The Logic of Mass Expressions

First published Fri Mar 8, 2013

In many languages, like English, nominal expressions headed by common nouns can be divided into two subtypes, mass expressions (like wine, silverware, wisdom) and count expressions (like cat, army, idea). We first characterize what mass expressions are. Then we discuss various proposals concerning their semantics.

1. What are mass expressions?

How can we identify a class of mass expressions as distinct from a class of count expressions? In order to do so, one may try to employ syntactic criteria or semantic criteria. We present them in turn. As we shall see, only the syntactic criteria are satisfactory.

1.1 Syntactic criteria

At the syntactic level, there are two viable positions concerning the mass / count distinction: it applies at the level of nouns; or it only applies at the level of noun phrases.

The first position is the traditional, dominant view (e.g., Weinreich 1966; Krifka 1991; Gillon 1992). According to it, in a language like English (or French, German, Greek, Italian, etc.), common nouns are divided into two morphosyntactic subclasses, mass nouns and count nouns. A defining characteristic of mass nouns, like milk, gold, furniture, wisdom and love, is that they are invariable in grammatical number, while count nouns, like rabbit, bottle, table, idea and set, can be used in the singular and in the plural. Depending on the language, this basic morphosyntactic difference between the two types of noun is supplemented by differences as to the determiners they can combine with. Thus, in English, mass nouns can be used with determiners like much and a lot of, but neither with one nor many. On the contrary, count nouns can be employed with numerals like one and determiners like many, but not with much.

However, as is well known, mass nouns (like milk) can often be used as count nouns: You should take a hot milk with some honey. And vice versa: You will find a lot of rabbit around here. For this reason, several researchers have denied that the mass / count distinction applies at the level of nouns, and proposed instead that it only applies at the level of noun phrases (e.g., Damourette & Pichon 1927; Pelletier 1975; Ware 1975). Under this view, at the level of nouns, there are only common nouns, but common nouns can be used in a mass way or in a count way depending on the morphosyntactic environment they are put into. Mass determiners, like much or a little, lead to a mass use of the noun (much water, much table), while count determiners, like a or two, lead to a count use (two waters, two tables).

The two positions seem to be viable (cf. Pelletier & Schubert 2003) and they have their respective proponents. For ease of exposition, we adopt the dominant view in the rest of the entry.[1]

1.2 Semantic criteria

At the semantic level, two properties have been proposed as being characteristic of mass nouns: cumulative reference and distributive reference. But as we shall see, cumulative reference is also a property of plurals, while distributive reference doesn't apply to all mass nouns.

Since Quine (1960), it is generally accepted that mass nouns refer cumulatively. Consider a mass noun M. Suppose that we can truly say of something x that This is M (with this referring to x) and of something distinct, y, that This is M (with this now referring to y). Then in the same circumstance, we can also refer to x and y together, and say of x and y that This is M. This property of mass nouns is called cumulative reference. Plural count nouns also have the same property. Let Ns be a plural count noun. If these are Ns and those are Ns, then we can refer to these and those together, and say of all of them that they are Ns.

Various authors have proposed that mass nouns also refer distributively (e.g., Cheng 1973; ter Meulen 1981). Let M be a mass noun. Suppose that we can truly say of something x that This is M (with this referring to x). Then in the same circumstance, for anything y that is part of x, we can also say of y that This is M (with this now referring to y). However, with many mass nouns, the property doesn't apply when one considers parts that are small enough. Water is made of oxygen and hydrogen, but oxygen isn't water. And with mass nouns like furniture or silverware, the problem appears even more clearly, at the macroscopic level: a table is furniture, a leg of the table is part of the table, but the leg isn't furniture. Thus, the thesis that mass nouns refer distributively is mistaken (e.g., Gillon 1992; Nicolas 2002).

A first attempt to defend the view would be as follows. Bunt (1985) and others have proposed that, although modern science is in conflict with the claim that the mass noun water refers distributively, English speakers use the noun as if it did. The problem with this suggestion is that it cannot be falsified, since it puts aside the very cases that would do so. So it doesn't seem to be an empirical hypothesis and it doesn't appear to make any prediction. What benefit would there be to add this claim to any theory?

A better attempt would consist, in effect, in attributing a weaker property to mass nouns. As we will see in section 2, an approach based on mereology may well, contrary to what is usually assumed, want to use a non-extensional mereology, where the notion of part is defined in terms of the notion of sum. If distributive reference were understood using such a notion of part, it could avoid the problems mentioned here. There is nothing wrong with that, but then, the property attributed to mass nouns would be much weaker than that originally advocated by its partisans (see Nicolas 2002, chapter 3, for a proposal of this kind). The claim made here is simply that distributive reference, as usually conceived, is not a property of mass nouns.

But more generally, it seems that there are no necessary and sufficient semantic conditions that would specify what mass nouns are and what count nouns are (see Gillon 1992, Koslicki 1999, and Nicolas 2002 for detailed arguments to this effect; a contrario, see for instance Landman 2011). A common noun that is mass in a language (like luggage in English) may be count in another (like bagage in French). The distinction between mass nouns and count nouns should be drawn syntactically. A key feature of count nouns is that they admit the singular / plural contrast while mass nouns do not. So languages that do not mark the singular / plural contrast could lack count nouns and all their common nouns function in a similar way as mass nouns do in English. This might the case of certain classifier languages, like Mandarin (Chierchia 1998, 2010).[2] Alternatively, the mass / count distinction could just fail to apply to such languages. The proper way to draw the mass / count distinction across languages is still debated (see Doetjes 2012 for a cross-linguistic overview advocating yet a different perspective).

In the rest of this entry, we examine how sentences containing mass nouns are interpreted, i.e., how their truth-conditions can be specified. We consider several approaches to the semantics of mass nouns. Even though a given approach may turn out to be unsatisfactory, it is important to know in what precise respects it fails. For some of its key proposals may be retained in (or transposed to) a better, overall framework.

2. The purely mereological approach

We first consider the purely mereological approach (Moravcsik 1973), which uses mereological sums as the denotata of mass nouns, and interprets mass predication (e.g., This is water) in terms of parthood.

Take the noun water. The view is that this noun denotes the sum of all the water that there is. The notion of sum involved here can be characterized formally, as done in mereology (cf. Varzi 2011). Intuitively, suppose there is some water in a bottle, a, and some water in a cup, b. Then we can also refer to the water in the bottle and the cup. This is a bigger portion of water, the sum of a and b, noted ab (or a+b). a is part of ab, and so is b. More generally, we can sum all the portions of water together. This is a very big portion of water, which is the denotation of the noun water. Mass predication is then interpreted in terms of these associated notions of sum and parthood:

This is M is true iff [this] ≤ [M],

where [ · ] is the denotation function, [this] is the sum of what is demonstrated and [M] is the sum of all M. For instance:

This is water is true iff [this] ≤ [water], the sum of all water.

However, this quickly runs into a problem, since there are parts of water (e.g., oxygen) that are too small to count as water. Water seems to have “minimal parts”, smallest parts that count as water. (As said in section 1.2, this is even clearer with mass nouns like furniture.)

Parsons (1970, reprinted in 1979: 150) points out a related difficulty, the ‘WOOD = FURNITURE’ problem. Suppose that all wood is used to make up furniture and all furniture is made of wood. Then it would seem that the sum of the wood is identical with the sum of the furniture. Therefore, all sentences of the form The wood P and The furniture P are predicted to have the same truth-value, for any predicate P. Yet, it might well be that The furniture is heterogeneous is true, intuitively, while The wood is heterogeneous is false.

Remark 1: The purely mereological approach is usually understood in terms of classical extensional mereology. However, such an approach doesn't seem to require the full power of this theory. The notion of sum used could be the join operation ∨ in a join semi-lattice. And the notion of parthood employed could be the order relation ≤ defined in this way: xy =def xy = y. The notion of join semi-lattice is more general and far less constrained than classical extensional mereology (see Moltmann 1997, ch. 1, for other criticisms of the mereological extensional view).

Remark 2: Thus, against Parsons, one may well want to deny that the (sum or join of the) wood is identical to the (sum or join of the) furniture. Indeed, if the furniture is broken, it ceases to exist, while the wood does not. This line of argumentation is adopted more generally by those who deny the identity of a ship and the wood it is made of, of a man and its molecules, etc. (cf. Wasserman 2012). Parsons' argument is based on a controversial metaphysical assumption, one that a semantics of mass nouns need not make.[3] (See Steen 2012, section 2.2 and supplement 1, for other metaphysical considerations concerning the purely mereological approach.)

Remark 3: Indeed, Moravcsik (1973) proposes to do something of this kind in order to avoid the problem of minimal parts. The idea is to associate to any mass noun its own part-whole relation. Let M be a mass noun, [M] the sum it denotes, and ≤M the associated part-whole relation. The sentence This is M is represented as: [this] ≤M [M]. Then, the leg of a table isn't a furniture-part of the furniture, so the problem of minimal parts is avoided.

Remark 4: However, this doesn't account for the validity of syllogisms like the following (Burge 1972: 266–267):

This is gold. Gold is metal. Therefore, this is metal.

Presumably, it represents it as follows:

[this] ≤GOLD [gold] & [gold] ≤METAL [metal] → [this] ≤METAL [metal]

This is invalid, since only a uniform part-whole relation could guarantee transitivity.[4]

Remark 5: The purely mereological approach faces yet another, very general problem. One still needs a uniform framework for doing semantics: for proper names, singular count nouns, plurals, mass nouns, adjectives, verbs, etc. This has to be set theory, or something as powerful like “non-singular” or “plural” logic (see section 9).

3. The purely set-theoretic approach

By contrast, the purely set-theoretic approach (Burge 1972; Grandy 1973; Montague 1973[5]) treats mass nouns as ordinary predicates that denote sets[6]. Mass predication is interpreted as set membership. For any mass noun M and predicate P:

This is M is true iff [this] ⊆ [M]
Some M P is true iff [M] ∩ [P] ≠ ∅,

where [this] is the set whose elements are what is demonstrated, [M] is the set having for elements everything that is M, [P] is the set having for elements everything that P.

A difficulty for this approach is to specify, for any mass noun M, what the “portions of M” are. This difficulty appears especially clearly with definite descriptions, as in The gold on the table weighs fifty grams. If the description the gold on the table denotes the set having for elements everything that is gold on the table, then how can we evaluate the truth of the sentence? It would not do to give the sum of all weights (cf. Bunt 1985: 41). So it seems we must impose restrictions on the elements of the set [the gold on the table].[7]

Now comes a second and crucial difficulty concerning identity over time. Consider:

The clay that was on the desk on July 1st is identical with the clay that was on the table on July 2nd.
(Context of utterance: three solid bits of clay were on the desk on July 1st, and two solid bits of clay were on the table on July 2nd. Example inspired by Cartwright 1965.)

Which set could make [the clay that was on the desk on July 1st] = [the clay that was on the table on July 2nd] true? What about the set of all minimal parts of clay, i.e., the set of all the instances of clay that have no other instance of clay as part? However, with mass nouns like garbage, it is not clear what the minimal parts would be (cf. Pelletier & Schubert 2003). And more crucially, one cannot exclude a priori the possibility that what a given mass noun applies to may be indefinitely divisible. So the semantics should not require mass nouns to have minimal parts (cf. Bunt 1985; Gillon 1992). (See section 9 for a solution to this problem within the framework of non-singular logic; see Steen 2012, section 2.3, for various metaphysical considerations concerning the purely set-theoretic approach.)

4. The mixed set-theoretic and mereological approach

From what precedes, one may be tempted to draw the following lessons:

  • Mass predication (as in This is water) should not be understood in terms of parthood, but in terms of set membership.
  • The denotation of a mass noun M (the set whose elements are everything that is M) should be the join semi-lattice generated by the sum or join operation on portions of M.[8]

This solves the problems encountered above by the purely mereological approach and the purely set-theoretic approach. Indeed, what precedes suggests that mass predication (to be M), like count predication or adjectival predication, is well rendered in terms of set membership. The purely set-theoretic approach has problems with definite descriptions because it just uses sets, avoiding sums. But as we saw earlier, mass nouns have the property of cumulative reference. If there is some clay in two cups, then one can refer to all of the clay as the clay in the two cups. This suggests that portions of clay can be summed, and that the set of portions of clay should have the structure of a join semi-lattice. When this is guaranteed for any mass noun M, the semantic value of definite descriptions can easily be specified. The description the M that Q denotes the sum of everything that is some M that Q. It is such a sum that is weighted in The gold on the table weighs fifty grams. And it is such a sum whose identity over time is asserted in The clay that was on the desk on July 1st is identical with the clay that was on the table on July 2nd. (Another treatment of identity over time is presented in section 9.)

Accordingly, we arrive at the mixed set-theoretic and mereological approach:

This is M is true iff [this] ⊆ [M]
Some M P is true iff [M] ∩ [P] ≠ ∅
The M (that Q) P is true iff [the M (that Q)] ⊆ [P],

where [this] is the set having for sole member the sum of what is demonstrated, [M] is the set of everything that is M (a join semi-lattice), [the M (that Q)] is the set having for sole member the sum of everything that is some M (that Q), [P] is the set having for members everything that P.

This offers a simple way to accommodate the hindsights of the set-theoretic and mereological approaches, while avoiding the previous pitfalls. A decisive advantage of this view over the purely mereological one is that the overall framework for doing semantics remains the usual one, set theory. Gillon (1992) and Nicolas (2010) can be seen as instances of such a mixed view,[9] with an additional component, namely “aggregations” or “coverings” (see section 8 below).

5. Negation

However, a difficulty appears with negation (Roeper 1983; Lønning 1987; Higginbotham 1994). Consider a positive sentence of the form The M P and its negation The M not P, where M is a mass noun and P a predicate. For instance: The gold is in the safe and The gold is not in the safe. Imagine that the universe of discourse contains only two bits of gold, a and b, and their sum ab. Then under the mixed view, [gold] = {a, b, ab}, [the gold] = {ab}. Suppose further that only a is in the safe: [in the safe] = {a}. Given what we said in section 4:

The gold is in the safe is true iff [the gold] ⊆ [in the safe]

So the sentence is predicted to be false.

Now, it seems plausible that the semantics should validate the following equivalence: The M not P is true iff The M P is false. Then, the sentence The gold is not in the safe is predicted to be true. This is a problem for the mixed approach developed so far, since one would like to ascribe the same status to the positive sentence and its negation. Either because both sentences are taken to be false. Or because both are judged inapplicable in the circumstance, being as it were partly true and partly false.

Consider also noun phrases of the form the M that P and the M that not P. For instance: the gold that is in the safe and the gold that is not in the safe. Here, intuitions are very clear: the first noun phrase designates the solid bit of gold a, while the second designates b. However, under the mixed approach, The gold is not in the safe is true. This means that a+b (the gold) is in the denotation of is not in the safe. So it may seem that a+b is also in the denotation of gold that is not in the safe and in that of the gold that is not in the safe, contradicting speakers' intuitions.

How can we avoid these difficulties? Roeper (1983), Lønning (1987) and Higginbotham (1994) propose that the solution lies in defining predication and negation in a certain way within a Boolean algebra.[10] They consider only cases where predicates (mass nouns included) are “homogeneous”, like above. Following ter Meulen (1981), a predicate is said to be homogeneous if it applies both cumulatively and distributively. Predicates like gold and in the safe may indeed seem to apply distributively and cumulatively, if we stay at the macroscopic level for gold. In this approach, mass nouns and predicates denote elements in a certain Boolean algebra, (B,≤,∨,∧0,1). ≤ is the order (or parthood) relation. ∨ is the join (or sum) operation. ∧ is the meet (or intersection) operation. 0 is the smallest element. 1 is the largest element. As in any Boolean algebra, every element x has a Boolean complement, noted −x (cf. Monk 2009).

Predication is understood in terms of Boolean intersection:

This is M is true iff [this] ∧ [M] = [this] iff [this] ≤ [M]
The M P is true iff [M] ∧ [P] = [M] iff [M] ≤ [P]
Some M P is true iff [M] ∧ [P] ≠ 0,

where [this] is the join of what is demonstrated, [M] is join of everything that is M, and [P] is the join of everything that P.

And negation is defined in terms of Boolean complement: [not P] = −[P]. So The M not P is true iff [M] ≤ [not P] = −[P].

Applying this, both The gold is in the safe and The gold is not in the safe are predicted to be false. Indeed, in the situation imagined, the universe of discourse contains only two bits of gold, a and b, and their join ab. So [gold] = ab = 1, [is in the safe] = a, [is not in the safe] = −a = b.[11]

The denotation of complex noun phrases is also built through Boolean intersection: [M that P] = [M] ∧ [P]. So [gold that is in the safe] = [gold]∧[is in the safe] = (ab)∧a = a. And [gold that is not in the safe] = (ab)∧b = b.

Remark 1: Under this approach, the whole universe of discourse (for mass nouns and their predicates) is specified by a single Boolean algebra, with uniformly defined join (sum), meet (intersection), and order (parthood). Predication is defined in terms of Boolean intersection (or equivalently, order or parthood in the case of definite subjects). This works with mass nouns and predicates that are homogeneous (i.e., refer distributively and cumulatively). But mass nouns like furniture are clearly not homogeneous. And a predicate like made by John isn't homogeneous either. When something is made by John (e.g., a piece of furniture), it doesn't imply that any part of it (e.g., some wood used to make it up) is also made by John. For the reasons given in section 2, the Boolean approach may ascribe incorrect truth-conditions to sentences like This is furniture, Some furniture is made by John, and The furniture is made by John. For instance, [this] ≤ [furniture] does not guarantee that what is demonstrated is furniture, since a piece of wood may be a part of a piece of furniture without being furniture. So there are mass nouns and predicates to which the approach doesn't seem to apply, even though the same difficulties with negation appear with them. If in the examples above we replace gold by furniture and in the safe by made by John, we meet the same problems with negation. (If there are two pieces of furniture, only one of which is made by John, is it true or false that The furniture is made by John?) So an appropriate solution had better not be tied to the assumption of homogeneity.[12]

Remark 2: Indeed, the proposed treatment of negation can be adapted within the mixed approach. The basic idea is that if something x P and something y not P, then x and y do not overlap (have no part in common, have 0 as intersection). So, within the mixed view, one may define [not P] as the set comprising anything that does not overlap ∨[P], the sum of everything that P. This solves the problems above, without requiring homogeneity.

Remark 3: However, defining negation in terms of Boolean complement or non-overlap doesn't work with all predicates. Consider the adjective cheap. Fix the context of speech so that what counts as cheap is specified and what counts as not cheap is also specified. The pieces of furniture a and b may each count as cheap, while together they (ab) count as not cheap. So non-overlap isn't satisfied here: something not cheap overlaps with something cheap. Cheap is a vague predicate. But the same phenomenon is observed with an exact predicate like costs fifty euros: a and b may each cost fifty euros, while together they don't, costing ninety euros, for instance. So non-overlap should not be required. In general, [not P] cannot be defined in terms of [P]. Instead, it seems that [P] and [not P] should be separately specified. (This is done in many approaches to vagueness.)

Remark 4: The same difficulties also appear with plurals, as we can see if we replace gold by pieces of furniture and in the safe by made by John in the examples above. There is no agreement on what the proper treatment of negated plural sentences is. Still, a popular view is the following (Krifka 1996; Löbner 2000; see Breheny 2005 a contrario). Sentences like The pieces of furniture are in the safe and The pieces of furniture are not in the safe make a presupposition of “indivisibility”: they can be used felicitously only if all the pieces of furniture are in safe or if none is.[13] The same could be proposed concerning mass nouns. In any case, a unified treatment of negation would be welcome, given that negation seems to create the same basic problem with mass nouns and with plurals.

Remark 5: But the problem is even more general, since it also appears with subjects that are count and singular, like table. Is the table in the living-room, when one half of it is, while the other half is in the bedroom? The application of a predicate to an entity (or the application of the negated predicate) seems to be often sensitive to the part structure of the entity (Löbner 2000; Corblin 2008). More work on this is needed to understand how predication and negation work in connection to part-structure.

6. Quantifiers

What is the semantics of quantifiers combining with mass nouns: some, all, no, only, little, much, most, two liters of…? Higginbotham and May (1981) propose that the semantics of quantifiers combining with count nouns (some, all, no, only, few, many, most, two…) can be captured within the framework of generalized quantification. Inspired by Roeper (1983) and Lønning (1987), Higginbotham (1994) applies similar ideas to the case of mass nouns. His proposals are made in the Boolean approach criticized in the last section. So we transpose them directly into the mixed set-theoretic and mereological framework. This also has the advantage that the same framework is used for count quantifiers and mass quantifiers.

We consider sentences of the form Q M P, where Q is a quantifier, M a mass noun and P a predicate. [M] is the denotation of the mass noun, i.e., the set that has for members everything that is M (a join semi-lattice). [P] is the set that has for members everything that P. Using set-theoretic intersection ∩, one may propose:

Some M P is true iff [M] ∩ [P] ≠ ∅
All M P is true iff [M] ∩ [P] = [M][14]
No M P is true iff [M] ∩ [P] = ∅
Only M P is true iff [M] ∩ [P] = [P]

This applies to sentences like Some / All / No / Only gold was stolen.

With the other quantifiers (little, much, most, two liters of…), one seems to say something about the quantity of M (little gold) or intensity of M (little wisdom). Let us suppose that a mass noun M has an associated function, μ, that measures quantity or intensity. We focus here on mass nouns that apply to concrete entities, like water or furniture (see section 10 for “abstract” mass nouns). In that case, it is handy (though perhaps not necessary) to suppose that μ is monotonic:

xy → μ(x) ≤ μ(y)

and additive (if x and y don't overlap, the measure of their sum is the sum of their measures):

¬∃z (zx & zy) → μ(xy) = μ(x) + μ(y)

(The measure function μ is associated to a certain mass noun M. But of course, some mass nouns may share the same measure function. And with a single mass noun M, different measure functions may perhaps be used, in different contexts, to measure the “quantity of M” that is relevant in the context.)

One can also define the measure of a set E:

μ(E) =def μ(∨E),

where ∨E is the sum (or join) of the elements of E.

With this in hand, the meanings of little, much and most can be specified as follows, the numerical values p, q, r and s being specified contextually when a sentence is uttered:

Little1 M P is true iff μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≤ p
Little2 M P is true iff μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≤ r*μ([M])
Much1 M P is true iff μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≥ q
Much2 M P is true iff μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≥ s*μ([M])
Most M P is true iff μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≥ μ([M]) / 2
Two liters of M P is true iff μ([M] ∩ [P]) = 2
with a function μ measuring in liters

Above, little and much are given two meanings, an “absolute” one and a “proportional” one. Thus, a sentence like Much gold was stolen may mean that:

  • The stolen gold was a large quantity of gold (absolute interpretation):

    μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≥ q, where q is specified contextually.

  • The stolen gold was a great proportion of the gold (proportional interpretation):[15]

    μ([M] ∩ [P]) ≥ s*μ([M]), where s is specified contextually.

Remark 1: What precedes allows one to characterize the meaning(s) of the various mass quantifiers. But of course, it leaves room for improvement concerning the specific meanings attributed. For instance, Solt (2009) argues in favor of a different condition for the quantifier most.

Remark 2: In the case of the count quantifiers few and many, there is evidence that each quantifier is really ambiguous between two interpretations, the absolute one and the proportional one (Partee 1989). It remains to be seen whether there is similar evidence in the case of little and much.

Remark 3: Adding negation to this picture creates the same difficulties as we saw above in the case of definites. In certain cases, [not P] can be defined in terms of [P] and non-overlap. But in general, [P] and [not P] should be separately specified.

7. Logical relations

In what precedes, we have looked at the semantics of various kinds of sentences where mass nouns appear. But we haven't considered whether there are logical relations between such sentences, i.e., whether the semantics makes up for an adequate logic of mass nouns. This is the topic of this section. An appropriate semantics for mass nouns should guarantee things like what follows. (For a more detailed discussion, see Pelletier & Schubert 2003: 63–74.)

Existential generalization: there are many sentences whose truth entails the truth of an existential generalization. For instance:

The wine is on the table. So some wine is on the table.

Universal instantiation: as mentioned in section 2, this kind of reasoning also seems to be valid:

This is gold. All gold is metal. Therefore, this is metal.

Also, sentences like the following should come out as always true, given the meanings of the words involved: All gold is gold. And in any situation in which there is some gold in Zurich, this should also be true: The gold in Zurich is gold.

Mass nouns can also be used in generic sentences, which express generalizations: Gold is metal. So one would need a semantics for generic sentences to check, for instance, if this reasoning is validated: This is gold. Gold is metal. Therefore, this is metal. However, the semantics of genericity is a vast topic, which falls out of the scope of this entry (see also note 5).

Finally, mass nouns can also be used as count nouns: Gold is a metal. So a full-blown semantics, covering both mass nouns and count nouns, should be able to validate syllogisms like the following, which involve mass and count uses of a mass noun: This is gold. Gold is a metal. Therefore, this is a metal.

For illustration, let us see how the mixed set-theoretic and mereological framework developed in sections 4 and 6 handles some of these cases. According to section 4:

The wine is on the table is true iff [the wine] ⊆ [on the table],

where [the wine] denotes the sum of the wine, and [on the table] denotes the set containing everything that is on the table.

Some wine is on the table is true iff [wine] ∩ [on the table] ≠ ∅,

where [wine] is the set containing everything that is wine (a join semi-lattice).

Since [wine] is the join semi-lattice containing everything that is wine, it contains in particular the sum of the wine. So, given how the semantics is set-up, the truth of The wine is one the table guarantees that of Some wine is on the table.

For a different case, according to sections 4 and 6:

This is gold is true iff [this] ⊆ [gold]
All gold is metal is true iff [gold] ∩ [metal] = [gold]

So the truth of This is gold and All gold is metal guarantees that [this] ⊆ [metal] and so that This is metal is true.

8. Collective and non-collective construals, coverings

According to Gillon (1992), a sentence containing a mass noun may receive so-called “collective” and “distributive” construals, modulo the meaning of the particular lexical items composing the sentence, context of speech and knowledge of the world. (Sentences containing plurals also receive such construals. This is well documented by Gillon (1992, 1996) and Schwarzschild (1996). This may be confirmed by replacing mass nouns with plurals in the examples we give below.)

Take the following sentence: This silverware costs a hundred euros. The sentence may be true if the silverware costs, altogether, a hundred euros: this is the collective construal of the sentence. It may be true if each piece of silverware, by itself, costs a hundred euros: this is the distributive construal. It may also be true if the silverware demonstrated consists in two sets of silverware, each set of silverware costing, by itself, a hundred euros: this may be called an “intermediate” construal.

A partly similar range of construals is observed with a mass noun like wine: This wine costs a hundred euros. A collective construal would assert that the wine, altogether, costs a hundred euros. A non-collective construal may be obtained, for instance, when the wine demonstrated consists of two cases of wine. The speaker could then assert that each case of wine costs a hundred euros. What about a distributive construal of the sentence? In fact, this notion does not apply in this case, since a mass noun like wine has no linguistically specified minimal part.

Therefore, the distinction that concerns all mass nouns is not that between collective and distributive construals (nor that between collective, distributive and intermediate readings), but rather, that between collective and non-collective construals. What happens is that, in the specific case of mass nouns like silverware, one can identify, among the non-collective construals, one reading that may be called distributive and other readings that may be called intermediate.

The specific meanings of the verbal expression and its arguments, combined with knowledge of the world and context of speech, may render a type of construal more, or less, plausible. In particular, non-collective, “intermediate” construals may be harder to get than the collective reading, or than the “distributive” reading if there is one. Such construals require specific information about the context in order to become available. They are often easier to get when the verb has several arguments, as in the following example due to Gillon (1992): This fruit was wrapped in that paper. A non-collective, “intermediate” construal with respect to its first argument (this fruit) would be one where there are several pieces of paper, each enclosing several pieces of fruit.

In the examples we have given so far (as well as in those considered by Gillon), non-collective construals always correspond to partitions of the denotation of the mass noun phrase. However, some interpretations correspond to a more general notion, that of a “covering”: a set X is a covering of a set Y just in case the sum of the elements of X is identical with the sum of the elements of Y.[16] Thus, with This livestock carried that furniture, it may be that some pieces of furniture were repeatedly part of the furniture carried by some of the livestock. The relation of carrying thus applies between elements of a covering of [this livestock] and elements of a covering of [that furniture]. So it seems that the semantics of mass nouns should leave room, not only for partitions, but also for all kinds of coverings.[17]

Let us now see how Gillon (1992, 1996, 2012) accounts for these data. We follow him quite closely, but introduce a few technical modifications to ensure that everything works.

The denotation of a mass noun M is the set [M] that has for elements everything that is M (a join semi-lattice). This is needed in order to specify correctly the truth-conditions of This is M:[18]

This is M is true iff [this] ⊆ [M],

where [this] is the set having for sole member the sum of what is demonstrated.

A set Y is an M-covering of a set Z just in case these two conditions are satisfied:

  • Y is a subset of [M]: Y ⊆ [M].
  • The sum of the elements of Y is identical to the sum of the elements of Z.

The interpretation of sentences like the following depends on the choice of an M-covering of the noun's denotation.[19] Relative to this choice of covering C:

The M P is true iff C ⊆ [P]
Some M P is true iff C ∩ [P] ≠ ∅
All M P is true iff C ∩ [P] = C

Gillon doesn't extend his account to other quantified statements. However, this is easily done, following section 6. Thus, one may define the measure of a set E:

μ(E) =def μ(∨E),

where ∨E is the sum of the elements of E.

And propose that:

Most M P is true iff μ(C ∩ [P]) ≥ μ(C) / 2

And similarly for the other quantifiers whose interpretation involve a measure.

Remark: For Gillon, each choice of covering determines a specific interpretation of the sentence. The sentence is thus many-ways ambiguous. Schwarzschild (1996) offers a detailed defense for a similar position in the case of plurals. But the view also has opponents, like Lasersohn (1995). Among the alternatives, one could propose that a sentence of the form The M P is true just in case there exists a covering C of [M] such that C ⊆ [P]. The sentence wouldn't be ambiguous but indeterminate with respect to coverings. A problem is that this wouldn't predict the distributive / collective ambiguity, which does seem real (see Gillon 1992 for evidence).

9. Non-singular terms

There are many similarities between the semantics of mass nouns and plurals, cf. sections 5, 6, and 8. Also, at a very intuitive level, if there are eight pieces of silverware on the table, then the speaker seems to refer to eight things at once when he says: The silverware that is on the table comes from Italy. If this intuition is taken seriously, then a mass noun isn't a singular term. Rather, it is a non-singular term that may refer to one or several things at once.

Nicolas (2008) puts forwards a semantics of mass nouns that does justice to this intuition (see Laycock (2006) and Cocchiarella (2009) for related proposals). It is cashed out in “non-singular” or “plural” logic. In usual logic frameworks, like predicate logic, constants and variables are singular in the following sense. Under any interpretation, a constant is interpreted as one individual, and under any assignment, a variable is interpreted as one individual. By contrast, non-singular or plural logic possesses singular and non-singular constants and variables. Under any interpretation and variable assignment, a non-singular term (a constant or a variable) may be interpreted as one or more individuals in the domain of interpretation. In particular, a formula consisting of a predicate whose argument is a non-singular constant is true just in case the constant is interpreted as one or more individuals that jointly satisfy the predicate (cf. Linnebo 2012[20]).

Remark: The claim is not that mass nouns are plurals. It is that mass nouns and plurals share a common property, namely the ability to refer non-singularly, to one or several things at once.

The resulting semantics has the following features:

  • Axioms guaranteeing the existence of mereological sums are replaced by non-singular or plural reference. (Cf. also Nicolas 2009.)
  • Combined with a generalized notion of covering, this allows a treatment of identity statements different from that offered by the mixed set-theoretic and mereological approach (where what remains identical over time is a certain mereological sum).

Imagine that three solid bits of clay, the as, were on the desk on July 1st, and two solid bits of clay, the bs, were on the table on July 2nd. Now consider the statement:

The clay that was on the desk on July 1st is identical with the clay that was on the table on July 2nd.

According to Nicolas (2008), the sentence is true when a common non-singular covering can be chosen for the as and the bs.[21] This means that there are some small bits of clay, each of which has retained its identity over time. On July 1st, these bits of clay were so arranged that they made up the as (i.e., they were a covering of the as). On July 2nd, they were arranged differently, in such a way that they made up the bs. This doesn't require the existence of minimal parts of clay. It only requires the existence of a common division of the as and the bs into certain bits of clay. (See Steen 2012, section 2.4, for metaphysical considerations concerning the non-singularist or pluralist approach.)

10. Abstract mass nouns

“Abstract” nouns like sadness and wisdom and “concrete” nouns like water and furniture all belong to the morphosyntactic class of mass nouns. However, semantics for mass nouns have generally focused on concrete terms, i.e., terms that apply to concrete entities. This raises an important question: are abstract mass nouns a separate species of mass nouns, with their own semantic properties? Or can a general account be proposed, which would work both for concrete mass nouns and abstract ones?

Nicolas (2004, 2010) shows that a general account of the semantics of mass nouns can indeed be proposed, provided one takes a more general stance than when focusing on concrete mass nouns alone. Several issues arise.

Reference: concrete common nouns can be used in definite descriptions, where they seem to refer to entities of various types. Do abstract mass nouns refer to something when they are used in definite descriptions? And if so, what do they refer to? Consider sentences like these: Julie's wisdom attracted Tom. Julie's love for Tom lasted several years. Nicolas proposes that their subjects, which are headed by abstract mass nouns, do refer (or make as if to refer) to instances of properties or relations, thereby introducing these as referents in the discourse (Moltmann 2007 proposes something similar). He argues that this provides the most unified explanation of the various uses of abstract mass nouns.

Nominalization: many abstract mass nouns are derived from an adjective or verb. What is the semantic effect of nominalization? Nicolas proposes that its intuitive effect, namely reification, a "something-from-nothing transformation", is adequately captured by meaning postulates. Thus, a meaning postulate relates the meanings of the mass noun love and the verb to love. It ensures that an instance of love from John towards Mary exists if and only if John loves Mary.

Distributive, collective, and intermediate construals: sentences with concrete mass nouns or plurals may receive so-called distributive, collective, and intermediate construals (cf. section 8 above). Is it also the case with abstract mass nouns? Nicolas (2010) suggests that this is so. Take the sentence The strength of these men is impressive, uttered in a context where two strong teams are competing. The sentence can assert that the strength of each team is impressive. This corresponds to a construal which is neither distributive (the strength of each man is impressive), nor collective (the strength of the men all together is impressive), but intermediate between distributive and collective. Nicolas shows that these construals can be accounted for by Gillon's (1996) rule for the interpretation of complex noun phrases containing a prepositional phrase.

Overall, then, it seems that a unified semantics can be specified for all mass nouns.


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mass expressions: metaphysics of | material constitution | mereology | plural quantification


For comments, I would like to thank Alan Bale, Francis Corblin, Carmen Dobrovie-Sorin, Brendan Gillon, Giorgio Magri, Barry Schein, Mark Steen, Martin Stokhof, Lucia Tovena, and an anonymous reviewer for Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Thanks also to audiences in Istanbul, Montreal, Paris, and Storrs for their feedback. This work was supported by the grants ANR-10-LABX-0087 IEC and ANR-10-IDEX-0001-02 PSL*.

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