Now if the reader looks back at our use of the
necessity operator in defining the remaining four alethic modal
operators, it will be clear that that definitional scheme is perfectly
analogous to the deontic one above. From the formal standpoint, the
one is merely a syntactic variant of the other: just replace
**OB** with □, **PE** with ◊, etc.

In addition to the TDS, it was traditionally assumed that the following, call it “The Traditional Threefold Classification (TTC)” holds:

Here too, all propositions are divided into three jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive classes: every proposition is obligatory, optional, or impermissible, but no proposition falls into more than one of these three categories. Furthermore, the permissible propositions are those that are either obligatory or optional, and the omissible propositions are those that are impermissible or optional. The reader can easily confirm that this natural scheme is also perfectly analogous to the threefold classification we gave above for the alethic modal notions.

Furthermore, “The Deontic Square” (DS)” is part of the Traditional Scheme:

The logical operators at the corners are to be interpreted as in the
modal square of opposition. The two squares are plainly perfectly
analogous as well. If we weave in nodes for optionality, we get a
deontic hexagon:^{[6]}

Given these correspondences, it is unsurprising that our basic
operator, read here as “it is obligatory that”, is often
referred to as “deontic *necessity*”. However,
there are also obvious dis-analogies. Before, we saw that these two
principles are part of the traditional conception of alethic
modality:

If □pthenp(if it is necessary thatp, thenpis true).

Ifpthen ◊p(ifpis true, then it is possible).

Their deontic analogs are:

IfOBp thenp(if it is obligatory thatp, thenpis true).

IfpthenPEp(ifpis true, then it is permissible).

The latter two are transparently false, for obligations can be
violated, and impermissible things do
hold.^{[7]}
However, as researchers turned to generalizations of alethic modal
logic, they began considering wider classes of modal logics, including
ones where the necessity operator was not truth-implicating. This too
encouraged seeing deontic necessity, and thus deontic logic, as
falling within modal logic so-generalized, and in fact recognizing
possibilities like this helped to fuel the generalizations of what
began with a focus on alethic modal logic (Lemmon 1957, Lemmon and
Scott 1977).

### 1.3 Toward Deontic Logic Proper

It will be convenient at this point to introduce a bit more
regimentation. Let's assume that we have a simple propositional
language with the usual suspects, an infinite set of propositional
variables (say,
*P*_{1},…,*P*_{n},…)
and a complete (per their standard interpretation) set of
truth-functional operators (say, ~ and →), as well as the
one-place deontic operator, **OB**.

A more formal definition can be found in the supplemental document Deontic Wffs

Unless otherwise stated, we will only be interested in deontic logics
that contain classical propositional calculus (PC). So let's assume we
add that as the first ingredient in specifying any deontic logic, so
that, for example, **OB***p* →
~~**OB***p*, can be derived in any system to be
considered here.

Above, in identifying the Traditional Definitional Scheme, we noted
that we could have taken any of the first four of the five primary
normative statuses listed as basic and defined the rest in terms of
that one. So we want to be able to generate the corresponding
equivalences derivatively from the scheme we did settle on, where
**OB** is basic. But thus far we cannot. For example, it
is obviously desirable to have **OB***p* →
~**PE**~*p* as a theorem from the traditional
standpoint. After all, this wff merely expresses one half of the
equivalence between what would have been definiens and definiendum had
we chosen the alternate scheme of definition in which
“**PE**” was taken as basic instead of
“**OB**”. However,
**OB***p* → ~**PE**~*p* is
not thus far derivable. For **OB***p* →
~**PE**~*p* is definitionally equivalent to
**OB***p* → ~~**OB**~~*p*,
which reduces by PC to **OB***p* →
**OB**~~*p*, but the latter formula is not
tautological, so we cannot complete the proof. So far we have deontic
wffs and propositional logic, but no deontic logic. For that we need
some distinctive principles governing our deontic operator, and in
particular, to generate the alternative equivalences that reflect the
alternative definitional schemes alluded to above, we need what is
perhaps the most fundamental and least controversial rule of inference
in deontic logic, and the one characteristic of “classical modal
logics” (Chellas 1980):

OB-RE: Ifp↔qis a theorem, then so isOBp↔OBq.

This rule tells us (roughly) that if two formulas are provably
equivalent, then so are the results of prefacing them with our basic
operator, **OB**. With its aid (and the Traditional
Definitional Scheme's), it is now easy to prove the equivalences
corresponding to the alternative definitional schemes. For example,
since
⊢ *p*
↔ ~~*p*, by **OB**-RE, we get
⊢
**OB***p* ↔ **OB**~~*p*,
i.e.,
⊢ **OB***p* ↔
~~**OB**~~*p*, which generates
⊢
**OB***p* ↔ ~**PE**~*p*,
given our definitional scheme. To the extent that the alternative
definitional equivalences are supposed to be derivable, we can see RE
as presupposed in the Traditional Scheme.

All systems we consider here will contain RE (whether as basic or derived). They will also contain (unless stated otherwise) one other principle, a thesis asserting that a logical contradiction (conventionally denoted by “⊥”) is always omissible:

OD: ~OB⊥

So, for example, OD implies that it is a logical truth that it is not
obligatory that my taxes are paid and not paid. Although OD is not
completely
uncontestable^{[8]}
it is plausible, and like RE, has been pervasively presupposed in
work on deontic logic. In this essay, we will focus on systems that
endorse both RE and OD.

Before turning to our first full-fledged system of deontic logic, let us note one very important principle that is not contained in all deontic logics, and about which a great deal of controversy in deontic logic and in ethical theory has transpired.

### 1.4 The Fundamental Presupposition of the Traditional Scheme

Returning to the Traditional Scheme for a moment, its Threefold Classification, and Deontic Square of Opposition can be expressed formally as follows:

DS: (OBp↔ ~OMp) & (IMp↔ ~PEp) & ~(OBp&IMp) & ~(~PEp& ~OMp) & (OBp→PEp) & (IMp→OMp).TTC: (

OBp∨OPp∨IMp) & [~(OBp&IMp) & ~(OBp&OPp) & ~(OPp&IMp)].

Given the Traditional Definitional Scheme, it turns out that DS and
TTC are each *tautologically* equivalent to the principle that
obligations cannot conflict (and thus to one another):

NC: ~(OBp&OB~p).^{[9]}

So the Traditional Scheme rests squarely on the soundness of NC (and the traditional definitions of the operators). Indeed, the Traditional Scheme is nothing other than a disguised version of NC, given the definitional component of that scheme.

NC is not to be confused in content with the previously mentioned
principle, OD (~**OB**⊥). OD asserts that no single
logical contradiction can be obligatory, whereas NC asserts that there
can never be two things that are each separately obligatory, where the
one obligatory thing is the negation of the other. The presence or
absence of NC arguably represents one of the most fundamental
divisions among deontic schemes. As until recently in modern normative
ethics (see Gowans 1987), early deontic logics presupposed this
thesis. Before turning to challenges to NC, we will consider a number
of systems that endorse it, beginning with what has come to be
routinely called “Standard Deontic Logic”, the benchmark
system of deontic logic.

## 2. Standard Deontic Logic

### 2.1 Standard Syntax

*Standard Deontic Logic* (SDL) is the most cited and studied
system of deontic logic, and one of the first deontic logics
axiomatically specified. It builds upon propositional logic, and is in
fact essentially just a distinguished member of the most studied class
of modal logics, “normal modal logics”. It is a monadic
deontic logic, since its basic deontic operator is a one-place
operator (like ~, and unlike →): syntactically, it applies to a
*single* sentence to yield a compound
sentence.^{[10]}

Assume again that we have a language of classical propositional logic
with an infinite set of propositional variables, the operators ~ and
→, and the operator, **OB**. SDL is then often
axiomatized as follows:

SDL: A1. All tautologous wffs of the language (TAUT) A2. OB(p→q) → (OBp→OBq)( OB-K)A3. OBp→ ~OB~p( OB-D)R1. If ⊢ pand ⊢p→qthen ⊢q(MP) R2. If ⊢ pthen ⊢OBp( OB-NEC)^{[11]}

SDL is just the normal modal logic “D” or
“KD”, with a suggestive notation expressing the intended
interpretation.^{[12]}
TAUT is standard for normal modal systems. **OB**-K,
which is the K axiom present in all normal modal logics, tells us that
if a material conditional is obligatory, and its antecedent is
obligatory, then so is its
consequent.^{[13]}
**OB**-D tells us that *p* is obligatory only if
its negation isn't. It is just “No Conflicts” again, but
it is also called “D” (for “Deontic”) in
normal modal logics. MP is just Modus Ponens, telling us that if a
material conditional and its antecedent are theorems, then so is the
consequent. TAUT combined with MP gives us the full inferential power
of the Propositional Calculus (often referred to, including here, as
“PC”). As noted earlier, PC has no distinctive deontic
import. **OB**-NEC tells us that if anything is a
theorem, then the claim that that thing is obligatory is also a
theorem. Note that this guarantees that something is always obligatory
(even if only logical
truths).^{[14]}
Each of the distinctively deontic principles, **OB**-K,
**OB**-D, and **OB**-NEC are contestable,
and we will consider criticisms of them shortly. However, to avoid
immediate confusion for those new to deontic logic, it is perhaps
worth noting that **OB**-NEC is generally deemed a
convenience that, among other things, assures that SDL is in fact one
of the well-studied normal modal logics with a deontic
interpretation. Few have spilled blood to defend its cogency
substantively, and these practical compromises can be strategic,
especially in early stages of research.

A quick comparison of SDL with the seminal system in von Wright 1951 can be found in the supplemental document von Wright's 1951 System and SDL

Regarding SDL's expressive powers, advocates typically endorse the Traditional Definitional Scheme noted earlier.

Below we list some theorems and two important derived rules of
SDL.^{[15]}

OB⊤( OB-N)~ OB⊥^{[16]}( OB-OD)OB(p&q) → (OBp&OBq)( OB-M)( OBp&OBq) →OB(p&q)( OB-C / Aggregation)OBp∨OPp∨IMp( OB-Exhaustion)OBp→ ~OB~p( OB-NC orOB-D)If ⊢ p→qthen ⊢OBp→OBq( OB-RM)If ⊢ p↔qthen ⊢OBp↔OBq( OB-RE)

We will be discussing a number of these subsequently. For now, let’s briefly show that RM is a derived rule of SDL. We note some simple corollaries as well.

Show: If ⊢p→q, then ⊢OBp→OBq. (OB-RM)

Proof: Suppose ⊢p→q. Then byOB-NEC, ⊢OB(p→q), and then by K, ⊢OBp→OBq.

Corollary 1: ⊢OBp→OB(p∨q) (Weakening)

Corollary 2: If ⊢p↔qthen ⊢OBp↔OBq(OB-RE)^{[17]}

An alternative formulation of SDL can be found in the supplemental document Alternative Axiomatization of SDL.

SDL can be strengthened in various ways, in particular, we might consider adding axioms where deontic operators are embedded within one another. For example, suppose we added the following formula as an axiom to SDL. Call the result “SDL+” for easy reference here:

A4.OB(OBp→p)

This says (roughly) that it is required that obligations
are
fulfilled.^{[18]}
This is not a theorem of SDL (as we will see in the next section), so
SDL+ is a genuine strengthening of SDL. Furthermore, it makes a
logically *contingent* proposition (i.e., that
**OB***p* → *p*) obligatory *as a
matter of deontic logic*. SDL does not have this substantive
feature. With this addition to SDL, it is easy to prove
**OBOB***p* → **OB***p*, a
formula involving an iterated occurrence of our main
operator.^{[19]}
This formula asserts that if it is obligatory that *p* be
obligatory, then *p* *is* obligatory. (Cf. “the
only things that are required to be obligatory are those that actually
are”).^{[20]}
It should be noted that these are often given an impersonal ought reading,
so that A4 would then be read as “It ought to be the case that (if
it ought to be the case that *p*, then it
is).”^{[21]}

### 2.2 Standard Semantics

The reader familiar with elementary textbook logic will have perhaps
noticed that the deontic square and the modal square both have even
better-known analogs for the quantifiers as interpreted in classical
predicate logic (“all *x*: *p*” is read as
all objects *x* satisfy condition *p*; similarly for
“no *x*: p” and “some *x*:
p”):

Though less widely noted in textbooks, there is also a threefold classification for classical quantifiers:

Here all conditions are divided into three jointly exhaustive and
mutually exclusive classes: those that hold for all objects, those
that hold for none, and those that hold for some and not for others,
where no condition falls into more than one of these three
categories. These deep quantificational analogies reflect much of the
inspiration behind what is most often called “possible worlds
semantics” for such logics, to which we now
turn.^{[22]}
Once the analogies are noticed, this sort of semantics seems all but
inevitable.

We now give a standard “Kripke-style” possible world
semantics for SDL. Informally, we assume that we have a set of
possible worlds, *W*, and a relation, *A*, relating
worlds to worlds, with the intention that *A**ij* iff
*j* is a world where everything obligatory in *i* holds
(i.e., no violations of the obligations holding in *i* occur in
*j*). For brevity, we will call all such worlds so related to
*i*, “*i*-*A*cceptable” worlds and
denote them by
*A*^{i}.^{[23]}
We then add that the acceptability relation is “serial”:
for every world, *i*, there is at least one
*i*-acceptable world. Finally, propositions are either true or
false at a world, never both, and when a proposition, *p*, is
true at a world, we will often indicate this by referring to that
world as a “*p*-world”. The truth-functional
operators have their usual behavior at each world. Our focus will be
on the contribution deontic operators are taken to make.

The fundamental idea here is that the normative status of a
proposition from the standpoint of a world *i* can be assessed
by looking at how that proposition fairs at the *i*-acceptable
worlds. Let’s see how. For any given world, *i*, we can
easily picture the *i*-acceptable worlds as all corralled
together in logical space as follows (where seriality is reflected by
a small dot representing the presence of at least one world):

The intended truth-conditions, relative to *i*, for our five
deontic operators can now be pictured as follows:

Thus, *p* is *obligatory* iff it holds in all the
*i*-acceptable worlds, *permissible* iff it holds in
some such world, *impermissible* iff it holds in no such world,
*omissible* iff its negation holds in some such world, and
*optional* iff *p* holds in some such world, and so does
~*p*. When a formula must be true at any world in any such
model of serially-related worlds, then the formula is
*valid*.

A more formal characterization of this semantic framework can be found in the supplemental document Kripke-Style Semantics for SDL

To illustrate the workings of this framework, consider NC
(**OB**-D), **OB***p* →
~**OB**~*p*. This is valid in this framework. For
suppose that **OB***p* holds at any world
*i* in any model. Then each *i*-accessible world is one
where *p* holds, and by the seriality of accessibility, there
must be at least one such world. Call it *j*. Now we can see
that ~**OB**~*p* must hold at *i* as well,
for otherwise, **OB**~*p* would hold at
*i*, in which case, ~*p* would have to hold at all the
*i*-accessible worlds, including *j*. But then
*p* as well as ~*p* would hold at *j* itself,
which is impossible (by the semantics for “~”). The other
axioms and rules of SDL can be similarly shown to be valid, as can all
the principles listed above as derivable in SDL

However, A4, the axiom we added to SDL to get SDL+, is not valid in
the standard serial models. In order to validate A4,
**OB**(**OB***p* → *p*),
we need the further requirement of “secondary reflexivity”:
that any *i*-acceptable world, *j*, must be in turn
acceptable to itself. We can illustrate such an *i* and
*j* as follows:

Here we imagine that the arrow connectors indicate relative
acceptability, thus here, *j* (and only *j*) is
acceptable to *i*, and *j* (and only *j*) is
acceptable to *j*. If in all eligible models, all worlds that
are acceptable to any given world have this property of
self-acceptability, then our axiom is valid. For suppose this property
holds throughout our models, and that for some arbitrary world
*i*, **OB**(**OB***p* →
*p*) is false at *i*. Then not all *i*-acceptable
worlds are worlds where **OB***p* →
*p* is true. So, there must be an *i*-acceptable world,
say *j*, where **OB***p* is true, but
*p* is false. Since **OB***p* is true at
*j*, then *p* must be true at all *j*-acceptable
worlds. But by stipulation, *j* is acceptable to itself, so
*p* must be true at *j*, but this contradicts our
assumption that *p* was false at *j*. Thus
**OB**(**OB***p* → *p*)
must be true at all worlds, after all.

Two counter-models showing that A4 is not derivable in SDL, and that
SDL + **OBOB***p* →
**OB***p* does not imply A4 can be found
in the supplemental document
Two Counter-Models Regarding Additions to SDL

We should also note that one alternative semantic picture for SDL is
where we have a set of world-relative ordering relations, one for each
world *i* in *W*, where *j*
≥_{i} *k* iff *j* is as good as
*k* (and perhaps better) relative to *i*. We then assume
that from the standpoint of any world *i*, *a*) each
world is as good as itself, *b*) if one is as good as a second,
and the second is as good as a third, then the first is as good as the
third, *c*) and for any two worlds, either the first is as good
as the second or vice versa (i.e., respectively, each such
≥*i* is reflexive, transitive, and connected in
*W*). It is widely recognized that this approach will also
determine SDL, but proofs of this are not widely
available.^{[24]}
If we then add “The Limit Assumption”, that for each
world *i*, there is always at least one world as good as all
worlds (i.e., one i-best world), we can easily generate our earlier
semantics for SDL derivatively. We need only add the natural analogue
to our prior truth-conditions for **OB**:
**OB***p* is true at a world *i* iff
*p* is true at all the *i*-best worlds.

Essentially, the ordering relation coupled with the Limit Assumption
just gives us a way to *generate* the set of
*i*-acceptable worlds instead of taking them as primitive in
the semantics: *j* is *i*-acceptable iff *j* is
*i*-best. Once generated, we look only at what is going on in
the *i*-acceptable worlds to interpret the truth-conditions for
the various deontic operators, just as with our simpler Kripke-Style
semantics. The analogue to the seriality of our earlier
*i*-acceptability relation is also assured by the Limit
Assumption, since it entails that for each world i, there is always
some *i*-acceptable (now *i*-best) world. Although this
ordering semantics approach appears to be a bit of overkill here, it
became quite important later on in the endeavor to develop
expressively richer deontic logics (ones going beyond the linguistic
resources of SDL). We will return to this later.

For now, we turn to the second-most well known approach to monadic
deontic logic, one in which SDL will emerge *derivatively*.

## 3. The Andersonian-Kangerian Reduction

The *Andersonian-Kangerian* reduction is dually-named in
acknowledgement of Kanger's and Anderson's independent formulation of
it around the same
time.^{[25]}
As Hilpinen 2001a points out, the approach is adumbrated much earlier
in Leibniz. We follow Kanger's development here, noting Anderson's
toward the end.

### 3.1 Standard Syntax

Assume that we have a language of classical modal propositional logic, with a distinguished (deontic) propositional constant:

“d” for “all (relevant) normative demands are met”.

Now consider the following axiom system,
“K*d*”:

K d:A1: All Tautologies (TAUT) A2: □( p→q) → (□p→ □q)(K) A3: ◊ d(◊ d)R1: If ⊢ pand ⊢p→qthen ⊢q(MP) R2: If ⊢ pthen ⊢ □p(NEC)

K*d* is just the normal modal logic K with A3
added.^{[26]}
A3 is interpreted as telling us that it is possible that all
normative demands are met. In import when added to system K, it is
similar to (though stronger than) the “No Conflicts”
axiom, A3, of SDL. *All* of the Traditional Scheme's deontic
operators are defined operators in K*d*:

OBp=_{df}□(d→p)

PEp=_{df}◊(d&p)

IMp=_{df}□(p→ ~d)

OMp=_{df}◊(d& ~p)

OPp=_{df}◊(d&p) & ◊(d& ~p)

So in K*d*, *p* is *obligatory* iff *p* is
necessitated by all normative demands being met, *permissible*
iff *p* is compatible with all normative demands being met,
*impermissible* iff *p* is incompatible with all
normative demands, *omissible* iff p's negation is compatible
with all normative demands, and *optional* iff *p* is
compatible with all normative demands, and so is ~*p*. Since
none of the operators of the Traditional Scheme are taken as
primitive, and the basic logic is a modal logic with necessity and
possibility as the basic modal operators, this is referred to as
“a reduction” (of deontic logic to modal logic)

Proofs of SDL-ish wffs are then just K-proofs of the corresponding
modal formulae involving “*d*”. Two such simple
proofs can be found in the supplemental document
Two Simple Proofs in K*d*.

A proof that SDL is indeed contained in K*d* can be found
in the supplemental document SDL Containment Proof

In addition to containing all theorems of SDL, we note a few
theorems specific to K*d* because of the non-overlapping
syntactic ingredients, *d*, □, and ◊:

⊢OBd

⊢ □(p→q) → (OBp→OBq) (RM′)

⊢ □p→OBp(NEC′)

⊢OBp→ ◊p(“Kant's Law”)^{[27]}

⊢ ~◊(OBp&OB~p) (NC′)

These are easily
proven.^{[28]}

Although our underlying modal system is just K, adding further non-deontic axiom schema (i.e., those neither abbreviate-able via SDL wffs, nor involving d specifically) can nonetheless have a deontic impact. To illustrate, suppose we added a fourth axiom, one to the effect that necessity is here truth-implicating, called axiom T:

T: □p→p

Call the system that results from adding this formula to our current
system KT*d*. Axiom T is certainly plausible
enough here, since, as mentioned above, this approach to deontic logic
is more sensible if necessity is interpreted as truth-implicating,
since it takes obligations to be things necessitated by all normative
demands being met, but in what sense, if not a truth-implicating sense
of necessity?

Now with T added to K*d*, we have gone beyond SDL, since we can
now prove things expressible in SDL's language that we have already
shown are not theorems of SDL. The addition of T makes derivable our
previously mentioned axiom A4 of SDL+, which we have shown is not
derivable in SDL itself:

⊢OB(OBp→p)^{[29]}

So, reflecting on the fact that SDL+ is derivable in KT*d*, we
see that the Andersonian-Kangerian reduction must either rely on a
non-truth-implicating conception of necessity in order for its pure
deontic fragment to match SDL, or SDL itself is not susceptible to the
Andersonian-Kangerian reduction. Put another way, the most plausible
version of the Andersonian-Kangerian reduction can't help but view
“Standard Deontic Logic” as too weak.

A brief exploration of determinisms catastrophic implications for
deontic matters in the context of KT*d* can be found
in the supplemental document
Determinism and Deontic Collapse in the Classic A-K Framework.

Anderson's approach is practically equivalent to Kanger's. First,
consider the fact that we can easily define another constant in
K*d*, as follows:

s=_{df}~d,

where this new constant would now be derivatively read as follows:

“some (relevant) normative demands has been violated”.

Clearly our current axiom, ◊*d*, could be replaced with
~□*s*, asserting that it is not necessary that some normative
demand is violated. We could then define **OB** as:

OBp=_{df}□(~p→s),

and similarly for the other four operators.

Essentially, Anderson took this equivalent course with
“*s*” being his primitive (initially standing for
something like “the sanction has been invoked” or
“there is a liability to sanction”), and
~□*s* the axiom added to some modal system (at least as
strong as modal system
K⊤).

We should also note that Anderson was famous as a founding figure
in relevance logic,
and instead of using strict implication, □(*p* →
*q*), he explored the use of a relevant (and thus neither
material nor strict) conditional, ⇒, to express the reduction
as: **OB***p* =_{df} ~*p*
⇒ *s*. (A bit more on this can be found within the entry
Mally's deontic logic.
See references there, but also see Mares 1992.) This alternative
reflects the fact that there is an issue in both Kanger's and
Anderson's strict necessitation approaches of just what notion of
“necessity” can we say is involved in claiming that
meetings all normative demands (or avoiding the sanction)
*necessitates* *p*?

As a substantive matter, how should we think of these
“reductions”? For example, should we view them as giving
us an *analysis* of what it is for something to be obligatory?
Well, taking Kanger's course first, it would seem that *d* must
be read as a distinctive deontic ingredient, if we are to get the
derivative deontic reading for the “reduced” deontic
operators. Also, as our reading suggests, it is not clear that
*d* does not, at least by intention, express a complex
quantificational notion involving the very concept of obligation
(demand) as a proper part, namely that all obligations have been
fulfilled, so that the “reduction”, *presented as an
analysis*, would appear to be circular. If we read *d*
instead as “ideal circumstances obtain”, the claim of a
substantive reduction or analysis appears more promising, until we
ask, “Are the circumstances ideal only with respect to meeting
normative *demands or obligations*, or are they ideal in other
(for example supererogatory) ways that go beyond merely satisfying
normative *demands*? Anderson's “liability to
sanction” approach may appear more promising, since the idea
that something is obligatory if (and only if) and because
non-compliance necessitates (in some sense) liability to (or perhaps
desert of) punishment does not appear to be circular, (unless the
notion of “liability” itself ultimately involves the idea
of permissibility of punishment), but is it still controversial
(e.g. imperfect obligations are often thought to include obligations
where no one has a right to sanction you for violations)?
Alternatively, perhaps a norm that is merely an *ideal* cannot
be *violated*, in which case perhaps norms that have been
*violated* can be distinguished (as a subset) from norms that
have not been *complied* with, and then the notion of an
obligation as something that must obtain unless some norm is violated
will not be obviously circular. The point here is that there is a
substantive philosophical question lingering here that the language of
a “reduction” brings naturally to the surface. The formal
utility of the reduction does not hinge of this, but its philosophical
significance does.

### 3.2 Standard Semantics

The semantic elements here are in large part analogous to those for
SDL. We have a binary relation again, but this time instead of a
relation interpreted as relating worlds *acceptable* to a given
world, here we will have a relation, *R*, relating worlds
“accessible” to a given world (i.e., possible relative to
the given world). The only novelties are two: (1) we add a simple
semantic element to match our syntactic constant
“*d*”, and (2) we add a slightly more complex analog
to seriality, one that links the accessibility relation to the
semantic element added in order to model *d*. We introduce the
elements in stages.

Once again, assume that we have a set of possible worlds, *W*,
and assume that we have a relation, *R*, relating worlds to
worlds, with the intention that *R**ij* iff *j*
is accessible to *i* (e.g., *j* is a world where
everything true in *j* is possible relative to
*i*)^{[30]}.
For brevity, we will call all worlds possible relative to *i*,
“*i*-*accessible* worlds” and denote them by
*R*^{i}. For the moment, no restrictions are
placed on the relation *R*. We can illustrate these
truth-conditions for our modal operators with a set of diagrams
analogous to those used for giving the truth-conditions for
SDL’s deontic operators. We use obvious abbreviations for
necessity, possibility, impossibility, non-necessity, and
contingency:

Here we imagine that for any given world, *i*, we have
corralled all the *i*-accessible worlds together. We then
simply look at the quantificational status of *p* (and/or
~*p*) in these *i*-accessible worlds to determine
*p*'s modal status back at *i*: at a given world
*i*, *p* is *necessary* iff *p* holds
throughout *R ^{i}*,

*possible*iff

*p*holds somewhere in

*R*,

^{i}*impossible*iff

*p*holds nowhere in

*R*,

^{i}*non-necessary*iff ~

*p*holds somewhere in

*R*, and

^{i}*contingent*iff

*p*holds somewhere in

*R*, and so does ~

^{i}*p*.

The only *deontic* element in the syntax of K*d* is our
distinguished constant, *d*, intended to express the fact that
all normative demands are met*.* To model that feature, we
simply assume that the worlds are divided into those where all
normative demands are met and those that are not. We denote the former
subset of worlds by “DEM” in a model. Then *d* is
true at a world *j* iff *j* belongs to DEM. Here is a
picture where *d* is true at an arbitrary world,
*j*:

Since *j* is contained in DEM, that means all normative demands
are met at
*j*.^{[31]}

Corresponding to simple seriality for SDL (that there is always an
*i*-acceptable world), we assume what I will call “strong
seriality” for K*d*: for every world *i*, there is
an *i*-accessible world that is among those where all normative
demands are met. In other words, for every world *i*, the
intersection of the *i*-accessible worlds with those where all
normative demands are met is non-empty. Given the truth conditions for
*d*, strong seriality validates ◊*d***,**
ensuring that for any world *i*, there is always some
*i*-*accessible* world where *d* is true:

Given these semantic elements, if you apply them to the definitions of
the five deontic operators of K*d*, you will see that in each
case, the normative status of *p* at *i* depends on
*p*'s relationship to this intersection of the
*i*-accessible worlds and the worlds where all normative
demands are met:

If that inter-section is permeated by *p*-worlds, *p* is
obligatory; if it contains some *p*-world, *p* is
permissible, if it contains no p-world, *p* is impermissible,
if it contains some ~*p*-world, *p* is omissible, and
if it contains some *p*-world as well as some
~*p*-world, then *p* is
optional.^{[32]}

A more formal characterization of this semantic picture can be found
in the supplemental document
Kripke-Style Semantics for K*d*.

If we wish to validate ⊤,
□*p* → *p* (and derivatively, A4,
**OB**(**OB***p* → *p*)),
we need only stipulate that the accessibility relation, *R*, is
reflexive: that each world *i* is *i*-accessible
(possible relative to itself):

For then □*p* → *p* must be true at any world
*i*, for if □*p* is true at *i*, then *p*
is true at each *i*-accessible world, which includes
*i*, which is self-accessible. This will indirectly yield the
result that **OB**(**OB***p* →
*p*) is true in all such models as well.

We turn now to a large variety of problems attributed to the preceding closely related systems.

## 4. Challenges to Standard Deontic Logics

Here we consider some of the “paradoxes” attributed to “Standard Deontic Logics” like those above (SDLs). Although the use of “paradox” is widespread within deontic logic and it does conform to a technical use in philosophical logic, namely the distinction between “paradox” and “antinomy” stemming from Quine’s seminal “The Ways of Paradox” (Quine 1976 [1962]), I will also use “puzzle”, “problem” and “dilemma” below.

To paraphrase von Wright, the number of outstanding problems in deontic logic is large, and most of these can be framed as problems or limitations attributed to SDLs. In this section we will list and briefly describe most of them, trying to group them where feasible under crucial principles of SDL or more general themes.

### 4.1 A Puzzle Centering around the Very Idea of a Deontic Logic

*Jorgensen’s Dilemma* (Jorgensen 1937):

A view still held by many researchers within deontic logic and
metaethics, and particularly popular in the first few decades
following the emergence of positivism, was that evaluative sentences
are not the sort of sentences that can be either true or false. But
then how can there be a logic of normative sentences, since logic is
the study of what follows from what, and one thing can follow from
another only if the things in question are the sort that can be either
true or false? So there can be no deontic logic. On the other hand,
some normative sentences do seem to follow from others, so deontic
logic must be possible. What to do? That's Joergesson's
dilemma.^{[33]}

A widespread distinction is that between a *norm* and a
*normative
proposition*^{[34]}.
The idea is that a normative sentence such as “You may park
here for one hour” may be used by an authority to provide
permission on the spot or it may be used by a passerby to report on an
already existing norm (e.g., a standing municipal regulation). The
activity of using a normative sentence as in the first example is
sometimes referred to as “norming”—it creates a norm
by granting permission by the very use. The second use is often said
to be descriptive, since the sentence is then not used to grant
permission, but to report that permission to do so is a standing
state. It is often maintained that the two uses are mutually
exclusive, and only the latter use allows for truth or falsity. Some
have challenged the exclusiveness of the division, by blending
semantics and speech-act theory (especially regarding performatives),
thereby suggesting that it may be that one who is in authority to
grant a permission not only grants it in performing a speech act by
uttering the relevant sentence (as in the first example), but also
thereby makes what it said true (that the person is permitted to
park).^{[35]}

### 4.2 A Problem Centering Around NEC

This problem can be found in the supplemental document The Logical Necessity of Obligations Problem

### 4.3 Puzzles Centering Around RM

*Free Choice Permission Paradox* (Ross 1941):

Consider:

(1) You may either sleep on the sofa-bed or sleep on the guest room bed.^{[36]}(2) You may sleep on the sofa-bed and you may sleep on the guest room bed.

The most straightforward symbolization of these in SDL appears to be:

(1′)PE(s∨g)

(2′)PEs&PEg

Now it is also natural to see (2) as following from (1): if you permit
me to sleep in either bed, it would seem that I am permitted to sleep
in the first, *and* I am permitted to sleep in the second
(though perhaps not to sleep in both, straddling the two, as it were).
But (2′) does not follow from (1′) and the following is not a
theorem of SDL:

*PE(p∨q) → (PEp&PEq)

Furthermore, suppose * were added to a system that contained SDL.
Disaster would result. For it follows from **OB**-RM that
**PE***p* → **PE**(*p*
∨
*q*).^{[37]}
So with * it would follow that **PE***p* →
(**PE***p* & **PE***q*),
for any *q*, so we would get

**PEp→PEq,

that if anything is permissible, then everything is, and thus it would
also be a theorem that nothing is obligatory,
⊢
~**OB***p*.^{[38]}

Some have argued for two senses of
“permissibility”^{[39]}

Another puzzle centering around RM can be found in the supplemental document The Violability Puzzle.

*Ross's Paradox* (Ross 1941):

Consider:

(1) It is obligatory that the letter is mailed.

(2) It is obligatory that the letter is mailed or the letter is burned.

In SDLs, these seem naturally expressible as:

(1′)OBm

(2′)OB(m∨b)

But ⊢
**OB***p* →
**OB**(*p*
∨
*q*) follows by RM from ⊢
*p* → (*p*
∨
*q*). So (2′) follows from (1′), but it seems rather
odd to say that an obligation to mail the letter entails an obligation
that can be fulfilled by burning the letter (something presumably
forbidden), and one that would appear to be violated by not burning it
if I don't mail the letter.

*The Good Samaritan Paradox* (Prior
1958):^{[40]}

Consider:

(1) It ought to be the case that Jones helps Smith who has been robbed.

(2) It ought to be the case that Smith has been robbed.

Now it seems that the following must be true:

Jones helps Smith who has been robbed if and only if Jones helps Smith and Smith has been robbed.

But then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1) and (2) in SDLs is:

(1′)OB(h&r)

(2′)OBr

But it is a thesis of PC that (*h* & *r*) →
*r*, so by RM, it follows that **OB**(*h*
& *r*) → **OB***r*, and then we
can derive 2′) from 1′) by MP. But it hardly seems that if
helping the robbed man is obligatory it follows that his being robbed
is likewise
obligatory.^{[41]}

A much-discussed variant of this paradox can be found in the supplemental document The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation.

There have been various responses to these RM-related
paradoxes.^{[42]}

### 4.4 Puzzles Centering Around NC, OD and Analogues

*Sartre's Dilemma* (Lemmon
1962b)^{[43]}:

*A conflict of obligations* is a situation where there are two
obligations and it is not possible for both to be fulfilled.

Consider the following conflict:

- It is obligatory that I now meet Jones (say, as promised to Jones, my friend).
- It is obligatory that I now do not meet Jones (say, as promised
to Smith, another friend).
^{[44]}

Here it would seem that I have a conflict of obligations, in fact a
quite direct and explicit one, since what I promised one person would happen, I
promised another would not happen. People do (e.g., under pressure or
distraction) make such conflicting promises, and it appears that they
incur conflicting obligations as a
result.^{[45]}
But consider the natural representation of these in SDLs:

(1′)OBj

(2′)OB~j

But since NC, **OB***p* →
~**OB**~*p*, is a theorem of all SDLs, we can
quickly derive a contradiction from (1) and (2), which means that
(1′) conjoined with (2′) represents a logically inconsistent
situation. Yet, the original hardly seems logically
incoherent.^{[46]}

A puzzle regarding **OB***p* → ◊*p* can
be found in the supplemental
document A Puzzle Surrounding Kant's Law

Another puzzle associated with NC and OD can be found in the supplemental document Collapse of Conflicts and Impossible Obligations

Let me note that a long-ignored and challenging further puzzle for conflicting obligations, called “van Fraassen's Puzzle” (van Fraassen 1973) has deservedly received increasing attention of late: Horty 1994, Horty 2003, van der Torre and Tan 2000, McNamara 2004a, Hansen 2004, and Goble 2005.

*Plato's Dilemma* (Lemmon
1962b):^{[47]}

- I'm obligated to meet you for a light lunch at noon.
- I'm obligated to rush my choking child to the hospital at noon.

Here we seem to have an indirect, non-explicit conflict of
obligations, if we assume that satisfying both obligations is
practically impossible. Yet here, unlike in our prior example, where
the two promises might naturally have been on a par, we would all
agree that the obligation to help my child *overrides* my
obligation to meet you for lunch, and that the first obligation
is *defeated* by the second obligation, which *takes
precedence*. Ordinarily, we would also assume that no other
obligation overrides my obligation to rush my son to the hospital, so
that this obligation is an *all things considered non-overridden
obligation*, but not so for the obligation to meet you for
lunch. Furthermore, we are also prone to say that the situation is one
where the general obligation we have to keep our appointments (or to
keep our promises, still more generally) has
an *exception*—the circumstances are extenuating. If we
define an “obligations dilemma” as a conflict of
obligations where neither of the conflicting obligations is overridden
(cf. Sinnott-Armstrong 1988), then the case above involves a conflict
of obligations but not an obligations dilemma. Once we acknowledge
conflicts of obligation, there is the further issue of representing
the logic of reasoning about conflicting obligations where some do
(some don't) override others, some are (some are not) defeated, some
are (some are not) all things considered non-overridden obligations,
where some are perhaps parts of obligation dilemmas, where some hold
generally, but not unexceptionally, some are perhaps absolute, etc. So
a central issue here is that of conflicting obligations of different
weight and the defeasability of obligations. Clearly, there is no
mechanism in SDL for this, since SDL does not allow for conflicts to
begin with, yet this is an issue that goes well beyond that of merely
having a logic that allows for conflicts. There have been a variety of
approaches to this dilemma, and to defeasibility among conflicting
obligations.^{[48]}

### 4.5 Puzzles Centering Around Deontic Conditionals

A forerunner of the next paradox may be found in the supplemental document The Paradox of Derived Obligation/Commitment:

*Contrary-to-Duty* (*or Chisholm's*) *Paradox* (Chisholm
1963a):

Consider the following:

(1) It ought to be that Jones goes (to the assistance of his neighbors).(2) It ought to be that if Jones goes, then he tells them he is coming.

(3) If Jones doesn't go, then he ought not tell them he is coming.

(4) Jones doesn't go.

This certainly appears to describe a possible situation. It is widely
thought that (1)–(4) constitute a *mutually consistent* and
*logically independent* set of sentences. We treat these two
conditions as desiderata.

Note that (1) is a *primary* *obligation*, saying what
Jones ought to do
unconditionally.^{[49]}
(2) is a *compatible-with-duty obligation*, appearing to say
(in the context of 1)) what else Jones ought to do on the condition
that Jones fulfills his primary obligation. In contrast, (3) is a
*contrary-to-duty obligation* *or “imperative”
(a “CTD”)* appearing to say (in the context of 1))
what Jones ought to do conditional on his violating his primary
obligation. (4) is a factual claim, which conjoined with (1), implies
that Jones *violates* his primary obligation. Thus this puzzle
also places not only deontic *conditional* constructions, but
the *violability* of obligations, at center stage. It raises
the challenging question: what constitutes proper reasoning about what
to do in the face of violations of obligations?

How might we represent the above quartet in SDL? The most straightforward symbolization is;

(1′)OBg.

(2′)OB(g→t).

(3′) ~g→OB~t.

(4′) ~g.

But Chisholm points out that from (2′) by principle
**OB**-K we get **OB**g →
**OB**t, and then from (1′) by MP, we get
**OB**t; but by MP alone we get **OB**~t
from (3′) and (4′). From these two conclusions, by PC, we
get ~(**OB**t → ~**OB**~t),
contradicting **OB**-NC of SDL. Thus (1′) -
(4′) leads to inconsistency per SDL. But (1)–(4) do not seem
inconsistent at all, so the representation cannot be a faithful
one.

Various less plausible representations in SDL are similarly
unfaithful. For example, we might try reading the second and third
premises uniformly, either on the model of (2′) or on the model
of (3′). Suppose that instead of (3′) above, we use
(3″) **OB**(~*g* → ~*t*). The
trouble with this is (3″) is derivable from (1′) in SDL,
but there is no reason to think (3) in fact follows from 1), so we
have an unfaithful representation again. Alternatively, suppose that
instead of (2′) above, we use (2″) *g* →
**OB***t*. This is derivable from (4′) in PC
(and thus in SDL). But there is no reason to think (2) follows from (4).
So again, we have an unfaithful representation.

The following displays in tabular form the difficulties in trying to
interpret the quartet in
SDL:^{[50]}

First Try : | Second Try: | Third Try: |

(1′) OBg |
(1′) OBg |
(1′) OBg |

(2′) OB(g → t) |
(2′) OB(g → t) |
(2″) g → OBt |

(3′) ~g → OB~t |
(3″) OB(~g → ~t) |
(3′) ~g → OB~t |

(4′) ~g |
(4′) ~g |
(4′) ~g |

From (1′), (2′), OBt. |
(3″) follows from (1′). | (2″) follows from (4′). |

From (3′), (4′), OB~t. |
So independence is lost. | So independence is lost. |

By NC, OBt →
~OB~t. |
||

So ⊥; consistency is lost. |

Each reading of the original quartet violates one of our desiderata: mutual consistency or joint independence.

If von Wright launched deontic logic as an academic specialization,
Chisholm's Paradox was the booster rocket that provided the escape
velocity deontic logic needed from subsumption under normal modal
logics, thus solidifying deontic logic's status as a distinct
specialization. It is now virtually universally acknowledged that
Chisholm was right: the sort of conditional deontic claim expressed in
(3) can't be faithfully represented in SDL, nor more generally by a
composite of some sort of unary deontic operator and a material
conditional. This is one of the few areas where there is nearly
universal agreement in deontic logic. Whether or not this is because
some special *primitive dyadic deontic conditional* is
operating or because it is just that some *non-material*
conditional is essential to understanding important deontic reasoning
is still a hotly contested open
question.^{[51]}

Further discussion of this important puzzle can be found in the supplemental document A Bit More of Chisholm's Paradox

*The Paradox of the Gentle Murderer* (Forrester
1984)^{[52]}

Consider:

(1) It is obligatory that John Doe does not kill his mother.(2) If Doe does kill his mother, then it is obligatory that Doe kills her gently.

(3) Doe does kill his mother (say for an inheritance).

Then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1) through (3) in SDLs is:

(1′)OB~k

(2′)k→OBg

(3′)k

First, from (2′) and (3′), it follows that
**OB***g* by MP. But now add the following
unexceptionable claim:

Doe kills his mother gently only if Doe kills his mother.

Assuming this, symbolized as *g* → *k*, is a
logical truth in an expanded system, by **OB**-RM it
follows that **OB***g* →
**OB***k*, and so by MP again we get
**OB***k*. This seems bad enough, for it hardly
seems that from the fact that if I kill my mother then I must kill her
gently and that I will kill her (scoundrel that I am), we can conclude
that I am actually obligated to kill my mother
*simplicter*. Add to this that from
**OB***k* in turn, we get
~**OB**~*k* by NC of SDL, and thus we have a
contradiction as well. So we must either construe (2) so that is does
not satisfy *modus ponens* or we must reject
**OB**-RM.^{[53]}

### 4.6 Problems Surrounding (Normative) Expressive Inadequacies of SDL

Here we look at some monadic normative notions that appear to be inexpressible in SDL.

*The Normative Gaps Puzzle* (von Wright
1968)^{[54]}:

In some normative systems, permissions, prohibitions and obligations
are explicitly given. So it would seem to be possible for there to be
normative systems with gaps: systems where something is neither
explicitly obligatory, impermissible, nor permissible because, say, it
is neither explicitly commanded, prohibited or permitted by the
relevant authority. Yet **OB***p* ∨
(**PE***p* & **PE**~*p*)
∨ **IM***p* is a thesis
(“exhaustion”) of SDL (given the Traditional Definitional
Scheme), which seems to make any such gaps impossible.

*Urmson's Puzzle—Indifference versus Optionality*
(Urmson 1958):

Consider:

1) It is optional that you attend the meeting, but not a matter of indifference that you do so.

This seems to describe something quite familiar: optional matters that
are nonetheless not matters of indifference. But when deontic
logicians and ethicists gave an operator label for the condition
(~**OB***p* &
~**OB**~*p*), it was almost invariably “It
is indifferent that *p*”,
“**IN**p”. But then it would seem to follow
from the theorem **OB***p* ∨
(~**OB***p* & ~**OB**~*p*)
∨ **IM***p*, that
(~**OB***p* & ~**IM***p*)
→ **IN***p*, that is, everything that is
neither obligatory nor prohibited is a matter of indifference. But
many actions, including some heroic actions, are neither obligatory
nor prohibited, yet they are hardly matters of indifference. We might
put this by saying that SDL can represent optionality, but not
indifference, despite the fact that the latter concept has been a
purported target for representation since nearly its beginning.

*The Supererogation Problem* (Urmson 1958):

Some things are beyond the call of duty or supererogatory (e.g., volunteering for a costly or risky good endeavor where others are equally qualified and no one person is obligated). SDL has no capacity to represent this concept, which calls for a substantial increase in expressive and logical resources. (See also Chisholm 1963b)

*The Must versus Ought Dilemma* (McNamara 1996b)

Consider:

(1) Although you can skip the meeting, you ought to attend.

This seems perfectly possible, even in a situation where no
conflicting obligations are present, as we will suppose here. (1)
appears to imply that it is optional that you attend—that you
*can* attend and that you *can* fail to attend. It seems
clear that the latter two uses of “can” express
permissibility. Yet “ought” is routinely the reading given
for deontic necessity in deontic logic (and in ethical theory), and
then “permissibility” is routinely presented as its
dual. But then if we symbolize 1) above accordingly, we get,

(1′)PE~p&OBp

which is just ~**OB***p* &
**OB***p* in disguise (given
**OB**-RE and the Traditional Definitional Scheme). So
(1′), given **OB**-NC, yields a
contradiction. Another way to put this is that the “can”
of permissibility is much more plausibly construed as the dual of
“must” than as the dual of “ought”. This
yields a dilemma for standard deontic logic (really for most work in
deontic logic):

Either deontic necessity represents “ought”, in which case, its dual does not represent permissibility (and neither does any other construction in SDL), or permissibility is represented in SDL, but “ought” is inexpressible in it despite the ubiquitous assumption otherwise.

That “ought” is the dual of permissibility is really a
largely overlooked pervasive mistaken bipartisan presupposition
partially characterizing twentieth century ethical theory and deontic
logic.^{[55]}

*The Least You Can Do Problem* (McNamara 1996b):

(1) You should have come home on time; the least you could have done was called, and you didn’t do even that.

The expression in the second clause has been completely ignored in the literature of deontic logic and ethical theory. (1) appears to express the idea that there is some minimal but acceptable alternative (and the criticism suggested in the emphatic third clause is that not even that minimal acceptable option was taken, much less the preferable option identified in the first clause using “ought”). This notion of what is minimally acceptable among the permissible options is not expressible in SDL.

Regarding the last four problems, McNamara 1996a, 1996b provide a semantical and logical framework for distinguishing “must” from “ought”, indifference from optionality, as well as distinctly representing “the least you can do” idiom and analyzing one central sense of “supererogation” via that otherwise unstudied idiom. A quick glance at the resulting scheme, which presupposes a no-conflicts atmosphere for simplicity, can be found in the supplemental document A Framework for Common Sense Morality in Non-Conflict Contexts.

### 4.7 Agency in Deontic Contexts

We routinely talk about both what *ought to be* and what people
*ought to do*. These hardly look like the same things (for
example, the latter notion calls for an agent, the former does
not). This issue, and the general issue of representing agency in
deontic logic has been much discussed, and continues to be an area of
active concern.

*The Jurisdictional Problem and the Need for
Agency ^{[56]}*

Consider the following:

(1) Jane Doe is obligated to not bring it about thatyour child is disciplined.

(2) Jane Doe is obligated to not bring it aboutthat your child is not disciplined.

Suppose you have a child. For almost any Jane Doe, (1) is then true:
she is obligated to not bring it about that *your* child is
disciplined, since that is none of her business. Similarly, for (2):
she also is obligated to not bring it about that *your* child
is not disciplined, since bringing that about is also none of her
business. How might we represent these in SDL? Suppose we try to read
the **OB** of SDL as “Jane Doe is obligated to
bring it about that
__ __”^{[57]};
then how do we express (1) and (2)? The closest we appear to be able to
come is:

(1′) ~OBp.

(2′) ~OB~p.

But these won't do. Collectively, (1′) and (2′) amount to saying that two obligations are absent, that it is neither obligatory that Jane Doe brings it about that your child is disciplined nor obligatory that she brings it about that your child is not disciplined. But this is compatible with its being the case that both (1) and (2) above are false. After all, suppose now that you are Jane Doe, the single parent of your child. Then in a given situation, it may be that you, the child's sole parent and guardian, are both permitted to bring it about that the child is disciplined and permitted to bring it about that the child is not disciplined, in which case both (1) and (2) are false. These permissions in fact appear to be equivalent to the negations of (1) and (2).) But the falsity of (1) (and the first permission) implies the truth of (2′) on the current reading, and the falsity of (2) (and the second permission) implies the truth of (1′) on the current reading. So clearly (1) and (1′) are not equivalent, nor are (2) and (2′).

Alternatively, on the proposed reading of **OB,**
shifting the outer negation signs to the right of the operators in
(1′) and (2′) will just get us this conflicting pair:

(1″)OB~p

(2″)OB~~p

which are hopeless candidates for symbolizing (1) and (2), which do not conflict with one another.

Also, consider this traditional equivalence:

IMp↔OB~p.

If we are going to read “**OB**” as having
agency built into it, presumably we want to do the same for the other
operators, and so **IM***p* above will be read as
“it is impermissible for Jane Doe to bring it about that
*p*”. However, this renders the left to right implication
in the equivalence above unsound, for it may be true that it is
impermissible for me to discipline your child, but false that it is
obligatory for me to see to it that your child is positively not
disciplined. The matter must be left up to you.

On the face of it, the “not”s in (1) and (2) are not
external to the deontic operators, as it were, nor are they directly
operating on *p*; rather they pertain to Jane Doe's agency with
respect to *p*. They come “between” a deontic
element and an agential element, so reading **OB** as an
amalgamation of a deontic and agential operator does not allow for the
“insertion” of any such negation. So, unsurprisingly, it
looks like we simply must have some explicit representation of agency
if we are to represent agential obligations like those in (1) and
(2) above.

*A Simple Kangerian Agency Framework*

So let us introduce a standard operator for this missing element,

BA: Jane Doe brings it about that.^{[58]}

Then clearly the following relations expressing an agent's simple
position with respect to a proposition, *p*, are to be
distinguished:

BAp: Jane Doe brings it about thatp

BA~p: Jane Doe brings it about that ~p

~BAp: Jane Doe does not bring it about thatp

~BA~p: Jane Doe does not bring it about that ~p

Plainly, if neither of the first two hold, then the conjunction of the
last two holds. In such a case we might say that Jane Doe is
*passive* with respect to *p*, or more adequately,
passive with respect to herself bringing about *p* or its
negation.^{[59]}
Let's introduce such an operator:

PVp =_{df}~BAp & ~BA~p

Clearly we have here another potential set of modal operators, and we can introduce rough analogues to our traditional definitional schemes for alethic modal operators and deontic operators as follows:

ROp =_{df}BA~p

NRp =_{df}~BA~p

NBp =_{df}~BAp

PVp =_{df}~BAp & ~BA~p

The first says *that it is ruled out by what our agent does that
p* if and only if our agent brings it about that ~*p*.
Note that this notion does not apply to all things that are ruled out
*per se*, but only to those that are specifically ruled out by
our agent's exercise of her agency. So contradictions, the negations
of laws of nature and of past events are not ruled out by what our
agent now does. The second says it is *n*ot *r*uled out
by anything our agent does that *p* if and only if our agent
does not bring it about that ~*p*. Laws of logic (which are
necessarily ruled in) as well as contradictions (which are necessarily
ruled out) are not things that are ruled out by our agent. The third
says our agent does not bring it about that *p* (*p* is
not ruled in by anything our agent does) if and only if it is false
that our agent brings it about that *p*. This is of course
compatible with *p*'s holding for some other reason, such as
that it is a law of logic or nature, or because it holds due to
another person’s exercise of her own agency. The fourth says our
agent is passive regarding *p* (does nothing herself that
determines the status of *p*) if and only if our agent neither
brings about *p* nor rules *p* out by what she does do
(if anything). Again, it does not follow from the fact that our agent
leaves something open that it is open *per se*. PV*p* is
consistent with its being fixed that *p* and consistent with
its being fixed that ~*p*, as long as it is not fixed by
anything our agent has done. These notions are all intended to have a
strong agential reading.

It is quite plausible to think that the first five agential operators satisfy the conditions of the traditional square and the traditional threefold classification scheme:

For example, in the latter case, for every agent Jane Doe, and any
proposition, *p*, either Doe brings about *p*, or Doe
brings about ~*p*, or Doe brings about neither, and
furthermore, no more than one of these three can hold (i.e., the three
are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive). We will come back to
this in a moment.

Virtually all accounts of this operator take it to satisfy the rule,

Ifp↔qis a theorem, so is BAp↔ BAq(BA-RE),

as well as the scheme,

BAp→p(BA-T)

(if an agent brings about *p*, then *p*
holds—“success” clause), and the schema,

(BAp& BAq) → BA(p&q) (BA-C)^{[60]}

It is also the majority opinion that this operator satisfies this scheme:

~BA⊤. (BA-NO)

Consider again:

(1) BA p1′) ~BA p(2) BA~ p,(2′) ~BA~ p,

and consider pairing these with one another. Pruning because of the commutativity of conjunction, we get six combinations:

a) BAp & BA~ p.(Contradiction given BA-T axiom) b) BAp & ~BAp. (PC contradiction) c) BAp & ~BA~ p.(The second clause is implied by the first) d) BA~ p& ~BAp.(The second clause is implied by the first) e) BA~ p& ~BA~p.(PC contradiction) f) ~BAp & ~BA~ p.(i.e., PV p)

Recall that because of the BA-T axiom, (1) above implies (2′), and
(2) implies (1′). So the following three pruned down statuses for
a proposition, *p*, and an agent, s, are the only pairs that
remain of the six above (redundancies are also eliminated):

BAp,BA~

p,PV

p.

For the reasons alluded to already, it is easy to prove using the
above principles that these three statuses (regarding an agent) and a
proposition, *p*, are indeed mutually exclusive and jointly
exhaustive, as anticipated.

Another operator of considerable pre-theoretic interest is briefly discussed in the supplemental document Inaction versus Refraining/Forebearing

It is beyond the scope of this essay to delve non-superficially into
the logic of
agency,^{[61]}
and here we only barely touch on the more complex interaction of
such logics with deontic logics by keeping the agency component
exceedingly simple.

*The Meinong-Chisholm Reduction: A Simple Recipe for Agential
Obligations* (Chisholm
1964)^{[62]}:

Let us set aside the jurisdictional problem as having established the
need to go beyond SDL in order to represent agential obligations.
Returning to deontic matters, the question arises: how do we represent
not just agency, but agential obligation? With an agency operator in
hand, we might now invoke the famous “Meinong-Chisholm
Reduction”: the idea that Jane Doe’s obligation *to
do* some thing is equivalent to what it is obligatory that Jane do
(cf. what Jane ought to do is what it ought to be that Jane does). If
we regiment this a bit using our operator for agency, we get the
following version of the “reduction”:

*Meinong-Chisholm Reduction*: Jane Doe is obligated to bring it
about that *p* iff it is obligatory that Jane Doe brings it
about that *p*.

This is sometimes taken to be a reduction of personal obligation to
impersonal obligation and agency (or it is sometimes rephrased as a
reduction of the personal “ought to do” to the impersonal
“ought to be” and
agency).^{[63]}
Although not uncontested (e.g., see Horty 2001), by relying on this
analysis we appear to have a way to represent the troublesome
sentences, (1) and (2) of the jurisdictional problem:

1″)OB~BAp,

2″)OB~BA~p.

These might be taken to assert that Jane Doe is positively obligated
to *not* bring it about that *p* and that she is also
positively obligated to *not* bring it about that
~*p*. Here we can properly express the fact that she is
positively obligated to be non-agential with respect to the status of
both *p* and ~*p*. These are easily distinguished from
the claims that Jane Doe is *not* obligated to bring about
*p* (i.e., ~**OB**BA*p*) and that she is
*not* obligated to bring about ~*p* (i.e.,
~**OB**BA~*p*). Similar remarks hold for our
earlier equivalence **IM***p* ↔
**OB**~*p*.

Generally, if we substitute “BA*p*” for *p*
in the traditional definitional scheme's equivalences, we get:

IMBAp↔OB~BAp

PEBAp↔ ~OB~BAp

OMBAp↔ ~OBBAp

OPBAp↔ ~OBBAp& ~OB~BAp

If we now read each deontic operator as “it is ____ for Jane Doe
that”, so that it is impersonal but not agential, the earlier
problem with **IM***p* ↔
**OB**~*p*, coupled with trying to read the agency
into the deontic operators, disappears. For the deontic-agential
compound above gets things right: it is impermissible that Jane Doe
brings it about that your child is disciplined iff it is obligatory
for Jane Doe that she does not bring it about that your child is
disciplined. We can now clearly and distinctly express the idea that
something is simply out of Jane Doe's jurisdiction.

This general approach to obligations to do things has been very widely
employed in deontic
logic.^{[64]}

Krogh and Herrestad 1996 reinterpret the analysis so that the deontic
operator is *personal*, yet not agential. This is arguably a
more plausible way to preserve a componential analysis of agential
obligation. McNamara 2004a also makes the case that a person's being
obligated to be such that a certain condition holds (e.g., being
obligated to be at home at noon, as promised) is the more basic idiom,
and being obligated to bring about something is just being obligated
to be such that you do bring it about.

*A Glimpse at the Theory of Normative Positions* (Kanger 1971
[1957]):

One way in which the Meinong-Chisholm analysis has been fruitfully
employed is in the study of what are called “normative
positions”. A set of normative positions is intended to describe
the set of all possible mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive
positions that a person or set of persons may be in regarding a
proposition and with respect to a set of selected primitive normative
statuses and a set of agency operators. For a given proposition,
*p*, recall the partition regarding how Jane Doe may be
positioned agentially with respect to *p*:

(BAp∨ ROp∨ PVp) & ~(BAp& ROp) & ~(BAp& PVp) & ~(ROp& PVp)

Now also recall our partition with respect to obligations:

(OBp∨IMp∨OPp) & ~(OBp&IMp) & ~(OBp&OPp) & ~(IMp&OPp)

We might consider “merging” these two partitions, as it
were, and try to get a representation of the possible ways Jane Doe
may be positioned normatively with respect to her agency regarding
*p*. Given certain choices of logic for BA and for
**OB**, we might get a set of mutually exclusive and
exhaustive “normative positions” for Jane Doe regarding
*p*, the basic normative status, **OB**, and the
basic agency operator, BA, such as that pictured below:

As usual, the partition above is intended to assert that the following seven classes are mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive:

OBBA~pOBBApPEBAp&PEROp&PEPVp(~ OB~BAp& ~OB~BA~p& ~OB~PVp)PEBAp&PEROp&OB~PVp(~ OB~BAp& ~OB~BA~p&OB~PVp)PEBAp&OB~ROp&PEPVp(~ OB~BAp&OB~BA~p& ~OB~PVp)OBNBp&PEROp&PEPVp( OB~BAp& ~OB~BA~p& ~OB~PVp)OBPVp( OBNBp&OBNRp, given axiomsOB-C &OB-M)

This too has been a dynamic area of research that we have barely
touched on
here.^{[65]}

A further issue regarding the Meinong-Chisholm Reduction can be found in the supplemental document Deontic Complements

*An Obligation Fulfillment Dilemma* (McNamara
2004a)^{[66]}

Obligations can be fulfilled and violated. These are among the most characteristic features of obligations. It is often thought that fulfillment and violation conditions for what is obligatory are easily represented in SDL as follows:

OBp&p(fulfillment)

OBp& ~p(violation).

Call this the “Standard Analysis”. Now consider cases
where *p* is itself some agential sentence, say BA*q*,
where we continue to read this as saying that Jane Doe brings it about
that *q*. The Standard Analysis then implies:

OBBAq& BAq(fulfillment?)

OBBAq& ~BAq(violation?).

These suggest that Doe's obligation to bring it about that *q*
is fulfilled iff she brings it about that *q* and is violated
iff she doesn't. But if this is the proper analysis of obligation
fulfillment, then it is hard to see how someone else could ever
fulfill our obligations when we don't fulfill ours, for then our
obligation would be unfulfilled and violated according to the Standard
Analysis. Yet surely people can fulfill other people's obligations,
and when they do so, it certainly seems to follow that our obligation
is fulfilled. So the question then becomes, just what is obligatory?
It would seem that it can't be that what is obligatory is that
*Jane Doe* brings it about that *p*, for it is
incoherent to say that someone else does that unless we mean that
someone else gets Jane Doe to bring it about that *p*; but that
is hardly the usual way in which we fulfill other's obligations. I
might bring your book back to the library for you, thereby fulfilling
one of your obligations without getting you to return the book
yourself, at gunpoint say. So we face a dilemma:

Since others can sometimes discharge our obligations, eitherourobligations are not always obligations forusto do things, and thus personal obligations need not be agential or obligation fulfillment is more complex than has been previously realized, and perhaps both.

A related problem can be found in the supplemental document The Leakage Problem.

### 4.8 Challenges regarding Obligation, Change and Time

Although we have seen that obligations can be obligations to be (i.e.,
to satisfy a condition) as well as obligations to do, and that the
former may be a special case of the latter, nonetheless, it is
plausible to think that one is obligated *to do* something only
if that thing is in the future. Thus even if attempts to solve
Chisholm's contrary to duty paradox by invoking time do not look very
plausible, this does not mean that there is no interesting work needed
to forge relationships between time and obligations. For example,
consider the system K*d*. If we read *d* atemporally as
all obligations past, present, and future are met, then the only
relevant worlds are those so ideal that in them there has never been a
single violation of a mandatory norm. But as a parent, I may be
obligated to lock the front door at night even though this would not
be a norm unless there had been past violations of other norms (e.g.,
against theft and murder). People also acquire obligations over time,
create them for themselves and for others by their actions, discharge
them,
etc.^{[67]}

## 5. Conclusion

Plainly, there are a number of outstanding problems for deontic logic. Some see this as a serious defect; others see it merely as a serious challenge, even an attractive one. There is some antecedent reason to expect that the challenges will be great in this area. Normativity is challenging generally, not just in deontic logic. Normative notions appear to have strong semantic and pragmatic features. Normative notions must combine with notions for agency and with temporal notions to be of maximal interest—which introduces considerable logical complexity. There is also reason to think that there are hidden complexities in the interaction of normative notions and conditionals. Finally, there appears to be a wide array of normative notions with interesting interactions, some easily conflated with others (by ethicists as much as deontic logicians). Clearly, there is a lot of work to be done.

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logic: action | logic: modal | logic: relevance | Mally, Ernst | Mally, Ernst: deontic logic | moral dilemmas | reasoning: moral | square of opposition

### Acknowledgments

This entry is an original contribution to the Stanford Encyclopedia
of Philosophy. It has been adapted for inclusion in the *Handbook
of the History of Logic*. See McNamara 2006. I'd like to
thank the editors of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their
cooperation in working out these arrangements.