Fuzzy Logic

First published Tue Sep 3, 2002; substantive revision Wed Aug 4, 2010

The term “fuzzy logic” emerged in the development of the theory of fuzzy sets by Lotfi Zadeh (1965). A fuzzy subset A of a (crisp) set X is characterized by assigning to each element x of X the degree of membership of x in A (e.g., X is a group of people, A the fuzzy set of old people in X). Now if X is a set of propositions then its elements may be assigned their degree of truth, which may be “absolutely true,” “absolutely false” or some intermediate truth degree: a proposition may be more true than another proposition. This is obvious in the case of vague (imprecise) propositions like “this person is old” (beautiful, rich, etc.). In the analogy to various definitions of operations on fuzzy sets (intersection, union, complement, …) one may ask how propositions can be combined by connectives (conjunction, disjunction, negation, …) and if the truth degree of a composed proposition is determined by the truth degrees of its components, i.e. if the connectives have their corresponding truth functions (like truth tables of classical logic). Saying “yes” (which is the mainstream of fuzzy logic) one accepts the truth-functional approach; this makes fuzzy logic to something distinctly different from probability theory since the latter is not truth-functional (the probability of conjunction of two propositions is not determined by the probabilities of those propositions).

Two main directions in fuzzy logic have to be distinguished (cf. Zadeh 1994). Fuzzy logic in the broad sense (older, better known, heavily applied but not asking deep logical questions) serves mainly as apparatus for fuzzy control, analysis of vagueness in natural language and several other application domains. It is one of the techniques of soft-computing, i.e. computational methods tolerant to suboptimality and impreciseness (vagueness) and giving quick, simple and sufficiently good solutions. The monographs Novak 1989, Zimmermann 1991, Klir-Yuan 1996, Nguyen 1999 can serve as recommended sources of information.

Fuzzy logic in the narrow sense is symbolic logic with a comparative notion of truth developed fully in the spirit of classical logic (syntax, semantics, axiomatization, truth-preserving deduction, completeness, etc.; both propositional and predicate logic). It is a branch of many-valued logic based on the paradigm of inference under vagueness. This fuzzy logic is a relatively young discipline, both serving as a foundation for the fuzzy logic in a broad sense and of independent logical interest, since it turns out that strictly logical investigation of this kind of logical calculi can go rather far. A basic monograph is Hajek 1998, further recommended monographs are Turunen 1999, Novak et al. 2000; also recent monographs dealing with many-valued logic (not specifically oriented to fuzziness), namely Gottwald 2001, Cignoli et al. 2000a; are highly relevant.

The interested reader will find below some more information on fuzzy connectives and a survey of a logical system called basic fuzzy (propositional and predicate) logic together with three stronger systems — Łukasiewicz, Gödel and product logic; a short discussion on paradoxes and fuzzy logic; some comments on other formal systems of fuzzy logic, complexity and, finally, a few remarks on fuzzy computing and bibliography.

1. Fuzzy connectives

The standard set of truth degrees is the real interval [0,1] with its natural ordering ≤ (1 standing for absolute truth, 0 for absolute falsity); but one can work with different domains, finite or infinite, linearly or partially ordered. Truth functions of connectives have to behave classically on the extremal values 0,1.

It is broadly accepted that t-norms (triangular norms) are possible truth functions of conjunction. (A binary operation * on the interval [0,1] is a t-norm if it is commutative, associative, non-decreasing and 1 is its unit element. Minimum (min(x,y) is the most popular t-norm. See the Glossary at the end.) Dually, t-conorms serve as truth functions of disjunction. See Klement et al. 2000 for an extensive theory of t-norms. The truth function of negation has to be non-increasing (and assign 0 to 1 and vice versa); the function 1 − x (Łukasiewicz negation) is the best known candidate.

Implication is sometimes disregarded but is of fundamental importance for fuzzy logic in the narrow sense. A straightforward but logically less interesting possibility is to define implication from conjunction and negation (or disjunction and negation) using the corresponding tautology of classical logic; such implications are called S-implications. More useful and interesting are R-implications: an R-implication is defined as a residuum of a t-norm; denoting the t-norm * and the residuum → we have x → y = max{z| x*zy}. This is well-defined only if the t-norm is left-continuous.

2. Basic fuzzy propositional logic

Basic fuzzy propositional logic is the logic of continuous t-norms (developed in Hajek 1998). Formulas are built from propositional variables using connectives & (conjunction), → (implication) and truth constant 0 (denoting falsity). Negation ¬ φ is defined as φ → 0. Given a continuous t-norm * (and hence its residuum →) each evaluation e of propositional variables by truth degrees for [0,1] extends uniquely to the evaluation e*(φ) of each formula φ using * and → as truth functions of & and →.

A formula φ is a t-tautology or standard BL-tautology if e*(φ) = 1 for each evaluation e and each continuous t-norm *. The following t-tautologies are taken as axioms of the logic BL:

(A1) (φ → ψ) → ((ψ → χ) → (φ → χ))
(A2) (φ & ψ) → φ
(A3) (φ & ψ) → (ψ & φ)
(A4) (φ & (φ → ψ)) → (ψ & (ψ → φ))
(A5a) (φ → (ψ → χ)) → ((φ & ψ) → χ)
(A5b) ((φ & ψ) → χ) → (φ → (ψ → χ))
(A6) ((φ → ψ) → χ) → (((ψ → φ) → χ) → χ)
(A7) 0 → φ

Modus ponens is the only deduction rule; this gives the usual notion of proof and provability of the logic BL. The standard completeness theorem (Cignoli et al. 2000b) says that a formula φ is a t-tautology iff it is provable in BL.

There is a more general semantics of BL, based on algebras called BL-algebras; each BL-algebra can serve as the algebra of truth functions of BL. The general completeness theorem says that a formula φ is provable in BL iff it is a general BL-tautology, i.e., a tautology for each (linearly ordered) BL-algebra L.

3. Basic fuzzy predicate logic

Basic fuzzy predicate logic has the same formulas as classical predicate logic (they are built from predicates of arbitrary arity using object variables, connectives &, →, truth constant 0 and quantifiers ∀, ∃. A standard interpretation is given by a non-empty domain M and for each n-ary predicate P by a n-ary fuzzy relation on M, i.e., a mapping assigning to each n-tuple of elements of M a truth value from [0,1] — the degree in which the n-tuple satisfies the atomic formula P(x1,…,xn). Given a continuous t-norm, this defines uniquely (in Tarski style) the truth degree ||φ|| of each closed formula φ given by the interpretation M and t-norm *. (The degree of an universally quantified formula ∀xφ is defined as the infimum of truth degrees of instances of φ; similarly ∃xφ and supremum. See the Glossary at the end of this entry.)

This generalizes in an appropriate manner to a so called safe interpretation over any linearly ordered BL-algebra and definition of the truth value ||φ|| M,L given by the L-interpretation M. A formula is a general BL-tautology in the predicate logic BL∀ if its truth value is 1 in each safe interpretation.

The following BL-tautologies are taken as axioms of BL∀: (a) axioms of the propositional logic BL, and

(∀1) xφ(x) → φ(y)
(∃1) φ(y) → ∃xφ(x)
(∀2) x(χ→ψ) → (χ → ∀xψ)
(∃2) x(φ → χ) → (∃xφ → χ)
(∀3) x(φ ∨ χ) → (∀xφ ∨ χ)

(where y is substitutable for x into φ and x is not free in χ).

Deduction rules are modus ponens and generalization as in classical logic.

The general completeness theorem says that a formula is provable in the fuzzy predicate logic BL∀ iff it is a general BL-tautology (of predicate logic). This generalizes in a natural way to provability in a theory over BL∀ and truth in all models of the theory. But note that standard BL-tautologies, i.e., formulas true in all standard interpretations w.r.t. all continuous t-norms are not recursively axiomatizable (see Montagna 2001 for the final result).

From recent important and general papers we recommend Cintula & Hajek 2010a, Esteva et al. 2009, Metcalfe et al. 2008 and Montagna 2005.

4. Łukasiewicz, Gödel and product logic

The following table presents three most important continuous t-norms, their residua and the corresponding negation:


They define three corresponding notions of tautology (being true in each evaluation with respect to the t-norm — standard Ł-tautologies, G-tautologies and Π-tautologies.) On the level of propositional logic they are completely axiomatized as follows:

Ł BL plus the axiom ¬¬φ → φ of double negation,
G BL plus the axiom φ → (φ & φ) of idempotence of conjunction,
Π BL plus the axiom ¬¬φ → ((φ→ (φ & ψ)) → (ψ & ¬¬ψ)).

This is standard completeness; we have also general completeness with respect to BL-algebras satisfying the corresponding additional conditions (making the additional axioms true): they are called MV-algebras (for Ł), G-algebras (for G) and product algebras (for Π) The corresponding predicate logics Ł∀, G∀, Π∀ are extensions of the basic predicate fuzzy logic BL∀ by the just formulated axioms characterizing Ł, G, Π.

Analogously to BL∀ we have the general completeness heorem for predicate logics: provability = general validity; for G∀ we have also standard completeness, but neither standard L∀-tautologies nor standard Π∀-tautologies are recursively axiomatizable.

Among important recent papers, we should mention Cintula & Hajek 2009.

5. Fuzzy logic, paradoxes and probability

In classical logic, the liar paradox (sentence asserting its own falsity) relies on the fact that no formula can be equivalent to its own negation. In Łukasiewicz logic this is not the case: if φ has the value 0.5 then its negation ¬φ has the same value and is equivalent to φ. But one may ask if one can add to (classical) arithmetic a fuzzy truth predicate Tr satisfying, for formulas of this extended language, the disquotation schema

φ ≡ Tr(φ), (where φ denotes the Gödel number of φ)

The answer is “yes and no”: you get a theory which is consistent but has no model expanding the standard natural numbers. This is discussed in Hajek et al. 2000; see also Grim et al. 1992.

The Sorites paradox is related to notions like small, many etc.; considering them to be crisp (two-valued) leads to unnatural consequences. We shall sketch a treatment of the notion “small number” in fuzzy logic. (See Goguen 1968–69 for a “classic” analysis.) Without going into detail, imagine a theory inside fuzzy predicate calculus (BL∀ or other) containing crisp arithmetic of natural numbers (as above) and an additional predicate Small with the axioms saying that 0 is small (Small(0)), that Small respects ≤, i.e.,

x,y (xy → (Small(y) → Small(x))),

and that for all x, the implication Small(x)→Small(x+1) is almost true; finally that there is a non small number, ∃x¬Small(x). The “induction” condition can be expressed in various ways, e.g.,

x At(Small(x) → Small(x+1))

where At is an unary connective “almost true”. Its truth function has to satisfy some natural conditions, in particular u→At(u). You can have At definable, introducing a new propositional constant r that should be interpreted by a truth value near to 1 and defining Atφ to be r→φ, thus the above formula becomes

x(r → (Small(x) → Small(x+1))), or equivalently
x((Small(x) & r) → Small(x+1)).

You see that the theory admits many interpretations (and hence is consistent). All interpretations satisfy in some sense the following: the truth degree of Small(x+1) is only slightly less than (or equal to) the truth degree of Small(x). Thus the paradox can be handled in the frame of fuzzy logic in an axiomatic way, not enforcing any unique semantics. The semantics need not be numerical and the truth values need not be linearly ordered (there are BL algebras whose order is not linear).

For the liar paradox and fuzzy logic see Hajek et al. 2000 and for Sorites paradox and fuzzy logic see Hajek & Novak 2003.

Several other notions can be handled similarly; for example the fuzzy notion probably can be axiomatized as a fuzzy modality. Having a probability on Boolean formulas, define for each such formula φ a new formula Pφ, read “probably φ”, and define the truth value of Pφ to be the probability of φ. One gets a reasonably elegant bridge between fuzziness and probability, with a simple axiom system over Łukasiewicz logic. See Hajek 1998.

6. Other systems of fuzzy logic

We mention a few:

  • Pavelka's logic. (Łukasiewicz with rational truth constants; see Pavelka 1979, Novak et al. 2000; V. Novak systematically develops this logic as a logic with evaluated syntax (working with pairs (formula, truth value)), fuzzy theories (sets of evaluated formulas) and fuzzy modus ponens [from (φ,u), (φ→ψ,v) derive (ψ,u*v) where * is Łukasiewicz t-norm]. This has excellent properties thanks to the fact that Łukasiewicz t-norm is the only continuous t-norm whose residuum is continuous. Expansions of other logics with truth constants were studied in Esteva et al. 2009 and Savicky et al. 2006.

  • Expansions of basic logic BL by aditional connectives. These include logics with an additional involutive negation (Esteva et al. 2000), and logics putting Łukasiewicz and product logic together (Esteva & Godo 1999, Cintula 2001, Cintula 2003, Horcik & Citula 2004).

  • The monoidal t-norm based logic MTL. Introduced in Esteva & Godo 2001 as well as its predicate variant MTL∀. This is a generalization of the logic BL — a logic of left continuous t-norms. It has stronger variants IMTL and ΠMTL generalizing the Łukasiewicz and product logic. These logics are (strongly) complete with respect to corresponding algebras. For results on standard completeness of these logics, see Jenei & Montagna 2002 and (for ΠMTL) Horcik 2005.

  • Fuzzy logics with non-commutative conjunction. (φ&ψ not necessarily equivalent to ψ&φ). For details see di Nola et al. 2002, Hajek 2003, and for standard completeness, Jenei & Montagna 2003.

  • Fuzzy logic and vagueness. Is fuzzy logic a logic of vague notions? This is discussed; there are two monographs on vagueness written by philosophers, Shapiro 2006 and Smith 2008. They also discuss the relation of vagueness to truth degrees (fuzziness). Shapiro is rather negative but Smith is open and positive. Let's mention two papers: Fermüller 2003 and Hajek 2009a.

  • Axiomatic fuzzy set theory. Let us mention two important approaches: first, an axiomatic theory (over a fuzzy predicate logic) which should be analogous to the classical Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory. This is well possible - see Hajek & Hanikova 2003. Another very interesting approach is to have a theory (over Łukasiewicz predicate logic) which would have full comprehension — each formula determines a set of all elements satisfing the formula. Over classical logic this is contradictory (Russel's paradox), but over Łukasiewicz it is consistent (Cantor-Łukasiewicz set theory), as was proved by White 1979. It is very interesting to investigate what can one prove on natural numbers in this set theory, see e.g. Hajek 2005b and Yatabe 2005, 2007, 2009.

To close this section let us mention a very general treatment of fuzzy logics in the frame of the so-called weakly implicative logics presented in Cintula 2006.

7. On fuzzy computing

We briefly comment on so-called fuzzy IF-THEN rules as an example of fuzzy logic in a broad sense. They may be understood as partial imprecise knowledge on some crisp function and have (in the simplest case) the form IF x is Ai THEN y is Bi. They should not be immediately understood as implications; think of a table relating values of a (dependent) variable y to values of an (independent variable) x:

x A1 An
y B1 Bn

Ai, Bi may be crisp (concrete numbers) or fuzzy (small, medium, …) It may be understood in two, in general non-equivalent ways:

(1) as a listing of n possibilities, called Mamdani's formula:

MAMD(x,y) n

(Ai(x) & Bi(y)).

(where x is A1 and y is B1 or x is A2 and y is B2 or …).

(2) as a conjunction of implications:

RULES(x,y) n

(Ai(x) → Bi(y)).

(if x is A1 then y is B1 and …).

Both MAMD and RULES define a binary fuzzy relation (given the interpretation of Ais, Bis and truth functions of connectives). Now given a fuzzy input A*(x) one can consider the image B* of A*(x) under this relation, i.e.,

B*(y) ≡ ∃x(A(x) & R(x,y)),

where R(x,y) is MAMD(x,y) (most frequent case) or RULES(x,y). Thus one gets an operator assigning to each fuzzy input set A* a corresponding fuzzy output B*. Usually this is combined with some fuzzifications converting a crisp input x0 to some fuzzy A*(x) (saying something as “x is similar to x0”) and a defuzzification converting the fuzzy image B* to a crisp output y0. Thus one gets a crisp function; its relation to the set of rules may be analyzed. For detailed information on fuzzy control see Driankov et al. 1993. (But be sure not to call minimum “Mamdani implication” — minimum is not an implication at all! For logical analysis, see e.g., Hajek 2000.)

8. Complexity

For propositional logics it is always a natural question whether a logic is decidable, i.e., whether its set of tautologies is recursive, and if it is, whether it is in co-NP (its complement being non-neterministically computable in polynomial time). Similarly for the set of satisfiable formulas and NP. (Also sets of positive tautologies, i.e. formulas having a positive value in each evaluation and positively satisfiable formulas are discussed.) It has been shown that for our logics tautologies are co-NP-complete (of maximal complexity in co-NP) and satisfiable formulas are NP-complete. See Baaz et al. 2002 and Hanikova 2002 for final results.

The corresponding predicate logics are undecidable (as is the classical predicate logic) but of various degree of undecidability in the sense of so-called arithmetical hierarchy of Σn-sets and Πn-sets. For the reader knowing this hierarchy we mention that for example the set of standard predicate tautologies of Gödel logic is Σ1-complete, for Łukasiewicz it is Π2-complete and for product logic it is non-arithmetical (outside the arithmetical hierarchy). Not surprisingly, the set of general predicate tautologies of each of these logics is Σ1-complete (due to completeness theorem). Much more is known; see Hajek 2005 for a survey of known results. Most difficult results on non-arithmeticity were obtained by Montagna 2001 and Montagna 2005.

For a recent and important contribution, see Montagna & Noguera 2010.

9. Glossary

To help the reader not familiar with the basic notions of higher mathematics, we describe two notions used:

Continuous t-norm. A t-norm is a particular operation x*y with arguments and values in the real unit interval [0,1]. Such an operation is continuous, intuitively speaking, if small changes of the arguments lead only to small changes of the result of the operation. Precisely, for each ε > 0 there is a δ > 0 such that wherever |x1x2| < δ and |y1y2| < δ then |(x1*y1) − (x2*y2)| < ε.

Infimum and supremum of a subset of the real unit interval [0,1]. Let A be a set of truth values, hence a subset of [0,1]. A truth value x is a lower bound of A if xy for each element y of A; it is the infimum of A if it is the largest lower bound (notation: x = inf(A)). Clearly, if A has a least element then this element is its infimum; but if A has no least element then its infimum is not its element. For example if A is the set of all positive truth values (x > 0) then inf(A)=0. Dually, x is an upper bound of A if xy for all y in A; the supremum of A is its least upper bound.


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